Antoine Le Grand

First published Fri Sep 14, 2001; substantive revision Wed Jul 26, 2023

Antoine Le Grand (1629–1699) was a philosopher and catholic theologian who played an important role in propagating the Cartesian philosophy in England and beyond during the latter half of the seventeenth century. He was born in Douai, (at the time under rule by the Spanish Hapsburgs), and early in life was associated with an English community of Franciscans who had a college there. Le Grand became a Franciscan Recollect friar prior to leaving for England as a missionary in 1656. In England, he taught philosophy and theology, advocating Catholicism and eventually Cartesianism, the latter being as unpopular as the former was perilous. It is not clear how Le Grand came to Cartesianism, but the first evidence of his adoption of the new philosophy was in his Institutio Philosophiae, published in London in 1672. His early works show affinities to the philosophies of Seneca and Epicurus. He is noted for his polemical exchanges with Samuel Parker and John Sergeant, and for having given Descartes’s work a Scholastic form to further its acceptance in the schools.

1. Life and Writings

Le Grand lived in London for many years before retiring to Oxfordshire towards the close of his life in 1695. His philosophy was generally well-received at the University of Cambridge, perhaps owing to the influence of some leading Neo-Platonists there such as John Smith, Henry More, and Ralph Cudworth, who were at least initially sympathetic to Descartes’s ideas. John Smith, author of Select Discourses (1660), and the earliest recorded partisan of the Cartesian philosophy in England, was the first to introduce the study of Descartes to Cambridge. Henry More corresponded with Descartes, and was sympathetic until about 1665, when he launched the most vigorous attack on Cartesianism in the age, in his Enchiridion Metaphysicum (1671). Cudworth, like More although with less venom, objected to Descartes’s mechanistic account of the material world in his The True Intellectual System of the Universe (1678). It was Le Grand who debated and defended Descartes’s philosophy to these and other English critics.

According to Anthony Wood, a contemporary of Le Grand’s and an historian at Oxford, Le Grand’s Institutio Philosophiae, secundum principia Domini Renati Descartes (1672), was a “must read” at Cambridge. (Wood, 1691, p. 620) Further attesting to the attention it attracted, Jean Robert Armogathe has detailed how the 1678 edition of this work came to be placed on the Index in 1709 because of its anti-scholastic arguments. (Armogathe, 2003) Le Grand also published a Latin edition of Jacques Rohault’s Traité de physique (1671), at the time an enormously popular physics text, using Bonet’s 1674 Latin translation with added commentary, Jacobi Rohaulti tractatus physicus (1682). In 1697, Samuel Clarke published a new Latin edition with annotations, and this along with subsequent annotated editions were largely responsible for the work’s continued popularity as a textbook in universities in England. (Dobre, Babeș, Bujor, and Vida, 2021) According to Benjamin Hoadly, the editor of Clarke’s The Works (1738), at the time of Clarke’s entrance to Cambridge in 1691, Rohault’s Traité was the standard modern scientific text, and Newton’s Principia (1687), had not yet been accepted: “The philosophy of Des Cartes was then the established philosophy of that university, and the system of nature hardly allowed to be explained any otherwise than his principles … . The Great Sir Isaac Newton had indeed then published his Principia. But this book was but for the few.” Clarke’s Latin translation of the Traité underwent four editions and became the new preferred Cambridge textbook, as the Cartesian physics gave way to that of Newton early in the eighteenth century.

Antoine Le Grand’s most substantial work, An Entire Body of Philosophy According to the Principles Of the Famous Renate des Cartes (1694), is a Cartesian tract from beginning to end. The work is a translation and compilation by Richard Bloom of three of Le Grand’s Latin works, which includes alterations and additions by Le Grand himself. It is based on Le Grand’s Institutio (1672), Historia naturae (1673), and Dissertatio de carentia sensus et cogitationis in brutis (1675). The first book, The Institution, is divided into ten parts and provides a treatment of the general nature of things according to Descartes’s principles; book two, The History of Nature, illustrates the operation of these first principles in nature, by means of a great variety of reported experiments and examples. In this book, Le Grand applied the general Cartesian principles to the study of particular bodies and their qualities, showing how such principles can explain all natural phenomena. His extensive discussion includes bodies as various as the loadstone, plants, and insects. And finally, in the third book, A Dissertation of the Want of Sense and Knowledge in Brute Animals, he argued against the supposed link of life and sense from Plato onwards. Following a brief survey of various hypotheses on the nature of soul by Aristotle, Gassendi, Fabri, and Descartes, he argues along with Descartes that bodies are soulless and animals are mere machines. In the Preface, Le Grand states, “ … this whole work contains nothing else, but his [Descartes’s] opinions, or what may clearly and distinctly be deduced from them.” (Le Grand, 1694, Preface, end of section iii, unpaginated)

At Oxford, Le Grand’s ideas were not well received. Samuel Parker aligned Hobbes’s mechanism with that of Descartes, charging both with atheism. Parker’s condemnations led to the banning of Descartes’s philosophy at Oxford, quashing its public entrance at the university. Le Grand responded to Parker’s charges of atheism in his Apologia de Descartes (1679), challenging Parker’s criticisms by offering various proofs of God’s existence. Another long-time, Oxford critic of Le Grand was the English secular priest and Aristotelian, John Sergeant. Sergeant, best known for his criticisms of Locke’s philosophy, was also highly critical of the Cartesian philosophy. Le Grand responded to Sergeant’s criticisms of the Cartesian criterion of truth in his Dissertatio de ratione cognoscendi (1679). A second major controversy occurred between the two authors late in Le Grand’s life, this time over the nature of ideas. This dispute led Le Grand to write a series of short pieces, published later as Several Smaller Pieces Against M. J. Sergeant (1698), no longer extant. (Bouillier, 1854, vol. 2, p. 495, fn.1) In response, Sergeant attacked the Cartesian idea of extension, to which the aging Le Grand never publicly responded. Le Grand died at the home of a wealthy farmer in Oxfordshire, where he had served as a tutor until his death in 1699.

2. Metaphysics and Natural Philosophy

Le Grand defended the first principles of Descartes’s philosophy with great fidelity. He held to Descartes’s dualism of mind and body and that the essence of mind is thought and the essence of matter is extension. Like Descartes, he also asserted that in the human being the mind and body are united and interact, and that while humans have souls, brutes and other living things are mere machines. In natural philosophy, Le Grand defended the Cartesian physics that material things operate in a plenum and move by means of vortical motions according to the laws of motion. Le Grand did not make any substantial revisions to Cartesian metaphysics or physics. However, he did make two important contributions: first, he provided clarifications and elaborations of Descartes’s account of motion which had direct consequences for the Cartesian account of matter, causation, and mind-body interaction; secondly, he extended the application of Cartesian physics, treating in detail such subjects as metals, plants, insects, animals, and the human body. Both contributions represented important developments of the Cartesian science, against the prevailing Scholastic-Aristotelian science.

Le Grand’s contribution to the Cartesian account of motion may either be seen as an extension or a revision of Descartes’s, somewhat ambiguous, treatment. Le Grand took seriously the claim that God is the total and efficient cause of motion in the universe, and that matter is entirely passive, and hence bodies are incapable of self-movement, or of moving other bodies. In his Entire Body of Philosophy, he argued that since a body may be in motion or at rest and yet still remain a body, motion must be a mode non-essential to matter. Moreover, given that matter itself is inert, it cannot be the source of the order and direction of moving bodies. Accordingly, God infused motion into the universe and laid down the laws of motion to govern it. Thus, motion itself as well as the orderly movement of bodies derive from God who acts as the effective principle. While the specific position, constitution, and configuration of the parts of a particular body determine how certain local motions are communicated, the source and ultimate direction of the motion itself is God. What this means for body-body interaction is that bodies function as secondary causes, directing local motions in virtue of the specific configurations of their parts. (1694, Book I, part iv, p. 116) Kenneth Clatterbaugh argues that Le Grand’s position on body-body causation amounts to occasionalism. Clatterbaugh identifies four positions that he claims commit Le Grand to the occasionalist doctrine articulated by Malebranche: 1) that there are no accidents; 2) that motion is identical to the will of God; 3) that conservation and creation are the same such that God creates bodies and their motions continuously; and 4) that the Divine Will and Intellect are one. (Clatterbaugh, 1999) However, Le Grand’s references to universal and secondary causes, and his commitment to the created nature of laws and eternal truths make the occasionalist ascription a complicated one. (See discussion of the Creation Doctrine below in section 3.)

Le Grand’s account of body-body interaction clears the way to explain mind-body interaction and union. In the same way as with finite bodies, God functions as the effective principle of finite minds, providing the ultimate source of change: “… there is nothing, besides motion, which can strike the organs of the senses, or affect the mind itself.” (1694, book I, part viii, p. 284) Although mind and matter are substances sharing no common properties, it is in virtue of God acting as the effective principle that mind and body are capable of interaction. This kind of interaction is no more or no less problematic than the interaction of two physical bodies. According to Le Grand, the causal interaction between bodies and between minds and bodies are facts dependent upon God’s will and known only by experience. The real question is not about whether there can be interaction, but rather, how particular interactions in fact occur: “The union of the soul and body consists in an actual dependency of all the cogitations of the soul, upon certain motions of the body; and of some certain motions of the body upon some cogitations of the soul.” (1694, book I, part xi, p. 325) As there is no mode of union of mind and body (for modes belong only to substances), what is required is the actual “mutual commerce of actions and passions.” (Ibid., p. 325)

As with interaction, Le Grand described the mind-body union in terms directly borrowed from Descartes. However, Le Grand explicated in more detailed terms than did Descartes the nature of the mind-body union. According to Le Grand, there are three kinds of union, each possessing their own principle that brings about that union: the first is that of two minds whose principle of union is love; the second is that of two physical bodies whose principle of union is local presence; and the third is that of the mind and body whose principle of union is actual mutual dependence. Just as two physical bodies are joined by physical contact, and as two minds are joined by love, the mind and body are joined by a mutually dependent activity. So long as the body actually receives its specific motions dependently on the soul, and the soul actually receives its local motions (passions) dependently on the body, then the spirit and the body are joined. Although there can be no mode common to mind and matter, there is this mutual action and hence a similitude and relation: “This similitude and relation we have formerly affirmed to consist in action and passion.” (Ibid., p. 325) In other words, just as the body is capable of receiving and transmitting local motions since motion is a mode of matter, the mind is capable of varying passions since passions are a mode of the mind. It is by the mutual commerce of such motions and passions that the mind and body are said to be united. The mutual activity said to occur between the mind and the body is a property which follows only from the union of mind and body and cannot proceed from either alone, “And the truth is, since neither body can think, nor mind be capable of dimension, there can be no mode common to mind and body, except a mutual acting of each upon each, from which alone the properties of both can follow.” (1694, p. 325).

In natural philosophy, Le Grand extended Descartes’s physics to include phenomena that would now be classified as metallurgy, entomology, botany, biology, physiology, medicine, psychology, and psychiatry. Book II of the Entire Body of Philosophy, entitled The History of Nature, catalogues and critically discusses the latest experiments of his time, as well as the theories of the ancients and moderns. Prominent in his discussions is the importance of secondary causes in nature (both exemplary and secondary efficient causes), and the need for experiments, not just as tools of confirmation, but also as a means of discovering the true nature of things. This was due to his application of mechanism to explain not only the behavior of material bodies but also the entire institution of nature. Le Grand believed that God laid down the laws of nature and the principles of being by acting as the primary efficient cause, and that the operation of these laws and principles manifested themselves in nature in the form of secondary causes and effects. Although the laws and their specific mechanisms of operation are not visible, secondary causes and their effects are. These causes and effects then are known by experience and are the starting point of all science, which is characterized by reasoning from effects (observed in nature) to causes (first principles discerned by reason). Book III of the Entire Body of Philosophy, entitled A Dissertation of the Want of Sense and Knowledge in Brute Animals, extends Descartes’s treatment of the mechanization of the sensitive soul to explain sensory, motor, and appetitive functions. In addition to defending Descartes’s controversial theses that life functions are reducible to material motions and that animals are mere machines, he provides an account of how cartesian organic bodies have identity over time. (Adriaenssen, 2018) As Hatfield shows, Le Grand’s compendium of nature demonstrates the magnitude of the Cartesian project to mechanize life and the soul. Its detailed observations and rich descriptions lay the groundwork for Cartesian physiology and psychology. (Hatfield, 2013)

3. Epistemology

Le Grand’s account of sensations and ideas is orthodox in its Cartesianism, although ampliative in interesting ways. Sensory impressions are what mediate the external object and our mind’s idea of it, and they consist in nothing more than the immediate motions of the sensory organs in the body. Such motions are produced by a natural necessity and they share no similarity or affinity with the particular objects that cause them. Like Descartes, Le Grand used the example of a sword wounding the body to illustrate the non-resemblance or dissimilitude of the relations between external objects and sensations, and sensations and ideas. (1694, book I, part ix, p. 327) A sword that produces pain in us is nothing like our sensation or idea of pain, nor is our idea of pain anything like our sensation of pain. Yet, we maintain that there is a causal and representational relation between the sword and the idea it produces. In addition, Le Grand like Descartes made a clear distinction between sensory impressions and ideas. Sensory impressions are particular, quantifiable motions, whereas ideas are representational and propositional in character. Given that sensations are non-resembling and non-representational it follows that ideas, which are essentially representational, could not be derived from sensations. Due to the lack of any form of similitude or affinity between object/sensation, and sensation/idea, it follows that there is no such relation that holds between an idea and an external (material) object. From this lack of similitude, Le Grand concluded that adventitious ideas (coming from material objects outside us) must be innate or inbred in the mind. For, if the external object is not like the idea we form of it, then the only explanation remaining is that the mind is responsible for it. Likewise, fictitious ideas, such as sirens and chimeras, have no exemplar outside the mind and so must be formed according to forms natural to the human mind. And finally, common notions such as substance, truth, goodness, equity, and God, as well as axioms such as ‘the same thing cannot be and not be,’ must also be innate, that is, they must proceed from the mind alone, since all corporeal motions are particular but these notions are universal. According to Le Grand, innate ideas do not proceed from the senses or the imagination but “are congenite and inbred with the said mind, from their original” (1694, book I, part ix, p. 328). By this Le Grand meant that the mind or thought itself, not any of its faculties such as sense, imagination, or intellection, is the principle or original of such ideas. These ideas are formed in the mind by the mind and from the mind.

Thus, as Descartes held, there are three kinds of ideas, adventitious, fictitious, and innate, which are distinguished by their differing sources as well as the way in which they are inbred in the mind. Adventitious ideas proceed from the senses, fictitious ideas proceed from the imagination and the intellect, and innate ideas proceed from thought itself, which acts as their ground or original. Nonetheless, all ideas, regardless of their source or origin, depend on the mind in some essential way for their form. But this gives rise to the problem of explaining how ideas can be said to represent, if they in no way resemble their objects. (Watson, 1966, chapter 6) This problem is especially acute for Cartesians who held that there is a modal difference between what is found at the level of sensory perception and intellection, such that impressions cannot contain any of the properties found at the level of ideas. What arrives at our faculty of thinking from the senses is not ideas such as we form them in our thought, as the scholastic empiricists held, but rather only various particular motions emitted by external objects. (1694, book I, part ix, p. 328)

Le Grand’s solution to the problem of how ideas represent their objects absent similitude was to employ the notion of substitution or ‘supplying a stead’—wherein the cause (the object) contains all the properties found in the effect (the idea) not actually but in virtue of its ability to supply the substitute properties or proxies. According to Le Grand, “[the] relation of substitution is that which intervenes betwixt the sign, and that which is signified by it.” (1694, book I, part I, p. 17) Such a relation, “…is nothing else but a mode of our understanding, comparing one thing with others, because of some properties or acts that are found in them.” (Ibid., p. 17). By virtue of a kind of causal concomitance of the signed-signified pairs there arises a signifying relation. Descartes himself never develops the notion of representation in terms of substitution, although he came close to suggesting it in the French version of the Third Meditation, in which he claimed that such things as extension, shape, position and movement may be contained in him eminently, “…and as it were the garments under which corporeal substance appears to us.” (1985–91, II, fn.1, p. 31). One could conceivably interpret this to mean that the garments of corporeal substance, namely extension, shape, position and movement are the garments supplied by the mind as the forms or the conceptions under which the mind grasps material things. Although the mind itself is not extended, shaped, locally positioned or moved, it dresses material substance in these properties in order to perceive particular material things. But there is no suggestion in Descartes regarding how the dressing is related to the material object grasped. Le Grand’s notion of substitution provided an explication of this relation, and constitutes his contribution to the Cartesian dialectic on ideas.

Le Grand was one of the few Cartesians to see the connection Descartes drew between the doctrine of the creation of essences and eternal truths (Creation Doctrine) and establishing the proper foundation of human knowledge and certainty. The thesis is that God is the efficient cause of all things equally in their existence and essence, including the truths we call eternal. Given the immutability and indivisibility of God’s will, once God chose to create the world in its being and essence, it could not be changed. In 1630, Descartes introduced the Creation Doctrine in his correspondence with Mersenne to explain the sense in which the truths of mathematics, such as 2+2=4, are necessarily true but could have been otherwise. According to Descartes, such truths are created, “The mathematical truths which you call eternal have been laid down by God and depend on him entirely no less than the rest of his creatures.” (1985–91, III, p. 23) The sense in which God could have made a universe in which 2+2 did not equal 4, or not willed a world at all, is beyond our grasp. What we know is that once the eternal truths are established in their being according to God’s will, they become necessary and knowable to the human intellect, “In general we can assert that God can do everything that is within our grasp but not that he cannot do what is beyond our grasp. It would be rash to think that our imagination reaches as far as his power.” (1985–91, III, p. 23)

Although Descartes promised to expand on this idea in his physics, and pleads with Mersenne to test the idea out on others (without mentioning his name), he seems instead to have abandoned it or decided not to publish on it further. (Ibid., p. 23) Le Grand was among a minority of Descartes’s successors to take up a defense of the Creation Doctrine. Le Grand draws on Descartes’s analogy of God laying down the eternal truths in the manner that a king lays down the laws of his kingdom: “The case of God and a king are very different. A king can change his laws because his will is changeable, but God’s will is unchangeable; for it is his perfection that he acts in a most constant and invariable manner ... Wherefore tho’ I cannot comprehend how it should not be true, that one and five are six; yet I understand clearly enough that it is impossible there should be anything in the whole universe of things which does not depend on him.” (1694, book I, part ii, p. 63) The main worry that critics such as Malebranche had of this doctrine was that it would remove any necessary foundation for the propositions of science and theology, making them contingent and uncertain. Le Grand’s answer is that whereas the creation of true and immutable natures was the work of God’s free will (not dictated according to his Wisdom, as Malebranche and other critics held), once created, they are necessary. In order to tie this necessity to the immutability of God’s will without limiting God in any way, Le Grand drew on a Scholastic distinction between antecedent and consequent necessity. He argued that true and immutable natures, such as mathematical truths, only possessed a consequent necessity. God did not will that 5+1=6 because he saw it could not be otherwise, but in virtue of his free will, 5+1 [necessarily] = 6; therefore it could not be otherwise. As Descartes put this same point, “And even if God has willed that some truths should be necessary, this does not mean that he willed them necessarily; for it is one thing to will that they be necessary, and quite another to will this necessarily, or to be necessitated to will it.” (1985–91, III, p. 235). For nothing outside of God, not even the eternal truths or immutable essences, necessitate that God act in one way or another, but rather, they are themselves eternal and immutable in virtue of the fact that God, whose existence is necessary and immutable, willed them in their essence and existence. Eternal truths and immutable essences are necessary only in that they presuppose and are consequent to the act of God who caused them. (Easton, 2009)

Echoing Descartes in part VI of the Discourse on Method, Le Grand held that God implanted certain simple, true, and immutable ideas in our minds so that we could have a science of nature. God also created nature with powers so ample and vast that observation becomes more and more necessary to advance our knowledge. Like Descartes, while Le Grand retains the essential role of reason in knowing immutable essences, laws, and truths it is tempered by the realization that the effects in nature are so numerous that observation is needed to connect our understanding to them. This dependence means that truths of natural philosophy must be sought after in the effects of nature, and not in something independent of those effects. In other words, our search for the truths of nature is in the specific operations of things, and even though our understanding of these truths is importantly independent of these specific operations, our discovery of them is not. (see also, Hatfield, 2013)

4. Ethics

Le Grand’s early ethical and political writings are not Cartesian. In Le Sage des Stoïques, ou l’Homme sans Passions, Selon les Sentiments de Sénèque (1662), later translated and published as Man Without Passions (1675), he expounds the Stoical doctrines of Seneca, for which the goal of the moral person is to expunge the passions. He later rejected this view of the passions and argued the Cartesian view that the passions ought to be trained (not expunged) in the moral life. Le Grand also wrote a curious political treatise, Scydromedia (1669), which is a semi-fictional, utopian work describing his vision of the ideal state.

There is nothing innovative in Le Grand’s moral theory, yet his discussions are rich with references to ancient and contemporary theories. He borrows from the ancient Atomists, the Stoics, the Scholastics, and the “Moralists” of his time, and frames it, where possible, in Cartesian terms. Le Grand acknowledges that Descartes himself wrote little on ethics, but he argues that Descartes’s treatment of the soul and the passions provides a solid foundation for the treatment of moral matters. According to Le Grand, the object of ethics is right reason, its end is the perfection of man, and it is an active not a speculative science. An example of his reconciling project can be seen in Book I, Part X of his Entire Body of Philosophy (1694), where Le Grand attempted to reconcile the doctrines of Seneca and Epicurus on the role of pleasure in the virtuous life, by drawing on Descartes’s theory of the passions. (1694, p. 347) He argues that pleasure has a role to play in the moral life, since virtue depends on free will (as the Stoics held) and pleasure derives from the satisfaction of the mind in possessing the good (as Epicurus held). What Descartes’s theory provided was an explanation of how pleasure (a passion) could aid the will in choosing the right course of action, while maintaining the voluntary nature of the will and virtue.

In summary, Le Grand is worthy of study for his contribution to the reception and development of Cartesianism in the latter half of the seventeenth century. He expanded the application of Descartes’s natural philosophy to a variety of observations and experiments of his day, and advanced Descartes’s ideas regarding the mechanization of nature, the causal interaction and union of minds and bodies, the nature of representation and truth, and in the realm of morals, how Descartes’s theory of the passions provides an important account of virtue. No less important is the fact that he spent most of his life in England, where his contact with members of the Royal Society and the universities of Cambridge and Oxford had a lasting impact on the reception of Descartes’s ideas in England, Germany, and France.


Primary Texts

  • Clarke, Samuel, 1738. The Works, 4 vols. Edited by B. Hoadly, London.
  • Cudworth, Ralph, 1678. The True Intellectual System of the Universe, London.
  • Descartes, René, 1985–91. The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 3 vols. Translated by J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff, D. Murdoch, vol. 3 including A. Kenny, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [Citations by year, volume, page number: e.g., (1985–91, I, p. 95)]
  • Le Grand, Antoine, 1662. Le sage des Stoïques ou l’homme sans passions , selon les sentiments de Sénèque, The Hague; reprinted anonymously as Les caractères de l’homme sans passions, selon les sentiments de Sénèque, Paris (1663, 1682); Lyons (1665); translated into English G. Richard, Man without Passion: Or, the wise Stoick, according to the Sentiments of Seneca, London (1675).
  • –––, 1669. L’Epicure spirituel, ou l’empire de la volupté sur les vertus, Douai; Paris; translated into English by E. Cooke, The Divine Epicurus, or, the Empire of Pleasure over the Virtues, London (1676).
  • –––, 1669. Scydromedia seu sermo quem Alphonsus de la Vida habuit corram comite de Falmouth de monarchia liber primus, London; Nuremberg, (1680); translated into German under same title U. Greiff, Bern: Lang (1991).
  • –––, 1671. Philosophia veterum, e mente Renati Descartes more scholastico breviter digesta, London.
  • –––, 1672. Institutio philosophiae secundum Principia D. Renati Descartes: Novo methodo adornata & explicata, cumque indice locupletissimo actua, London (1675, 1678, 1680, 1683); Nuremberg (1679, 1683, 1695, 1711); Geneva, (1694).
  • –––, 1673. Historia naturae variis experimentis & ratiociniis elucidata, London (1680); Nuremberg, (1678, 1680, 1702).
  • –––, 1675. Dissertatio de carentia sensus et cognitionis in brutis, London; Lyons (1675); Nuremberg (1679).
  • –––, 1679. Apologia pro Renato Des-Cartes contra Samuelem Parkerum, S.T.P. archidiaconum cantuariensem, instituta & adornata, London (1682); Nuremberg (1681).
  • –––, 1682. Jacobi Rohaulti tractatus physicus gallice emissus et recens latinitate donatus per Th. Bonetum D.M. Cum animadversionibus Antonii Le Grand, London; Amsterdam (1691).
  • –––, 1685. Historia sacra a mundi exordio ad Constatini Magni imperium deducta, London; Herborn (1686)
  • –––, 1694. An Entire Body of Philosophy, According to the Principles of the Famous Renate des Cartes, in Three Books, I The Institution; II The History of Nature; III Dissertation on Brutes, trans. from the Latin into English R. Blome, London: Roycroft; reprinted with introduction R.A. Watson, New York: Johnson Reprint Corp. (1972); reprinted by Thoemmes Continuum Press, 2 volumes, 2003.
  • –––, 1698. Censura Justissima Responsi, ut habetur, terribilis; cui titulus est idea cartesiana ad lydium veritatis lapidem, London.
  • –––, 1698. Dissertatio de ratione cognoscendi et appendix de mutatione formali, contra J.S. [John Sergeant] methodum sciendi, London.
  • More, Henry, 1671. Enchiridion Metaphysicum, London.
  • Newton, Isaac, 1687. Principia, London.
  • Rohault, Jacques, 1671. Traité de physique, Paris.
  • Sergeant, John, 1698. Non ultra: or a letter to a learned Cartesian; settling the rule of truth, and first principles, upon their deepest grounds, London.
  • Smith, John, 1660. Select Discourses, London.
  • Wood, Anthony, 1691. Athenae Oxonienses, Volume 2, London.

Selected Studies and Critical Discussions

  • Adriaenssen, Hans Thomas, 2018. “Antoine Le Grand on the Identity over Time of the Human Body.” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, vol. 26, no. 6, Dec. 2018: pp. 1084–1109.
  • Armogathe, Jean Robert, 2003. “The roman censure of the Institutio Philosophaie of Antoine Le Grand (1629–99) according to unpublished documents from the archives of the Holy Office,” in Cartesian views: papers presented to Richard A. Watson, T. M. Lennon (ed.), Boston: Brill, pp. 193–203.
  • Bouillier, Francisque, 1854. Histoire de la philosophie cartésienne, 2 volumes, Paris.
  • Clatterbaugh, Kenneth C., 1999. The causation debate in modern philosophy, 1637–1739, New York: Routledge.
  • Dobre, Mihnea, Ovidiu Babeș, Ioana Bujor, and Grigore Vida, 2021. “General Introduction: Rohault’s Cartesianism,” Society and Politics 15(1): 29. [Dobre et al. 2021 available online]
  • Easton, Patricia, 2009. “What is at stake in the cartesian debates on the eternal truths?”, Philosophy Compass, 4: 348–362. doi:10.1111/j.1747-9991.2009.00202.x
  • Hatfield Gary, 2013. “The Cartesian Psychology of Antoine Le Grand,” in M. Dobre and T. Nyden (eds), Cartesian Empiricisms (Studies in History and Philosophy of Science: Volume 31), Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 251–274.
  • Mautner, Thomas, 2000. “From Virtue to Morality: Antoine Le Grand (1629–1699) and the New Moral Philosophy,” Jahrbuch-fuer-Recht-und-Ethik, 8: 209–232.
  • Rosenfield, Leonora Cohen, 1968. From beast-machine to man-machine; animal soul in French letters from Descartes to La Mettrie, new and enlarged edition, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Ryan, John K., 1935. “Anthony Legrand, 1629–99: Franciscan and Cartesian,” The New Scholasticism, 9: 226–250.
  • –––, 1936. “Scydromedia: Anthony Legrand’s Ideal Commonwealth,” The New Scholasticism, 10: 39–55.
  • Watson, Richard A., 1966. The Downfall of Cartesianism 1673–1712, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.

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