#### Supplement to Inductive Logic

## Some Prominent Approaches to the Representation of Uncertain Inference

The following figure indicates a relationship among six of the most
prominent approaches to uncertain inference. The arrows point from
more general to less general representation schemes. For example, the
*Dempster-Shafer* representation contains the *probability
functions* as a special case.

Representations of Uncertainty

These representations are often described as measures on events, or states, or propositions, or sets of possibilities. But deductive logics are usually described in terms of statements or sentences of a language. So let’s follow suit throughout this discussion.

*Plausibility relations* (Friedman & Halpern 1995)
constitute the most general of these representations. They satisfy the
weakest axioms, the weakest constraints on the logic of uncertainty.
For a *plausibility relation* \(\succcurlyeq\) between
sentences, an expression ‘\(A \succcurlyeq B\)’, says that
*A* is at least as plausible as *B*. The axioms for
plausibility relations say that tautologies are more plausible than
contradictions, any two logically equivalent sentences are
plausibility-related to other sentence in precisely the same way, a
sentence is no more plausible than the sentences it logically entails,
and the *at least as plausible* relation is transitive. These
axioms make plausibility relations *weak partial orders* on the
relative plausibility of sentences. They permits some sentences to be
incomparable with respect to plausibility—neither more
plausible, nor less plausible, nor equally plausible to one
another.

*Qualitative probability relations* are *plausibility
relations* for which three additional axioms are satisfied. One of
these additional axioms says that when a sentence *S* is
logically incompatible with both sentence *A* and sentence
*B*, then \(A \succcurlyeq B\) holds *just in case* \((A
\textrm{ or } S) \succcurlyeq(B \textrm{ or } S)\) holds as well. Now,
suppose that a *qualitative probability relations* are on a
language satisfy one additional (two-part) axiom, they can be shown to
be *representable* by *probability
functions*—i.e., given any *qualitative probability
relation* \(\succcurlyeq\), there is a unique probability function
*P* such that \(A \succcurlyeq B\) just in case \(P[A] \ge
P[B]\). So quantitative *probability* may be viewed as
essentially just a way of placing a numerical measure on sentences
that uniquely emulates the *is at least as plausible* relation
specified by *qualitative probability* (see Koopman 1940;
Savage 1954; Hawthorne & Bovens 1999; Hawthorne 2009).

*Probability* (i.e., *quantitative probability*) is a
measure of *plausibility* that assigns a number between 0 and 1
to each sentence. Intuitively, the *probability* of a sentence
*S*, \(P[S] = r\), says that *S* *is plausible to degree
r*, or that *the rational degree of confidence (or belief)
that* *S* *is true is* *r*. The axioms for
*probabilities* basically require two things. First,
tautologies get probability 1. Second, when *A* and *B*
contradict each other, the probability of the disjunction \((A
\textrm{ or } B)\) must be the sum of the probabilities of *A*
and of *B* individually. It is primarily in regard to this second
axiom that *probability* differs from each of the other
quantitative measures of uncertainty.

Like *probability*, *Dempster-Shafer belief functions*
(Shafer 1976, 1990) measure *appropriate belief strengths* on a
scale between 0 and 1, with contradictions and tautologies at the
respective extremes. But whereas the *probability* of a
disjunction of incompatible claims must equal the sum of the parts,
*Dempster-Shafer belief functions* only require such
disjunctions be *believed at least as strongly as* the sum of
the *belief strengths* of the parts. So these functions are a
generalization of *probability*. By simply tightening up the
*Dempster-Shafer* axiom about how disjunctions are related to
their parts we get back a restricted class of *Dempster-Shafer
functions* that just is the class of *probability
functions*. *Dempster-Shafer* functions are primarily
employed as a logic of evidential support for hypotheses. In that
realm they are a generalization of the idea of evidential support
embodied by *probabilistic inductive logic*. There is some
controversy as to whether such a generalization is useful or
desirable, or whether simple *probability* is too narrow to
represent important evidential relationships captured by some
*Dempster-Shafer functions*.

There is a sense in which the other two quantitative measures of
uncertainty, *possibility functions* and *ranking
functions*, are definable in terms of formulas employing the
*Dempster-Shafer functions*. But this is not the best way to
understand them. *Possibility functions* (Zadeh 1965 1978;
Dubois & Prade 1980, 1990) are generally read as representing
*the degree of uncertainty* in a claim, where such uncertainty
is often attributed to vagueness or fuzziness. These functions are
formally like *probability functions* and *Dempster-Shafer
functions*, but they subscribe to a simpler addition rule: the
*degree of uncertainty* of a disjunction is the greater of the
*degrees of uncertainty* of the parts. Similarly, the
*degree of uncertainty* of a conjunction is the smaller of the
*uncertainties* of the parts.

*Ranking functions* (Spohn 1988) supply a measure of how
surprising it would be if a claim turned out to be true, rated on a
scale from 0 (not at all surprising) to infinity. Tautologies have
*rank* 0 and contradictions are infinitely surprising.
Logically equivalent claims have the same *rank*. The
*rank* of a disjunction is equal to the *rank* of the
lower ranking disjunct. These functions may be used to represent a
kind of *order-of-magnitude* reasoning about the plausibility
of various claims.

See Halpern 2003 for a good comparative treatment of all of these approaches.

Here are the axioms for the *Plausibility Relations* and the
*Qualitative Probability Relations*. We may specify them in
terms of a formal language *L* for either sentential logic or for
predicate logic. In this formal language we employ the following
expressions to represent the standard logical terms:
‘not’, ‘\({\nsim}\)’; ‘and’,
‘\(\cdot\)’; ‘or’, ‘\(\vee\)’. We
represent the the standard *logical entailment* relation with
the symbol ‘\(\vDash\)’—i.e., the expression
‘\(B \vDash A\)’ says “*B logically entails
A*” and the expression ‘\(\vDash A\)’ says
“*A* is a tautology”.

**Axioms for the**

*Plausibility Relations*Each

*plausibility relation*\(\succcurlyeq\) satisfies the following axioms:

- if \(\vDash A\), then
*not*\({\nsim}A \succcurlyeq A\); - if \(B \vDash A\), then \(A \succcurlyeq B\);
- if \(A \vDash B\) and \(B \vDash A\) (i.e., if
*A*is logically equivalent to*B*), then: (1) if \(A \succcurlyeq C\), then \(B \succcurlyeq C\); and (2) if \(D \succcurlyeq A\), then \(D \succcurlyeq B\); - if \(A \succcurlyeq B\) and \(B \succcurlyeq C\), then \(A \succcurlyeq C\).

**Axioms for the**

*Qualitative Probability Relations*To get the

*qualitative probability relations*we add the axioms

- if \(\vDash{\nsim}(A\cdot C)\) and \(\vDash{\nsim}(B\cdot C)\), then \(A \succcurlyeq B\) if and only if \((A \vee C) \succcurlyeq(B \vee C)\).
- \(A \succcurlyeq B\) or \(B \succcurlyeq\) A;

The typical axioms for *quantitative probability* are as
follows:

- for all sentences \(A, 0 \le P[A] \le 1\);
- if \(\vDash A\), then \(P[S] = 1\);
- if \(\vDash{\nsim}(A\cdot B)\), then \(P[(A \vee B)] = P[A] + P[B]\).

Axioms 1–6 for the *qualitative probability relations*
are probabilistically sound with respect to the quantitative
probability functions. That is, for each given probability function
*P*, define a relation \(\succcurlyeq\) such that \(A
\succcurlyeq B\) *just in case* \(P[A] \ge P[B]\). Then it can
be shown that \(\succcurlyeq\) must satisfy axioms 1–6. However,
not every qualitative probability relation that satisfies axioms
1–6 may be represented by a probability function. To get that we
must add one further *structural axiom*.

First we need to define a bit more notation. Two sentences are defined
as *equally plausible*, \(A \approx B\), just when both \(A
\succcurlyeq B\) and \(B \succcurlyeq A\). One sentence is defined as
*more plausible* than another, \(A \succ B\), just when \(A
\succcurlyeq B\) but *not* \(B \succcurlyeq A\).

Let’s say that a qualitative probability relation
\(\succcurlyeq\) is *fine-grained* just in case it satisfies
the following axiom:

- if \(A \succ B\), then (for each natural number
*n*) there is some tautology consisting of a disjunction of*n*sentences, \(\vDash(S_1 \vee S_2 \vee \ldots \vee S_n)\), where for each distinct \(S_i\) and \(S_j\) we have \(\vDash{\nsim}(S_{i} \cdot S_{j})\) (each distinct \(S_i\) and \(S_j\) are inconsistent with one another) and where \(S_i \approx S_j\) (they are equally plausible), and such that for each of the \(S_i\), \(A \succ(B \vee S_i)\).

Think of each sentence \(S_i\) as saying that in some fair lottery
consisting of *n* tickets ticket *i* will win (where exactly
one ticket must win, and where each ticket has the same chance of
winning).

It can be proved that for each *fine-grained* qualitative
probability relation \(\succcurlyeq\) there is a unique probability
function *P* such that \(A \succcurlyeq B\) *just in case*
\(P[A] \ge P[B]\).

Now, call a qualitative probability relation \(\succcurlyeq\)
*properly extendable* just in case it can be extended to a
*fine-grained* qualitative probability relation (perhaps
defined on a larger language, i.e., a language containing additional
sentences). Then for every *properly extendable* qualitative
probability relation \(\succcurlyeq\) there is a probability function
*P* such that \(A \succcurlyeq B\) *just in case* \(P[A]
\ge P[B]\). In general a given *properly extendable*
qualitative probability relation may have many such representing
probability functions, corresponding to different ways of extending it
to *fine-grained* qualitative probability relations.

Thus, the quantitative probability functions may be viewed as just
useful ways of representing *properly extendable* qualitative
probability relations on a convenient numerical scale.