Leibniz’s Exoteric Philosophy

First published Tue Jun 18, 2013; substantive revision Sun Jul 3, 2022

It is no secret that G. W. Leibniz is a difficult philosopher to study. One central reason for this is that the content of his philosophy is extremely challenging. It involves a range of subtle distinctions and paradoxical theses, such as the denial of causal interaction between substances and the thesis that each substance expresses every other substance in the universe. Just as significant, however, is the fact that his philosophical corpus is immense, comprising a bewildering array of letters, notes, essays, and larger manuscripts. These writings span a period of over fifty years. Only a small number of his essays and one philosophical book, the Essais de théodicée, were published during his lifetime. None of his published or unpublished works is considered a magnum opus on the order of Spinoza’s Ethics or Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason. The complexity of Leibniz’s literary remains forces scholars of his thought to engage difficult questions: how much continuity is there between Leibniz’s treatments of particular topics at different times in his career? On what issues does he attain considered views? Should certain texts be privileged over others in attempting to discern Leibniz’s views? Is Leibniz a deeply systematic philosopher who addresses a wide range of problems from the perspective of a unified theory, or does he apply his penetrating mind to a series of philosophical problems with little concern for the systematic coherence of his results?

One important clue for approaching the labyrinth of Leibniz’s texts is a distinction that he draws between esoteric (acroamaticus/acroamatique) and exoteric (exotericus/exoterique) presentations of his philosophy. Roughly speaking an esoteric presentation is one that is fully rigorous while an exoteric or “popular” presentation is less rigorous but easier to understand, which is more appropriate for a general audience. Leibniz distinguishes between these two modes of presentation early in his career and explicitly classifies many of his (later) published works such as the Essais de théodicée as exoteric. This distinction is clearly relevant to the questions raised in the previous paragraph. If it is possible to distinguish between esoteric and exoteric texts, then the most precise statements of Leibniz’s considered views are likely to be found in the esoteric texts. Similarly, if Leibniz’s treatments of an issue in different works seem to be in tension with one another, one potential explanation of the discrepancy is that one treatment is esoteric and the other is exoteric.

In order to plausibly use Leibniz’s distinction between the esoteric and the exoteric as an interpretive tool one must have a more detailed account of how he understands the distinction. This itself is not an easy matter, however, as Leibniz’s remarks on the distinction also require interpretation. One challenge for understanding his views on this issue is that some of his most explicit remarks on it are written quite early in his career. Although it is clear that he does not abandon the distinction later in his career one should not uncritically assume that his views on the distinction do not change over time. A second challenge is that Leibniz typically does not identify his exoteric texts as exoteric within those texts. For example, if you were to focus exclusively on what Leibniz writes in the Système nouveau de la nature et de la communication des substances, aussi bien que de l’union qu’il y a entre l’âme et le corps (New system of the nature and communication of substances, and of the union of the soul and body)—the first public presentation of his philosophy—you would have no idea that it is a popular presentation of is views. It is only in letters to certain of his correspondents that Leibniz identifies this text as exoteric. And when he does identify a text as exoteric he often provides few details about exactly what this is supposed to involve. A third challenge for understanding Leibniz’s views is that he does not use the terms “esoteric” and “exoteric” univocally. Sometimes these words are used to distinguish different kinds of content that a philosophy might have; other times they signify different modes of presenting one’s philosophy. It will be crucial to disambiguate these terms as we proceed (see Melzer 2014 for an insightful account of different kinds of esoteric and exoteric writing that have been utilized throughout the history of philosophy).

The notion of an exoteric Leibnizian philosophy is often associated with Bertrand Russell’s influential interpretation of Leibniz. Russell infamously claimed that the difference between Leibniz’s public and private writings is so significant that they effectively comprise two distinct philosophies: a theologically imbued fantasy designed to please royalty, and his true philosophy, derived from austere logical principles, that he revealed to a select few of his correspondents (Russell 1945). In recent decades Russell’s view has been rejected; nearly everyone agrees that there is much more continuity between Leibniz’s public and private works than Russell was willing to admit (see Curley 1972 for a critique of Russell’s view). And as we will see, the distinction between the esoteric and the exoteric does not involve a simple classification of his works depending on whether or not they were published. In order to attain a more accurate understanding of Leibniz’s distinction between the esoteric and the exoteric we must turn to his views on the ideal form that metaphysics should take.

1. The Ideal Form of Metaphysics

Leibniz conceived of metaphysics as an a priori demonstrative science. In its ideal form metaphysics would be presented in a manner analogous to Euclid’s Elements, where propositions are rigorously demonstrated on the basis of definitions and axioms. The point of departure for this conception of metaphysics is Leibniz’s theory of truth. Leibniz thought that truth consisted in conceptual containment: a proposition is true just in case the concept of the predicate is contained in the concept of the subject. This implies that all metaphysical truths are conceptual truths. Leibniz thought that a concept could be defined by analyzing it into simpler component concepts. A rigorous demonstration, for Leibniz, consists in a “chain of definitions” (catena definitionum) where one moves from premises to a conclusion via the substitution of definitionally equivalent terms (A II.i.398; L 198). In order for such demonstrations to attain the degree of certainty found in geometry they would need to be set forth in a purely formal system, which Leibniz termed his “universal characteristic” (characteristica universalis). The universal characteristic would allow one to express in a purely formal manner the composition of any concept on the basis of a set of primitive concepts. This system of representation, in conjunction with a logical calculus for expressing identity and inclusion relations among concepts, would enable one to set forth a strictly demonstrative metaphysics (see Rutherford 1996 for a detailed discussion of Leibniz’s conception of a demonstrative metaphysics).

Leibniz’s conception of an ideal metaphysics was incredibly ambitious. He made impressive progress on the project during his career, though he fell well short of attaining his lofty ideal. Some of Leibniz’s very early texts contain stretches of argument that are not carefully divided into axioms, definitions, propositions, and demonstrations, but which could be reconstructed to fit that model. Consider, for example, Leibniz’s unpublished 1672–3 Confessio Philosophi (The Confession of a Philosopher). Towards the beginning of this work, after providing definitions of “God”, “justice”, “love”, and “harmony”, he demonstrates that “happiness consists in the most harmonious state of mind” (A VI.iii.117; CP 31). Leibniz then argues (in the voice of The Philosopher):

If all happiness is harmonious (as demonstrated), and all harmony is known by God (by the definition of God), and all experience of harmony is a delight (by the definition of delight), it follows that all happiness is pleasing to God. Therefore (by the definition of love assumed previously) God loves everyone, and, accordingly (by the definition of the just) God is just. (A VI.iii.117; CP 31)

Leibniz’s demonstration is slightly informal here (as one might expect in a dialogue), but it could easily be reconstructed in deductive form. In 1675–6 Leibniz wrote a number of unpublished papers and notes on metaphysical topics (most of the papers are included in Parkinson’s De Summa Rerum: Metaphysical Papers, 1675–1676). These texts include definitions of key metaphysical concepts and many informal demonstrations of metaphysical propositions. In the late 1670s Leibniz completed several short drafts of works that were divided into axioms, definitions, and propositions, although the subject matter of those works was not strictly metaphysical (see De Obligatione Credendi A VI.iv.c.2149–2155 and Animadversiones in schedam ex Batavis Missam A VI.iv.c.2204–2210). In 1679 Leibniz quickly composed a work that was closer to the ideal of a demonstrative science of metaphysics than anything he had written to date (De Affectibus AVI.iv.b.1410–1441). It contained a long list of definitions of key terms along with some demonstrations of metaphysical principles and theses. Leibniz’s project continued in the 1680s in a series of extensive definitional studies of key concepts (see, e.g., De Notionibus Omnia Quae Cogitamus Continentibus A.VI.iv.a.398–405, Definitiones Notionum Metaphysicarum atque Logicarum A.VI.iv.a.624–630, and Tabula Notionum Praeparanda A.VI.iv.a.630–635). By 1690 Leibniz had developed a logical calculus for expressing identity and inclusion relations among concepts. Around this time, however, Leibniz began to doubt whether it was possible to discover absolutely primitive concepts. He also did not succeed in developing his purely formal system of representation, the universal characteristic. Without primitive concepts or the universal characteristic it was not possible for Leibniz to attain his ideal of a fully demonstrative metaphysics. It is plausible to think that Leibniz could nevertheless have completed a work that was an approximation of the ideal, written in Latin and using non-primitive concepts. Leibniz insisted throughout his later years that he could complete a work along these lines. In 1710, for example, he explains to correspondent Charles Hugony that in his (Leibniz’s) recently published Essais de théodicée he set forth one part of his views “in an informal manner” and that he is “thinking of [writing] a Latin work in which I will try to unfold my entire system” (G 3:680). And in 1715 Leibniz writes to Biber:

if God will grant me more free time, I will attempt by means of well-formed demonstrations to impart to a good portion of my views the certainty of Euclid’s Elements. (LBr 64)

But Leibniz never did unfold his entire system, even in this less ambitious form.

Leibniz’s account of the ideal form of metaphysics provides the basis for one of the ways that he distinguishes between the esoteric and the exoteric. In one of his earliest philosophical works, a very opinionated preface to an edition of a book by Marius Nizolius, Leibniz distinguishes between esoteric and exoteric modes of philosophizing. In this text he claims that the notion of demonstration provides the line of demarcation between the esoteric and exoteric modes. In the former “all things are demonstrated” while in the latter less rigorous forms of argumentation are utilized (e.g., supporting a proposition by means of an analogical argument). Works written in the exoteric mode, though useful in various respects, are “not most rigorous, not most exact” (A VI.ii.416). In this and other texts Leibniz equates the esoteric mode of philosophizing with the geometrical model of demonstration, as briefly described above.

2. Esoteric Form and Esoteric Content

Leibniz advocated the geometrical model of demonstration as the ideal form for metaphysics throughout his career. He claimed later in his career that he had all the materials at hand to compose a work that was a close approximation of the ideal. Yet such a work he did not compose. Why did Leibniz not make more progress on this task, which would seem to be of such great importance? Leibniz often mentioned his lack of free time as the reason for not completing an esoteric treatise. But this seems to provide an incomplete explanation of the situation. Though his extra-philosophical duties were numerous and burdensome, he made the time to write quite a lot on metaphysical subjects. If he thought that the geometrical model of demonstration was indeed the ideal form for metaphysics, one cannot help but wonder why he did not find the time to begin composing such a work.

It is likely that there were several additional factors that led Leibniz to compose exoteric rather than esoteric works. Consider the following remarks on the distinction between exoteric and esoteric modes of exposition in his 1704 Nouveaux Essais sur l’entendement humain (an unpublished critical examination of Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding written in dialogue form). The remarks occur in the context of a discussion of the precision (or lack thereof) in natural language:

The ancients distinguished the ‘exoteric’ [exoterique] or popular mode of exposition [maniere d’ecrire] from the ‘esoteric’ [acroamatique] one which is suitable for those who are seriously concerned to discover the truth; and that distinction is relevant here. If anyone wants to write like a mathematician in metaphysics or moral philosophy there is nothing to prevent him from rigorously doing so; some have announced that they would do this, and have promised us mathematical demonstrations outside mathematics, but it is extremely seldom that anyone has succeeded. I believe that people are repelled by the amount of trouble they would have to take for a tiny number of readers: like the question in Persius, ‘Who will read this?’, with its answer ‘Maybe a couple of people, maybe no one’. Yet I think that if anyone did go about it in the right way, he would have no reason to regret his labour. I have been tempted to try it myself. (NE: 260–261)

In this intriguing text Leibniz (through the voice of Theophilus) notes that few people have tried to write in the esoteric mode, and even fewer (if any) have succeeded in the endeavor. He also suggests several reasons that authors avoid esoteric expositions. Esoteric texts are both difficult to compose and unlikely to attract readers, presumably because of their intimidating formal apparatus. And what is the point of writing a text that no one is going to read? This point is also emphasized by Leibniz in a 1705 letter to Burnett:

I never write anything in philosophy that I do not treat by definitions and axioms, though I do not always give it that mathematical air, which puts people off, for one must speak in a familiar manner to be read by ordinary people. (G 3:302)

Despite these significant drawbacks to writing in the esoteric mode, Leibniz insists that if someone pursued this strategy “in the right way” it would be a worthwhile project. In the New Essays Leibniz does not explain what doing this “in the right way” would involve. He does, however, provide some important additional remarks on esoteric philosophy earlier in the text. In the Preface he points out some key differences between his philosophy and the philosophy of Locke:

…although the author of the Essay says hundreds of fine things which I applaud, our systems are very different. His is closer to Aristotle and mine to Plato, although each of us parts company at many points from the teachings of both of these ancient writers. He is more popular [populaire] whereas I am sometimes forced to be a little more esoteric [acroamatique] and abstract—which is no advantage for me, particularly when writing in a living language. (Preface to the New Essays, NE: 48)

In these remarks Leibniz is using the term “esoteric” in a subtly different way than he is in the earlier quote from the New Essays. Whereas in the first text “esoteric” designated a mode of presenting one’s philosophy, in this text it concerns the content of one’s philosophy. Here he is drawing attention to the fact that his philosophy is less “popular” than Locke’s. Locke’s philosophy is popular in the sense that much of his philosophy accords with the deliverances of the senses and so-called “common sense”. Leibniz’s philosophy, in contrast, is often very abstract and far removed from ordinary opinions. Leibniz elaborates on this point in a 1702 letter to Sophie Charlotte where he distinguishes between things that can be known through the senses (the “sensible”) and things that are the “object of the understanding alone” (the “intelligible”). Leibniz claims that the existence of “intelligible things”, particularly the “mind or or soul”, is more certain than the existence of things that can be sensed. However, many people fail to recognize this because “they take sensible things for the only true things” (G 6:502–3; AG 188–9). This overreliance on the senses makes it difficult for people to understand Leibniz’s metaphysics, which involves a number of things that simply cannot be known through the senses. This puts Leibniz at a significant disadvantage when it comes to trying to communicate his philosophy to the general public. Readers are far more likely to find favor with Locke’s philosophy given that it coheres much better with their current beliefs (see Nelson 2005 for more on this general theme).

In some of his letters Leibniz makes the point about how difficult it is for most people to understand his philosophy in even stronger terms. Consider, for example, what he writes to Pierre Bayle in 1702:

…I should not be in too much of a hurry to publish what I have written, the point of which was only to provide some clarification for you, sir, and for some other people, so as to receive the same in return. For I write not so much to make an impression as to investigate the truth, which it is often useless, and even harmful, to publish—on account of the uninitiated [des profanes], who are incapable of appreciating it, and quite capable of taking it the wrong way. (G 3:66–7; WF 127)

These are striking words. Read in isolation from his other remarks on the exoteric/esoteric distinction, one might take this text to suggest that Leibniz had two distinct philosophies—a false philosophy suitable for presentation to the public, and his true philosophy, which he only revealed to a few trusted correspondents. But Leibniz’s claim is not as radical as it might initially seem. While it is true that the esoteric character of the content of his metaphysics made it susceptible to being seriously misunderstood, his solution was not to permanently hide his views from everyone who was likely to misunderstand them. His point, as additional texts will make clear, is that he thinks it is often useless and harmful to straightforwardly present the content of his metaphysics to the public (and even to trusted correspondents). For example, in a 1710 letter to Charles Hugony, he claims that some of his views

cannot be presented in a straightforward manner [ne peut donner cruement], since people are likely to misunderstand them … in relation to the senses. (G 3:680)

This suggests that although Leibniz thinks it is unwise to present some of his views straightforwardly, there is a way to present them that is not straightforward. We need to now consider what this involves.

3. The Primary Function of Exoteric Texts

Leibniz faced what might seem like an intractable problem. He thought that the ideal form for metaphysics was the esoteric mode of presentation. However, he knew that few people were inclined to read texts presented in the esoteric mode due to their daunting formal structure. Even worse, Leibniz thought that the content of his philosophy was such that most people were likely to misunderstand it in fundamental ways (see Whipple 2015a for a discussion of this problem). How then would it be possible for him to communicate his views to people? His letter to Hugony, cited earlier, suggested that it would involve a non-straightforward presentation of his views. In that text he did not elaborate on what non-straightforward presentation involved, but he did provide more concrete suggestions in some unpublished remarks appended to metaphysical notes written in 1676. The quotation is divided into several parts for ease of reference:

[a] Metaphysics should be written with accurate definitions and demonstrations, [b] but nothing should be demonstrated in it that conflicts too much with received opinions. For thus this metaphysics will be able to be received. [c] If it is once approved, then afterwards, if any examine it more profoundly, they will draw the necessary consequences themselves. [d] Besides this, one can, as a separate undertaking, show these people later the way of reasoning about these things. [e] In this metaphysics, it will be useful for there to be added here and there the authoritative utterances of great men, who have reasoned in a similar way; especially when these utterances contain something that seems to have some possible relevance to the illustration of a view. (A VI.iii.573)

[a] is best read as a terse reference to the esoteric mode of presentation. Although this is the way that metaphysics should ideally be written, he thinks that it would be a mistake to publish anything that “conflicts too much with received opinions”. As we have already seen, this is because many people will regard it as absurd, summarily reject it, or misunderstand it entirely (possibly all three at the same time!). Leibniz suggests a strategy of selective omission, not to permanently hide the controversial features of his philosophy, but as part of a longer-term strategy of preparing his readers to understand his most esoteric doctrines. In some cases he thinks that sympathetic readers who study his texts “more profoundly” will be able to infer the esoteric conclusions themselves. In [d] he suggests a complementary strategy of supplementation. In subsequent works he can explicitly draw the conclusions that may have only been implicit in the initial text. Taken collectively Leibniz’s remarks in this passage suggest that the primary function of exoteric texts is pedagogical: they are designed to serve as intellectual stepping stones that enable his readers to gradually move from received opinions to esoteric doctrine.

A number of Leibniz’s remarks in later texts confirm that he conceives of exoteric texts as important preparatory works. Consider, for example, what he writes to Fontenelle in 1704:

The true metaphysics, or philosophy, if you will, does not appear to me any less important than geometry, especially if there is also a way of introducing into it demonstrations, which until now have been entirely excluded from it, along with the calculus that will be necessary in order to give them all the entry they need. However, it is necessary to prepare readers with exoteric writings. The journals have served me well until now. (FC 1:234)

Here Leibniz explicitly claims that his choice to present various features of his philosophy in journal articles should be understood as part of a broad exoteric strategy to prepare his readers to understand the “true metaphysics”. This helps shed light on some of Leibniz’s better-known remarks about the composition of his journal articles. Consider what Leibniz writes to correspondent Nicolas Remond in 1714:

In the Leipzig journal [Acta Eruditorum] I adapt myself to the language of the schools, in the others I adapt myself more to the style of Cartesians, and in this latest piece I try to express myself in a way that could be understood by those who are not yet very accustomed to the style of one or the other. (G 3:624)

Leibniz’s strategy of adapting himself to the language of the schools in some articles and to the language of the Cartesians in others is one of his core exoteric strategies. He thinks that using language that is familiar with his readers is a good way to make his views seem not too far removed from received opinions. This is not merely a feature of his published writings. Leibniz tailors his writings in a similar way in his private correspondences. For example, in his correspondence with Jesuit theologian Bartholomew Des Bosses he frequently employs scholastic terminology, and in his correspondence with (largely) Cartesian physicist Burcher De Volder he sometimes presents his views with a Cartesian slant. To use a more concrete example, early in the correspondence with De Volder, Leibniz appeals to the doctrine of continued divine creation, which he (Leibniz) regards as a central Cartesian tenet. Although he initially presents the doctrine in a way that makes it seem like this is a point of common doctrine between him and the Cartesians, it emerges later in the correspondence that Leibniz only affirms the doctrine in a qualified sense (for a detailed discussion of this issue see Whipple 2011). The general strategy here is to use language that is familiar to the reader or correspondent and to emphasize initial points of agreement. Fine-grained differences and esoteric implications are typically avoided at the initial stages of engagement.

One important general point that emerges from Leibniz’s remarks in the letter to Remond is that there was more than one set of “received opinions” that he needed to take into account. The received opinions of a Cartesian and the opinions of someone who was committed to a version of Aristotelian Scholasticism would be different in fundamental respects. In the letter cited above Leibniz speaks of another of his works, the Principes de la Nature et de la Grace, fondés en raison (Principles of Nature and Grace, Based on Reason), which targets yet another audience—those who are not accustomed to the style of the Cartesians or the scholastics. When it comes to exoteric philosophy, one size does not fit all. Different strategies are required for people with different backgrounds and views.

4. Eclecticism and Exoteric Philosophy

Leibniz is sometimes described as being an eclectic philosopher. There are different ways of understanding eclecticism, but the basic idea is that an eclectic philosopher is one who incorporates ideas from a wide range of sources. In certain places Leibniz characterizes himself as proceeding along these lines. He famously writes to Remond, for example, that:

I have tried to uncover and unite the truth buried and scattered under the opinions of all the philosophical sects, and I believe I have added something of my own that takes a few steps forward…most sects are right in a good part of what they affirm, but not so much in what they deny. (10 Jan 1714, G 3:606–7; L 654)

It is undeniable that Leibniz read from an extraordinary range of sources and that his thought was influenced by a number of these texts. Although the precise nature of these influences is a matter of scholarly controversy that cannot be engaged in this article, it is important to note that Leibniz’s exoteric strategies bear significantly on this general topic. Recall the final sentence in the long quotation from Leibniz’s 1676 notes on exoteric philosophy:

In this metaphysics, it will be useful for there to be added here and there the authoritative utterances of great men, who have reasoned in a similar way; especially when these utterances contain something that seems to have some possible relevance to the illustration of a view. (A VI.iii.573)

Appealing to similarities between his views and those of his predecessors is one of Leibniz’s strategies for presenting his philosophy in a way that makes it seem to be not too far from received opinions. We need to remain open to the possibility that Leibniz’s proclamations of continuity between his thought and the thought of his philosophical forebears often mask subtle or not so subtle differences between their respective views. Nuanced differences and radical implications may be left implicit or omitted entirely in his more exoteric works. One might put the point as follows. Leibniz is not merely finding ideas in other philosophers and incorporating them whole cloth into his philosophical system. In some cases, at least, Leibniz develops distinctive philosophical views and then seeks out similar ideas in his predecessors as a strategy for presenting his views to the public (see Schepers 2008 and Mercer 2001: 23–59 for more on this topic).

5. Selective Omission in Leibniz’s Système Nouveau

Leibniz first presented his philosophy to the public in an essay titled “Système nouveau de la nature et de la communication des substances, aussi bien que de l’union qu’il y a entre l’âme et le corps” (New system of the nature and communication of substances, and of the union of the soul and body). This essay was published in 1695 in the Journal des savants. If one were to read this essay in isolation from Leibniz’s other writings (as would have been the case with most of his readers) one would likely have no idea that it is an exoteric text. He prefaces the essay in the following way:

Finally, since some important persons have desired to see my opinions further clarified, I have risked publishing these meditations, even though they are not at all popular [populaires], nor can they be appreciated by all sorts of minds. I have decided upon this mainly to profit from the judgments of persons enlightened in these matters, since it would be too troublesome to seek out and call individually upon all those who would be disposed to give me instruction—which I shall always be glad to receive, provided that it contains the love of truth, rather than a passion for preconceived opinions. (G 4:477; AG 138)

Note that Leibniz claims that his meditations are “not at all popular” and that many people will not be able to appreciate them. These remarks, in conjunction with the comment on preconceived opinions, are designed to encourage the reader to seriously consider the views that he will be presenting despite the fact that they will be difficult to understand and will likely diverge—perhaps significantly—from the reader’s current beliefs. What Leibniz leaves unsaid, however, is that the Système nouveau is written according to the exoteric mode of presentation. First, the essay is clearly not written in accordance with the formal apparatus of definitions and demonstrations that is required in a strictly esoteric presentation. Second, and perhaps more significantly, Leibniz purposefully omits some of the most controversial features of his philosophical system in this essay.

In order to more fully appreciate the exoteric features of the Système nouveau it will be helpful to consider this text in relation to Leibniz’s earlier Discours de métaphysique (Discourse on Metaphysics). Leibniz wrote the Discours in 1686. Although it was not published during his lifetime, this text has become one of Leibniz’s most famous works. It is best known for presenting the complete concept theory of substance. This theory states, roughly, that each substance has an infinitely complex complete concept that specifies everything that will ever happen to that substance. It is contained in the complete concept of Judas, for example, that he betrays Jesus (along with everything else that can be truly predicated of Judas). Leibniz was well aware that his readers might think that the complete concept theory implies that all of a person’s actions are necessary, and thus that no person is free. In the main text of the Discours and in its section headings Leibniz attempts to show that Judas’ betrayal of Jesus, for example, is both contingent and a free action despite being foreseen in Judas’ complete concept for all eternity. Part of Leibniz’s strategy for showing this is his claim that Judas’ reasons for betraying Jesus “incline without necessitating”. Leibniz’s discussion of these thorny philosophical issues is exoteric, at least to a certain degree. Like the Système nouveau it was not written in strict accordance with the esoteric mode of presentation. And arguably, Leibniz’s use of language such as “inclination without necessitation” is carefully chosen with the aim of making his position seem closer to received views.

The section headings of the Discours were sent to Antoine Arnauld, a well-regarded theologian and philosopher of the day, to see how the text would be received. Leibniz could not have been encouraged by Arnauld’s response:

I find in these thoughts so many things which alarm me and which almost all men, if I am not mistaken, will find so shocking, that I do not see of what use a writing can be, which apparently all the world will reject. (G 2:15)

Arnauld singled out as an example the complete concept theory of substance, which he took to imply a “more than fatal necessity” that would undermine the very possibility of human freedom. Leibniz’s attempts to forestall this implication in the sections headings of the Discours had not worked as planned, at least for Arnauld. Leibniz attempted to assuage Arnauld’s concerns in subsequent letters with moderate success.

It is no surprise that Leibniz chose not to publish the Discours. It is also no surprise that the complete concept theory of substance does not make an appearance in the Système nouveau. This does not imply that Leibniz abandoned the complete concept theory; it might just be that he came to realize that it was not the most effective way of introducing readers to his philosophical system. Leibniz utilizes the exoteric strategy of selective omission, choosing to avoid a detailed discussion of necessity and contingency. Instead he introduces his theory of substance by appealing to the less controversial characteristics of unity and activity, and by trying to show how his theory could resolve the notorious problem of mind-body interaction. Letters to some of Leibniz’s correspondents confirm that he was “testing the waters” in the Système nouveau, and that he would reveal more of his system to the public if it was well received. He writes to Simon Foucher, for example:

If the public receives these meditations well, I will be encouraged to offer in addition some rather remarkable ideas I have for alleviating the difficulties concerning fate and contingency, and to clarify an essential distinction that can be drawn between material forms and intelligences or spirits. (1695, G 1:423)

Leibniz’s aim was not to permanently hide his views on contingency, fate, and freedom. By selectively omitting some of these more controversial features of his system he increased the likelihood that his readers would grasp the features of his system that were presented in the Système nouveau. Once they endorsed these parts of the system they would be more receptive to Leibniz’s views on more controversial topics. Such was Leibniz’s hope, in any case.

Leibniz returned to the topics of fate, necessity, and contingency in the one philosophical book that he published during his lifetime, the Essais de théodicée of 1710. It has been suggested in the secondary literature that Leibniz’s treatment of necessity and contingency in this text is exoteric to a significant degree (Adams 1994:52). For example, Leibniz frequently uses terms such as “inclination without necessitating”, “moral necessity”, and “hypothetical necessity” without providing strict definitions of them. Some of Leibniz’s predecessors understood these terms in ways that implied a non-deterministic view of human action. According to most interpretations of Leibniz’s considered views on these issues (based on a number of texts other than the Essais de théodicée), he was committed to a strict determinism (but not necessitarianism) about human actions. However, by omitting definitions of terms like “moral necessity” in the Essais de théodicée Leibniz might have allowed readers that were committed to non-deterministic accounts of “moral necessity” to assume that he was using this concept in a way that was less deterministic than his considered view allowed. This is in keeping with Leibniz’s stated strategy of not presenting anything to the public that is too far removed from received opinions. One way of not presenting something to the public that is far removed from received opinions is to selectively omit it (his strategy in the Système nouveau). Another strategy is to present a view that is far removed from received opinions in a way that makes it seem less removed than it actually is. If Leibniz is utilizing this latter strategy in the discussions of necessity and contingency in the Essais de théodicée, it does not imply that he is trying to permanently mislead his readers. As we have seen, he has several general strategies for helping his reader progress to a more rigorous understanding of his views. One of the strategies is to provide subtle hints such that a “more profound” examination of the text would yield a deeper understanding. By omitting clear definitions of terms such as “moral necessity”, however, it is not clear whether there is enough material in the Essais de théodicée for even a discerning reader to grasp Leibniz’s views on necessity and contingency. But Leibniz did not claim that such inferences could always be made on the basis of an exoteric text alone. In a number of cases his exoteric treatments need to be supplemented by a more rigorous work. And we must keep in mind that Leibniz clearly did conceive of the Essais de théodicée in precisely this way (see Antognazza 2009: 481–2). He writes to Charles Hugony shortly after its publication:

My essays on the goodness of God, the freedom of man, and the origin of evil have been printed in Holland, but I did not want to put my name on them. They are woven together from what I said and wrote at various times to the Queen of Prussia, who enjoyed reading M. Bayle and in whose company the difficulties that he raises on these matters were often discussed. I try to explain one part of my views in a rather informal manner [un peu familierement]. As you know, some of my views cannot be presented in a straightforward manner [ne peut donner cruement], since people are liable to misunderstand them, not in relation to religion, which is strongly supported, but in relation to the senses. I am therefore thinking of [writing] a Latin work in which I will try to unfold my entire system. (6 November 1710, G 3:680)

Leibniz’s remarks in this passage cohere well with the other remarks on exoteric philosophy that we have considered thus far. As in the case of the Système nouveau and Leibniz’s other journal articles, he conceives of the Essais de théodicée as a preparatory work that will help prepare his readers for a more systematic and rigorous presentation of his views.

6. Additional Exoteric Strategies

We have seen that the primary function of exoteric texts is to serve as intellectual stepping-stones that bridge the gulf between received opinions and esoteric truth. Leibniz utilizes a wide range of strategies in his exoteric works, some of which we have already discussed. Several additional strategies deserve mention as well. Let us begin by returning to Leibniz’s remarks on the distinction between esoteric and exoteric modes of presentation in the 1670 Preface to Nizolius:

There is…a vast difference between modes of philosophizing [philosophandi modus], for one is, if I may so speak, esoteric [acroamaticus], another is exoteric [exotericus]. The esoteric mode is that in which all things are demonstrated; the exoteric is that in which some things are said without demonstration, but they are still given confirmation by means of certain similarities and by dialectical arguments, or even by arguments based on definition, but not proposed except dialectically, [and] they are illustrated by examples and likenesses. Such a kind of speaking is indeed dogmatic or philosophical; however, it is not esoteric, that is, not most rigorous, not most exact. (A VI.ii.416)

One point that we take Leibniz to be making here is that in exoteric contexts propositions can be treated as hypotheses rather than providing rigorous demonstrations of them. He seems to think that in certain cases his readers will be less hostile to a novel thesis if it is presented as a hypothesis than if it is presented as a thesis that can be demonstrated from metaphysical principles. Although propositions that are presented hypothetically are not demonstrated they can be motivated and illustrated by examples, analogies, metaphors, and stories (as he says later on). He does not, however, claim that an esoteric work cannot contain analogies, metaphors, and the like. It can include these things, which “give a pleasing respite to a weary soul”, so long as they are carefully distinguished from the rigorous demonstrations that form the core of the work. Leibniz notes that this difference is also observed in mathematics where demonstrations, which are rigorous and exact, are carefully distinguished from scholia in which reasoning can be treated in a more familiar manner.

It is striking to look at a text like the Monadologie through the lens of Leibniz’s remarks about the distinction between esoteric and exoteric modes of presentation in the Preface to Nizolius (and the other texts that we have considered thus far). The text is replete with analogies, metaphors, and other forms of argumentation that fall well short of rigorous demonstrations. On the assumption that Leibniz remains committed to his early account of the distinction between the esoteric and the exoteric, it follows that even the Monadologie, which has traditionally been taken to be one of the definitive statements of Leibniz’s mature metaphysics, contains numerous exoteric features. As in the case of the Système nouveau, Leibniz does not explicitly flag the exoteric features of this work as exoteric. It is thus easy to mistake exoteric illustration for esoteric demonstration.

Before considering a few particular examples of exoteric strategies in the Monadologie (and other texts), it is worth reiterating Leibniz’s explanation of why his philosophy was easy to misunderstand. In the letter to Hugony quoted earlier Leibniz said that he needed to present his philosophy in an informal manner because it was likely to be misunderstood in relation to the senses. The tendency people have to rely on a sensory-based theory of knowledge is one of the primary stumbling blocks that prevent them from understanding his philosophical system. Many of Leibniz’s core concepts and principles can only be adequately grasped through the intellect, not through the senses or the imagination (see, for example, Leibniz’s remarks on force in De Ipsa Natura (G 4:508; AG 159)). One of Leibniz’s main exoteric strategies for dealing with this situation is to utilize sensible analogies, imaginative metaphors, anecdotes, and stories to introduce and motivate his abstract concepts, principles, and theses. Such metaphors and analogies enable his readers to attain an introductory understanding of the thesis or principle in question. Let us consider a few examples.

In explaining the thesis that there is no inter-substantial causation between finite substances in the Monadologie, Leibniz famously says: “monads have no windows through which something can enter or leave” (G 6:607; AG 214). This metaphor of being “windowless” helps the reader attain some understanding of Leibniz’s thesis, but it will be an imperfect understanding to the extent that it involves conceiving of monads as being extended.

Leibniz frequently uses imagistic metaphors to describe God’s sustenance of finite substances. Late in the Monadologie, for example, he writes:

all created or derivative monads are generated, so to speak, by continual fulgurations of the divinity from moment to moment. (G 6:614; AG 219)

And in the Essais de théodicée Leibniz uses the analogy of a heavy-laden boat travelling down a river to explain how God and finite substances can be said to co-operate in the production of particular effects in the ordinary course of nature (T 30–1). Both the metaphor and the analogy provide useful but imperfect devices for conceiving of things that cannot be sensed or imagined, strictly speaking. In reading Leibniz’s texts it is important to recognize that these are only metaphors and analogies—they are not meant to provide metaphysically rigorous descriptions of divine action (see Whipple 2015b).

Leibniz is committed to the principle of the identity of indiscernibles. This principle states, roughly, that it is impossible for there to be two numerically distinct substances that are qualitatively identical. In discussing this principle Leibniz sometimes supports it by appealing to an anecdote and other empirical considerations. In the anecdote he recalls discussing the principle with an “ingenious gentleman” who thought he could find two perfectly identical leaves. Princess Sophia, who was observing the conversation, “defied him to do it; he ran all over the garden a long time to look for some but it was to no purpose” (4th letter to Clarke, G 7:372; AG 327–8). Leibniz also defends the principle by appealing to the empirical results of the microscopists: objects that can seem qualitatively identical to the naked eye (two drops of water, or two drops of milk) are shown to be different when viewed under the microscope. Neither the anecdote nor the appeal to microscopes is intended to be anything like a rigorous proof of the principle of the identity of indiscernibles. A rigorous proof would show how the principle is derived a priori from other principles such as the principle of sufficient reason.

Few people are likely to interpret Leibniz’s anecdote concerning the principle of the identity of indiscernibles as a rigorous argument. Other cases are more easily misunderstood, however. Consider section 17 of the Monadologie:

…perception, and what depends on it is inexplicable in terms of mechanical reasons, that is, through shapes and motions. If we imagine that there is a machine whose structure makes it think, sense, and have perceptions, we could conceive it enlarged, keeping the same proportions, so that we could enter into it, as one enters into a mill. Assuming that, when inspecting its interior, we will only find parts that push and pull one another, and we will never find anything to explain a perception. And so, we should seek perception in the simple substance and not in the composite or in the machine. (G 6:609; AG 215)

It is easy to see why this is one of the better-known passages in the Monadologie. It contains a vivid imaginative thought experiment that is presented in support of an anti-materialist conclusion, namely that perception is inexplicable by means of shapes and motions. Given that thought experiments along these lines have been popular in contemporary philosophy of mind it might seem natural to suppose that Leibniz takes the thought experiment to provide a conclusive argument for his conclusion (it is sometimes referred to as “Leibniz’s Mill Argument”). Although this is not the place to discuss the issue at length, we can say that Leibniz’s remarks on the exoteric/esoteric distinction suggest that this might not be the case. It is plausible to think that the passage is designed to appeal to people who rely heavily on the imagination in doing philosophy; it could be a heuristic that will help motivate Leibniz’s thesis that perception is a property of simple substances and not of bodies, not a rigorous argument for this conclusion .

As the discussion of Leibniz’s Mill Argument suggests, it is not always easy to recognize when Leibniz is using an exoteric strategy. Another place where an exoteric strategy might be at work is in one of his most frequent “arguments” for the theory of simple substances. Consider the first section of the Principes de la Nature et de la Grace and the first three sections of the Monadologie:

“A substance is a being capable of action. It is simple or composite. A simple substance is that which has no parts. A composite substance is a collection [l’assemblage] of simple substances, or monads. Monas is a Greek word signifying unity, or what is one. Composites or bodies are multitudes; and simple substances—lives, souls, and minds—are unities. There must be simple substances everywhere, because, without simples, there would be no composites” (G 6:598; AG 207).
“1. The Monad, which we shall discuss here, is nothing but a simple substance that enters into composites—simple, that is, without parts. 2. And there must be simple substances, since there are composites; for the composite is nothing more than a collection, or aggregate [un amas, ou aggregatum], of simples. 3. But where there are no parts, neither extension, nor shape, nor divisibility is possible. These monads are the true atoms of nature and, in brief, the elements of things” (G 6:607; AG 213).

These texts contain important similarities and differences. In [1] he speaks of “composite substances”, which he also describes as “bodies”, while in [2] he speaks only of “composites”. Setting these differences aside for the moment, both texts contain a version of what has been termed the “grounding argument” for simple substances. Taken at face value, the texts suggests the following argument:

  1. composites exist
  2. a composite is a collection of simple substances
  3. therefore, simple substances exist

The reader seems invited in these passages (particularly in [1] and the first two sections of [2]) to conceive of the relation between simples and composites in a straightforward and intuitive way. If you have a dozen eggs, for example, you must have twelve individual eggs. Trying to argue that one could have a dozen eggs without having any individual eggs seems a hopeless task indeed. The argument also initially lends itself to a kind of physical atomism. If one thinks that tables and chairs, for example, are collections of indivisible physical atoms, then the argument is once again intuitive and difficult to deny. It becomes clear in the third section of text [2] that the relation between composite and simple cannot be quite this straightforward because the simples are not extended. Leibniz also makes this point in the section that follows [1] in the Principes de la Nature et de la Grace. But something like the intuitive picture remains. There are composites (bodies). Composites are collections of simples. If you put a bunch of simples together you get a composite. It is natural to think that the relation between simples and composites is understood on the model of part and whole. Simples are the parts that compose wholes (bodies).

Leibniz’s considered view is far more nuanced and less straightforward than texts [1] and [2] suggest. First, Leibniz does not think monads compose bodies in the manner of a part/whole relation. As he explains elsewhere, a part of a whole must be “of the same sort” as the whole (G 3:591). Monads and bodies are not of the same sort because only the latter are extended. This implies that the parts of an extended body must themselves be extended. Leibniz does assert on a number of occasions that bodies are aggregates of monads (or simple substances). However, he has a technical conception of an aggregate (see Lodge 2001). Suppose, for example, that there were a carton of twelve eggs sitting on a table. This alone would not imply that there was an aggregate of eggs, strictly speaking. For there to be an aggregate of eggs there would need to be at least two eggs that are perceived by a mind as being one thing (i.e., by perceiving them as a unity). So you cannot merely add together a bunch of eggs to get an aggregate of eggs. Similarly, you cannot merely add together a bunch of monads to get an aggregate of monads. You only have an aggregate if there is a mind that perceives the individuals as constituting one thing. The precise details of how one should understand Leibniz’s claim that bodies are aggregates of monads is a matter of scholarly controversy that we need not engage here. It will suffice to make the following points. The fact that bodies are aggregates of monads implies that bodies depend ontologically on monads but it does not imply that the relation between monads and bodies is a part/whole relation. As Leibniz explains to De Volder,

properly speaking, matter isn’t composed of constitutive unities, but results from them…substantial unities aren’t really parts, but the foundations of phenomena. (G 2:268; AG 179)

Once one becomes aware of Leibniz’s technical notion of an aggregate and of certain aspects of his conception of the part-whole relation, it becomes less clear exactly how the “grounding argument” in texts [1] and [2] is supposed to work. The intuitive appeal of the argument seems to depend, at least in part, on assuming a straightforward account of the relation between bodies and monads that Leibniz does not actually endorse. Leibniz seems to encourage this oversimplified account of the relation by omitting an explanation of his notion of an aggregate and of his account of the part-whole relation, among other things. This suggests that Leibniz is not trying to provide a fully rigorous argument for the existence of simple substances or a full explanation of the relation between monads and bodies in the Monadologie or the Principes de la Nature et de la Grace. What Leibniz is doing, one might think, is helping his readers attain a preliminary grasp of the relation between bodies and simple substances—to help them recognize that simple substances provide some kind of ontological grounding for the world of bodies. By introducing the view in the form of a simple and intuitive argument Leibniz helps to motivate the radical idea that an infinity of immaterial mind-like simple substances exist. The reader will thus be more likely to take the view seriously enough to consider the further elaborations of the theory that are presented in the remainder of the texts. This is not to deny that Leibniz might have had a fully demonstrative “grounding argument” for the existence of simple substances, or that he wanted the fully demonstrative argument to be consistent with the versions of the argument that are presented in texts [1] and [2]. The point is that Leibniz omits too many essential distinctions and details for even a very discerning reader to be able to reconstruct a demonstrative argument merely on the basis of texts [1] or [2]. On this reading significant portions of the Monadologie and the Principes de la Nature et de la Grace are exoteric in content and form. They serve to introduce some of the central features of Leibniz’s metaphysics while omitting many important details (more details are omitted in the latter text, as we will soon see).

Let us now consider one notable difference between the Monadologie and the Principes de la Nature et de la Grace. In the Principes de la Nature et de la Grace Leibniz speaks of “composite substances” while in the Monadologie he only speaks of “composites”. The difference is puzzling. In the Monadologie Leibniz is typically taken to be presenting a strictly monadological metaphysics according to which simple substances are the only finite substances. Bodies exist and animals exist, but they are not substances (roughly speaking he thinks that an animal is a dominant monad and its organic body, which is itself an aggregate of monads). A number of texts suggest that neither bodies nor animals are true unities, and only a true unity (an unum per se) can qualify as a substance, strictly speaking. Any reality that bodies and animals possess is in some way derivative of the reality of simple substances. The obvious puzzle is that Leibniz speaks of simple and composite substances in the Principes de la Nature et de la Grace. What are we to make of these seemingly divergent claims?

One way of accounting for divergent claims in different texts is to say that Leibniz had different views on the issue over time. There is no question that Leibniz’s views on substance changed to some degree over the course of his career (exactly how much they changed is one of the most contentious issues in Leibniz scholarship). However, the developmental strategy is more difficult (though not impossible) to deploy in the present case because both texts were written around the same time in 1714. Another possibility (suggested in the secondary literature) is that Leibniz is exploring different theories of substance at this point in his career. Though he is tempted by a strictly monadological metaphysics (as presented in the Monadologie), he is also considering an ontology that countenances the existence of simple substances and corporeal substances (where corporeal substances are “animals” as described in the previous paragraph). Leibniz is laying out this latter theory in The Principes de la Nature et de la Grace (see Hartz 2007). There are some prima facie reasons for resisting an interpretation along these lines (though it cannot be conclusively ruled out). First, Leibniz does not describe himself as a “theory pluralist” with respect to substance. As we have seen, Leibniz consistently refers to his philosophy as a (single) system. This is one of the things that make it amenable to the geometric model of demonstration. When Leibniz addresses the fact that he has not unfolded his entire system in a single work, he emphasizes that this is not because he has not thought the system all the way through. In one of his less modest moments he writes to Burnett, for example:

I never write anything in philosophy that I do not treat by definitions and axioms, though I do not always give it that mathematical air, which puts people off, for one must speak in a familiar manner [familierement] to be read by ordinary people…I would even dare to say that I have established sufficiently in all matters of thought what is most fundamental to them, and that I no longer have any need to reason about them. Thus what you wish for me to do was already done a long time ago. I have quite satisfied myself on nearly all matters of reasoning. (10 December 1705 letter to Burnett; G 3:302–3)

Another place where Leibniz emphasizes the systematicity of his philosophy is in his correspondence with Des Bosses:

My views certainly are connected with each other in such a way that no link can be removed without the chain’s being broken. From the very consideration of possible worlds and God’s choice, it follows both that he has chosen the best and that he has chosen it with one decree, whose object, obviously, is the chosen world. (October 1708 letter to Des Bosses, LR 113)

If only the attribute of incomprehensibility were proper to God alone! Then, our hope of knowing nature would be greater. But it is all too true that there is no part of nature that could be known perfectly by us, and the very interconnection of things proves this. No creature, however elevated, can perceive distinctly or comprehend the infinite at the same time; but, on the contrary, whoever comprehends even one part of matter likewise comprehends the whole universe on account of the same interconnection I mentioned. My principles are such that they can hardly be separated one from another. Whoever knows one well, knows them all. (7 November 1710 letter to Des Bosses, LR 189)

More could be said about the context of these passages and exactly how they should be interpreted. At the very least, however, these texts do not suggest that Leibniz saw himself as unsure about which theory of substance to endorse. That being said, Leibniz wrote a considerable amount on the theory of monads and bodies between 1710 and 1714. Did Leibniz’s views on substance evolve during those intervening years?

To answer this question one would need to delve deeply into Leibniz’s long and fascinating correspondence with Des Bosses (as well as other texts). This is obviously not the place to provide such an investigation, but we can briefly summarize a standard interpretation of one of the central moments of the correspondence (see Look and Rutherford’s introduction [2007] to the Leibniz-Des Bosses Correspondence, xlix–lxxviii). As a Jesuit priest, Des Bosses was interested in determining whether Leibniz’s philosophy could provide an adequate ontological framework for the doctrine of transubstantiation. The central point of contention in their discussion of this issue concerned the reality of corporeal substance. Did Leibnizian corporeal substances meet the criteria for being a substance in the strict sense of the term? On a monadological view a corporeal substance (or animal) is a dominant monad united with an organic body, which is itself an aggregate of subordinate monads. The “union” of a dominant monad and its organic body consists in certain harmonious perceptual relations that obtain between the dominant monad and the subordinate monads of the organic body. This rather weak notion of union is not sufficient to make the dominant monad and its organic body truly one being. This implies that a corporeal substance is not a substance strictly speaking because it does not possess per se unity. Des Bosses thought that this reductive view of corporeal substance did not provide a robust enough conception of the reality of bodies to properly ground the doctrine of transubstantiation. In response to Des Bosses’ concerns Leibniz developed the notion of a substantial bond (vinculum substantiale). This substantial bond (superadded by God) could serve as a kind of metaphysical glue uniting the dominant monad and the subordinate monads of an organic body. Leibniz told Des Bosses that the only way for a corporeal substance to be a per se unity would be through one of these substantial bonds. Arguably, Leibniz did not endorse the theory himself; he told Des Bosses that he preferred the more ontologically parsimonious version of the theory of monads (letter of 16 June 1712; LR 255).

The correspondence with Des Bosses has thus been taken to provide support for the interpretive thesis that Leibniz’s mature ontology of finite substance countenances the existence of simple substances exclusively (but see Garber 2009 for an opposing view). The correspondence also shows, importantly, that the mere occurrence of the word “corporeal substance” in a text does not immediately imply that Leibniz takes corporeal substances to be substances, strictly speaking. These conclusions might help resolve the apparent tension between Leibniz’s remarks on substance in the Monadologie and the Principes de la Nature et de la Grace. The text of the Monadologie more accurately reflects Leibniz’s considered position because it only characterizes simple substances as “substances”. The Principes de la Nature et de la Grace, in contrast, is less rigorous on this issue (more exoteric) because it uses the term “composite substance” when composites are not substances, strictly speaking (Rutherford 1995: 281–2).

But why would Leibniz use a term like “composite substance” in the Principes de la Nature et de la Grace if it did not accurately reflect his considered position? Here is one possible answer. In presenting his theory of simple substances Leibniz was concerned to avoid a fundamental misunderstanding. The misunderstanding is that if the only true substances are unextended simple substances, then bodies must be mere illusions. Leibniz does not think that bodies are mere illusions. His view of bodies (from the perspective of the theory of monads) is, roughly, that they are “real but not fully real”. To adequately grasp Leibniz’s view one must understand that his ontology countenances different levels or degrees of reality. Simplifying things considerably, these degrees range from the ideal (the least real) to the phenomenal (mid-grades of reality) to the level of monads (the most real). Bodies fall within the purview of the phenomenal: they are more real than entities that are purely ideal (e.g., space) but less real than simple substances. Bodies are accorded an enhanced degree of reality (in comparison to merely ideal entities) because they are well founded on the reality of monads. The precise nature of this “well founding”—and of Leibniz’s ontological scheme more generally—is a complicated and controversial matter. The nuanced framework (however one might fill in the details) does not lend itself to a straightforward and intuitive presentation in several paragraphs of text (see Whipple 2020 for a more detailed account).

One can reasonably view the Principes de la Nature et de la Grace as one of the most exoteric presentations of Leibniz’s theory of monads. In the text he omits nearly all of the details of his nuanced ontological scheme. He describes bodies as “composite substances” so that his reader will recognize that both simple substances and bodies are “real”. By overemphasizing the degree of reality that he grants bodies he is able to introduce the theory of monads in a way that makes it appear less far removed from received opinions. It also helps avoid the serious misunderstanding that bodies are mere illusions—a misunderstanding that one could easily fall into in the absence of a full presentation of Leibniz’s ontological scheme.

This very brief sketch of an “exoteric resolution” of the textual discrepancy between Leibniz’s use of the word “substance” in the Monadologie and the Principes de la Nature et de la Grace provides an alternative to the “developmental” and “two theory” readings of the relevant passages mentioned earlier. It suggests a more general moral for Leibniz scholarship. Whenever one is faced with texts that appear to provide conflicting remarks on an issue, it is important to consider whether an exoteric strategy that could resolve the apparent conflict might be at work. It is not easy to determine when an exoteric strategy is at work given that Leibniz rarely flags the features of his works that are exoteric within the works themselves. One must consider Leibniz’s general remarks on exoteric strategies along with any additional texts that explicitly or implicitly bear on the passages in question. It is only once all of these texts have been examined that one can argue that a particular interpretive hypothesis is the best all things considered. In some cases an esoteric/exoteric interpretation will be the most plausible; in other cases it might be more plausible to view Leibniz as having changed his views over time, or as having not fully resolved a difficult problem, among other possibilities (see Whipple 2010 for discussion of a problem where it is particularly difficult to discern the most plausible interpretation).

7. Summary

Throughout his career Leibniz distinguished between esoteric and exoteric modes of presentation in philosophy. He endorsed the esoteric mode, which was modeled closely on the Geometrical model of demonstration, as the ideal mode of presentation. Leibniz did some important preparatory work for an esoteric presentation of his metaphysics in the 1670s and 1680s, but he never completed a work that was in strict accordance with the esoteric ideal. Although he continued to regard the geometrical model of demonstration as the ideal, he thought it would be a mistake to introduce his philosophy to people in the form of an esoteric treatise. This is because the content of his philosophy was highly esoteric; it involved a range of abstract principles and theses, many of which were far removed from received opinions. He thought that if he were to present his philosophy in a strictly esoteric manner people would misunderstand it and summarily reject it. This is why exoteric texts were so important for Leibniz. They were designed to serve as intellectual stepping-stones that could help readers move from received opinions to esoteric truth. In letters to trusted correspondents Leibniz explicitly describes his journal articles and the Essais de théodicée as exoteric works. But even Leibniz’s letters to trusted correspondents such as De Volder and Des Bosses fall short of the esoteric ideal. All of Leibniz’s texts are exoteric to a certain degree, but some are more so than others. They can be categorized as more or less exoteric depending on the degree to which they approximate the esoteric ideal in form and content. It is difficult to provide this categorization given that Leibniz never completed a strictly esoteric treatise. However, Leibniz’s general comments about the exoteric mode of presentation can help us form reasonable hypotheses about the implicitly exoteric features of his texts. We have seen that Leibniz utilized a variety of complimentary exoteric techniques, including:

  1. Selective omission: he omits the features of his philosophy that are furthest removed from received opinions. In some cases it is possible to infer the omitted views from a careful reading of the exoteric text; in other cases a supplementary work is required.

  2. Surface reading vs. deep reading: the text admits of an intuitive surface reading that can make his views seem closer to received opinions than they actually are. The texts are also compatible with a more rigorous but less straightforward reading; it may or may not be possible to grasp the deeper meaning on the basis of the exoteric text alone.

  3. Familiar language: he tailors his language to his audience so that it will appear more familiar to them. For example, he uses Cartesian language when he writes in the journals of Paris and the language of the schools when he writes in the journals of Leipzig.

  4. Eclectic references: he appeals to the claims of well-regarded historical and contemporary figures to illustrate and motivate his own theses.

  5. Hypothesis: he presents a thesis as a hypothesis rather than providing a strict demonstration of the thesis, even if he is capable of providing the demonstration. He thinks that in some cases a reader will be less hostile to a novel thesis if it is presented as a hypothesis.

  6. Sensible analogies, metaphors, imaginative thought experiments, stories, and anecdotes: he utilizes these devices because they allow readers that are accustomed to conceiving of things by means of the senses and the imagination to attain an introductory understanding of theses and principles that are abstract and distinctly conceivable only through the intellect (not the senses or the imagination).

Some work identifying particular exoteric strategies has been done in the secondary literature on Leibniz. However, much work remains to be done. More detailed examinations of the exoteric features of Leibniz’s works will help us more adequately determine which texts (if any) present his considered views and the extent to which his philosophy is systematic.


Primary Sources

Note that all quotes from untranslated sources listed below are translated by the author of this entry.

Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe, Darmstadt and Berlin: Berlin Academy, 1923–, (cited by series, volume, and page).
Philosophical Essays, Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber (trans.), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1989.
Confessio Philosophi: Papers Concerning the Problem of Evil, 1671–1678. Translated and edited by Robert C. Sleigh, Jr. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 2005.
Lettres et opuscules inedits, Louis Alexandre Foucher de Careil (ed.), Hildesheim, New York: George Olms, 1975.
Die philosophischen Schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, C. I. Gerhardt (ed.), Berlin: Weidman, 1875–1890 (cited by volume and page).
Philosophical Papers and Letters, second edition, Leroy E. Loemker (trans.), Dordrecht and Boston: Reidel, 1969.
The Leibniz-Des Bosses Correspondence, Brandon C. Look and Donald Rutherford (trans.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 2007.
Briefwechsel, Hannover: Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz Bibliothek/Niedersächsische Landesbibliothek.
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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

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