Logic and Artificial Intelligence

First published Wed Aug 27, 2003; substantive revision Fri Nov 2, 2018

Artificial Intelligence (referred to hereafter by its nickname, “AI”) is the subfield of Computer Science devoted to developing programs that enable computers to display behavior that can (broadly) be characterized as intelligent.[1] Most research in AI is devoted to fairly narrow applications, such as planning or speech-to-speech translation in limited, well defined task domains. But substantial interest remains in the long-range goal of building generally intelligent, autonomous agents,[2] even if the goal of fully human-like intelligence is elusive and is seldom pursued explicitly and as such.

Throughout its relatively short history, AI has been heavily influenced by logical ideas. AI has drawn on many research methodologies: the value and relative importance of logical formalisms is questioned by some leading practitioners, and has been debated in the literature from time to time.[3] But most members of the AI community would agree that logic has an important role to play in at least some central areas of AI research, and an influential minority considers logic to be the most important factor in enabling strategic, fundamental advances.

The relations between AI and philosophical logic are part of a larger story. It is hard to find a major philosophical theme that doesn’t become entangled with issues having to do with reasoning. Implicatures, for instance, have to correspond to inferences that can be carried out by a rational interpreter of discourse. Whatever causality is, causal relations should be inferrable in everyday common sense settings. Whatever belief is, it should be possible for rational agents to make plausible inferences about the beliefs of other agents. The goals and standing constraints that inform a rational agent’s behavior must permit the formation of reasonable plans.

In each of these cases, compatibility with an acceptable account of the relevant reasoning is essential for a successful philosophical theory. But the methods in the contemporary philosophical inventory are too crude to provide anything like an adequate account of reasoning that is this complex and this entangled in broad world knowledge.

Bringing an eclectic set of conceptual tools to the problem of idealized reasoning in realistic settings, and using computers to model and test the theories, research in AI has transformed the study of reasoning—especially of practical, common sense reasoning. This process and its outcome is well documented in Russell & Norvig 2010.

The new insights and theories that have emerged from AI are of great potential value in informing and constraining many areas of philosophical inquiry. The special case of philosophical logic that forms the theme of this article may provide support for the more general point. Although logic in AI grew out of philosophical logic, in its new setting it has produced new theories and ambitious programs that would not have been possible outside of a community devoted to building full-scale computational models of rational agency.

This entry assumes an audience consisting primarily of philosophers who have little or no familiarity with AI. The entry concentrates on the issues that arise when logic is used in understanding problems in intelligent reasoning and guiding the design of mechanized reasoning systems. Logic in AI is by now a very large and not very well demarcated field—nothing like complete coverage has been achieved here. Sections 3 and Section 4 provide an overview with some historical and technical details concerning nonmonotonic logic and reasoning about action and change, a topic that is not only central in AI but that should be of considerable interest to philosophers. The remaining sections provide brief and more or less inadequate sketches of selected topics, with references to the primary literature.

Minker 2000b is a comprehensive collection of survey papers and original contributions to the field of logic-based AI, with extensive references to the literature. Jack Minker’s introduction, Minker 2000a, is a useful orientation to the field. This volume is a good beginning point for readers who wish to pursue this topic further. Brachman & Levesque 2004a provides an introduction to the field of knowledge representation in textbook form. Davis 1991a and Mueller 2006a are book-length treatments of the challenging problem of formalizing commonsense reasoning. Antonelli 2012a is a good entry point for readers interested in nonmonotonic logic, and Shanahan 2009a is a useful discussion of the frame problem. Wooldridge 2000a deals with logical formalizations of rational agents.

Contents of this entry:

1. Logic and Artificial Intelligence

1.1 The Role of Logic in Artificial Intelligence

Theoretical computer science developed out of logic, the theory of computation (if this is to be considered a different subject from logic), and some related areas of mathematics.[4] So theoretically minded computer scientists are well informed about logic even when they aren’t logicians. Computer scientists in general are familiar with the idea that logic provides techniques for analyzing the inferential properties of languages, and with the distinction between a high-level logical analysis of a reasoning problem and its implementations. Logic, for instance, can provide a specification for a programming language by characterizing a mapping from programs to the computations that they license. A compiler that implements the language can be incomplete, or even unsound, as long as in some sense it approximates the logical specification. This makes it possible for the involvement of logic in AI applications to vary from relatively weak uses in which the logic informs the implementation process with analytic insights, to strong uses in which the implementation algorithm can be shown to be sound and complete. In some cases, a working system is inspired by ideas from logic and then acquires features that at first seem logically problematic but can later be explained by developing new ideas in logical theory. This sort of thing has happened, for instance, in logic programming.

In particular, logical theories in AI are independent from implementations. They can be used to provide insights into the reasoning problem without directly informing the implementation. Direct implementations of ideas from logic—theorem-proving and model-construction techniques—are used in AI, but the AI theorists who rely on logic to model their problem areas are free to use other implementation techniques as well. Thus, in Moore 1995b (Chapter 1), Robert C. Moore distinguishes three uses of logic in AI; as a tool of analysis, as a basis for knowledge representation, and as a programming language.

A large part of the effort of developing limited-objective reasoning systems goes into the management of large, complex bodies of declarative information. It is generally recognized in AI that it is important to treat the representation of this information, and the reasoning that goes along with it, as a separate task, with its own research problems.

The evolution of expert systems illustrates the point. The earliest expert systems, such as MYCIN (a program that reasons about bacterial infections, see Buchanan & Shortliffe 1984), were based entirely on large systems of procedural rules, with no separate representation of the background knowledge—for instance, the taxonomy of the infectious organisms about which the system reasoned was not represented.

Later generation expert systems show a greater modularity in their design. A separate knowledge representation component is useful for software engineering purposes—it is much better to have a single representation of a general fact that can have many different uses, since this makes the system easier to develop and to modify. And this design turns out to be essential in enabling these systems to deliver explanations as well as mere conclusions.[5]

1.2 Knowledge Representation

In response to the need to design this declarative component, a subfield of AI known as knowledge representation emerged during the 1980s. Knowledge representation deals primarily with the representational and reasoning challenges of this separate component. The best place to get a feel for this subject is the proceedings of the meetings that are now held every other year: see Brachman et al. 1989, Allen et al. 1991, Nebel et al. 1992, Doyle et al. 1994, Aiello et al. 1996, Cohn et al. 1998, Cohn et al. 2000, Fensel et al. 2002, Dubois et al. 2004, Doherty et al. 2006, Brewka & Lang 2008, Lin et al. 2010, Eiter et al. 2012, Baral et al. 2012, and Baral et al. 2016.

Typical articles in the proceedings of the KR and Reasoning conferences deal with the following topics.

  1. Topics in logical theory and the theory of computation, including
    1. Nonmonotonic logic
    2. Complexity theory
  2. Studies in application areas, including
    1. Temporal reasoning
    2. Formalisms for reasoning about planning, action and change, and causality
    3. Metareasoning
    4. Reasoning about context
    5. Reasoning about values and desires
    6. Reasoning about the mental states of other agents, and especially about knowledge and belief
    7. Spatial reasoning
    8. Reasoning about vagueness
  3. Argumentation and argumentation theory
  4. Aggregation problems of many kinds, such as the integration of conflicting knowledge sources
  5. Studies in application techniques, including
    1. Logic programming
    2. Description logics
    3. Theorem proving
    4. Model construction
  6. Studies of large-scale applications, including
    1. Cognitive robotics
    2. Merging, updating, and correcting knowledge bases

These topics hardly overlap at all with the contents of the Journal of Symbolic Logic, the principal research archive for mathematical logic. But there is substantial overlap in theoretical emphasis with The Journal of Philosophical Logic, where topics such as tense logic, epistemic logic, logical approaches to practical reasoning, belief change, and vagueness account for a large percentage of the contributions. Very few JPL publications, however, deal with complexity theory or with potential applications to automated reasoning.

1.3 Philosophical Logic

A history of philosophical logic is yet to be written. Though philosophical logic has traditionally been distinguised from mathematical logic, the distinction may well be incidental in relation to the overall goals of the subject, since technical rigor and the use of mathematical methods seem to be essential in all areas of logical research. However, the distinction between the two subfields has been magnified by differences in the sorts of professional training that are available to logicians, and by the views of individuals on what is important for the field.

The statement of policy presented in Journal of Symbolic Logic (1936, Volume 1, No. 1) lists bringing together the mathematicians and philosophers working in logic among the goals of the new journal. Probably at this time both the mathematicians and the philosophers shared a sense that their subject was considered to be somewhat marginal by their colleagues, and may have felt a primary loyalty to logic as a subject rather than to any academic discipline. Articles in the first volume of the JSL were divided about equally between professional mathematicians and philosophers, and the early volumes of the JSL do not show any strong differences between the two groups as to topic.

This situation changed in the 1960s. The 1969 volume of the JSL contained 39 articles by mathematicians, and only nine by philosophers. By the early 1970s, many philosophers felt that philosophical papers on logic were unlikely to be accepted by the JSL, and that if they were accepted they were unlikely to be read by philosophers. At this point, the goals of the two groups had diverged considerably. Mathematicians were pursuing the development of an increasingly technical and complex body of methods and theorems. Many philosophers felt that this pursuit was increasingly irrelevant to the goal of illuminating philosophical issues. These divisions led to the founding of the Journal of Philosophical Logic in 1972. The list of sample topics in the first issue included:

  1. Contributions to branches of logical theory directly related to philosophical concerns, such as inductive logic, modal logic, deontic logic, quantum logic, tense logic, free logic, logic of questions, logic of commands, logic of preference, logic of conditionals, many-valued logic, relevance logics;
  2. Contributions to philosophical discussions that utilize the machinery of formal logic …;
  3. Discussions of philosophical issues relating to logic and the logical structure of language, …;
  4. Philosophical work relating to the special sciences, ….

Most of the articles over the subsequent 28 years of the JPL belong to the first of these four categories. But the description with which this list begins is not particularly illuminating: why should these particular topics be of interest to philosophers? Their most important shared feature is a sense that despite successes in formalizing areas of mathematical logic, the scope of logic remained severely limited. There are unsolved problems in formalizing the nonmathematical sciences that seem to require thinking through new and different logical issues (quantum logic and the logic of induction, for instance). The remaining topics cover a part, at least, of the even more pressing problems involved in extending logical theory to nonscientific reasoning. The dominant goal, then, of philosophical logic is the extension of logical methods to nonmathematical reasoning domains. This goal has a theoretical dimension if (as many philosophical logicians seem to feel) it requires reworking and extending logical formalisms.

The development and testing of applications, such as the problem of formalizing the reasoning involved in getting to the airport, posed as a challenge in McCarthy 1959 (see Section 2.2, below), doesn’t even appear as a category in the list of JPL topics, and in fact most of the philosophical logic literature is theoretical in nature, and is tested using philosophical techniques. Essentially, this means that the theories are motivated and tested with small-scale, artificial examples, selected by the theoreticians. These examples usually serve more as demonstrations or illustrations than as tests.

1.4 Logic in AI and Philosophical Logic

The rough comparison in Section 1.2 of the contents of the main publications for research in logical AI and philosophical logic suggests the following picture. Theoretical work in logical AI and in philosophical logic overlap to a large extent. Both are interested in developing nonmetamathematical applications of logic, and the core topics are very similar. This overlap is due not only to commonality of interest, but to direct influence of philosophical logic on logical AI; there is ample evidence, as we will see, that the first generation at least of AI logicists read and were influenced by the literature in philosophical logic.

Since that point, the specialties have diverged. New logical theories have emerged in logical AI (nonmonotonic logic is the most important example) which are not widely known in philosophical logic. Other differences are due to the AI community’s interest in the theoretical analysis of algorithms and, of course, with their sense of the importance of implementations. Some have to do with the emerging development in computer science of ambitious applications using unprecedentedly large bodies of logical axioms. The sheer size of these applications produces new problems and new methodologies. And other differences originate in the interest of philosophical logicians in some topics (metaphysical topics, for instance) that are primarily inspired by purely philosophical considerations.

Concern for applications can be a great influence on how research is carried out and presented. The tradition in philosophical logic predates applications in automated reasoning, and to this day remains relatively uninterested in such applications. The methodology depends on intuitions, but without any generally accepted methodology for articulating and deploying these intuitions. And the ideas are illustrated and informed by artificial, small-scale examples.[6] In general, the philosophical literature does not deal with implementability or efficiency of the reasoning, or indeed with any features of the reasoning process. And it is hard to find cases in which the philosophical theories are illustrated or tested with realistic, large-scale reasoning problems.

These differences, however, are much more a matter of style than of substance or of strategic research goals. It is difficult to think through the details of the reasoning process without the computational tools to make the process concrete, and difficult to develop large-scale formalizations of reasoning problems without computational tools for entering, testing, and maintaining the formalizations. Because the core theoretical topics (modal, conditional and temporal logic, belief revision, and the logic of context) are so similar, and because the ultimate goal (the formalization of nonmathematical reasoning) is the same, one can see logic in AI as a continuous extension of the philosophical logic tradition.

The early influence of philosophical logic on logic in AI was profound. The bibliography of McCarthy & Hayes 1969, one of the most influential early papers in logical AI, illustrates the point well. There are 58 citations in the bibliography. Of these, 35 refer to the philosophical logic literature. (There are 17 computer science citations, one mathematical logic citation, one economics citation, and one psychology citation.) This paper was written at a time when there were hardly any references to logical AI in the computer science literature. Naturally, as logical AI has matured and developed as a branch of computer science, the proportion of cross-disciplinary citations has decreased. A sampling of articles from the first Knowledge Representation conference, Brachman et al. 1989, held in 1989, shows only 12 philosophical logic citations out of a total of 522 sampled citations; a sampling of articles from Cohn et al. 1998, held in 1998, shows 23 philosophical logic citations out of a total of 468 sampled.[7]

Despite the dramatic decrease in quantity of explicit citations, the contemporary literature in logical AI reflects an indirect acquaintance with the earlier literature in philosophical logic, since many of the computational papers that are explicitly cited in the modern works were influenced by this literature. Of course, the influence becomes increasingly distant as time passes, and this trend is accelerated by the fact that new theoretical topics have been invented in logical AI that were at best only dimly prefigured in the philosophical literature.

Although philosophical logic is now a relatively small field in comparison to logical AI, it remains a viable area of research, with new work appearing regularly. But references to contemporary research in philosophical logic are rare in the AI literature. Similarly, the papers currently published in The Journal of Philosophical Logic, at least, do not show much influence from AI.[8] In Europe, the lines are harder to draw between professional divisions among logicians: some European journals, especially the Journal of Logic, Language, and Information, are successful in maintaining a focus in logic while attracting authors from all the disciplines in which logic is represented.

1.5 The Role of Artificial Intelligence in Logic

The importance of applications in logical AI, and the scale of these applications, represents a new methodology for logic—one that would have been impossible without mechanized reasoning. This methodology forces theoreticians to think through problems on a new scale and at a new level of detail, and this in turn has a profound effect on the resulting theories. The effects of this methodology will be illustrated in the sections below, dealing with various topics in logical AI. But the point is illustrated well by reasoning about action and change. This topic was investigated in the philosophical literature. Reasoning about change, at least, is part of tense logic, and the consequences of action are investigated in the literature on “seeing to it that”; see, for instance, Belnap 1996. The latter theory has no very robust account of action. The central construct is a variation on a branching-time modality of the sort that has been familiar since Prior 1967. Although it represents an interesting development in philosophical logic, the scale of the accomplishment is very different from the research tradition in logical AI reported in Section 4, below. The formalisms in this tradition not only support the formalization of complex, realistic planning problems, but provide entirely new insights into reasoning about the causal effects of actions, the persistence of states, and the interactions between actions and continuous physical processes. Developments such as this would have been impossible without the interactions between the logical theories and large-scale, practical applications in automated planning.

In Carnap 1955, Rudolf Carnap attempted to clarify intensional analyses of linguistic meaning, and to justify from a methodological point of view, by imagining how the analysis could be applied to the linguistic usage of a hypothetical robot. Carnap hoped that the fact that we could imagine ourselves to know the internal structure of the robot would help to make the case for an empirical science of semantics more plausible. This hope proved to be unjustified; the philosophical issue that concerned Carnap remains controversial to this day, and thought experiments with robots have not proved to be particularly rewarding in addressing it. Real robots, though, with real applications,[9] are a very different matter. Though it is hard to tell whether they will prove to be helpful in clarifying fundamental philosophical problems, they provide a laboratory for logic that is revolutionary in its potential impact on the subject. They motivate the development of entirely new logical theories that should prove to be as important for philosophy as the fundamental developments in logic of the late nineteenth century proved to be.

The emergence of separate mathematical and philosophical subspecialties within logic was not an entirely healthy thing for the field. The process of making mathematical logic rigorous and of demonstrating the usefulness of the techniques in achieving mathematical ends that was pursued so successfully in the first half of the twentieth century represents a coherent refinement of logical methodology. All logicians should be pleased and proud that logic is now an area with a body of results and problems that is as substantial and challenging as those associated with most areas of mathematics.

But these methodological advances were gained at the expense of coverage. In the final analysis, logic deals with reasoning—and relatively little of the reasoning we do is mathematical, while almost all of the mathematical reasoning that nonmathematicians do is mere calculation. To have both rigor and scope, logic needs to keep its mathematical and its philosophical side united in a single discipline. In recent years, neither the mathematical nor the philosophical professions—and this is especially true in the United States—have done a great deal to promote this unity. But the needs of Computer Science provide strong unifying motives. The professional standards for logical research in Computer Science certainly require rigor, but the field also puts its practitioners into contact with reasoning domains that are not strictly mathematical, and creates needs for innovative logical theorizing.

The most innovative and ambitious area of Computer Science, in terms of its coverage of reasoning, and the one that is closest in spirit to philosophical logic, is AI. This article will attempt to provide an introduction, for outsiders who are familiar with logic, to the aspects of AI that are closest to the philosophical logic tradition. This area of logic deserves, and urgently needs, to be studied by historians. But such a study will not be found here.

2. John McCarthy and Common Sense Logicism[10]

2.1 Logical AI

The most influential figure in logical AI is John McCarthy. McCarthy was one of the founders of AI, and consistently advocated a research methodology that uses logical techniques to formalize the reasoning problems that AI needs to solve. All but the most recent work in McCarthy’s research program can be found in Lifschitz 1990a, which also contains an introduction to McCarthy’s work Lifschitz 1990b; for additional historical background, see Israel 1991.

McCarthy’s methodological position has not changed substantially since it was first articulated in McCarthy 1959 and elaborated and amended in McCarthy & Hayes 1969. The motivation for using logic is that—even if the eventual implementations do not directly and simply use logical reasoning techniques like theorem proving—a logical formalization helps us to understand the reasoning problem itself. The claim is that without an understanding of what the reasoning problems are, it will not be possible to implement their solutions. Plausible as this Platonic argument may seem, it is in fact controversial in the context of AI; an alternative methodology would seek to learn or evolve the desired behaviors. The representations and reasoning that this methodology would produce might well be too complex to characterize or to understand at a conceptual level.

From McCarthy & Hayes 1969, it is clear that McCarthy thought of his methodology for AI as overlapping to a large extent with traditional philosophy, but adding to it the need to inform the design of programs capable of manifesting general intelligence. This idea is not uncongenial to some philosophers (see, for instance, Carnap 1956 (pp. 244–247) and Pollock 1995). In practice, the actual theories that have emerged from McCarthy’s methodology are influenced most strongly by work in philosophical logic, and the research tradition in logical AI represents a more or less direct development of this work, with some changes in emphasis. This review will concentrate on logical AI in relation to philosophical logic, without further comment on relations to philosophy in general or to the feasibility of developing human-level intelligent systems.

2.2 The Formalization of Common Sense

McCarthy’s long-term objective was to formalize common sense reasoning, the prescientific reasoning that is used in dealing with everyday problems. An early example of such a problem, mentioned in McCarthy 1959, is getting from home to the airport. Other examples include:

  1. Narrative understanding. The reasoning involved in reconstructing implicit information from narratives, such as sequencing of eventualities, and inferred causal connections.
  2. Diagnosis. For instance, detecting faults in physical devices.
  3. Spatial Reasoning. For instance, reasoning about the parts of rigid bodies and their shapes, and their relation to the shape of the whole.
  4. Reasoning about the attitudes of other agents. For instance, making informed guesses about the beliefs and desires of other agents, not from “keyhole observation” but from conversational clues of the sort that could be obtained in a brief, interactive interview.

Stated baldly, the goal of formalizing common sense would probably seem outrageous to most philosophers, who are trained to think of common sense as rather elusive. But whether or not the ultimate goal is appropriate and achievable, the specific formalization projects that have emerged from this program have been successful in several ways. They have succeeded in breaking new territory for logic by extending the scope of the reasoning problems to which logical techniques can be successfully applied. They have demonstrated that logical techniques can contribute usefully to the solution of specific AI problems—planning is the most successful of these, but some success has been achieved in other areas as well.[11] They form the basis of one approach to developing complete, autonomous agents.[12] And they have illuminated many specific forms of nonscientific reasoning—for instance, qualitative reasoning about the behavior of physical devices.[13]

Although McCarthy has advocated this program of formalization since 1959—an almost prehistorical date for AI—the program has not been taken on board and pursued by a dedicated community until recently. Research in this area has gained much momentum since 1990. For further discussion and details, see Section 8.

3. Nonmonotonic Reasoning and Nonmonotonic Logics

3.1 Nonmonotonicity

Aristotle believed that most reasoning, including reasoning about what to do and about sublunary natural phenomena, dealt with things that hold “always or for the most part.” But Aristotelian logic deals only with patterns of inference that hold without exception. We find at the very beginning of logic a discrepancy between the scope of logical theory and common sense reasoning. Nonmonotonic logic is the first sustained attempt within logical theory to remedy this discrepancy. As such, it represents a potential for a sweeping expansion of the scope of logic, as well as a significant body of technical results.

The consequence relations of classical logics are monotonic. That is, if a set Γ of formulas implies a consequence C then a larger set Γ ∪ A will also imply C. A logic is nonmonotonic if its consequence relation lacks this property. Preferred models provide a general way to induce a nonmonotonic consequence relation. Invoke a function that for each Γ produces a subset MΓ of the models of Γ; in general, we will expect MΓ to be a proper subset of these models. We then say that Γ implies C if C is satisfied by every model in MΓ. As long as we do not suppose that MΓ∪{A}MΓ, we can easily have an implication relation between Γ and C without imposing this relation on supersets of Γ.[14]

This model theoretic behavior corresponds to expectation-guided reasoning, where the expectations allow certain cases to be neglected. Here is an important difference between common sense and mathematics. Mathematicians are trained to reject a proof by cases unless the cases exhaust all the possibilities; but typical instances of common sense reasoning neglect some alternatives. In fact, it is reasonable to routinely ignore improbable possibilities. Standing in a kitchen in California, wondering if there is time to wash the dishes before leaving for work, one might not take the possibility of an earthquake into account.

There seem to be many legitimate reasons for neglecting certain cases in common sense reasoning. A qualitative judgment that the probability of a case is negligible is one reason. But, for instance, in a planning context it may be reasonable to ignore even nonnegligible probabilities, as long as there is no practical point in planning on these cases.

The motivations for nonmonotonicity seem to involve a number of complex factors; probability (perhaps in some qualitative sense), normality, expectations that are reasonable in the sense that one can’t be reasonably blamed for having them, mutual acceptance, and factors having to do with limited rationality. It may well be that no one has succeeded in disentangling and clarifying these motivating considerations. In the early stages of its emergence in logical AI, many researchers seem to have thought of nonmonotonic reasoning as a general method for reasoning about uncertainty; but by the end of the 1980s, implementations of fully quantitative probabilistic reasoning were not only possible in principle, but were clearly preferable in many sorts of applications to methods involving nonmonotonic logic. A plausible and realistic rationale for nonmonotonic logic has to fit it into a broader picture of reasoning about uncertainty that also includes probabilistic reasoning.[15]

3.2 Historical Motivations

Three influential papers on nonmonotonic logic appeared in 1980: McDermott & Doyle 1980, Reiter 1980, and McCarthy 1980. In each case, the formalisms presented in these papers were the result of a gestation period of several years or more. To set out the historical influences accurately, it would be necessary to interview the authors, and this has not been done. However, there seem to have been two motivating factors: strategic considerations having to do with the long-range goals of AI, and much more specific, tactical considerations arising from the analysis of the reasoning systems that were being deployed in the 1970s.

Section 2.2 drew attention to McCarthy’s proposed goal of formalizing common sense reasoning. The brief discussion above in Section 3.1 suggests that monotonicity may be an obstacle in pursuing this goal. An additional motive was found in Minsky 1974, which was widely read at the time. This paper presents an assortment of challenges for AI, focusing at the outset on the problem of natural language understanding.[16] Minsky advocates frame-based knowledge representation techniques[17] and (conceiving of the use of these representations as an alternative to logic), he throws out a number of loosely connected challenges for the logical approach, including the problem of building large-scale representations, of reasoning efficiently, of representing control knowledge, and of providing for the flexible revision of defeasible beliefs. In retrospect, most AI researchers would tend to agree that these problems are general challenges to any research program in AI (including the one Minsky himself advocated at the time) and that logical techniques are an important element in addressing some, perhaps all, of the issues. (For instance, a well structured logical design can be a great help in scaling up knowledge representation.)

Minsky apparently intended to provide general arguments against logical methods in AI, but McDermott & Doyle 1980 and McCarthy 1980 interpret Minsky 1974 as a challenge that can be met by developing logics that lack the monotonicity property. Perhaps unintentionally, the paper seems to have provided some incentive to the nonmonotonic logicians by stressing monotonicity as a source of the alleged shortcomings of logic. In fact, the term ‘monotonicity’ apparently makes its first appearance in print in Minsky’s 1974 paper.

The development of nonmonotonic logic also owes a great deal to the applied side of AI. In fact, the need for a nonmonotonic analysis of a number of AI applications was as persuasive as the strategic considerations urged by McCarthy, and in many ways more influential on the shape of the formalisms that emerged. Here, we mention three such applications that appear to have been important for some of the early nonmonotonic logicians: belief revision, closed-world reasoning, and planning.

3.2.1 Belief Revision

Doyle 1979 provides an analysis and algorithm for a “truth maintenance system”. The TMS answers a general need, providing a mechanism for updating the “beliefs” of knowledge bases. The idea of the TMS is to keep track of the support of beliefs, and to use the record of these support dependencies when it is necessary to revise beliefs.

In a TMS, part of the support for a belief can consist in the absence of some other belief. This introduces nonmonotonicity. For instance, it provides for defaults; that Wednesday is the default day for scheduling a meeting means the belief that the meeting will be on Wednesday depends on the absence of special-case beliefs entailing that it will not be on Wednesday.

The TMS algorithm and its refinements had a significant impact on AI applications, and this created the need for a logical analysis. (In even fairly simple cases, it can be hard in the absence of analytic tools to see what consequences a TMS should deliver.) This provided a natural and highly specific challenge for those seeking to develop a nonmonotonic logic. The TMS also provided specific intuitions: the idea that the key to nonmonotonicity has to do with inferences based on unprovability was important for the modal approaches to nonmonotonic logic and for default logic. And the TMS’s emphasis on interactions between arguments began a theme in nonmonotonic logic that remains important to this day. (See the discussion of argument-based approaches, in Section 3.4, below.)

3.2.2 Closed-world reasoning

The study of databases belongs to computer science, not specifically to AI. But one of the research paradigms in the scientific analysis of databases uses logical models of the representations and reasoning (see Minker 1997 for a recent survey of the field), and this area has interacted with logical AI. The deductive database paradigm was taking shape at about the same time that many AI researchers were thinking through the problems of nonmonotonic logic, and provided several specific examples of nonmonotonic reasoning that called for analyses. Of these, perhaps the most important is the closed-world assumption, according to which—at least as far as simple facts are concerned, represented in the database as positive or negative literals—the system assumes that it knows all that there is to be known. It is the closed world assumption that justifies a negative answer to a query “Is there a direct flight from Detroit to Bologna?” when the system finds no such flight in its data. This is another case of inference from the absence of a proof; a negative is proved, in effect, by the failure of a systematic attempt to prove the positive. This idea, which was investigated in papers such as Reiter 1978 and Clark 1978 also provided a challenge for nonmonotonic logics, as well as specific intuitions—note that again, the idea of inference rules depending on the absence of a proof is present here.

3.2.3 Planning

Rational planning is impossible without the ability to reason about the outcomes of a series of contemplated actions. Predictive reasoning of this sort is local; in a complex world with many features, we assume that most things will be unchanged by the performance of an action. But this locality has proved to be difficult to formalize. The problem of how to formalize this “causal inertia”[18] is known as the Frame Problem.

It is very natural to suppose that inertia holds by default; variables are unchanged by the performance of an action unless there is a special reason to think that they will change. This suggests that nonmonotonic temporal formalisms should provide an appropriate foundation for reasoning about action and change. So attempts to formalize the reasoning needed in planning also created a need for nonmonotonic logics. One of the earliest attempts to formalize nonmonotonic reasoning, Sandewall 1972, addresses the frame problem. Inertial defaults are an especially important and instructive case study; no more will be said about them here, since they are discussed in detail in Section 4.4, below.

3.3 The Earliest Formalisms

The three 1980 papers mentioned at the beginning of Section 3.2 represent three approaches to nonmonotonic logic that remain important subfields to this day: circumscription (McCarthy), modal approaches (Doyle & McDermott) and default logic (Reiter).

In McCarthy 1993a, McCarthy urges us, when considering the early history of circumscription, to take into account a group of three papers: McCarthy 1986, 1980, and 1987. The first paper connects the strategic ideas of McCarthy & Hayes 1969 with the need for a nonmonotonic logic, and sketches the logical ideas of domain circumscription, which is now classified as the simplest case of circumscription. The second paper provides more thorough logical foundations, and introduces the more general and powerful predicate circumscription approach. The third paper concentrates on developing techniques for formalizing challenging common sense examples.

All forms of circumscription involve restricting attention to models in which certain sets are minimized; for this reason, circumscription can be grouped with the preferred models approaches to nonmonotonicity: see Section 3.4, below. McCarthy’s formalism is fairly conservative; though it raises interesting logical issues in higher-order logic and complexity, it uses familiar logical frameworks. And much of the focus is on the development of formalization techniques. The other varieties of nonmonotonic logic, including default logic and the modal nonmonotonic logics, raise issues of the sort that are familiar to philosophical logicians, having to do with the design of new logics, the systematic investigation of questions concerning validity, and managing the proliferation of alternative logics.

As the discussion above of truth maintenance indicated, it is very natural to think of nonmonotonic inferences as being hedged. That is, a nonmonotonic inference may require not merely the presence of a set of proved conclusions, but the absence of certain other conclusions. The general form of such a rule is:

In the presence of {A1,…,An} and in the absence of {B1,…,Bn}, conclude C.

An important special case of DR is a normal default, a simple rule to the effect that C holds by default, conditionally on assumptions A1,…,An. This can be formalized by taking the condition that must be absent to simply be the negation of the conclusion.

In the presence of {A1,…,An} and in the absence of ¬C, conclude C.

At first sight, it is somewhat perplexing how to formalize this notion of nonmonotonic inference, since it seems to require a circular definition of provability that can’t be replaced with an inductive definition, as in the nonmonotonic case. The difficulty with the early theory of Sandewall 1972 is that it does not address this difficulty successfully. McDermott & Doyle 1980 and Reiter 1980 use fixpoint definitions to solve the problem. In both cases, the logical task is (1) to develop a formalism in which rules like DR can be expressed, and (2) to define the relation between a theory DT (which may incorporate such rules) and the theories E which could count as reasonable consequences of DT. In the terminology that later became standard, we need to define the relation between a theory DT and its extensions.

In retrospect, we can identify two sorts of approaches to nonmonotonic logic: those based on preference and those based on conflict. Theories of the first sort (like circumscription) involve a relatively straightforward modification of the ordinary model-theoretic definition of logical consequence that takes into account a preference relation over models. Theories of the second sort (like default logic) involve a more radical rethinking of logical ideas. The possibility of multiple extensions—different possible coherent, inferentially complete conclusion sets that can be drawn from a single set of premises—means that we have to think of logical consequence not as a function taking a set of axioms into its logical closure, but as a relation between a set of axioms and alternative logical closures. Since logical consequence is so fundamental, this represents a major theoretical departure. With multiple extensions, we can still retrieve a consequence relation between a theory and a formula in various ways, the simplest being to say that DT nonmonotonically implies C if C is a member of every extension of DT. Still, the conflict-based account of consequence provides a much richer underlying structure than the preferential one.

Reiter approaches the formalization problem conservatively. Nonmonotonicity is not expressed in the language of default logic, which is the same as the language of first-order logic. But a theory may involve a set of default rules—rules of the form DR. Reiter 1980 provides a fixpoint definition of the extensions of such a theory, and develops the theoretical groundwork for the approach, proving a number of the basic theorems.

Of these theorems, we mention one in particular, which will be used in Section 4.5, in connection with the Yale Shooting Anomaly. The idea is to take a conjectured extension (which will be a set T*) and to use this set for consistency checks in a proof-like process that successively applies default rules in <W,D> to stages that begin with W.

We define a default proof process T0,T1,… for W, D, relative to T*, as follows.

  • Let T0 = W.
  • If no default rule in D is nonvacuously applicable to Ti relative to T*, then Ti+1 = ThFOL(Ti), where ThFOL(T) is the logical closure in FOL of T.
  • Otherwise, choose some default rule
    A  :  B1,…, Bn

    that is nonvacuously applicable to Ti relative to T*, and let

    Ti+1 = ThFOL(Ti∪{ C}).

In other words, as long as we can nonvacuously close the stage we are working on under an applicable default, we do so; otherwise, we do nothing. A theorem of Reiter’s says that, under these circumstances:

T is an extension of <W, D> if and only if there is a proof process T0, T1,... for W, D, relative to T, such that
T =
0≤ i
Ti .

Thus, we can show that T is an extension by (1) using T for consistency checks in a default reasoning process from <W, D>, (2) taking the limit T′ of this process, and (3) verifying that in fact T′ = T.

The modal approach represents a “higher level of nonmonotonic involvement” than default logic. The unprovability construct is represented explicitly in the language, by means of a modal operator L informally interpreted as ‘provable’ (or, as in McDermott & Doyle 1980, by the dual of this operator).[19] Although McDermott and Doyle’s terminology is different from Reiter’s, the logical ideas are very similar—the essence of their approach, like Reiter’s, is a fixpoint definition of the extensions of a nonmonotonic logic. Incorporating nonmonoticity in the object language creates some additional complexities, which in the early modal approach show up mainly in proliferation of the logics and difficulties in evaluating the merits of the alternatives. As better foundations for the modal approach emerged, it became possible to prove the expected theorems concerning equivalence of modal formalisms with default logic.[20]

Reiter’s paper Reiter 1980 appears to have developed primarily out of tactical considerations. The earlier paper Reiter 1978 is largely concerned with providing an account of database queries. Unlike the other seminal papers in nonmonotonic logic, Reiter’s shows specific influence from the earlier and independent work on nonmonotonicity in logic programming—the work seems to have been largely inspired by the need to provide logical foundations for the nonmonotonic reasoning found in deductive databases. Doyle and McDermott’s paper shows both strategic and tactical motivation—citing the earlier literature in logicist AI, it motivates nonmonotonic logic as part of a program of modeling common sense rationality. But the theory is also clearly influenced by the need to provide a formal account of truth maintenance.

3.4 Approaches to Nonmonotonic Logic

Nonmonotonic logic is a complex, robust research field. Providing a survey of the subject is made difficult by the fact that there are many different foundational paradigms for formalizing nonmonotonic reasoning, and the relations between these paradigms is not simple. An adequate account of even a significant part of the field requires a something like a book-length treatment. A number of books are available, including Łukaszewicz 1990, Brewka 1991, Besnard 1992, Marek & Truszczynski 1994, Antoniou 1997, Brewka et al. 1997, Schlechta 1997, Antonelli 2005, Makinson 2005b, and Horty 2012. Two collections are especially useful: Ginsberg 1987 and Gabbay et al. 1994. The former is a useful source for readers interested in the early history of the subject, and has an excellent introduction. The handbook chapters in Gabbay et al. 1994 provide overviews of important topics and approaches. My current recommendation for readers interested in a quick, readable introduction to the topic would be Brewka et al. 1997 and self-selected chapters of Gabbay et al. 1994. Some other sources include Bochman 2004, Makinson 2005, Antoniou and Wang 2007, Bochman 2007, and Schlechta 2007. We rely on these references for technical background, and will concentrate on intellectual motivation, basic ideas, and potential long-term signifgicance for logic.

3.4.1 Preference Semantics

At the outset in Section 3.1, it was mentioned how preferred models could be used to characterize a nonmonotonic consequence relation. This general model theory of nonmonotonicity emerged in Shoham 1988, five years after the work discussed in Section 3.2, and represents a much more general and abstract approach.

Preferential semantics relies on a function S taking a set K of models into a subset S(K) of K. The crucial definition of preferential entailment stipulates that A is a (nonmonotonic) consequence of Γ if every model M of S(Models(Γ)) implies A. Shoham’s theory is based on a partial order ≼ over models: S(K) can then be characterized as the set of models in K that are ≼-minimal in K. To ensure that no set can preferentially entail a contradiction unless it classically entails a contradiction, infinite descending ≼ chains need to be disallowed.

This treatment of nonmonotonicity is similar to the earlier modal semantic theories of conditionals—the similarities are particularly evident using the more general theories of conditional semantics, such as the one presented in Chellas 1975. Of course, the consequence relation of the classical conditional logics is monotonic, and conditional semantics uses possible worlds, not models. But the left-nonmonotonicity of conditionals (the fact that A box-arrow C does not imply [AB] Box-arrow C) creates issues that parallel those in nonmonotonic logics. Early work in nonmonotonic logic does not seem to be aware of the analogy with conditional logic. But the interrelations between the two have become an important theme more recently; see, for instance, Gärdenfors & Makinson 1994, Boutilier 1992, Pearl 1994, Gabbay 1995, Benferat et al. 1997, Delgrande 1998, Arlo-Costa & Shapiro 1992, Alcourrón 1995, Asher 1995, and Thomason 2007.

Preference semantics raises an opportunity for formulating and proving representation theorems relating conditions over preference relations to properties of the abstract consequence relation. This line of investigation began with Lehmann & Magidor 1992.

3.4.2 Modal and epistemic theories

Neither Doyle or McDermott pursued the modal approach much beyond the initial stages of McDermott 1982, and McDermott & Doyle 1980. With a helpful suggestion from Robert Stalnaker (see Stalnaker 1993), however, Robert C. Moore produced a modal theory that improves in many ways on the earlier ideas. Moore gives the modal operator of his system an epistemic interpretation, based on the conception of a default rule as one that licenses a conclusion for a reasoning agent unless something that the agent knows blocks the conclusion. In Moore’s autoepistemic logic, an extension E of a theory T is a superset of T that is stable, i.e., that is deductively closed, and that satisfies the following two rules:

  1. If AE then □AE.
  2. If AE then ¬□AE.

It is also usual to impose a groundedness condition on autoepistemic extensions of T, ensuring that every member of an extension has some reason tracing back to T. Various such conditions have been considered; the simplest one restricts extensions to those satisfying

  1. E is the set of nonmodal consequences of T∪{A : □AE} ∪ {¬□A : AE}.

Autoepistemic logic remains a popular approach to nonmonotonic logic, in part because of its usefulness in providing theoretical foundations for logic programming. For more recent references, see Marek & Truszczynski 1991, Moore 1995b, Marek & Truszczynski 1989, Konolige 1994, Antoniou 1997, Moore 1993, and Deneker et al. 2003.

Epistemic logic has inspired other approaches to nonmonotonic logic. Like other modal theories of nonmonotonicity, these use modality to reflect consistency in the object language, and so allow default rules along the lines of DR to be expressed. But instead of consistency, these use ignorance. See Halpern & Moses 1985 and Levesque 1987 for variations on this idea. These theories are explained, and compared to other nonmonotonic logics, in Meyer & van der Hoek 1995. In more recent work, Levesque’s ideas are systematically presented and applied to the theory of knowledge bases in Levesque & Lakemeyer 2000.

3.5 Further Topics

This brief historical introduction to nonmonotonic logic leaves untouched a number of general topics that might well be of interest to a nonspecialist. These include graph-based and proof-theoretic approaches to nonmonotonic logic, results that interrelate the various formalisms, complexity results, tractable special cases of nonmonotonic reasoning, relations between nonmonotonic and abductive reasoning, relations to probability logics, the logical intuitions and apparent patterns of validity underlying nonmonotonic logics, and the techniques used to formalize domains using nonmonotonic logics. For these and other topics, the reader is referred to the literature. As a start, the chapters in Gabbay et al. 1994 are highly recommended.

4. Reasoning about Action and Change[21]

4.1 Priorian Tense Logic

Time and temporal reasoning have been associated with logic since the origins of scientific logic with Aristotle. The idea of a logic of tense in the modern sense has been familiar since at least the work of Jan Łukasiewicz (see, for instance, Łukasiewicz 1970), but the shape of what is commonly known as tense logic was standardized by Arthur Prior’s work in the 1950s and 1960s: see Prior 1956, 1967, 1968.[22] As the topic was developed in philosophical logic, tense logic proved to be a species of modal logic; Prior’s work was heavily influenced by both Hintikka and Kripke, and by the idea that the truth of tense-logical formulas is relative to world-states or temporal stages of the world; these are the tense-theoretic analogues of the timeless possible worlds of ordinary modal logic. Thus, the central logical problems and techniques of tense logic were borrowed from modal logic. For instance, it became a research theme to work out the relations between axiomatic systems and the corresponding model theoretic constraints on temporal orderings. See, for instance, Burgess 1984 and van Benthem 1983.

Priorian tense logic shares with modal logic a technical concentration on issues that arise from using the first-order theory of relations to explain the logical phenomena, an expectation that the important temporal operators will be quantifiers over world-states, and a rather remote and foundational approach to actual specimens of temporal reasoning. Of course, these temporal logics do yield validities, such as


(if A, then it was the case that A was going to be the case), which certainly are intuitively valid. But at most, these can only play a broadly foundational role in accounting for realistic reasoning about time. It is hard to think of realistic examples in which they play a leading part.

This characteristic, of course, is one that modal logic shares with most traditional and modern logical theories; the connection with everyday reasoning is rather weak. Although modern logical techniques do account with some success for the reasoning involved in verifying mathematical proofs and logic puzzles, they do not explain other cases of technical or common sense reasoning with much detail or plausibility. Even in cases like legal reasoning, where logicians and logically-minded legal theorists have put much effort into formalizing the reasoning, the utility of the results is controversial.

4.2 Planning Problems and the Situation Calculus

Planning problems provide one of the most fruitful showcases for combining logical analysis with AI applications. On the one hand there are many practically important applications of automated planning, and on the other logical formalizations of planning are genuinely helpful in understanding the problems, and in designing algorithms.

The classical representation of an AI planning problem, as described in Amarel 1968, evidently originates in early work of Herbert Simon’s, published in a 1966 CMU technical report, Simon 1966. In such a problem, an agent in an initial world-state is equipped with a set of actions, which are thought of as partial functions transforming world-states into world-states. Actions are feasible only in world-states that meet certain constraints. (These constraints are now called the “preconditions” of the action.) A planning problem then becomes a search for a series of feasible actions that successively transform the initial world-state into a desired world-state.

The Situation Calculus, developed by John McCarthy, is the origin of most of the later work in formalizing reasoning about action and change. It was first described in 1969, in McCarthy 1983; the earliest generally accessible publication on the topic is McCarthy & Hayes 1969.

Apparently, Priorian tense logic had no influence on Amarel 1968. But there is no important difference between Amarel’s world-states and those of Priorian tense logic. The “situations” of the Situation Calculus are these same world-states, under a new name.[23] They resemble possible worlds in modal logic in providing abstract locations that support a consistent and complete collection of truths. As in tense logic, these locations are ordered, and change is represented by the variation in truths from one location to another. The crucial difference between the Situation Calculus and tense logic is that change in the situation is dynamic—changes do not merely occur, but occur for a reason.

This difference, of course, is inspired by the intended use of the Situation Calculus: it is meant to formalize Simon’s representation of the planning problem, in which a single agent reasons about the scenarios in which a series of actions is performed.[24] In this model, what drives change is the performance of actions, so the fundamental model theoretic relation is the relation


between an action a, an initial situation s in which a is performed, and a resulting situation s′ immediately subsequent to the performance of the action. Usually (though this is not absolutely necessary) the deterministic assumption is made that s′ is unique. In general, actions can be successfully performed only under certain limited circumstances. This could be modeled by allowing for cases in which there is no s′ such that RESULT(a,s,s′). But usually, it is assumed that RESULT is in fact a total function, but that in cases in which s does not meet the “preconditions” of a, there are no restrictions on the s′ satisfying RESULT(a,s,s′), so that the causal effects of a will be entirely unconstrained in such cases.

A planning problem starts with a limited repertoire of actions (where sets of preconditions and effects are associated with each action), an initial situation, and a goal (which can be treated as a formula). A planning problem is a matter of finding a sequence of actions that will achieve the goal, given the initial situation. That is, given a goal G and initial situation s, the problem will consist of finding a sequence s1,...,sn of actions which will transform s into a final situation that satisfies G. This means (assuming that RESULT is a function) that G will be satisfied by the situation sn, where s0 = s and si+1 is the s′ such that RESULT(ai+1,si,s′). The planning problem is in effect a search for a sequence of actions meeting these conditions. The success conditions for the search can be characterized in a formalism like the Situation Calculus, which allows information about the results of actions to be expressed.

Nothing has been said up till now about the actual language of the Situation Calculus. The crucial thing is how change is to be expressed. With tense logic in mind, it would be natural to invoke a modality like [a]A, with the truth condition

s[a]A iff ⊨sA, where RESULT(a,s,s′).

This formalization, in the style of dynamic logic, is in fact a leading candidate; see Section 4.7, below.

But McCarthy & Hayes 1969 deploys a language that is much closer to first-order logic. (This formalization style is characteristic of McCarthy’s work; see McCarthy 1979.) Actions are treated as individuals. And certain propositions whose truth values can change over time (propositional fluents) are also treated as individuals. Where s is a situation and f is a fluent, Holds(f,s) says that f is true in s.

4.3 Formalizing Microworlds

Since the pioneering work of the nineteenth and early twentieth century logicians, the process of formalizing mathematical domains has largely become a matter of routine. Although (as with set theory) there may be controversies about what axioms and logical infrastructure best serve to formalize an area of mathematics, the methods of formalization and the criteria for evaluating them are relatively unproblematic. This methodological clarity has not been successfully extended to other domains; even the formalization of the empirical sciences presents difficult problems that have not yet been resolved.[25]

The formalization of temporal reasoning, and in particular of reasoning about actions and plans, is the best-developed successful extension of modern formalization techniques to domains other than mathematical theories. This departure has required the creation of new methodologies. One methodological innovation will emerge in Section 4.5: the development of a library of scenarios for testing the adequacy of various formalisms, and the creation of specialized domains like the blocks-world domain (mentioned above, in Section 4.2) that serve a laboratories for testing ideas. For more on the blocks world, see Genesereth & Nilsson 1987; Davis 1991. McCarthy’s ideas about elaboration tolerance McCarthy 1999 provide one interesting attempt to provide a criterion for the adequacy of formalizations. Another idea that has emerged in the course of formalizing common sense domains is the importance of an explicit ontology; see, for instance, Fikes 1996 and Lenat & Guha 1989. Another is the potential usefulness of explicit representations of context; see Guha, 1991. Another is the use of simulation techniques: see, for instance, Johnstone & Williamson 2007

4.4 Prediction and the Frame Problem

To tell whether a plan achieves its goal, you need to see whether the goal holds in the plan’s final state. Doing this requires predictive reasoning, a type of reasoning that was neglected in the tense-logical literature. As in mechanics, prediction involves the inference of later states from earlier ones. But (in the case of simple planning problems at least) the dynamics are determined by actions rather than by differential equations. The investigation of this qualitative form of temporal reasoning, and of related sorts of reasoning (e.g., plan recognition, which seeks to infer goals from observed actions, and narrative explanation, which seeks to fill in implicit information in a temporal narrative) is one of the most impressive chapters in the brief history of common sense logicism.

The essence of prediction is the problem of inferring what holds in the situation that ensues from performing an action, given information about the initial situation. It is often assumed that the agent has complete knowledge about the initial situation—this assumption is usual in classical formalizations of planning.[26]

A large part of the qualitative dynamics that is needed for planning consists in inferring what does not change. Take a simple plan to type the word ‘cat’ using word processing software: the natural plan is to first enter ‘c’, then enter ‘a’, then enter ‘t’. Part of one’s confidence in this plan is that the actions are independent: for instance, entering ‘a’ does not also erase the ‘c’. The required inference can be thought of as a form of inertia. The Frame Problem is the problem of how to formalize the required inertial reasoning.

The Frame Problem was named and introduced in McCarthy & Hayes 1969. Unlike most of the philosophically interesting technical problems to emerge in AI, it has attracted the interest of philosophers; most of the relevant papers, and background information, can be found in Ford & Pylyshyn 1996; Pylyshyn 1987. Both of these volumes document interactions between AI and philosophy.

The quality of these interactions is discouraging. Like any realistic common sense reasoning problem, the Frame Problem is open-ended, and can depend on a wide variety of circumstances. If you put $20 in a wallet, put the wallet in your pocket, and go to the store, you can safely assume that the $20 is still in the wallet. But if you leave the $20 on the counter at the store while shopping, you can’t safely assume it will be there later. This may account for the temptation that makes some philosophers[27] want to construe the Frame Problem very broadly, so that very soon it becomes indiscernible from the problem of formalizing general common sense in arbitrary domains. Such a broad construal may serve to introduce speculative discussions concerning the nature of AI, but it loses all contact with the genuine, new logical problems in temporal reasoning that have been discovered by the AI community. It provides a forum for repeating some familiar philosophical themes, but it brings nothing new to philosophy. This way of interpreting the Frame Problem is disappointing, because philosophy can use all the help it can get; the AI community has succeeded in extending and enriching the application of logic to common sense reasoning in dramatic ways that are highly relevant to philosophy. The clearest account of these developments to be found in the volumes edited by Pylyshyn is Morgenstern 1996. An extended treatment can be found in Shanahan 1997; also see Sandewall 1994 and Shanahan 2009.

The purely logical Frame Problem can be solved using monotonic logic, by simply writing explicit axioms stating what does not change when an action is performed. This technique can be successfully applied to quite complex formalization problems.[28] But nonmonotonic solutions to the framework have been extensively investigated and deployed; these lead to new and interesting lines of logical development.

Some philosophers (Fodor 1987, Lormand 1996) have felt that contrived propositions will pose special difficulties in connection with the Frame Problem. As Shanahan points out Shanahan 1997 [p. 24]) Fodor’s “fridgeon” example is readily formalized in the Situation Calculus and poses no special problems. However, as Lormand suggests, Goodman’s examples Goodman, 1946 do create problems if they are admitted as fluents; there will be anomalous extensions in which objects change from green to blue in order to preserve their grueness.

This is one of the few points about the Frame Problem made by a philosopher that raises a genuine difficulty for the formal solutions. But the difficulty is peripheral, since the example is not realistic. Recall that fluents are represented as first-order individuals. Although fluents are situation-dependent functions, an axiom of comprehension is certainly not assumed for fluents. In fact, it is generally supposed that the domain of fluents will be a very limited set of the totality of situation-dependent functions; typically, it will be a relatively small finite set of variables representing features of the domain considered to be important. In particular cases these will be chosen in much the same way that a set of variables is chosen in statistical modeling.

There doesn’t seem to be a systematic account in the AI literature of how to choose an appropriate set of fluents, but it would certainly be part of such an account that all fluents should correspond to projectable predicates, in Goodman’s sense.

4.5 Nonmonotonic Treatments of Inertia and a Package of Problems

The idea behind nonmonotonic solutions to the Frame Problem is to treat inertia as a default; changes are assumed to occur only if there is some special reason for them to occur. In an action-centered account of change, this means that absence of change is assumed when an action is performed unless a reason for the change can be found in axioms for the action.

For explicitness, let’s use Reiter’s default logic to illustrate the formalization. Recall that in Reiter’s theory, defaults are represented as rules, not formulas, so that they are not subject to quantification. To formalize inertia, then, we need to use default rule schemata. For each fluent f, action a, and situation s, the set of these schemata will include an instance of the following schema:

IR(f, a, s)   T : Holds(f,s) ↔ Holds(f,RESULT(a,s))
Holds(f,s) ↔ Holds(f,RESULT(a,s))

This way of doing things makes any case in which a fluent changes truth value a prima facie anomaly. But it follows from Reiter’s account of extensions that such defaults are overridden when they conflict with the monotonic theory of situation dynamics. So if, for instance, there is a monotonic causal axiom for the action blacken ensuring that blackening a block will make it black in the resulting situation, then the appropriate instance of IR will be inefficacious, and there will be no extension in which a white block remains white when it is blackened.

The Frame Problem somehow managed to capture the attention of a wide community—but if one is interested in understanding the complex problems that arise in generalizing formalisms like the Situation Calculus, while at the same time ensuring that they deliver plausible solutions to a wide variety of scenarios, it is more useful to consider a larger range of problems. For the AI community, the larger problems include the Frame Problem itself, the Qualification Problem, the Ramification Problem, generalizability along a number of important dimensions including incomplete information, concurrency (multiple agents), and continuous change, and finally a large assortment of specific challenges such as the scenarios mentioned later in this section.

The Qualification Problem arises generally in connection with the formalization of common sense generalizations. Typically, these involve exceptions, and these exceptions—especially if one is willing to entertain far-fetched circumstances—can iterate endlessly. The same phenomenon, under a label like ‘the problem of ceteris paribus generalizations’, is familiar from analytic philosophy. It also comes up in the semantics of generic constructions found in natural languages.[29] In a sense, this problem is addressed at a general level by nonmonotonic logics, which—though they do not provide a way to enumerate exceptions—do allow common sense generalizations to be formulated as defaults, as well as enabling further qualifications to be added nondestructively. Ideally, then, the initial generalization can be stated as an axiom and qualifications can be added incrementally in the form of further axioms.

The Qualification Problem was raised in McCarthy 1986, where it was motivated chiefly by generalizations concerning the consequences of actions; McCarthy considers in some detail the generalization that turning the ignition key in an automobile will start the car. Much the same point, in fact, can be made about virtually any action, including stacking one block on another—the standard action that is used to illustrate the Situation Calculus. A circumscriptive approach to the Qualification Problem is presented in Lifschitz 1987; this explicitly introduces the precondition relation between an action and its preconditions into the formalism, and circumscriptively minimizes preconditions, eliminating from preferred models any “unknown preconditions” that might render an action inefficacious.

Several dimensions of the Qualification Problem remain as broad, challenging research problems. For one thing, not every nonmonotonic logic provides graceful mechanisms for qualification. Default logic, for instance, does not deliver the intuitively desired conclusions. Suppose one formalizes the common sense generalization that if you press the ‘a’ key on a computer it will type ‘a’ as a normal default:

T : VALUE(text, RESULT(Press-a,s)) = VALUE(text,s) + ‘a’
VALUE(text, RESULT(Press-a,s)) = VALUE(text,s) + ‘a’

If we then formalize the exception to this generalization that if you press the ‘a’ key while the Alt key is depressed the cursor moves to the beginning of the current sentence as a normal default along the same lines, we get two extensions: one in which pressing ‘a’ while the Alt key is depressed moves the cursor and another in which it adds ‘a’ to the text.

The problem is that default logic does not provide for more specific defaults to override ones that are more general. This principle of specificity has been discussed at length in the literature. Incorporating it in a nonmonotonic logic can complicate the theory considerably; see, for instance, Asher & Morreau 1991 and Horty 1994. And, as Elkan 1995 points out, the Qualification Problem raises computational issues.

Relatively little attention has been given to the Qualification Problem for characterizing actions, in comparison with other problems in temporal reasoning. In particular, the standard accounts of unsuccessful actions are somewhat unintuitive. In the formalization of Lifschitz 1987, for instance, actions with some unsatisfied preconditions are only distinguished from actions whose preconditions all succeed in that the conventional effects of the action will only be ensured when the preconditions are met. It is as if an action of spending $1,000,000 can be performed at any moment—although if you don’t have the money, no effects in particular will be guaranteed. [30] And there is no distinction between actions that cannot even be attempted (like boarding a plane in London when you are in Sydney), actions that can be attempted, but in which the attempt can be expected to go wrong (like making a withdrawal when you have insufficient funds), actions that can be attempted with reasonable hope of success, and actions that can be attempted with guaranteed success. As J.L. Austin made clear in Austin 1961, the ways in which actions can be attempted, and in which attempted actions can fail, are a well developed part of common sense reasoning. Obviously, in contemplating a plan containing actions that may fail, one may need to reason about the consequences of failure. Formalizing the pathology of actions, providing a systematic theory of ways in which actions and the plans that contain them can go wrong, would be a useful addition to planning formalisms, and one that would illuminate important themes in philosophy.

The challenge posed by the Ramification Problem (characterized first in Finger 1987) is to formalize the indirect consequences of actions, where “indirect” effects are not delayed,[31] but are temporally immediate but causally derivative. If one walks into a room, the direct effect is that one is now in the room. There are also many indirect effects: for instance, that one’s shirt also is now in the room.

You can see from this that the formulation of the problem presupposes a distinction between direct consequences of actions (ones that attach directly to an action, and that are ensured by the successful performance of the action) and other consequences. This assumption is generally accepted without question in the AI literature on action formalisms. You can make a good case for its common sense plausibility—for instance, many of our words for actions (‘to warm’, to ‘lengthen’, ‘to ensure’) are derived from the effects that are conventionally associated with them. And in these cases, success is entailed: if someone has warmed something, this entails that it became warm. [32] A typical example is discussed in Lin 1995: a certain suitcase has two locks, and is open if and only if both locks are open. Then (assuming that actions are not performed concurrently) opening one lock will open the suitcase if and only if the other lock is open. Here, opening a lock is an action, with direct consequences; opening a suitcase is not an action, it is an indirect effect.

Obviously, the Ramification Problem is intimately connected with the Frame Problem. In approaches that adopt nonmonotonic solutions to the Frame Problem, inertial defaults will need to be overridden by conclusions about ramifications in order to obtain correct results. In case the left lock of the suitcase is open, for instance, and an action of opening the right lock is performed, then the default conclusion that the suitcase remains closed needs somehow to be suppressed. Some approaches to the Ramification Problem depend on the development of theories of common sense causation, and therefore are closely related to the causal approaches to reasoning about time and action discussed below in Section 4.6. See, for instance, Giunchiglia et al. 1997, Thielscher 1989, Lin 1995.

Philosophical logicians have been content to illustrate their ideas with relatively small-scale examples. The formalization of even large-scale mathematical theories is relatively unproblematic. Logicist AI is the first branch of logic to undertake the task of formalizing large examples involving nontrivial common sense reasoning. In doing so, the field has had to invent new methods. An important part of the methodology that has emerged in formalizing action and change is the prominence that is given to challenges, posed in the form of scenarios. These scenarios represent formalization problems which usually involve relatively simple, realistic examples designed to challenge the logical theories in specific ways. Typically, there will be clear common sense intuitions about the inferences that should be drawn in these cases. The challenge is to design a logical formalism that will provide general, well-motivated solutions to these benchmark problems.

Among the many scenarios that have been discussed in the literature are the Baby Scenario, the Bus Ride Scenario, the Chess Board Scenario, the Ferryboat Connection Scenario, the Furniture Assembly Scenario, the Hiding Turkey Scenario, the Kitchen Sink Scenario, the Russian Turkey Scenario, the Stanford Murder Mystery, the Stockholm Delivery Scenario, the Stolen Car Scenario, the Stuffy Room Scenario, the Ticketed Car Scenario, the Walking Turkey Scenario, and the Yale Shooting Anomaly. Accounts of these can be found in Shanahan 1997 and Sandewall 1994; see especially Sandewall 1994[Chapters 2 and 7].

Many of these scenarios are designed to test advanced problems that will not be discussed here—for instance, challenges dealing with multiple agents, or with continuous changes. Here, we concentrate on one of the earliest, and probably the most subtle of these scenarios: the Yale Shooting Anomaly, first reported in Hanks & McDermott 1985 and published in Hanks & McDermott 1986; Hanks & McDermott 1987.

The Yale Shooting Anomaly involves three actions: load, shoot, and wait. A propositional fluent Loaded tracks whether a certain pistol is loaded; another fluent, Alive, tracks whether a certain person, Fred, is alive. load has no preconditions; its only effect is Loaded. The fluent shoot has Loaded as its only precondition and Alive as a negative effect; wait has no preconditions and no effects.

Causal information regarding the axioms is formalized as follows.

Load ∀sHolds(Loaded, RESULT(load,s))
Shoot 1 ∀s[Holds(Loaded,s) → HoldsAlive, RESULT(shoot,s))]
Shoot 2 ∀s[Holds(Loaded,s) → HoldsLoaded, RESULT(shoot,s))]

There is no Wait Axiom—that is, wait has no preconditions and no effects.

We will formalize the inertial reasoning in this scenario using a nonmonotonic logic—to be specific, we use Reiter’s default logic. The set D of defaults for this theory consists of all instances of the inertial schema IR. In the initial situation, Fred is alive and the pistol is unloaded.

IC1 Holds(Alive,s0)
IC2 ¬Holds(Loaded,s0)

The monotonic theory W of the scenario consists of: (1) the action axioms Load, Shoot 1 and Shoot 2 and (2) the initial conditions IC1 and IC2. Let s1 = RESULT(load,s0), s2 = RESULT(wait,s1), and s3 = RESULT(shoot,s2).

The Yale Shooting Anomaly arises because this theory allows an extension in which the actions are load; shoot; wait, and in the final situation s3, the pistol is unloaded and Fred is alive. The initial situation in the Anomaly and the three actions, with their resulting situations, can be pictured as follows.

s0 load
s1 wait
s2 shoot

The natural, expected outcome of these axioms is that the pistol is loaded and Fred is alive after waiting, so that shooting yields a final outcome in which Fred is not alive and the pistol is unloaded. There is no problem in showing that this corresponds to an extension; the problem is the presence of the other, anomalous extension, which looks like this.


Here is a narrative version of this extension. At first, Fred is alive and the pistol is unloaded. After loading, the pistol is loaded and Fred remains alive. After waiting, the pistol becomes unloaded and Fred remains alive. Shooting is then vacuous since the pistol is unloaded, so finally, after shooting, Fred remains alive and the pistol remains unloaded.

The best way to see clearly that this is an extension is to work through the proof. Less formally, though, you can see that the expected extension violates just one default: the frame default for Alive is violated when Fred changes state in the last step. But the anomalous extension also violates only one default: the frame default for Loaded is violated when the pistol spontaneously becomes unloaded while waiting. So, if you just go by the number of defaults that are violated, both extensions are equally good.

The Yale Shooting Anomaly represents a major obstacle in developing a theory of predictive reasoning. A plausible, well-motivated logical solution to the Frame Problem runs afoul of a simple, crisp example in which it clearly delivers the wrong results. Naturally, the literature concerning the Yale Shooting Problem is extensive. Surveys of some of this work, with bibliographical references, can be found in Shanahan 1997; Morgenstern 1996.

4.6 Some Emergent Frameworks

Many formalisms have been proposed to deal with the problems surveyed in the previous section. Some are more or less neglected today. Several are still advocated and defended by leading experts; some of these are associated with research groups who are not only interested in developments of logical theory, but in applications in planning and cognitive robotics.

The leading approaches provide solutions to the main problems mentioned in Section 4.5, and to many of the scenarios designed to test and illustrate theories of reasoning about action and change. It is commonly agreed that good solutions need to be generalizable to more complex cases than the early planning formalisms, and that in particular the solutions they offer should be deployable even when continuous time, concurrent actions, and various kinds of ignorance are allowed. Also, it is generally agreed that the formalisms should support several kinds of reasoning, and, in particular, not only prediction and plan verification but retrodiction, i.e., construction of a sequence of states and actions from partial information, presented in narrative form.

We describe four approaches here: (1) Features and fluents (Sandewall), (2) Motivated Action Theory (Morgenstern and Stein), (3) State Minimization in the Event Calculus (Shanahan) and (4) Causal Theories (Lifschitz and others). The accounts of the first three in what follows will be fairly brief; fortunately, each approach is well documented in a single reference. The fourth approach is most likely to be interesting to philosophers and to contain elements that will be of lasting importance regardless of future developments in this area.

4.6.1 Features and fluents

This approach, described in Sandewall 1994, uses preference semantics as a way to organize nonmonotonic solutions to the problems of reasoning about action and change. Rather than introducing a single logical framework, Sandewall considers a number of temporal logics, including ones that use discrete, continuous, and branching time. The properties of the logics are systematically tested against a large suite of test scenarios.

4.6.2 Motivated Action Theory

This theory grew out of direct consideration of the problems in temporal reasoning described above in Section 4.5, and especially the Yale Shooting Scenario. In Morgenstern & Stein 1994, Morgenstern and Stein seek to find a general, intuitively motivated logical framework that solves the difficulties. They settle on the idea that unmotivated actions are to be minimized, where an action (“actions” construed generally enough to include any change) can be motivated directly, e.g. by an axiom, or indirectly, through chains of motivations. The key technical idea of the paper is a (rather complicated) definition of motivation in an interval-based temporal logic. In Morgenstern 1996, Morgenstern presents a summary of the theory, along with reasons for rejecting its causal rivals. The most important of these reasons is that these theories, based on the Situation Calculus, do not appear to generalize to cases allowing for concurrency and ignorance. She also cites the failure of early causal theories to deal with retrodiction.

4.6.3 State-Based Minimization in the Event Calculus

In Baker 1989, Andrew Baker presented a solution to the version of the Yale Shooting problem in the Situation Calculus, using a circumscriptive inertial axiom. The very brief account of circumscription above in Section 3 indicated that circumscription uses preferred models in which the extensions of certain predicates are minimized. In the course of this minimization, a set of parameters (including, of course, the predicates to be minimized) is allowed to vary; the rest are held constant. Which parameters vary and which are held constant is determined by the application.

In the earliest circumscriptive solutions to the Frame Problem, the inertial rule CIR is stated using an abnormality predicate.

∀f∀s∀a[¬Ab(f,a,s) → [Holds(f,s) ↔ Holds(f,RESULT(a,s))]]

This axiom uses a biconditional, so that it can be used for retrodiction; this is typical of the more recent formulations of common sense inertia. In circumscribing, the abnormality predicate is minimized while the Holds predicate is allowed to vary and all other parameters are fixed. This formalization succumbs to the Yale Shooting Anomaly in much the same way that default logic does. (Circumscription does not involve multiple extensions, so the problem emerges as the nonderivability of the conclusion that Fred is alive after the occurrence of the shooting.)

In Baker’s reformulation of the problem, separate axioms ensure the existence of a situation corresponding to each Boolean combination of fluents, and the RESULT function is allowed to vary, while the Holds predicate is held constant. In this setting, the RESULT function needs to be specified for “counterfactual”actions—in particular, for shooting as well as for waiting in the Yale Shooting Anomaly. It is this feature that eliminates the incorrect model for that scenario; for details, see Baker 1989 and Shanahan 1997, Chapter 6.

This idea, which Shanahan calls “State-Based Minimization,” is developed and extended in Shanahan 1997, in the context of a temporal logic deriving from the Event Calculus of Kowalski and Sergot; see Kowalski & Sergot 1986. Shanahan’s formalism has the advantage of being closely connected to implementations using logic programming.

4.6.4 Causal Theories

Recall that in the anomalous model of the Yale Shooting Scenario the gun becomes unloaded after the performance of the wait action, an action which has no conventional effects—the unloading, then, is uncaused. In the context of a nonmonotonic logic—and without such a logic, the Yale Shooting Anomaly would not arise—it is very natural to formalize this by treating uncaused eventualities as abnormalities to be minimized.

This strategy was pursued by Hector Geffner in Geffner 1992 1990, where he formalizes this simple causal solution to the Yale Shooting Anomaly. But the solution is presented in the context of an ambitious general project in nonmonotonic logic that not only develops properties of the preferred model approach and shows how to apply it to a number of reasoning problems, but that relates nonmonotonic logic to probabilities, using ideas deriving from Adams 1975. In Geffner 1992, the causal theory is sketched; it is not developed to show its adequacy in dealing with the battery of problems presented above, and in particular the Ramification Problem is left untouched.

The work beginning with Lifschitz 1987 has contributed to a sustained line of research in the causal approach—not only by Lifschitz and students of his such as Enrico Giunchiglia and Hudson Turner, but by researchers at other sites. For work in this area, and further references, see Thielscher 1989, Gustaffson & Doherty 1996, Baral 1995, Nakashima et al. 1997, Lifschitz 1997, Giunchiglia & Lifschitz 1998, Lin 1995, Haugh 1987, Lifschitz 1998, Turner 1999, McCain & Turner 1995, Elkan 1991, McCain & Turner 1997, Thielscher 1996, and Gelfond & Lifschitz 1998.

Here, we briefly describe some of theories developed by the Texas Action Group, leading up to the causal solution presented in Turner 1999. Turner returns to the ideas of Geffner 1992, but places them in a simpler logical setting and applies them to the formalization of more complex scenarios that illustrate the interactions of causal inertia with other considerations, especially the Ramification Problem.

Ramification is induced by the presence of static laws which relate the direct consequences of actions to other changes. Let’s use a car-starting scenario to illustrate the difficulties. There is one action, turn-on, which turns on the ignition; let’s suppose that this action has no preconditions. There is a fluent Ig tracking whether the ignition is on, a fluent Dead tracking whether the battery is dead, and a fluent Run tracking whether the engine is running. A static law says that if the ignition is on and the battery isn’t dead, the engine is running. (Let’s suppose that every other source of failure has already been eliminated in this scenario; the only possible reason for not starting is the battery.) We want to consider a transition in which turn-on is performed in a situation in which the ignition is not on, the battery is not dead, and the car isn’t running.

Of course, we want a planning agent to be able to infer in such a case that a performance of turn-on will result in a situation in which the ignition is on, the battery isn’t dead, and the engine is running. But contraposition of laws makes it difficult to devise a principled solution. Informally, this difficulty is this: we can conclude by contraposing our only static law that if the ignition is on and the engine isn’t running, then the battery is dead. This law not only is true in our scenario, but would be used to explain a failed attempt to start the car. But if we allow it to be used for prediction, then it is hard to see how to rule out an outcome of turn-on in which the ignition is on, the battery is dead, and the engine isn’t running. The battery is dead in this outcome because of causal inertia. The engine isn’t running because of the contraposed causal law.

Readers who want to explore in some detail the problems of embedding a nonmonotonic solution to the Frame Problem in relatively expressive action languages can look to Gelfond & Lifschitz 1998. This paper presents an increasingly powerful and sophisticated series of action languages. Their language incorporates an ad hoc or at least purely syntactic solution to the Ramification Problem.

A theory in language B consists of two sets of axioms:

  1. Static laws of the form FL, where L is a literal and F is a conjunction of literals or is T.
  2. Dynamic laws of the form A Causes L if F, where A is an action term and F is a boolean formula.

Gelfond and Lifschitz impose a weak closure condition on static laws: where s is a set of literals, s is restricted-closed with respect to a B theory T, RBClT(s) if and only if every literal that would be added by starting with s and forward-chaining through the static laws of B is already in s. In other words:

RBClT(s) iff for all static laws FL of T, if s entails F then Ls.

The closure operation induced by this condition is used in defining RESULT(a,s) for the language B. Of course, this solution treats logically equivalent static laws differently; for instance, a theory whose only static law is [P ∧ ¬Q] →R will in general determine a very different RESULT function than one whose only static law is [P ∧ ¬R] →Q.

This has some somewhat counterintuitive effects. In the car-starting scenario, Gelfond and Lifschitz’ language B indeed yields the desired conclusion that the car will start when there is one dynamic law,

turn-on Causes Ig  if T,

when the only static law is

[Ig ∧ ¬Dead] → Run,

when the initial state is s = {¬Ig, ¬Dead, ¬Run}, and when the action turn-on is performed.

However, if we add a true static law saying that if the ignition is on and the engine isn’t running the battery is dead, we get an anomaly. With the addition of this law, there is a model in which preserving the fact that the car is not running makes the battery become dead when the ignition is turned on.

If the two static laws, [Ig ∧ ¬Dead] → Run and [Ig ∧ ¬Run] → Dead, are reformulated using causal language, the former sounds correct, while the second is distinctly problematic: compare

If the battery isn’t dead, the ignition’s being on will cause the engine to run.


If the engine isn’t running, the ignition’s being on will cause the battery to be dead.

This makes it very plausible to suppose that the source of the problem is a representation of underlying causal information in action language B that is somehow inadequate.

Gelfond and Lifschitz go on to describe another action language, C, which invokes an explicit notion of causality—motivated, in all likelihood, in part by the need to provide a more principled solution to the problem. Instead of describing that language, we now discuss the similar theory of Turner 1999.

Turner’s idea is to treat Caused as a modal operator [ c ], making this the basis of a modal nonmonotonic logic. In the preferred models of this logic, the caused propositions coincide with the propositions that are true, and this must be the only possibility consistent with the extensional part of the model. To make this more explicit, recall that in the possible worlds interpretation of S5, it is possible to identify possible worlds with state descriptions, which we can represent as sets I of literals (atomic formulas and their negations). Making this identification, then, we can think of a model as a pair <I, S>, where S is a set of interpretations (complete, consistent sets of literals) including I. The modal operator [ c ] is given the standard semantics: where S is a set of interpretations and where I ∈ S, S ⊨I [ c  ] A if and only if S ⊨I′ A for all I′ ∈S. <I, S> satisfies a set of formulas T if and only if S ⊨I A for all A ∈ T.

Turner’s preferred models of T are the pairs <I, S> such that: (1) <I, S> satisfies T, (2) S = {I}, and (3) <I, S> is the unique interpretation <I′, S′> meeting conditions (1) and (2) with I′ = I. Condition (2) guarantees the “universality of causation”; it validates A[ c ]A. Condition (3) “grounds” causality in noncausal information (in the models in which we are interested, this will be information about the occurrence of events), in the strongest sense: it is uniquely determined by this information.

Although it is not evident from the formulation, Turner’s account of preferred models is related to the constructions of more general nonmonotonic logics, such as default logic. Consult Turner 1999 for details.

The axioms that specify the effects of actions treat these effects as caused; for instance, the axiom schema for loading would read as follows:

Causal-Load [ c ]Holds(load, RESULT(load, s))[33]

Ramifications of the immediate effects of actions are also treated as caused. And the nonmonotonic inertial axiom schemata take the form

[[[c]Holds(f,s)] ∧ Holds(f,RESULT(a,s))] → [c]Holds(f,R ESULT(a,s))


[[[c]¬Holds(f,s)] ∧ ¬Holds(f,RESULT(a,s))] →

Thus, a true proposition can be caused either because it is the direct or indirect effect of an action, or because it involves the persistence of a caused proposition. Initial conditions are also considered to be caused, by stipulation.

To illustrate the workings of this approach, let’s consider the simplest case of inertia: we have a language with just one constant denoting a fluent, f, and one action-denoting constant, wait. As in the Yale Shooting Problem, there are no axioms for wait; this action can always be performed and has no associated effects. Let s1 be RESULT(wait,s 0). The theory T contains an initial condition for f, Holds(f,s0) and a statement that the initial condition is caused, [c] Holds(f,s 0), as well as the inertial schemata.

Two models of T satisfy conditions (1) and (2):

M1 = <I1,{I1}> and M2 = <I2,{I2}>,

where I1 = {Holds(f,s0), Holds(f,s1)} and I2 = {Holds(f,s0), ¬Holds(f,s1)}.

M1 is the intended model, in which nothing changes. It satisfies Condition (3), since if <I1, S> satisfies T it satisfies [c]Holds(f,s 1) by the inertial axiom

[[[c]Holds(f,s)] ∧ Holds(f,s1)] → [c]Holds(f,s 1).

Therefore, S = {I1}.

M2 is an anomalous model, in which the fluent ceases spontaneously. This model does not satisfy Condition (3), since M3 = <I2,{I1, I2}> also satisfies T; in particular, it satisfies the inertial axiom for f because it fails to satisfy Holds(f,s1). So, while M1 is a preferred model, M2 is not.

Turner’s approach avoids the problem of contraposition by giving causal relations the form


When contraposed, this becomes


which does not have the form of a causal law. This solution is less than fully satisfactory at solving the intuitive difficulties, because Turner’s semantics seems intuitively to validate formulas such as

[c][[¬DeadIg] → Run],

and in this form, contraposition would be restored. The task of clarifying the foundations of causal theories of action and change may not yet be complete.

But the apparent usefulness of a “principle of universal causality” in accounting for a range of problems in qualitative common sense reasoning will be tantalizing to philosophers. And the causal theory, as initiated by Geffner and developed by Turner, has many interesting detailed features. For instance, while philosophical work on causality has concentrated on the causal relation, this work in logical AI shows that a great deal can be done by using only a nonrelational causal predicate.

The relation between causality and conditionals can be explored and exploited in various ways. Lewis 1977 undertakes to account for causality in terms of conditionals. In the reverse direction, Lent and Thomason 2015 uses Turner’s causal approach to construct models for conditional logics, in the restricted case where the antecedent is the conjunction of an action expression and simple situational conditions. The motivation for this idea is than an explicit solution to the frame problem automatically provides a semantics for such conditionals.

Morgenstern’s two chief criticisms of the causal approach to reasoning about actions are that it does not give an adequate account of explanation[34] and that the logical context in which it works (the Situation Calculus) is limited. As work on the approach continues, progress is being made in these areas. But the constraints that a successful logic of action and change must meet are so complex that it seems to be a reasonable research methodology to concentrate initially on a restricted logical setting.

For another approach to nonmonotonic causal reasoning, based on input-output logics (Makinson & van der Torre 2000), see Bochman 2004.

4.7 Action Formalisms and Natural Language

Although for many AI logicists, the goal of action formalisms is to illuminate an important aspect of common sense reasoning, most of their research is uninformed by an important source of insights into the common sense view of time—namely, natural language. Linguists concerned with the semantics of temporal constructions in natural language, like the AI community, have begun with ideas from philosophical logic but have discovered that these ideas need to be modified in order to deal with the phenomena. A chief discovery of the AI logicists has been the importance of actions and their relation to change. Similarly, an important discovery of the “natural language logicists” has been the importance of different kinds of events (including structured composite events) in interpreting natural language. From work such as this the idea of “natural language metaphysics” (see, for instance, Bach 1989) has emerged.

The goal of articulating a logical framework tailored to a representational system that is motivated by systematic evidence about meanings in natural languages is not acknowledged by all linguistic semanticists. Nevertheless, it is a significant theme in the linguistic literature. This goal is remarkably similar to those of the common sense logicists, but the research methodology is entirely different.

Can the insights of these separate traditions be reconciled and unified? Is it possible to constrain theories of temporal representations and reasoning with the insights and research methodologies of both traditions? In Steedman 1995 (and 2000, listed in the Other Internet Resources Section), these important questions are addressed, and a theory is developed that extends action formalisms like the Situation Calculus, and that incorporates many of the insights from linguistic semantics. The project reported in Steedman 2000 is still incomplete, but the results reported there make a convincing case that the event-based ideas from linguistics can be fruitfully combined with the action-centered formalisms in the AI literature. The possibility of this unification is one of the most exciting logical developments in this area, bringing together as it does two independent descendants of the earlier work in the logic of time.

5. Causal Reasoning

In Section 4.6, we traced the reasons for the development of theories incorporating causality in work on reasoning about action and change. This is not the only area of AI in which causality has emerged. Causality figures in qualitative reasoning about devices; for Herbert Simon’s important work in this area, which goes back to the 1950s, see Simon 1952; 1977; Iwasaki & Simon 1986. Both these traditions are important. But the most robust and highly developed program in AI relating to causality is that of Judea Pearl and his students and associates, which derives from statistical techniques known as structural equation models. Halpern and Pearl 2001 introduced the idea that causal relations among events could be inferred from these models: Bayesian belief networks could be interpreted as causal networks.

Pearl’s program has developed into a far-reaching campaign to rehabilitate causality in statistical thinking. We shall not discuss this topic here. For one thing, this survey omits probabilistic reasoning in AI. For another, Pearl’s views on causality are systematically and comprehensively presented in a recent book-length study, Pearl 2000.

But it is important to point out that the work on causality discussed in Section 4.6 and Pearl’s ideas do share some common themes. On both approaches: action is central for causality. Also there is a focus on causality as a tool in reasoning that is necessitated in part by limited resources. Another important theme is the deployment and systematic study of formalisms in which causality is related to other constructs (in particular, to probability and to qualitative change) and a variety of realistic reasoning problems are addressed.

These commonalities provide reason to hope that we will see a science of causality emerging from the AI research, unifying the contributions of the probabilistic, the qualitative physics, and the nonmonotonic traditions, and illuminating the various phases of causal reasoning.

A recent landmark in this direction is Halpern 2016, which develops and applies the general theory of event causality that arises from the causal network approach. Although Halpern is a computer scientist, a large part of this book is philosophical, exploring notions such as blame and explanation. But the book also explores practical applications of the approach that would not occur to philosophers, in areas such as software fault diagnosis.

Whether you take causality to be a fundamental construct in natural science, or a fundamental common sense phenomenon, depends on whether you have in mind an idealized nature described by differential equations or you have in mind the view of nature we have to take in order to act, either in everyday situations, or for that matter in designing experiments in the laboratory. The fact that, as Bertrand Russell noted (see Russell 1957), causality is not to be found as a theoretical primitive in contemporary physical theories is at odds with its seeming importance in so many familiar areas of reasoning. The rigorous theories emerging in AI that are beginning to illuminate the workings of causality are important not only in themselves, but in their potentiality to illuminate wider philosophical issues.

6. Spatial Reasoning

The precomputational literature in philosophical logic relating to spatial reasoning is very sparse in relation, for instance, to the temporal literature. The need to support computational reasoning about space, however, in application areas such as motion planning and manipulation in physical space, the indexing and retrieval of images, geographic information systems, diagrammatic reasoning, and the design of high-level graphics programs has led to new interest in spatial representations and spatial reasoning. Of course, the geometrical tradition provides an exceptionally strong mathematical resource for this enterprise. But as in many other AI-related areas, it is not clear that the available mathematical theories are appropriate for informing these applications, and many computer scientists have felt it worthwhile to develop new foundations. Some of this work is closely related to the research in qualitative reasoning mentioned above in Section 2.2, and in some cases has been carried out by the same individuals.

The literature in spatial reasoning is extensive; for references to some areas not discussed here, see Stock 1997, Kapur & Mundy 1988, Hammer 1995, Wilson 1998, Osherson & Lasnik 1990, Renz & Nebel 1999, Yeap & Jeffries 1999, Forbus et al. 1991, Chen 1990, Burger & Bhanu 1992, Allwein & Barwise 1996, Glasgow et al. 1995, and Kosslyn 1990. Here, we discuss only one trend, which is closely connected with parallel work in philosophical logic.

Qualitative approaches to space were introduced into the logical literature early in the twentieth century by Lesniewski; see Lesniewski 1916, which presents the idea of a mereology, or qualitative theory of the part-whole relation between physical individuals. This idea of a logical theory of relations among regions or the objects that occupy them, which does not depend on construing regions as sets of points, remained an active area of philosophical logic, even though it attracted relatively few researchers. More recent work in the philosophical literature, especially Casati & Varzi 1999, Simons 1987, Casati & Varzi 1996, Clarke 1981, Clarke 1985, as directly influential on current computational work.

The Regional Connection Calculus (RCC), developed by computer scientists at the University of Leeds, is based on a primitive C relating regions of space: the intended interpretation of C(x, y) is that the intersection of the closures of the values of x and y is nonempty. (See Cohn et al. 1997, Cohn 1996) for details and references.) One area of research concerns the definability of shapes in RCC. The extent of what can be defined with this simple primitive is surprising, but the technicalities quickly become complex; see, for instance, Gotts 1994, Gotts 1996). The work cited in Cohn et al. 1997 describes constraint propagation techniques and encodings in intuitionistic propositional logic as ways of supporting implemented reasoning based on RCC and some of its extensions. More recent work based on RCC addresses representation and reasoning about motion, which of course combines spatial and temporal issues; see Wolter & Zakharyaschev 2000). For more information about qualitative theories of movement, with references to other approaches, see Galton 1997.

7. Reasoning about Knowledge

Epistemic logic is another area in which logic in computer science have been influenced by philosophical logic. The classical source for epistemic logic is Hintikka 1962, in which Jaakko Hintikka showed that a modal approach to single-agent epistemic attitudes could be informative and rewarding. This work discusses at length the question of exactly which constraints are appropriate for knowledge and belief, when these attitudes are viewed as explicated by a model theoretic relation over possible worlds; in both cases, Hintikka argues for S4 type operators.

In several papers (including McCarthy 1979), John McCarthy has recommended an approach to formalizing knowledge that uses first-order logic, but that quantifies explicitly over such things as individual concepts. In this section, we discuss the approach taken by most computer scientists, who, unlike McCarthy, use a modal language to formalize propositional attitudes.

The logical aspects of modal epistemic logic were not significantly developed after Hintikka’s 1962 presentation; instead, the philosophical literature (which is not extensive, compared with many other topics in the area) concentrates on the issue of hyperintensionality, or closure of epistemic attitudes under logical consequence. This topic is especially challenging, turning out to be closely related to the semantic paradoxes, and the philosophical literature is inconclusive. Intuitions seem to conflict, and it is difficult to find ways to model the important phenomena using logical techniques.[35]

Fagin et al. 1984 begins a tradition in computational logic that revives the modal approach to epistemic logic, developing generalized logical foundations and applications that had not occurred to the philosophers. The technical idea is to simplify the modality, using S5 (or deontic S5 for belief), but to introduce multiple agents, and to concentrate on reasoning having to do with agents’ attitudes about one another’s attitudes. Such logics have direct applications in the analysis of distributed systems, dynamic systems in which change is effected by message actions, which change the knowledge of agents according to rules determined by a communications protocol.

As such, this work belongs to a separate area of computer science, but one that overlaps to some extent with AI. Later, this work has interacted with a research tradition in economics that is concerned with the role of knowledge in games and bargaining; see, for instance, Geanakopolos 1994; Osborne & Rubenstein 1994 [Chapter 5].

For some reason, the multi-agent case did not occur to philosophical logicians.[36] This is another example of the way in which need for an application (in this case, the need for a theory of distributed systems) provided the inspiration for an important logical development. The logical details are extensively and systematically recorded in Fagin et al. 1995; this is essential reading for anyone seriously interested in this topic.

Much of the interdisciplinary work in applications of the logic of knowledge is reported in the proceedings of a series of conferences initiated in 1986 with Halpern 1986. These conferences record one of the most successful collaborations of philosophers with logicians in Computer Science, although the group of involved philosophers has been relatively small. The focus of the conferences has gradually shifted from Computer Science to Economics.

AI applications deal with with knowledge in the form of stored representations, and the tradition in AI with which we are concerned here thinks of reasoning as the manipulation of symbolic representations. Also, it is mainly due to AI that the problem of limited rationality has become a topic of serious interest, providing a counterbalance to the idealizations of philosophy and economics.[37] So you would think that a logical model of propositional attitudes that is committed to closure under logical consequence would be highly unpopular in AI. But this is not so; the possible worlds approach to attitudes is not only the leading theory in the areas discussed in Fagin et al. 1995, but has even been advocated in robotics applications; see Rosenschein & Kaelbling 1995; Rosenschein 1989. Nevertheless, the issue of hyperintensionality has been investigated in the AI literature; see Perlis 1985; Konolige 1986; Lakemeyer 1997; Levesque 1984). Though there are some new positive results here, the AI work in this area has, for the most part, been as inconclusive as that in philosophy.

The philosophical literature on a related topic, the logic of perception, has not been extensive; the main reference is Hintikka 1970.[38] But sensation is addressed in recent work in the AI literature which is concerned with developing logical frameworks for general-purpose applications in robotics. The main idea in this area is to add sensing actions to the repertoire of a planning formalism of the sort discussed in Section 4. The earliest work in this area was carried out in the 1980s by Robert Moore; see Moore 1995b; Moore 1985. For some of the contemporary work in cognitive robotics, see Baral et al. 2000, Bacchus et al. 1999, Golden & Weld, 1996, Pirri & Finzi 1999, and Thielscher 2000.

8. Towards a Formalization of Common Sense

John McCarthy’s explicit long-term goal—the formalization of common sense knowledge—has been adopted and pursued by a relatively small, but active, subcommunity of AI researchers. A larger group (those involved in knowledge representation, cognitive robotics, and qualitative physics) can be considered to work on specialized projects that support the larger goal. Anything like a formalization of common sense is so far from being accomplished that—if it is achievable at all—it is not even possible to estimate when we could expect the task to be completed. However, since 2001 (the date of a symposium on common sense reasoning held at The Courant Institute—see The Common Sense 2001 Homepage) something like a cooperative, sustained effort in this direction has begun to emerge. This effort is yielding a better sense of how to develop a workable methodology for formalizing common sense, and of how to divide the larger problem up into more manageable parts. Many of the papers presented at this conference were presented in expanded form in 2004 in an issue of Artificial Intelligence. The introduction to this issue, Davis & Morgenstern 2004, provides a useful survey and appreciation of the general research area.

This cooperative formalization effort (1) seeks to account for many areas of knowledge, and at the same time (2) attempts to see how this formalized knowledge can be brought to bear on moderately complex common-sense reasoning problems. The first book-length treatment of this topic, Davis 1991, divides the general problem into the following subtopics.

  1. Quantities and Measurements
  2. Time
  3. Space
  4. Physics
  5. Minds
  6. Plans and Goals
  7. Society

Several of these topics overlap with concerns of the qualitative physics and qualitative reasoning community. Although it can be hard to tell where common sense ends and physics begins, the formalization of common sense reasoning can be seen as a more general formalization project that can draw on a tradition in qualitative physics that has gone through many years of development and by now is fairly mature.[39]

And a few of them overlap with the work on the formalization of planning that was described above in Section 4. Minds and society, however, are new and different topics; the former has to do with common sense psychology and its application in introspective and interpersonal reasoning, and the latter, of course, should have to do with social and political knowledge and reasoning, but this is the least-developed area of formalized common sense knowledge: the chapter on this topic in Davis 1991 is very brief, and discusses mutual attitudes and communication. More recently, Andrew S. Gordon and Jerry Hobbs have undertaken a large-scale, ambitious formalization of common-sense psychology. See, for instance, Hobbs & Gordon 2005.

A more recent book-length treatment of the formalization of common sense, Mueller, 2006, follows a similar pattern. More than half of the book is devoted to reasoning about actions and change. There are short chapters on space and mental states, and a longer treatment of default reasoning. Although logical techniques and formalization methods take center stage in this book, it also contains material on nonlogical methods and on implementations related to the formalizations.

Even when attempted on a moderate scale, the formalization of common sense knowledge puts considerable pressure on the resources of even the most powerful logical systems that were devised for the formalization of mathematics. As we tried to show in discussing the special case of action and planning in Section 4, this pressure may lead us to seek logics that can facilitate the formalization projects: for instance, nonmonotomic logics and logics that explicitly represent context.

When larger-scale formalizations are attempted, other challenges arise that are similar to those that software engineering tries to address. Even fairly small programs and systems of axioms are difficult to comprehend and can be highly unpredicable, yielding unexpected consequences and unanticipated interactions. The creation and use of larger programs and formalizations raises questions of how to enable teams of developers to produce coherent results when modules are integrated, how to maintain and test large systems, and how to use knowledge sources such as dictionaries and knowledge bases to automatically generate axioms.

You can think of the philosophical methodology of providing analyses as a collection of attempts to formalize or partially formalize various common sense notions. These attempts are far smaller in scale, less systematic, and more heterogeneous than the parallel effort that is emerging in AI. Philosophers have never chosen a specific domain comparable to the planning domain and mounted a sustained attempt to formalize it, along with a companion effort to develop appropriate logics. And no matter how complex the notions with which they which they are concerned, philosophers have never allowed their analyses to grow to the complexity where methodological issues arise similar to those that apply to the development and maintenance of large software systems.

The techniques emerging in AI are of great potential significance for philosophy because it is easy to suspect that many philosophically important phenomena have the sort of complexity that can only be dealt with by accepting the problems that go along with developing complex formalizations. Limitations of the philosophical methods that were used throughout the twentieth century and are still in use may make it impossible to produce theories that do justice to the subject matter.

It would therefore be a great mistake for philosophers to disparage and ignore the large-scale formalizations that are beginning to emerge in AI because these efforts begin to raise engineering issues. It may well be that, although philosophy requires us to address complex phenomena in a rigorous way, the traditional philosophical methods are capable of doing justice to the complexity. Methods that promise to do this are worth taking seriously.

Among other methods borrowed from computer science, the common sense reasoning community has sought to develop suites of “benchmark problems”. The idea is to publicize problems that are difficult but not impossibly difficult, to encourage the community to create solutions, and compare the solutions.

Probably the best-studied problem to date is Ernest Davis’ “egg-cracking problem.” This is formulated as follows on the Common Sense Reasoning Problem webpage.

A cook is cracking a raw egg against a glass bowl. Properly performed, the impact of the egg against the edge of the bowl will crack the eggshell in half. Holding the egg over the bowl, the cook will separate the two halves of the shell with his fingers, enlarging the crack, and the contents of the egg will fall gently into the bowl. The end result is that the entire contents of the egg will be in the bowl, with the egg unbroken, and that the two halves of the shell are in the cook’s fingers.
Variants: What happens if: The cook brings the egg to impact very quickly? Very slowly? The cook lays the egg in the bowl and exerts steady pressure with his hand? The cook, having cracked the egg, attempts to peel it off its contents like a hard-boiled egg? The bowl is made of looseleaf paper? Of soft clay? The bowl is smaller than the egg? The bowl is upside down? The cook tries this procedure with a hard-boiled egg? With a coconut? With an M&M? [40]

Along with the problem itself three solutions are posted: Shanahan 2004, Lifschitz 1998b, and a version of Morgenstern 2001. Comparing the solutions is instructive: similarities outweigh differences. All the authors think of this as a planning problem, and use a versions of the Situation Calculus or the Event Calculus in the formalization. Each axiomatization is modular, with, for instance, separate modules devoted to the relevant geometrical and material properties. Each author provides a “proof of concept” for the formalization by showing that the axioms support a proof of the correctness of a plan to crack the egg in the simple case. None of the authors considers all of Davis’ elaborations of the problem, but the axioms are framed with elaboration in mind and some elaborations are considered. It isn’t clear whether any of the authors actually implemented the formalization (for instance, using a theorem prover).

The egg-cracking case raises the problem of how to evaluate moderately large formalizations of common sense problems. Morgenstern and Shanahan express this issue explicitly. Morgenstern suggests that the important criteria are (1) Epistemological adequacy (correspondence to intuitive reasoning, as experienced by people who engage in it), (2) Faithfulness to the real world, (3) Reusability, and (4) Elaboration tolerance. It isn’t clear whether the first two of these criteria are too subjective to be useful. To these, Shanahan adds (5) Usability, which probably is presupposed by Morgenstern’s third criterion.

There is anecdotal evidence that the larger AI community is somewhat skeptical about such research projects—or, if not skeptical, at least puzzled about how to evaluate them. In considering these doubts, it is necessary to appreciate the complexity of these formalization problems, and the preliminary and tentative status of the research program. Nevertheless, this criticism has some legitimacy, the common sense reasoning community is sensitive to these criticisms, and is working to develop and refine the methods and criteria for evaluating this work.

As long as formalization problems remain relatively simple, we can treat formalization as an art rather than as a discipline with a well-articulated methodology. But the trends we’ve been discussing show that formalization of even moderate-sized realistic common sense reasoning problems is not merely an art. Just as programming systems, expert systems and knowledge bases have created corresponding software engineering disciplines, large-scale formalization projects require a carefully thought through and tested methodology.

9. Logical Approaches to Natural Language and Communication

Over the last twenty-five years or so, many profound relations have emerged between logic and grammar. Computational linguistics (or natural language processing) is a branch of AI, and it is fairly natural to classify some of these developments under logic and AI. But many of them also belong to an independent tradition in logical foundations of linguistics; and in many cases it is hard (and pointless) to attempt a classification. This sketch will concentrate on developments that have to do with reasoning about linguistics; other applications of logic to linguistics are described in van Benthem & ter Meulen 1996.

9.1 Parsing and Deduction

Grammar formalisms—special-purpose systems for the description of linguistic systems and subsystems—can be thought of as logics designed to axiomatize the association of linguistic structures with strings of symbols. You might be able to infer from such a system, for instance, that ‘assignments’ is the plural form of the nominalization of the verb ‘assign’. So you can look at the process of parsing a string of words—of finding the linguistic structures, if any, that are associated with it—as a search for a proof in a certain logical system.

This approach has been highly successful as an analytic tool. It makes model-theoretic techniques applicable to linguistic reasoning, This makes the underlying reasoning problems much more transparent, and makes it possible to apply many well-developed areas of logic to grammar formalisms. For more information on these topics, see Buszkowski 1996; Shieber 1992.

9.2 Feature Structure Logic

The usefulness and scope of logical methods in relation to linguistics is greatly increased by the development of techniques for analyzing the way information attaches to linguistic units. It is very natural to represent the information attaching, say, to a lexical item in the form of a set of functions (or attributes) that produce values in some linguistic domain. A pronoun x may have a number, a person, and a case: if x = ‘we’ then

  • number(x) = plural,
  • person(x) = first,
  • case(x) = nominative.

In more general cases, the values of these functions may themselves be linguistic units that take on values for certain attributes.

Allowing these functions to be partial provides a useful informational representation of the stages of a linguistic parse; much of the work of parsing involves completing this partial information, subject to constraints imposed by linguistic agreement conditions. Feature structures—sets of identities that serve to evaluate linguistic features—have a natural algebraic interpretation, and there is an elegant treatment of their logic. For more information and references, see Rounds 1996.

9.3 Logic and Discourse

The reasoning associated with discourse is the probably the least well understood area of computational linguistics. Although logical techniques do not yet play a major role in discourse, they seem to offer one of the most promising ways of providing a uniform account of the many forms of reasoning that are involved in generating and interpreting language in interactive conversation.

We briefly mention three contributions to this area. Building on the fact that the rules governing conversation are exception-ridden, Alex Lascarides and Nicholas Asher have developed techniques for formalizing discourse phenomena based on nonmonotonic logic; see Asher & Lascarides 1994, Asher & Lascarides 1997. Jerry Hobbs and various co-workers look at the inference processes used in discourse as abductive, and propose to formalize abduction as a search for a proof in which certain “low-cost” assumptions may be made which serve as data or additional axioms for the proof. Hobbs et al. 1993 shows how an impressive range of discourse phenomena can be formalized using this idea. In practice, this abductive account looks rather similar to that of Lascarides and Asher, because it involves deploying axioms about discourse (in the form of Horn clause rules supplemented with weights giving the assumption costs of premises) that in effect are nonmonotonic.

In more recent work, Matthew Stone shows in Stone 1998 how modal logic can inform the complex reasoning involved in natural language generation. Generating a coherent, appropriately phrased text that usefully performs a task-oriented communication task is difficult to formalize because it requires the integration of complex and sophisticated domain information with discourse planning, user modeling, and linguistic constraints. Stone shows that modal logic can be used to modularize the formalization of the information required in this task; he also shows how modal theorem proving can be used to implement the reasoning.

10. Taxonomic Representation and Reasoning

10.1 Concept-Based Classification

Traditionally, the task of representing large amounts of domain information for general-purpose reasoning has been one of the most important areas of knowledge representation. Systems that exploit the intuitive taxonomic organization of domains are useful for this purpose; taxonomic hierarchies not only help to organize the process of knowledge acquisition, but provide a useful connection to rule-based reasoning.[41]

For domains in which complex definitions are a natural way to organize information, knowledge engineering services based on definitions of concepts have been extremely successful. Like variable-free versions of first-order logic (see, for instance, Quine 1960, these systems are centered on concepts or first-order predicates, and provide a number of mechanisms for their definition. The fundamental algorithm associated with these taxonomic logics is a classifier which inputs a system of definitions and outputs the entailment relations between defined and primitive concepts. For background on these systems, see Woods & Schmolze 1992 and Brachman et al. 1991.

The simplest taxonomic logics can be regarded as subsystems of first-order logic with complex predicates; but they have been extended in many ways, and the issues raised by many of these extensions overlap in many cases with topics in philosophical logic.

10.2 Nonmonotonic Inheritance

Much more complex logical issues arise when the organization of a domain into hierarchies is allowed to have exceptions. One way to approach this topic is to explore how to make a taxonomic logic nonmonotonic; but nonmonotonic inheritance is a topic in its own right. Although there are strong affinities to nonmonotonic logic, nonmonotonic logic relies more heavily on graph-based representations than on traditional logical ideas, and seems to provide a much finer-grained approach to nonmonotonic reasoning that raises entirely new issues, and which quickly becomes problematic. For this reason, systems of nonmonotonic inheritance tend to be expressively weak, and their relations to the more powerful nonmonotonic logic has never been fully clarified. For background on this topic, see Thomason 1992, Horty 1994.

11. Contextual Reasoning

In the tradition in philosophical logic dealing with contextual effects on the interpretation of expressions, as well as in the more recent tradition in dynamic logic, context is primarily formalized as an assignment of values to variables, and the language is designed to make explicit reasoning about context either very limited or outright impossible.

Concern in AI about the representation of large and apparently heterogeneous domains and about the integration of disparate knowledge sources, as well as interests in formalizing common sense of the sort discussed in Section 2.2, above, have led to interest in the AI community in formalizing languages that take context into account more explicitly.

In McCarthy 1993b, McCarthy recommends the study of languages containing a construct


where ist is read “is-true.” This is analogous to the Holds construct of the situation calculus—but now c stands for a context, and φ is a possibly complex propositional representation, which many (including McCarthy) take to refer to a sentence.

There are analogies here both to modal logic and to languages with an explicit truth predicate. But the applications that are envisioned for a logic of context create opportunities and problems that are in many ways new. Work on the logic of context subsequent to McCarthy’s original suggestion, includes McCarthy & Buvac 1998, Guha 1991, and some of the papers in the conference volumes Akman et al. 2001, Bouquet et al. 1999. For extensions of Richard Montague’s Intensional Logic motivated by McCarthy’s suggestions, see Thomason 2003 and 2005.

For some reason, work on the explicit formalization of context hasn’t been actively pursued by the computational community beyond this point. Philosophical interest in context, and especially in the interaction of context with propositional attitudes and modals, continues to be strong; but the very general logical frameworks for context that McCarthy envisioned have yet not been taken up by philosophers.

12. Prospects for a Logical Theory of Practical Reason

There is reason to hope that the combination of logical methods with planning applications in AI can enable the development of a far more comprehensive and adequate theory of practical reasoning than has heretofore been possible. As with many problems having to do with common sense reasoning, the scale and complexity of the formalizations that are required are beyond the traditional techniques of philosophical logic. However, with computational methods of implementing and testing the formalizations and with areas such as cognitive robotics to serve as laboratories for developing and testing ideas, we can hope to radically advance a problem that has seen little progress since it was first proposed by Aristotle: the problem of devising a formalization of practical reasoning that is genuinely applicable to common sense reasoning problems.

The classical work in deontic logic that was begun by von Wright (see von Wright 1983) is one source of ideas; see (Horty 2001, van der Torre 1997). In fact, as the more recent work in deontic logic shows, nonmonotonic logic provides a natural and useful supplement to the classical deontic logic. One recent work (Horty 2012) seeks to base deontic logic on a prioritized version of Reiter’s default logic.

An even more robust account of practical reasoning begins to emerge when these ideas are supplemented with work on the foundations of planning and reasoning about action that were discussed in Section 4, above. But this development can be pursued even further, by extending the formalism to include preferences and intentions.[42]

Ultimately, what is needed is a model of an intelligent reasoning and acting agent. Developing such a model need not be entirely a matter of logic, but according to one school of thought, logic has a central role to play in it; see, for instance, Baral & Gelfond 2000, Wobcke et al. 1998, Rao & Georgeff 1991, Burkhard et al. 1998).


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I am grateful to John McCarthy, who read a draft of this article and provided extensive and helpful comments.

Copyright © 2018 by
Richmond Thomason <rthomaso@umich.edu>

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