Liberalism in Latin America

First published Mon Feb 1, 2016; substantive revision Wed Oct 5, 2022

Liberal political discourse was dominant in Latin America during most of the nineteenth century. Initially, in the first half of the century, it was a discourse of liberation from colonial rule in Hispanic America. Liberal ideas provided the political language to articulate the urgently needed new kind of legitimacy for the emerging republics. Later, in the second half, liberalism was firmly established as an ideology of nation building in most of the region. However, by the mid twentieth century, liberalism had mostly vanished from the political scene, except in Colombia where the liberal party continued to be a live political option until the end of the century. Despite the fact that it became the dominant political discourse in the nineteenth century, there is no such thing as Latin American or Hispanic American “liberalism”, if by the latter we mean something like a unified and internally coherent body of political doctrine (“Hispanic American” refers to Spanish-speaking America as opposed to Portuguese speaking, i.e., Brazil). Instead, what emerged in the nineteenth century were various political movements that can appropriately be called “liberal” to the extent that political actors either espoused liberal ideas or identified themselves as “liberals”, or both. Though such political movements began to take shape in the aftermath of the wars of independence from Spain and Portugal, self-identification as a member of a liberal group became possible around the mid-century when the liberal position became more definite in relation to usually “conservative” adversaries.

A central feature of Hispanic American liberalism (the case of Brazil is considered below) is that its multiple variants developed directly in response to the political challenges posed by the need to construct new states after the disintegration of the Spanish empire. Liberal political actors were primarily concerned with addressing institutional issues and also with pressing for specific political ends but not with systematic theorizing. Liberal intellectuals were public figures who usually held official positions and were mainly concerned with the practical tasks of constitutional design and institutional reform. Thus, the various liberal positions principally emerged in political and legal practice, not in theoretical works. Liberal intellectuals expressed and developed their views in the numerous constitutions that they produced, in legal commentary, and in the public debates that took place in pamphlets and newspapers. For this reason, it is crucial to understand the political challenges that they were forced to confront in the design of the new institutional structures. The various liberal positions that they developed can only be fully grasped as responses to the questions and problems that the social and political situations forced upon them. This is not to deny that some liberal Latin American intellectuals did produce theoretical works that are worth examining in their own right, such as those by Juan Bautista Alberdi in Argentina and José Victorino Lastarria in Chile.

Despite important differences in the social and political conditions across the region, liberal Hispanic American intellectuals shared some common themes and concerns. Chief among them was their commitment to carry out a radical break with the past that required the profound transformation of their own societies. Central to this enterprise was the replacement of the religiously grounded monarchical form of government with secular republics based on popular sovereignty. In light of this commitment, liberal political actors debated how best to carry out this transformation in political structures and social practices: whether constitutional design could be sufficient to produce the desired republican order (i.e., non-monarchical) with full protection of individual liberties and a market economy; or whether it was also necessary to engage in social and economic reform with the power of a strong centralized State that was still in the making. They asked what was to be done with inherited colonial institutions that fiercely resisted the new liberal order (especially the Catholic Church); and how to transform ex-colonial subjects with little if any experience in political representation and participation in a market economy into industrious citizens of the republic. A central concern was how to maintain social and political stability in the process of a deep transformation premised on the rejection of long established colonial institutional structures and social practices. Not surprisingly, liberal political actors disagreed deeply among themselves about how best to answer questions such as these and what exactly liberalism entailed. They disagreed on matters of constitutional design, the extent of individual liberties, the proper functions of the State, who was entitled to full active citizenship, how to deal with the Catholic Church, among other issues. For all their disagreements, they took for granted that the “Indians” and mestizos, who were in the majority, had to be transformed into industrious citizens, by force if necessary.

While the reconstruction of nineteenth century Latin American liberalism has been dominated by historians, it is also of philosophical interest for at least two reasons. First, the most prominent liberal intellectuals, such as Juan Bautista Alberdi in Argentina, José María Luis Mora in Mexico, and José Victorino Lastarria in Chile, did develop distinctive liberal positions. As already mentioned, Alberdi and Lastarria also produced theoretical works in which they systematized their own political views. Second, the consideration of nineteenth century Latin American liberalism can contribute to enrich our understanding of liberalism as a far more internally heterogeneous ideology than is usually assumed since what was meant by “liberalism” turns out to be sometimes surprising from contemporary perspectives. For nineteenth century Latin American liberals the liberal State could be the main agent promoting economic growth, the principal provider of formal schooling, and the champion of political and social secularization in constant confrontation with the Catholic Church.

Despite their lofty ambitions, the struggles of political actors to transform Latin American societies in light of liberal ideas and values have almost unanimously been met with a harsh judgement. Since early on in the nineteenth century, there emerged the concern that liberal ideas were “imported” and inadequate for Latin American societies (Bolívar 1815). Later, in the early twentieth, the discourse that liberalism had been a failure in the region enjoyed ample support given the oligarchical nature of the liberal regimes, the establishment of authoritarian “liberal” governments, and the inability of the liberal establishments to properly channel social demands for political participation and the inclusion of the large impoverished majorities in the benefits of economic growth. Since then, scholars have debated on the alleged inadequacy of Latin American societies for liberal institutions, the ways in which the “adaptation” of liberalism in Latin American allegedly “deviated” from the “original” European and North American liberal “models”, and the “foreign” nature of the latter.

However, in recent decades there has taken place a renewed scholarly interest in nineteenth century Latin American liberalism and local political history more broadly. Novel theoretical approaches have called into question well-established assumptions. Some authors have shifted attention from diagnosing the failures of liberalism in the region to offering more sympathetic and accurate reconstructions (Hale 1968 & 1989, Jáksic and Posada Carbó 2011). This development has opened a number of conceptual debates in an evolving field. Scholars now disagree as to what is to count as “liberalism” in carrying out this reconstruction. While some maintain that such a reconstruction necessarily presupposes a prior theoretical “definition” of liberalism in order to properly identify its subject matter (Aguilar 2000 & 2010, Gargarella 2010 & 2013), others reject all attempts at definition altogether (Palti 2005 & 2007). The question then arises whether any position that political actors called “liberal” is to count as such for scholarly purposes. For instance, Is the fusion of late nineteenth century liberalism with Comtean positivism that took place in some regions to be considered a genuine liberal development? Or should it be considered the demise of liberalism despite the fact that some of those who embraced positivism continued to call themselves “liberals”? What should be the subject matter in this reconstruction: the uses of the term “liberal” (Rivera-Castro 2021), the concept of “liberalism” regardless of the terminology that political actors and movements in fact employed (Fernández Sebastián 2009 & 2012), or the political languages in which they articulated their own views (Palti 2005 & 2007)? These debates have brought to the fore that the reconstruction of nineteenth century Latin American liberalism poses conceptual and methodologiacl questions regarding what we are to understand by “liberal” and “liberalism” both at the early stage around the time of independence and at the time of the liberll triumph in the closing decades of the century. The question even arises whether the attribution of a liberal ideology to political actors at the early stage before the formation of political groups that self-identified as “liberal” is appropriate or only a retrospective reconstruction.

In light of the variety and complexity of Latin American liberal views, this entry provides only a brief and general introduction to the topic that is far from being the whole story. Since the heyday of Latin American liberalism took place in the nineteenth century, this entry privileges this historical period, though the last section focuses on the decline of liberalism in the twentieth century, its modest revival in recent decades, and current scholarly debates on how best to carry out its reconstruction. In order to adequately present the liberal political movements, it has been indispensable to provide the highlights of the social and political context that motivated the initial enthusiastic appropriation of liberal ideas as well as their further development. This entry also provides closer though brief approximations to the views developed by the most prominent liberal intellectuals mentioned earlier, namely, Alberdi, Mora, and Lastarria. Since they articulated their positions in quite different political contexts, their respective liberal views differ greatly from each other. Though the entry is organized thematically, it also roughly follows a chronological order. The first section offers a brief overview. The second section presents the influence of Spanish liberalism in the initial reception of liberal ideas around the time of the wars of independence in the early nineteenth century. The third section presents early Hispanic American liberalism as an emancipatory ideology that commanded wide acceptance among the elites. The fourth section considers the transition from the initial constitutional optimism to the search for alternative ways for bringing about the much desired social and political change. The fifth section focuses on the ideological conflict between liberals and conservatives around the mid-nineteenth century. It was in the midst of this conflict that the contours of a liberal political identity came more clearly into view. The sixth section presents the liberal anticlerical response to the religious problem. The seventh section considers the influence of positivism and the triumph of liberalism as an ideology of nation building. The final eighth section briefly considers the decline of liberalism in the early decades of the twentieth century, the debates on the alleged failure of liberalism in Latin America, and the related discussions regarding the adequate conceptual framework for carrying out its reconstruction.

1. An Overview

Liberal ideas first became widespread in Latin American with the influence of the liberal Cádiz constitution of 1812 which was in force in the Spanish empire for two years until the reestablishment of absolute rule. At the beginning of the century, “liberalism” in this context primarily meant what Spanish liberals meant by it in the debates that took place in the Cádiz Courts, which met as a sovereign national assembly in response to the Napoleonic invasion of the Iberian peninsula in 1808. It was in this setting that the term “liberal” was for the first time employed in a political sense to refer to a political group (Breña 2012). Since the Cádiz constitution was, in turn, heavily influenced by the political ideas of the French Revolution, the first liberal ideas in Latin America had likewise primarily this origin. Ideas such as popular sovereignty, civil equality, individual representation, the conventional nature of political authority, freedom of thought and of the press, and a division of powers that privileges the legislative became central to early Latin American liberalism. The latter was by no means identical to Spanish liberalism or to the political ideas of the French revolution, but these two are its main initial sources.

The crisis of the Spanish and Portuguese monarchies upon the Napoleonic invasion set off the process of independence in most of Latin America and opened the way for the free circulation, for the first time, of modern political ideas in the region (the Spanish and Portuguese inquisitions had prohibited freedom of thought and of the press). Though the Cádiz constitution was influential in both Hispanic (i.e., Spanish-speaking) and Portuguese Americas, liberalism developed in quite different directions in these two regions because of the two quite different ways in which the Spanish and Portuguese monarchies responded to the French invasion. While the flight of the Spanish king tossed the empire into a political crisis, the Portuguese were able to maintain political stability by transferring the capital of the empire to Brazil. Thus, questions about the source of legitimate political authority became pressing in Hispanic America, but were not as critical in Brazil. Although the initial answers that Hispanic Americans offered were framed in terms of traditional scholastic political thinking, they soon began to appeal to the political ideas of the French revolution, specifically to the notion of popular sovereignty. According to the scholastic traditional view, sovereign authority rested on a pact between the king and its people, and in the absence of the king, sovereignty returned to the people. On this traditional view, the sovereign authority of the king was limited by natural, divine, and teleological (i.e., common good) considerations. The transition to the modern conception of unlimited and indivisible popular sovereignty marked a radical break in the political thinking in the Spanish colonies. Similarly new and revolutionary was the related conception of individual representation in a constituent assembly, as opposed to the traditional corporate representation before the king, to which the American subjects were never entitled.

The end result of this political process was the independence of all Hispanic America (with the exception of Cuba and Puerto Rico) within two decades of the Napoleonic invasion through armed revolt. Brazil, by contrast, obtained independence in the same period without bloodshed when the Portuguese prince-regent proclaimed it. This difference in the sequence of political events accounts for the fact that the liberal ideology in Hispanic America was deeply committed to carrying out a radical break with the colonial past while a salient feature of Brazilian liberalism is the continuity of monarchical rule. While liberals in Hispanic American uniformly rejected monarchism and embraced a republican form of government (i.e., non-monarchical) grounded on popular sovereignty, Brazilian liberalism remained monarchical until the closing decades of the century. The egalitarianism implicit in republicanism favored the abolition of slavery and of noble titles in the new republics. By mid-century slavery had been formally abolished in all of them, though practices of slave/serf-like labor continued in some regions, such as Mexico. In Brazil, slavery was finally abolished in 1888 after decades of contestation and gradual decline.

After having embraced the doctrine of popular sovereignty and the natural rights language of the French revolution, most liberals followed Benjamin Constant in his critique of the doctrine of popular sovereignty and his defense of a limited government. His writings on constitutionalism were closely followed in the design of Latin American constitutions, both liberal and conservative. Though French liberalism exerted the greatest influence overall, some Latin American liberals were also much influenced by British parliamentarism. Most of them also admired the North American republican experience. Montesquieu and Jeremy Bentham were, along with Constant, among the most cited European authors in the first half of the century (Safford 1987: 68). From Montesquieu, liberals took the idea of separation of powers and his critique of despotism. Though they did not adopt an explicitly utilitarian language, they admired and followed Bentham’s rationalistic approach to legislation (Jaramillo 2001: 120). In the mid-century, the political problem that came into focus and that gave liberals an identity against the conservative opposition was the religious one. The question was how to deal with a powerful Church that, in some regions, posed the most powerful internal challenge to the authority of the newly established republics, given the Catholic uncompromising rejection of liberalism. The Catholic Church had condemned liberalism, secularism, freedom of thought and toleration, among other “evils” in Pope Pius IX’s Syllabus of Errors published in 1864. Liberals demanded freedom of religious worship and, in some cases, the separation of church and state. At this point in time, they had for the most part distanced themselves from the natural rights discourse and from contractualism in light of the criticisms by the British utilitarians (especially Bentham) and French liberals (especially Constant). They turned their attention to the German historical school of law (Friedrich Karl von Savigny and his French follower Eugène Lerminier) and, above all, to Auguste Comte’s positivism, which became the most influential philosophical doctrine (Hale 1984) along with Herbert Spencer’s evolutionism. After decades of civil unrest, a doctrine that emphasized the maintenance of order in combination with progress appeared highly attractive. Liberalism had ceased to be an ideology in combat against an enemy, either foreign (Spain) or internal (the conservative political faction), and had become the triumphant ideology of national building (Hale 1984). In the closing decades of the century, positivism displaced liberalism in Brazil, while some Hispanic American liberals carried out a synthesis of liberal ideas and positivism that has often been considered the decline of liberalism.

In the early twentieth century, Latin American liberalism became the subject of strong criticisms. Critics argued that Latin American societies had not been successfully transformed according to liberal ideas because the former provided a hostile ground for the latter. On this view, liberalism was a foreign ideology that was not adequate for Hispanic American realities. This is a criticism against nineteenth century liberalism that has remained forceful to this date. By mid-twentieth century liberalism had been displaced by the emergence of alternative political movements and ideologies: corporativisms of various sorts as well as socialist, Marxist, indigenous, agrarian, and populist. In the late twentieth and early twenty-first centuries, liberalism has experienced a modest revival in political discourse in Latin America. This is manifest in the discourse that affirms the pluralism of forms of life and the demands for protection of the rights of minorities. In the sphere of academia, the works by English speaking liberal scholars, such as John Rawls, Ronald Dworkin, and Joseph Raz, have received much attention and have been amply discussed in academic publications. However, Latin American scholars have so far not related their current endorsement of recent Anglo-American liberalism to the nineteenth century Latin American liberal discourse. For the most part there is a sharp divide between current work by historians on nineteenth century Latin American liberalism, on the one hand, and systematic reflection by philosophers and political theorists on recent Anglo-American liberalism, on the other.

2. The Influence of Spanish Liberalism

In response to the French invasion in 1808, Spanish liberalism developed as an ideology of liberation against a foreign invader. This was the first powerful liberal movement in the Spanish empire and the very first serious questioning of absolute rule. In a society that had almost no experience in political representation, liberals sought to end despotic rule by replacing it with a parliamentary monarchy. They denied sovereign authority to the King and declared it to lie in the nation, which, in turn, was conceived of as having the faculty to make and remake its own fundamental laws. Traditionally, representation in the Courts had been corporate (nobility, clergy and the municipalities), while liberals stood for individualistic representation. Against despotism, liberals also favored a division of powers and an independent judiciary. Spanish liberalism was a revolutionary ideology that marked a radical break with the monarchical status quo. Liberals sought to end a corporate society and to create an individualistic one by abolishing corporate privileges and immunities and by replacing them with legal equality and economic freedom. The liberal position was expressed in the Cádiz constitution of 1812.

The most important philosophical influence that shaped the liberal position was the political ideas of the French Revolution and, more specifically, the 1791 Constitution (Varela Suanzes 1995). The Cádiz constitution exhibited the influence of Enlightenment rationalism, the rationalist natural rights discourse, and the political ideas of Montesquieu and Rousseau, to name the most salient referred to authors (Varela Suanzes1987). The liberal deputies embraced the idea of individual rights that were natural and inalienable. They also affirmed the natural equality of all men and the doctrine of national sovereignty. Following the French model, the Cádiz constitution established a division of powers that privileged the legislative as the power that represented the nation. The constitution established a unicameral legislature in which there were no special provisions for the traditional preeminence of the clergy and the nobility. While the monarch, as the executive, was subordinate to the legislative, the judiciary was held to be independent, echoing Locke and Montesquieu (Varela Suanzes1983).

However, there are two crucial features that notably distinguish the Cádiz constitution from the French model. The former, by contrast with the latter, was grounded in an appeal to history and it exhibited the weight of Catholicism. As regards the first feature, the Cádiz constitution presented itself in its preamble as in continuity with fundamental old Spanish legislation that had allegedly been subverted by despotism. According to the traditional view, the authority of the monarch rested on a pact with its people from which pact followed the fundamental laws of the monarchy that the king had to observe. The liberal appeal to historical legitimacy was clearly at odds with the doctrine of national sovereignty according to which sovereign authority is unlimited—the ultimate source of authority. In fact, liberals introduced a conventional conception of political power that subverted the traditional scholastic one according to which political power was natural and historical. Nevertheless, the presentation of the Constitution as in continuity with fundamental legislation tempered the break with the past (Varela Suanzes1987).

As regards the second feature, the Cádiz constitution continued the imperial protection of the Catholic religion to the exclusion of all others despite the fact that it also ended some privileges and immunities that the Catholic Church had traditionally enjoyed. It has been argued, however, that religious intolerance was not a feature of Spanish liberalism, but a concession that liberals had to make to traditionalist political forces in the Cádiz Courts (Varela Suanzes1987). Nevertheless, the religious language that pervades the constitutional text reveals the influence of Spanish scholasticism according to which there are exterior limits to sovereignty (natural, divine, historical, and teleological). This influence was even stronger in Spanish America since the intellectual elite around the time of independence had been educated in Spanish scholasticism. Religious toleration was a matter of bitter disputes even among Latin American liberals themselves and the religious language continued to be present in legal documents throughout the nineteenth century.

Early Latin American liberalism must be seen through the influence of the Spanish liberalism that developed in this political context, although the former’s two strands developed in different directions. While the Hispanic American strand (i.e., the strand in Spanish-speaking America) was firmly committed to a radical break with the colonial past, the Brazilian one was marked by crucial points of continuity. Let us consider the Hispanic strand first. The mark of the Cádiz constitution was evident in most Hispanic American constitutions in the first half of the century (Safford 1987: 62). All of them claimed sovereign authority to lie in the people or the nation and protected some basic individual rights (such as freedom of thought and of the press) that were considered natural. They all maintained protection of the Catholic religion as the official one as well as most of the corporate privileges of the Catholic Church. They also established a separation of powers and departed from the Spanish model by creating bicameral systems. However, there are at least two important points of contrast between Spanish and Hispanic American liberals. The first one is that Hispanic American liberals could not buttress their constitutionalism with appeals to historical legitimacy. They could not present the constitutions that they produced in continuity with the fundamental medieval laws of the Spanish monarchy. Independence from Spain pushed, after three centuries of colonialism, to conceive of the liberal institutions as something completely new that lacked any historical precedent. By contrast with Spanish liberals who looked both to the future and to the past, the Hispanic American ones made a break with the past and looked to the future only where emancipation and progress were supposed to lie. Liberal constitutions held the promise of a society fully transformed away from the colonial structures and in accordance with the protection of individual freedoms and legal equality. When Hispanic American liberalism became the ideology of a political group in the mid-century, its identity was importantly centered in this forward looking attitude. Liberal political actors often referred to themselves as “the party of progress.”

The second point of contrast is that Hispanic American liberalism was more radically egalitarian. Hispanic American liberals rejected a monarchical option and very early abolished slavery and noble titles. By mid-century slavery had been formally abolished in all independent countries. Hispanic American liberalism became synonymous with republican government, which meant a commitment to legal equality, political representation, and the rejection of monarchism. After three centuries of despotic monarchical rule, Hispanic Americans associated monarchism with despotism. They feared that one-person rule, even when limited by a parliament, would inevitably become despotic—as it in fact happened in the short lived monarchy in Mexico right after independence. This egalitarianism, however, did not translate into the establishment of a rule of law that guaranteed equal legal treatment to all citizens. Nor did the egalitarian discourse translate into the democratic inclusion of all citizens in the exercise of political rights. Most Hispanic American liberals firmly believed in the need of property or literacy qualifications for voting and for running for public office. They were consistently skeptical about extending political rights to a population that they regarded as incapable for republican citizenship.

While early Hispanic American liberalism defined itself by its rejection of the colonial heritage, Brazilian liberalism, by contrast, acquired its identity in the confrontation with the advocates of monarchical absolutism. Brazilian liberals did not challenge monarchism. Instead, they sought to establish parliamentary limits to monarchical authority (Cyril 2012), thus favoring a representative monarchy. Though absolutists and liberals agreed on the need for a written constitution, the protection of some fundamental liberties (such as freedom of the press), and a legislative body that represented the nation, the differences between them turned on the extent and limits of the executive authority. Liberals sought to subordinate the king to the legislative authority, while absolutists pushed for the opposite balance of forces. Brazilian liberalism became strongly identified with economic freedom, whereas absolutists favored governmental intervention in the economy along the lines of the late eighteenth century reformist absolutism. While Brazilian liberals wished to emulate North American federalism, absolutists were firmly committed to political centralism and, hence, to the political control of the entire nation by the monarch. In the second half of the century, Brazilian liberals defined themselves by opposition to “conservatives” who favored political centralization, the perpetuation of oligarchical privilege, and resisted the emancipation of slaves, among other issues. However, it has been maintained that the differences between the two political groups “were essentially rethorical” (Viotti da Costa 1986).

3. Early Hispanic American Liberalism

The liberal discourse received from the French Revolution via the Cadiz constitution provided the language in which political actors demanded emancipation from colonial rule in the early nineteenth century. This is why liberalism, though a diffuse ideology with no clear contours, commanded the assent of many who favored the cause of independence. The discourse of liberation appealed to the notion of popular sovereignty in order to justify emancipation from colonial rule (Palti 2007: ch. 2). Representation and legal equality were heartfelt demands in a region that had had little if no experience in political representation while a colony, except for the brief interval when the Cadiz constitution was in force from 1812 through 1814 (Palti 2007: ch. 4). The natural rights to freedom of thought and of the press were considered fundamental after centuries of tight control by the Catholic inquisition, which had curtailed the free circulation of ideas. A republican form of government with a division of powers was considered an antidote against one-person despotic rule and a clear sign of emancipation from monarchical absolutism. Some of those who were later considered “conservatives”, such as Lucas Alamán in Mexico, or “republicans”, such as Simón Bolívar in Venezuela, shared in this early liberal consensus. Both of them affirmed, at least initially, the core ideas of popular sovereignty, some natural rights, and a republican form of government with a division of powers. Conservative constitutions, such as the Chilean one from 1833, affirmed these core ideas as well. Liberal ideas thus provided a shared perspective in relation to which the various political positions that were to develop later defined themselves.

The philosophical sources of this early liberalism are quite diverse since public intellectuals referred to all sorts of authorities that could support their own positions. Though the list is long, the most widely referred to authors were Rousseau, Montesquieu, Constant, and Bentham (Safford 1987: 68). From Montesquieu they took the defense of a division of powers and the critique of despotism; from Rousseau the idea of popular sovereignty, the social contract, and the natural equality of men; from Constant the critique of popular sovereignty and the defense of a limited government; from Bentham the rationalistic approach to legislation. It should be noted, however, that the influence of these authorities was not limited to those who consistently subscribed to liberal views. Such an influence also extended across a political spectrum that acquired more definite contours in later decades. The echoes of Rousseau are apparent among those who advocated an egalitarian strand of liberalism that demanded equal political rights for all males, as in the 1814 Apatzingán Constitution in Mexico, which was never in force. This constitution mentions the need for a virtuous citizenry, who, when in disagreement with specific laws, must submit to them as a “sacrifice of particular intelligence to the general will”. But Rousseau was also highly influential among those who defended clearly authoritarian forms of governance, such as Bolívar, who established a lifetime executive in the 1826 Bolivian Constitution. The same holds for Constant, who was an authority for liberal intellectuals, such as José María Luis Mora in Mexico, but also for some of those who designed “conservative” constitutions, such as the Mexican constitution of 1836. Constant’s notion of a “moderating power” was also picked up by the Brazilian monarchy. This indicates that intellectuals often drew from the same philosophical sources in order to develop political positions that were, in fact, quite different from each other.

It is a matter of debate among scholars whether the notion of early Hispanic American liberalism is only a retrospective reconstruction or whether it is apt to refer to the initial usage of some liberal ideas for political and legal purposes as a sort of “liberalism”. As mentioned, at this early state in the first half of the nineteenth century there were no political groups that self-identified as “liberal”. The political usage of the term was not yet well established in the region. The term “liberal” still carried with it its original moral meaning associated with noble qualities of generosity and magnanimity, which, in the Hispanic-Portuguese Catholic tradition, were virtues that the monarch had to have (Fernández Sebastián 2009: 703–4). In this moral sense, “liberal” was opposed to tyranny and despotism. From the perspective afforded by this widespread moral usage of the term, it became difficult for Hispanic Americans political actors to identify themselves as “liberals” along the lines of Spanish liberalism. Although this may seem paradoxical, the reason is that the liberal Spanish Courts came to be seen as “illiberal” since they had grudgingly granted representation rights to as few American deputies as possible in the Cádiz constitution. Early Spanish liberalism proved not to be incompatible with empire. This led some Hispanic American liberals to claim distance from Spanish liberalism despite the fact that the greatest impulse for the spread of liberal ideas in Latin America was the Cadiz constitution. According to their own self-perception, for instance, Colombian liberals owed nothing to the latter. It was only in the twentieth century that historians have demonstrated the inaccuracy of this self-conception (Martínez Garnica 2006).

The moral meaning of the term “liberal” provided a perspective from which Hispanic American liberals construed their vision of the Spanish monarchy as a paradigm of tyranny and despotism. From the point of view of liberal ideas, more broadly, they came to see the colonial past as an age of obscurantism, ignorance, and backwardness (Lastarria 1844; Samper 1861; for discussion see Collier 1967: ch. 5). This negative conception of the Spanish heritage became a constant feature of the Hispanic American liberal frame of mind. In light of their abhorrence of the colonial past, liberals insisted on the need to construe completely new political institutions and to instill a new political mentality in the population. They were also prone to blame the colonial heritage for the great difficulties that they faced in carrying out these purposes. To be sure, this dismissive attitude towards the colonial past was not exclusive of liberals since it was Bolívar who famously blamed the ills of Hispanic America on the colonial past. In his Jamaica Letter he claimed that, as a consequence of the colonial heritage, “institutions which are wholly representative are not suited to our character, customs, and present knowledge” (Bolívar 1815). As some conservatives often complained, the repudiation of the Spanish heritage prevented liberals from positively valuing aspects of their society that could help build stable political institutions, such as the unifying force of Catholicism.

In light of this view of the character and customs inherited from the colonial times, the liberal faith in the capacity of written constitutions to fully transform their societies away from the colonial structures and in the direction of progress went hand in hand with strong a pessimism about the capacity of the majority of the people to live up to the demands of such institutions. Since the majority of the population shared the moral values of the colonial society and lacked even the basic skills of reading and writing, the elite judged them to be backward and ignorant. Most liberals indeed deemed the majority of the people to be unfit for republican citizenship. To be sure, the latter was a widely shared view among European liberals who also advocated a limited franchise. Most Hispanic American liberals endorsed the French doctrinaire’s argument that most of the population lacked the needed independence of judgment to exercise political rights either because of lack of instruction or because of their subservience to masters, or both, which was usually the case. A notable exception to this dominant view was the short lived liberal Colombian constitution of 1853 which granted universal male suffrage following the French example after the 1848 revolution (Bushnell 1993: 108). The same year, a local legislature in Colombia also granted women the right to vote for the first time in the Americas though the measure was turned down by the supreme court (Bushnell 1993: 163). By contrast with their European counterparts, however, the Hispanic American liberals’ conviction about the political incapacity of the masses was compounded by their belief that the cultural practices inherited from colonial times were a formidable obstacle for the realization of liberal political ideas. This perception motivated the disenchanted conclusion that liberal institutions were not suitable for Hispanic American societies, as Bolívar put it, and as many other conservatives repeatedly complained against partisans of liberalism.

4. From Constitutional Optimism to Alternatives for Social Change

In the aftermath of independence, most Hispanic American nations produced written constitutions as early as 1811 in Venezuela, New Granada (subsequently Colombia), and Chile. At the time, political actors shared the belief that a written code of law had the power to transform their societies in the direction of liberal ideas. They believed that good legislation was the way to promote individual liberties and economic progress. According to this, former subjects of a colonial regime would come to see themselves as the bearers of individual rights and liberties as soon as the latter were constitutionally protected. Likewise, on this optimistic view, economic progress would naturally develop as soon as individuals were granted the economic freedoms to work, to contract, and to accumulate wealth. This initial constitutionalism did indeed bring great changes with it: the constitutional protection of freedom of thought and of the press ended the traditional limits on the free circulation of printed materials and allowed for an explosion in the number of periodical publications in which people for the first time openly discussed political issues. Nevertheless, the liberal legislation also faced strong opposition by established social powers (such as the Catholic Church), the new republics were marked by great political instability (regimes were often overthrown), and economic progress did not materialize. By mid-century this initial constitutional optimism had waned and political actors looked for alternative solutions. The two most salient liberal proposed alternatives went beyond constitutionalism though in different ways. According to the first one, it was necessary to transform social practices first in order to prepare society for republican institutions. According to the second proposal, by contrast, it was necessary to engage the State in the task of social and economic reform. While the former alternative seeks to produce social transformation from below (in civil society), the latter deepens the strategy of producing social change from above (by the State). Juan Bautista Alberdi advocated the first kind of strategy as suitable for the specific situation of Argentina. In Mexico, José María Luis Mora affirmed the second alternative (section 6).

Juan Bautista Alberdi (1810–1884) was a public intellectual, a legal theorist, and a diplomat. He laid the theoretical foundations for the Argentinian constitution of 1853, which is the most long lasting liberal constitution of the period (still current albeit with important reforms). His proposal for constitutional reform in Bases and starting points for the political organization of the Argentine republic (Bases y puntos de partida para la organización política de la República Argentina, 1852) turns on two central ideas. The first one is that the South American republics should lower their aspirations: instead of a “true” democratic republic, they should aim for a “possible” one that would pave the way towards the former. The second idea is that for a true democratic republic to have any chance of success, society must be ready for it. On his view, the transformation of civil society must take place before granting political rights to the totality of the male adult population. Alberdi claimed that the much needed social transformation could take place through the interaction of the local population with northern European immigrants who would bring with them the habits of order, discipline, and industry that were necessary for economic progress and republican citizenship. Strongly influenced by the effects of massive immigration in California, Alberdi maintained that South America could become civilized through the transplantation of Northern European culture in American soil. Thus, his proposed solution was to promote massive immigration from northern Europe in a nation that was for the most part sparsely inhabited. Hence his famous claim that “to govern is to populate”.

Alberdi’s thinking was importantly influenced by the German historical school of law (Friedrich Karl von Savigny and his French follower Eugène Lerminier) that repudiated both natural law and the widely held idea that a society could be transformed on the basis of legislation that did not reflect its own state of civilization (Alberdi 1837). His distinction between a “possible” and a “true” republic is based on the idea that political organization must not be oriented by high and utopian ideals, but must be grounded in historical reality. On his view, law has to be adequate to the society that receives it. Since he also held that an examination of the situation of the South American republicans shows that they are not civilized enough to govern themselves through democratic institutions, he maintained that a possible republic should not grant equal political rights to all citizens. He favored a sort of government that was republican in form, but highly authoritarian in practice. This, he thought, was apt in light of what he considered the historical reality of Hispanic America. He famously referred approvingly to Bolívar’s dictum that “The new states of formerly Spanish America need kings with the name of president” (Alberdi 1852: 415). In the end, he favored a combination of federalism with political centralism: a certain degree of autonomy to the provinces combined with a strong executive, since, on his view, both federalism and centralism had important historical roots in South America.

According to Alberdi, the goals that should guide the political organization of a possible South American Republic must be responsive to the latter’s history and state of civilization (i.e., level of material and political progress), which establish the limits of political possibility. On his view, the most important goal of a possible republic is to educate the population for representative democracy. By “education” he meant the improvement of the local population’s level of civilization up to the level required for a true republic. He advocated two main means of civilization: the promotion of commerce and industry, on the one hand, and massive European immigration, on the other. Alberdi opposed the idea that the population could be made fit for democracy through formal schooling, as many other liberals indeed maintained. Domingo Sarmiento, the other dominant intellectual and political figure in Argentina at the time, favored formal schooling as the main means of civilization (Sarmiento 1849; Botana 1997). By contrast with Sarmiento, however, Alberdi held that the best means of moralization were industrious work and the constant interaction with people who already had the habits of order, discipline, and industry. In passages that evince the influence of Adam Smith, he maintained that social prosperity was not the work of governments, but a spontaneous result. He was completely skeptical about the possibility of civilizing the local population without the interaction with people who were already civilized. He summarily remarked that “whatever is not European in America is barbaric.”

Alberdi’s diagnosis about the best means for preparing the population for a true republic guides his recommendations for legislation. At the heart of his liberalism is his strong defense of free trade and industry. Such a defense was grounded on both economic and moral considerations: he regarded freedom of trade and industry as instrumental for material progress and for the improvement of the morals of the local population. Crucially, freedom of trade and industry was also indispensable in order to attract the desired sort of European immigrants. The protection of civil rights and liberties to everyone was part of his conception of a possible republic but also instrumental for promoting immigration. Though he favored religious toleration in order to attract non-Catholic Europeans, he also maintained that Catholicism should remain the official religion. On this point, he differed from most Hispanic American liberals who not only advocated the end of the official recognition of Catholicism but also, in some cases, the separation between Church and state. Again, Alberdi’s views were grounded on the realities of the Argentinian nation where the Catholic Church was relatively weak and did not pose a political threat to the republic in the making. In this respect, the situation in Mexico and Colombia was completely different.

5. Liberals, Conservatives, and the Religious Problem

What gave Latin American liberals and liberalism a clear identity around the mid-nineteenth century was their opposition to an adversary. In most of Hispanic America there emerged a “conservative” reaction against the dominant liberal tide as well as the political and social instability that characterized the initial constitutional experiments. A salient exception to this general trend is Argentina where liberals faced no such strong opposition and the liberal identity was for this reason less clearly defined (Halperín Donghi 1988). Though liberals and conservatives shared some political ground, the latter were usually the champions of order and stability, favoring gradual social change and the preservation of traditional hierarchies and privileges – including those historically enjoyed by the Catholic Church. Liberals, by contrast, favored a faster pace of change, the full protection of individual liberties, and the dismantling of the Church’s privileges and immunities. In Hispanic America, liberals and conservatives agreed on the need for a written constitution, the conventional nature of political authority, individual representation, and the separation of powers, among other ideas. In Brazil, the two political groups agreed on monarchical rule, though conservatives favored political centralism, the maintenance of oligarchical privilege, limited political participation, and also opposed the emancipation of slaves. By contrast, Brazilian liberals favored more provincial autonomy, political participation, religious freedom, secularization, and the end of slavery and of oligarchical privilege (Viotti da Costa 1986). Radical Brazilian liberals founded a republican party that called for the end of the monarchical system and the abolition of nobility titles.

In Hispanic America, what in particular was meant by “conservatism” varied across the region depending on what was politically at stake. In Chile, where the conservatives had been successful in maintaining order and economic prosperity (1831–1861), “conservatism” primarily meant authoritarian and centralized rule. Correspondingly, liberals pressed for the full protection of individual freedoms, parliamentary limits to executive power, and wider political participation. The 1833 Chilean conservative Constitution, which established a strong presidency, official religious intolerance, and a highly centralist system, remained in force for almost a full century and was often praised as a model for neighboring republics. Though Chilean liberals were anti-clerical while conservatives were not, the religious issue was not as divisive in view of the relative weakness of the Catholic Church. By contrast, in Colombia, where the Catholic Church had deeper roots, conservatism also meant, in addition to authoritarian and centralist rule, a strong pro-clericalism that advocated a central place for Catholicism and the Catholic Church in the republican order. Thus, the identity of Colombian liberals correspondingly centered on a combination of profound anti-clericalism with a defense of individual liberties and federalism. The Colombian 1853 liberal constitution abolished slavery and established religious freedom and the right to divorce. The more radical Rionegro constitution of 1863 confiscated Church property, established absolute freedom of the press, took federalism to the extreme (more so than any other constitution in the Americas; Bushnell 1993: 181), and limited the presidency to a two year term without the possibility of immediate reelection. Chilean liberals took control of government in 1870 and were able to deepen the process of secularization. By contrast, Colombian conservatives won out in 1885 and remained in power until 1930. The 1886 conservative Colombian constitution remained in force until 1991 with its strong centralism and privileging of the Catholic Church.

While all conservatives in Hispanic America favored a strong and centralized rule that could maintain peace and political stability, and also opposed the full protection of individual freedoms, they did not look back in nostalgia to the destroyed colonial and Catholic order, arguably with the exception of Lucas Alamán in Mexico who also favored a return to monarchism (Collier 2003: 123), Nor did they confer the Catholic church a central place in the new republican order, again with the exception of Alamán but also of Miguel Antonio Caro in Colombia, and Gabriel García Moreno in Ecuador. While the liberal forces of secularization had won out in most of the region by the end of the century, the confrontation between liberals and conservatives played out in Colombia until the end of the twentieth (Del Par 2010). Though the difference between liberals and conservatives was sometimes not clear cut, it has been maintained that the only issue that consistently placed them at opposite sides in Hispanic America was the religious one (Bushnell 1996, 288–289).

The religious problem in Hispanic America was, in some regions, primarily about religious toleration and individual rights, where the liberal position regarding religion centered on the demand for freedom of religious worship. This was the case in Argentina where the local Catholic Church was relatively weak. By contrast, in some other regions, such as Mexico or Colombia, where the church was much stronger, the religious problem was more complex and not merely a matter of individual rights insofar as the church was powerful enough to destabilize the new republican governments and to challenge their legitimacy. Where it had the power to do so, the church sought to mobilize the moral religious sensibilities of the majority of the population against the attempted liberal reforms. The church opposed civil equality in order to protect its own legal privileges and immunities, rejected the freedoms of thought and of the press as threats to religious morality and clerical authority, fought against economic reforms that endangered its position as the largest landowner and wealthiest corporation, favored a form of government that mirrored its own hierarchical structure (i.e., absolute monarchism), and sought to maintain official recognition and support by the state. The challenge posed by the church to the new liberal republics combined claims to political and economic power with the defense of morality and religion. In sum, the church opposed all aspects of liberal ideology in the name of the religion of the vast majority. By contrast with France at the time, liberal Catholicism did not develop in the Americas.

Though liberals and conservatives could agree on the need to protect freedom of religious worship, as sometimes they did, they held opposing views regarding the sorts of institutional supports, if any, that the State ought to provide to the dominant Catholic Church. Liberals favored the abolition of the church’s privileges and immunities in the name of legal equality, various degrees of exclusion of the church from official schooling, the establishment of a civil registry and civil matrimony, the possibility of divorce, and the secularization of hospitals and cemeteries. In the name of economic progress and freedom, liberals sometimes advocated the confiscation of church property not directly related to religious worship in order to make it available for in the market. In places where the conflict with the church was most profound liberals pushed for the complete separation between church and state as well as the “neutrality” of the state in religious matters. The latter meant that the state should not explicitly favor or disfavor religion as such. This liberal position, though clearly anti-clerical, did not necessarily entail hostility to religion. Though some liberals undoubtedly held anti-Catholic sentiments, the attack against the church was political insofar as it aimed to place the latter under the authority of the state. Conservatives, in turn, defended the privileges traditionally enjoyed by the church, which included establishment and the church’s alleged duty to spread religious morality through official schooling. They also opposed the confiscation of church property. Though some conservatives favored the church from authentic conviction (such as Miguel Antonio Caro in New Granada, the most prominent conservative intellectual there), many of them did so from instrumental considerations. Conservative politicians did not wish to antagonize what could be a useful ally in the maintenance of order. This pragmatic view was Diego Portales’, the architect of Chilean political stability (Collier 2003), and apparently also Lucas Alamán’s, who famously referred to Catholicism as “the only link that binds all Mexicans when all others have been broken” (Safford 1987: 100). In the long run, those regimes that contemporized with the church indeed proved to be more stable than the liberal ones that antagonized it.

6. Liberal Anti-Clericalism

The region where the confrontation between liberals and conservatives over the religious problem was most violent was Mexico, where the colonial church had been the most powerful. The first confrontation with the church took place in 1833, but the decisive blow to the church came with the “Reform Laws” in 1855–1863, which, among other measures, nationalized most of its property and established a separation between church and State. The political challenge that the church posed to the liberal regimes pushed some Mexican liberals to move beyond their constitutionalism and to press for social and economic reform. This was the case of José María Luis Mora (1794–1850), the most prominent Mexican liberal and whose liberal identity came to be centered on his anti-clericalism. He was a historian, politician, legislator, and a priest. His liberalism was strongly influenced by his admiration of the Cádiz constitution of 1812, the writings of Montesquieu and Constant, and by the course of political events that led him to assume anticlerical views. Mora began his career as a liberal intellectual as a partisan of constitutionalism. A constant theme in his writings is the defense of the “absolute” liberty of opinion and the criticism of any limits to freedom of the press. He argued that it is impossible to limit the freedom to think and to have opinions since men cannot divest themselves from their opinions through external force. Thus, he claimed, it is neither just nor convenient to prevent them from expressing their thoughts. The crucial point for public order, in his view, is that men observe the law regardless of the opinions that they may hold. He maintained that no principle of justice can ground the prohibition of doctrines considered false since men are fallible and the best or only means for arriving at knowledge of the truth is to subject doctrines to examination in a free discussion. The amendment of wrong opinions cannot be attained through prohibition but through the free circulation of ideas (Mora 1837: 491–5). Following Montesquieu, Mora placed great emphasis on the security of the person and affirmed the conception of civil freedom as the faculty of doing everything that the law does not expressly prohibit (Mora 1837: 504–6).

As an admirer of the Cadiz constitution, Mora espoused the idea of popular sovereignty but, following Constant, claimed that the latter was not unlimited. In his engagement with Rousseau, Constant had affirmed the notion of the general will as the source of legitimate political authority, but had denied the unlimited authority of society over the individual. According to Constant, individual rights are the limits that the political authority must not trespass. Mora warned that any unlimited authority was essentially tyrannical and, following Montesquieu, characterized despotism as the lawless, absolute, and unlimited use of political power regardless of the hands in which it falls and the particular form of government that it takes (Mora 1837: 475). According to Mora, individual rights and liberties limit the exercise of political power lest it become despotic. As was conventional wisdom in nineteenth century French liberalism, Mora argued for a franchise limited to proprietors who, in his view, were the only members of society capable of exerting an independent judgment, of displaying true civic virtues, and of caring for the public good (Mora 1837: 633–4). At the same time, however, he strove for the improvement of “the moral condition of popular classes” through various forms of education. However, Mora departed from the conventional wisdom of nineteenth century French liberalism in various ways. First, he rejected monarchism, continued to regard individual rights as natural, and subscribed to the doctrine of the social contract. He held that men’s purpose in establishing society is the preservation of their “liberty, security, equality and properties” (Mora 1837: 475). Second, Mora explicitly rejected Constant’s defense of a “conservative power”, which was one of the latter’s most popular conceptions in Latin America, though not among liberals (Mora 1837: 681). Constant had conceived of the constitutional monarch as a neutral power that could moderate conflicts among the executive, the legislative, and the judicial branches. As already mentioned, this notion was adopted by the Brazilian monarchy.

The third way in which Mora departed from French liberalism was his anticlericalism, which was motivated by local political events. Despite his admiration for the Cádiz constitution, Mora criticized the fact that it did not abolish the special privileges enjoyed by the military and the church. With respect to the latter in particular, Mora reacted against the church’s opposition to the establishment of republican values and came to regard it as a power capable of destabilizing the republic, to subvert its laws, and to turn the mass of the population against it (Mora 1837: 66). He regarded the church as having a esprit des corps that was opposed to both the national spirit and the representative system insofar as the church sought to maintain special privileges and immunities that were contrary to civil equality. He emphasized the church’s refusal to submit to civil and criminal law, its opposition to freedom of worship as well as to freedom of thought and of the press. On his view, the church opposed these freedoms because their exercise threatened the former’s rule over consciences. In the same vein, Mora regarded the church as an obstacle to public education insofar as education was instrumental to the masses’ emancipation from priestly power (Mora 1837: 63). He also considered the church as an obstacle to colonization of scarcely populated territories in virtue of its opposition to freedom of worship. He even criticized the clergy’s celibacy, which, on his view, isolates its members from society insofar as family ties are the “primary link that binds men to society” (Mora 1837: 61). Mora advocated the confiscation of the church’s property on the grounds that the clergy was not a productive class and lacked an inclination to industrious work. In Mexico, the church was indeed the wealthiest financial agent and the largest single proprietor in the nineteenth century until most of its property was nationalized in 1859.

Despite his multifaceted condemnation of the church, Mora’s anticlericalism did not entail hostility to religion. He held that the church should be free to devote itself to its spiritual mission since “religious beliefs and principles of conscience are man’s most sacred property considered as an individual” (Mora 1837: 74). His concern was to argue for the separation between the religious and the political “principles.” He maintained that the church should have no share in the exercise of political power, nor should it have any power to coerce citizens either in the form of forced economic contributions or punishments that are not solely spiritual. He warned that the religious principle degenerates when it is not kept separate from the political one. By contrast with the Argentinian Alberdi, who did not have to deal with a similarly powerful Catholic Church, Mora advocated a strong reformist state capable of curbing the opposition to liberal values by established social powers. According to Mora, a reformist state had to create the conditions for citizen’s freedom and equality. This was a position that was contrary to Alberdi’s commitment to more laissez faire liberalism.

Indeed, those countries in which liberalism became the dominant ideology in the late nineteenth century implemented secularizing reform laws that emancipated official institutions from control by the Catholic Church. Such reform laws created a civil registry, established civil matrimony and, in some cases, the possibility of divorce. Church property was often confiscated, convents and monasteries closed, and the Catholic Church’s legal immunities abolished. Central among such reforms was the secularization of official schooling, which became “laicist”. This process of secularization, along the lines suggested by Mora, took place comparatively early in Mexico (beginning in the 1850’s –after a failed attempt in the 1830’s) and Colombia (1850’s and 60’s). In both countries the process turned bitter and violent since the Church was powerful and was able to oppose resistance. The “laicist” State was consolidated in Mexico with the total defeat of the conservative pro-clerical adversaries, while in Colombia the secularizing reforms were almost fully reverted with the triumph of pro-clerical conservative “Regeneración” (1885–1904). During the 1870’s and 80’s similar processes of secularization took place in Venezuela and the Central American republics. Much less confrontational and violent were comparable changes in Chile, Argentina, and Uruguay in the 1880’s, and in later years in Ecuador, Bolivia, and Perú (where religious freedom was established only in 1915). The process in Brazil was rather different since the monarchy had maintained control over the Church through the patronage system (priests received State salaries and the monarch appointed clerical authorities, among other measures). The establishment of the republic in the late 1880’s, strongly influenced by positivism, brought with it full religious freedom and the separation of Church and State. With the exception Colombia, the liberal forces of secularization won out during this period displacing the Catholic Church from its traditional participation in the ruling of society through official political institutions.

7. The Influence of Positivism

In the closing decades of the nineteenth century, there took place a fusion of liberalism with positivism in some parts of Latin America. “Positivism” was the name for a scientific approach to the solution of social and political problems that was based on experience and observation. As developed by Auguste Comte in his Course of Positive Philosophy, positivism claimed that it was possible to uncover the laws of social phenomena and to organize society according to them. Comte’s thesis that it was possible to combine liberty with order and progress exerted great influence in Latin America along with Herbert Spencer’s evolutionism. While some liberals, such as Victorino Lastarria in Chile, sought to reconcile individual freedom with positivist philosophy, some others, such as Justo Sierra in Mexico, frankly subordinated individual liberty to the maintenance of social order. Comtean philosophy was most influential in the field of higher education, where social reformers introduced new curricula that privileged the study of the empirical sciences. Such innovations were intended for the education of the elites. Educators believed, following Comte, that the key to ending social disorder was mental order: education was instrumental to ending mental anarchy by emancipating individuals from prejudice and introducing them to “a common reservoir of truths” (Zea 1968: 125). However, Hispanic American educators inspired by Comte did not embrace his religion of humanity. The latter had the greatest impact in Brazil, where positivism displaced liberalism.

José Victorino Lastarria (1817–1888) was the most prominent Chilean liberal intellectual in the nineteenth century. He was a lawyer, a public intellectual, a central literary figure, and a politician who held official positions. His thinking was importantly influenced by John Stuart Mill’s rendering of positivist philosophy in his Auguste Comte and Positivism, and by Émile Littré, who popularized Comte’s positivism. Along with Federico Errazuriz, Lastarria wrote the “Basis for Reform” (1850), which is a liberal manifesto containing the much desired reforms to the conservative Chilean constitution of 1833. Above all, they demanded the protection of individual liberties and limits to the executive power but did not call for universal male suffrage. Instead, this liberal program endorsed literacy requirements for voting. When liberals came to power in 1861 they took the path of constitutional reform instead of drafting a new constitution. As has been noted, Chilean liberals privileged the way of reform, as opposed to revolution, to press for their own political ends (Jaksic and Serrano 2011, Jocelyn-Holt 1998).

Lastarria’s most important theoretical work is Lessons in Positivist Politics (Lecciones de política positiva) published in 1875. The influence of positivism is manifest in this work. By contrast with Comte, however, Lastarria was a thorough individualist who extolled the perfection of the individual and the value of individual liberty. He refused to subordinate individual liberty to social order and maintained throughout his political writings that society should protect the full exercise of individual liberty. The central idea that Lastarria took from Comte is the thesis that modern societies need to be guided by experience and scientific observation. According to this, politics must be an experimental science based on experience and observation, which are the only solid basis for social organization. Following Comte, Lastarria maintained that it is possible to comprehend society’s progressive movement by uncovering the laws that govern social phenomena. On his view, in order to examine a particular form of social organization, it is necessary first to determine the laws that govern humanity’s progress. The most fundamental law that Lastarria identifies and that, according to him, impulses humanity forward, is “moral liberty”: the tendency to augment and develop all of our faculties (Lecciones, 3rd Lesson). Social progress, on his view, is a product of this development. This is a perfectionist conception of the human person according to which perfection is not only an individual end but also the most important social end.

Lastarria conceived of his own epoch as one of painful transition towards the triumph of liberty. Following Comte, he subscribed to the view that society progresses through three stages: theological, metaphysical, and positive. At the theological stage, society is subject to the authority of spiritual dogmas and is governed by force. According to him, this is the most vicious state because it is contrary to man’s moral nature and stops social development. He associates the metaphysical stage with the French spirit and criticizes it for its anarchy and confusion. In particular, Lastarria criticizes the revolutionary conception of liberty as popular sovereignty which he regards as an absolute power incompatible with the rights of man, properly understood. The attack against the old theological order and the anarchy in the ideas characterize the epoch of transition towards a third, positive, stage. He identifies the latter as “liberal” insofar as it is founded on human liberty, which, on his view, is ideally exercised in what he calls “semecracia” (self-government). By the latter he not only means individual self-government but also government of the people by the people, which he saw realized in the North American republic that he greatly admired.

Lastarria maintained that liberty consists in the exercise of various rights: the right to make decisions about one’s own person (personal liberty), the right to exercise one’s own intelligence and to examine received beliefs, the right to work and to acquire property, the right to associate with others, and the right to demand equality before the law (Lecciones, 5th Lesson). He was particularly concerned with freedom of religious worship. He held religion to be a fundamental idea in society but also an intimate and private one. Following the example of North America, he advocated the separation of church and State both in order to maintain the independence of the church in the carrying out of its spiritual mission and the neutrality of the State with respect to religious dogma. As many other Hispanic American liberals, Lastarria established a connection between freedom of thought and freedom of teaching: on his view, just as the State should abstain from favoring any religious doctrine in particular, the State should also refrain from imposing any political doctrine through official schooling. Though this view pushes towards the disappearance of official schooling, he granted that the State had a duty to finance basic schooling but should leave all other instruction in private hands.

Lastarria’s individualism was an exception among those Hispanic American liberals who subscribed to positivist philosophy. The latter came to see society as an organism, of which the individual is a part, subject to fixed laws that determine its development. In their defense of a scientific approach to social problems that was based on observation and experience, they claimed that law had to be adjusted to social reality, not the other way around. They thus rejected the “utopias” of earlier liberals and came to regard the “old” defense of natural rights and popular sovereignty as metaphysical abstractions that were out of touch with reality. In the extreme, positivist liberals sided with the defense of authoritarian governments in the name of order and progress. In Mexico, positivist philosophy became the official creed of the governing elite, the so called “scientists”, who did not repudiate their liberal credentials. Their positivist version of liberalism, which they called “conservative” liberalism, served as the ideological framework for the justification of dictatorial rule. In Brazil, by contrast, positivism displaced liberalism as the ideology of the ruling elite with the fall of the monarchy and the advent of the republic in 1889 through a military coup. As has been maintained, Brazilian republicans, in their attacks to the oligarchy and distrust of the masses, were attracted to the positivist idea that scientifically grounded social reform had to be carried out by a technocratic elite (Krebs 2002: 269).

8. The Decline of Liberalism, its alleged failure, and contemporary conceptual debates

After having been the triumphant ideology of nation building in most of Latin America in the late nineteenth century and early twentieth, liberalism entered a phase of decline. In most of the region the liberal political and economic order was made unstable by social movements that contested the oligarchical nature of the regimes and pressed for both democratization and the inclusion of the masses in the benefits of economic growth. For reasons having to do with each particular national context, critics objected that the sought after transformation of Latin American societies in light of liberal ideas and values had been a failure. Where the liberal order had led to authoritarian regimes, as in Venezuela and Mexico, critics maintained that liberalism had proved inadequate for these societies. In Mexico, this skepticism emerged from within the liberal establishment itself (Rabasa 1912). In Venezuela, the positivist sociologist Laureano Vallenilla famously argued that authoritarian forms of governance were more suitable for Hispanic American societies (Vallenilla 1919). In Chile, the liberal parliamentarian regime that had successfully limited executive power in the 1870’s and 80’s was gradually eroded and finally displaced by a new presidentialism in the 1920’s. Chilean liberal parliamentarism proved unable to manage social unrest and criticism (Correa Sutil 2004 & 2008). There began a new conservative narrative that glorified the authoritarian regimes of the 1830’s and served to legitimize authoritarian rule (Edwards 1928). In Argentina, the liberal oligarchical regime was displaced in elections in which universal male suffrage was mandatory for the first time. The Brazilian republic, which had been established through a military coup, was in turn overthrown by another military coup and replaced with a dictatorship in the 1930s. By midcentury, corporativisms of various sorts as well as socialist, Marxist, indigenous, agrarian, and populist political movements and ideologies had become dominant and displaced liberalism in the region.

The idea view that liberal reformers had failed because liberal ideas were “imported” and not adequate for Latin American societies has not ceased to occupy interpreters ever since (a discussion is in Hale 1984). A notable exception to this dominant view is the reconstruction, by an official ideologue, of Mexican liberalism as the official and triumphant ideology of the political regimes emanated from the 1910 revolution (Reyes Heroles 1957). However, there is currently a growing tendency to abandon the “failure” view of liberalism and to focus on the reconstruction of what nineteenth century liberals aimed and accomplished, as a recent collection of essays shows (Jaksic and Posada Carbó 2011b). Scholars have engaged in conceptual debates regarding the adequate framework for a more sympathetic and accurate reconstruction of intellectual political history. The starting point has been the criticism of the “traditional history of ideas” that allegedly presumed political ideas to have a definite content subject to little, if any, historical change (Detailed discussions are in Palti 2005 & 2007, Linares Londoño 2021). On this “traditional” view, which is usually attributed to intellectual historian Leopoldo Zea, liberalism was some sort of political “model” originated in Europe and Anglo North America that was transplanted and adapted to Latin American societies, which were, the view goes, unsuitable (Escalante 1992, Montalvo Ortega 1995). Whatever resulted in this “adaptation”, this traditional view continues, was a “deviation” from the original model. As a commentator puts it in a recent work when presenting this view: “the importance of studying Latin American ideas does not lie in their contribution to western thought but in the ‘mistakes’ that the former contain in relation to the latter, that is, in the refractions or deviations that Latin American national circumstances impressed on the original ideas” (Linares Londoño 2021: 47). The traditional history of ideas, thus understood, would make at least three mistaken assumptions: First, that the meaning of liberalism can be established conceptually, apart from the historically changing conditions in which the notion has been deployed; second, that liberal Latin American political actors sought to “apply” this already complete model of liberalism to their own societies; and third, that to understand Latin American liberalism is primarily to trace its intellectual sources or “influences” in European and Anglo North American liberal authors and political movements.

Scholars who have sought to distance themselves from the traditional history of ideas thus understood have been motivated by various theoretical concerns. Some political theorists have attempted to show that Latin American liberals were not mere “imitators” engaged in the application of foreign models but also did produce “original” ideas that are relevant to “western thought” (Aguilar 2000 & 2010). Intellectual historians, on the other hand, have been motivated to avoid anachronisms that inevitable arise when current definitions are assumed in the reconstruction of past political thought and movements (Palti 2005 & 2007). They have also been reluctant to impose preconceived theoretical dichotomies in carrying out this reconstruction, such as tradition/modernity and organicism/individualism, and to avoid teleological approaches that regard history as pointing towards the triumph of liberalism. Instead, intellectual historians have attempted to offer sympathetic reconstructions that seek to capture what intellectuals and political actors meant (explicitly or implicitly) when they advocated or criticized liberal ideas and institutions. There has been a growing interest to seek to understand what nineteenth century liberal political actors and intellectuals meant when they affirmed a liberal view or other in the particular circumstances in which they did so. Some authors have purported to engage in professional history distancing themselves from national ideologies and political mythologies (Hale 1968 & 1989). Others have engaged in constitutional history for the sake of comparative analysis (Gargarella 2010 & 2013). Intellectual historians have engaged in debates regarding what should be the subject matter in this reconstruction, whether the uses of the term “liberal”, the concept of “liberalism” regardless of the terminology that political actors and movements in fact employed (Fernández Sebastián 2009), or the political languages in which they articulated their own views (Palti 2007 & 2007).

These multiple approaches have called into question the historical stability of what we mean by “liberalism” and have raised the issue whether anything that political actors and intellectuals called “liberal” can rightfully be considered as such for scholarly purposes. Some have resisted this conclusion and insisted on the need for a prior definition of liberalism in order to properly identify the subject matter of reconstruction (Aguilar 2000 & 2010, Gargarella 2010 & 2013). On approaches of this sort, definitions of “liberalism” are taken from twentieth or twenty-first century authors and applied retrospectively to discern what can rightfully be considered “liberal” and what not in nineteenth century Latin America. From this perspective, whatever does not fit the preferred definitions readily falls out of view, such as liberal social and economic reformism. Unsurprisingly, the failure view has to a great extent been nurtured by this kind of approach (Escalante 1992). In general, historians have been more willing than political theorists and philosophers to take as bona fide “liberal” positions whatever political actors and intellectuals claimed to be so. Some historians have assumed rather wide understandings of liberalism (Collier 2003), and have called to free the discipline from the grip of the failure view (Hale 1989).

The late twentieth and early twenty-first centuries have seen a modest revival of a liberal political discourse that is partly due to the decline of socialist and Marxist political movements and ideologies. Two salient instances of this revival in political discourse are the recognition of the pluralism of forms of life and the demands for protection of the rights of minorities. In the sphere of academia, many scholars have enthusiastically welcomed the influence of Anglo-American contemporary liberalism. The works by John Rawls, Ronald Dworkin, Joseph Raz, and many others have received much attention and have been amply discussed in academic publications. It is interesting to notice, however, that there is a sharp separation between the reconstruction of nineteenth century Latin American liberalism, which largely continues to be the province of historians, on the one hand, and systematic reflection on liberal ideas and values by professional philosophers and political theorists, on the other. Little effort has been made to relate current work on liberal ideas and values inspired by Anglo-American authors to the nineteenth century Latin American tradition.


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