Logic and Information

First published Mon Feb 3, 2014; substantive revision Thu Aug 3, 2023

At their most basic, logic is the study of consequence, and information is a commodity. Given this, the interrelationship between logic and information will centre on the informational consequences of logical actions or operations conceived broadly. The explicit inclusion of the notion of information as an object of logical study is a recent development. It was by the beginning of the present century that a sizable body of existing technical and philosophical work (with precursors that can be traced back to the 1930s) coalesced into the new emerging field of logic and information (see Dunn 2001). This entry is organised thematically, rather than chronologically. We survey major logical approaches to the study of information, as well as informational understandings of logics themselves. We proceed via three interrelated and complementary stances: information-as-range, information-as-correlation, and information-as-code.

The core intuition motivating the Information-as-range stance, is that an informational state may be characterised by the range of possibilities or configurations that are compatible with the information available at that state. Acquiring new information corresponds to a reduction of that range, thus reducing uncertainty about the actual configuration of affairs. With this understanding, the setting of possible-world semantics for epistemic modal logics proves to be rewarding for the study of various semantic aspects of information. A prominent phenomenon here is information update, which may occur in both individual and social settings, due to the interaction between both agents and their environment via different types of epistemic actions. We will see that an epistemic action is any action that facilitates the flow of information, hence we will return to epistemic actions themselves throughout.

The Information-as-correlation stance focuses on information flow as it is licensed within structured systems formed by systematically correlated components. For example: the number of rings of a tree trunk can give you information about the time when the tree was born, in virtue of certain regularities of nature that ‘connect’ the past and present of trees. Central themes of this stance include the aboutness, situatedness, and accessibility of information in structured information environments.

The key concern of the third stance, Information-as-code, is the syntax-like structure of information pieces (their encoding) and the inference and computation processes that are licensed by virtue (among other things) of that structure. A most natural logical setting to study these informational aspects is the algebraic proof theory underpinned by a range of substructural logics. Substructural logics have always been a natural home for informational analysis, and the recent developments in the area enrich the information-as-code stance.

The three stances are by no means incompatible, but neither are they necessarily reducible to each other. This will be expanded on later in the entry, and some further topics of research will be illustrated, but for a preview of how the three stances can live together, take the case of a structured information system composed of several parts. Firstly, the correlations between the parts naturally allow for ‘information flow’ in the sense of the information-as-correlation stance. Secondly, they also give rise to a local ranges of possibilities, since the local information available at one part will be compatible with a certain range of global states of the system. Thirdly, the combinatorial, syntax-like, proof-theoretical aspects of information can be brought to this setting in various ways. One of them is treating the correlational flow of information as a sort of combinatorial system by which local information states are combined in syntactic-like ways, fitting a particular interpretation of substructural logic. One could also add code-like-structure to the modelling explicitly, for example by assigning local deductive calculi to either the components or local states of the system. We begin however with information as range

1. Information as Range

The understanding of information as range has its origins in Bar-Hillel and Carnap’s theory of semantic information, Bar-Hillel and Carnap (1952).[1] It is here that the inverse range principle is given its first articulation with regard to the informational content of a proposition. The inverse range principle states that there is an inverse relationship between the information contained by a proposition on the one hand, and the likelihood of that proposition being true on the other. That is, the more information carried by a proposition, the less likely it is that the proposition is true. Similarly, the more likely the truth of a proposition, the less information it carries.

The likelihood of the truth of a proposition connects with information as range via a possible worlds semantics. For any contingent proposition, it will be supported by some possibilities (those where it is true) and not supported by others (those where it is false). Hence a proposition will be supported by a range of possibilities, an “information range”. Now suppose that there is a probability distribution across the space of possibilities, and for the sake of simplicity suppose that the distribution is uniform. In this case, the more worlds that support a proposition, the likelier the proposition’s truth, and, via the inverse relationship principle, the less information it carries. Although information as range has its origins in quantitative information theory, its role in contemporary qualitative logics of information cannot be overstated.

Consider the following example due to Johan van Benthem (2011). A waiter in a cafe receives an order for your table—an espresso and a soda. When the waiter arrives at your table, he asks “For whom is the soda?”. After your telling him that the soda is for you and his giving you your soda, the waiter does not need to ask about the espresso, he can just give it to your cafe-partner. This is because the information gained by the waiter from your telling him that you ordered the soda allows him to eliminate certain open possibilities from the total range of possibilities such that only one is left—your friend ordered the espresso.

The waiter case brings several facts about logic and information to the fore. For one, language is used often to refine informational options in the very way explained in the paragraph above. More subtly however, and perhaps even prior to this, language is used to exchange information, and we bring with us sometimes many scenarios—specified informationally. These scenarios might be neither known nor believed, but merely entertained—those about which we wonder. Recent work on inquisitive semantics (Ciardelli et al. 2018) provides a logic of such information exchange based on informational specifications of such wonderings.

Logics of information distinguish regularly between hard information and soft information. The terminology is a slight misnomer, as this distinction is not one between different types of information per se. Rather it is one between different types of information storage. Hard information is factive, and unrevisable. Hard information is often taken to correspond to knowledge. In contrast to hard information, soft information is non-necessarily-factive, hence revisable in the presence of new information. Soft information, in virtue of its revisability, corresponds very closely to belief. The terms knowledge and belief are conventional, but on the context of information flow, the hard/soft information reading is convenient on account of it bringing the informational phenomena to the foreground. At the very least the terminology is increasingly popular, so being clear on the distinction being one between types of information storage as opposed to types of information is important. Although both hard and soft information are important for our epistemic and doxastic success, in this section we will concentrate mainly on logics of hard information flow.[2]

In section 1.1 we will see how it is that classic epistemic logics exemplify the flow of hard information within the information as range framework. In section 1.2 we will extend our exposition from logics of hard information-gain to logics of the actions that facilitate the gain of such hard information, dynamic epistemic logics. At the end of Section 1.2, we will expound the important phenomenon of private information, before examining how it is that information as range is captured in various quantitative frameworks.

1.1 Epistemic logic

In this section we will explore how it is that the elimination of possibilities corresponding to information-gain is the starting point for research on logics of knowledge and belief that fall under the heading of epistemic logics. We will begin with classic single-agent epistemic logic, before exploring multi-agent epistemic logics. In both cases, since we will be concentrating on logics of knowledge as opposed to logics of belief, the information-gained will be hard information.

Consider the waiter example in more detail. Before receiving the hard information that the soda is for you (and for the sake of the example we are assuming that the waiting is dealing with hard information here), the waiter’s knowledge-base is modelled by a pair of worlds (hereafter information states) \(x\) and \(y\) such that in \(x\) you ordered the soda and your friend the espresso, and in \(y\) you ordered the espresso and your friend the soda. After receiving the hard information that the soda is for you, \(y\) is eliminated from the waiter’s knowledge-base, leaving only \(x\). As such, the reduction of the range of possibilities corresponds to an information-gain for the waiter. Consider the truth condition for agent \(\alpha\) knows that \(\phi\), written \(K_{\alpha}\phi\):

\[\tag{1} x \Vdash K_{\alpha}\phi \text{ iff for all } y \text{ s.t. (such that) } R_{\alpha}xy, y \Vdash \phi \]

The accessibility relation \(R_{\alpha}\) is an equivalence relation connecting \(x\) to all information states \(y\) such that \(y\) is indistinguishable from \(x\), given \(\alpha\)’s hard information at that state \(x\). That is, given what the waiter knows when he is in that state. So, if \(x\) was the waiter’s information state before being informed that you ordered the soda, \(y\) would have included the information that you ordered the espresso, as each option was as good as the other until the waiter was informed otherwise. There is an implicit assumption at work here—that some state \(z\) say, where you ordered both the soda and the espresso, is not in the waiter’s information-range. That is, the waiter knows that \(z\) is not a possibility. Once informed however, the information states supporting your ordering the espresso are eliminated from the range of information corresponding to the waiter’s knowledge.

Basic modal logic extends propositional formulas with modal operators such as \(K_{\alpha}\). If \(\mathbf{K}\) is the set of all Kripke models then we have the following:

\[\begin{align} \tag{A1} &\mathbf{K} \Vdash K_{\alpha}\phi \wedge K_{\alpha}(\phi \rightarrow \psi) \rightarrow K_{\alpha}\psi \\ \tag{A2} & \mathbf{K} \Vdash \phi \Rightarrow \mathbf{K} \Vdash K_{\alpha}\phi \end{align}\]

In hard information terms, (A1) states that hard information is closed under (known) implications. Since the first conjunct states that all states accessible by \(\alpha\) are \(\phi\) states, \(\alpha\) possesses the hard information that \(\phi\), hence \(\alpha\) also possesses the hard information that \(\psi\). (A2) states that if \(\phi\) holds in the set of all models, then \(\alpha\) possesses the hard information that \(\phi\). In other words, (A2) states that all tautologies are known/hard stored by the agent, and (A1) states that \(\alpha\) knows the logical consequences of all propositions that \(\alpha\) knows (be they tautologies or otherwise). That is, the axioms state that the agent is logical omniscient, or an ideal reasoner, a property of agents that we will return to in detail in the sections below.[3]

The framework explored so far concerns single-agent epistemic logic, but reasoning and information flow are very often multi-agent affairs. Consider again the waiter example. Importantly, the waiter is only able to execute the relevant reasoning procedure corresponding to a restriction of the range of information states on account of your announcement to him with regard to the espresso. That is, it is the verbal interaction between several agents that facilitates the information flow that enabled the logical reasoning to be undertaken.

It is at this point that multi-agent epistemic logic raises new questions regarding the information in a group. “Everybody in \(G\) possesses the hard information that \(\phi\)” (where \(G\) is any group of agents from a finite set of agents \(G^*)\) written as \(E_G\phi . E_G\) is defined for each \(G \subseteq G^*\) in the following manner:

\[\tag{2} E_G\phi = \bigwedge_{\alpha \in G} K_{\alpha}\phi \]

Group knowledge is importantly different from common knowledge (Lewis 1969; Fagin et al. 1995). Common knowledge is the condition of the group where everybody knows that everybody knows that everybody knows … that \(\phi\). In other words, common knowledge concerns the hard information that each agent in the group possesses about the hard information possessed by the other members of the group. That everybody in \(G\) possesses the hard information that \(\phi\) does not imply that \(\phi\) is common knowledge. With group knowledge each agent in the group may possess the same hard information (hence achieving group knowledge) without necessarily possessing hard information about the hard information possessed by the other agents in the group. As noted by van Ditmarsh, van der Hoek, and Kooi (2008: 30), “the number of iterations of the \(E\)-operator makes a real difference in practice”. \(C_G\phi\)—the common knowledge that \(\phi\) for members of \(G\), is defined as follows:

\[\tag{3} C_G\phi = \bigwedge_{n=0}^{\infty} E^n_G \phi \]

To appreciate the difference between \(E\) and \(C\), consider the following “spy example” (originally Barwise 1988 with the envelope details due to Johan van Benthem).

There are a group of competing spies at a formal dinner. All of them are tasked with the mission of acquiring some secret information from inside the restaurant. Furthermore, it is common knowledge amongst them that they want the information. Given this much, compare the following:

  • Each spy knows that the information is in an envelope on one of the other tables, but they don’t know that the other spies know this (i.e., it is not common knowledge).
  • It is common knowledge amongst the spies that the information is in the envelope.

Very obviously, the two scenarios will elicit very different types of behaviour from the spies. The first would be relatively subtle, the latter dramatically less so. See Vanderschraaf and Sillari (2009) for further details.

A still more fine-grained use of S5 based epistemic logics is that of Zhou (2016). Zhou demonstrates that S5 based epistemic logic may be used to model the epistemic states of the agent from the perspective of the agent themselves. Hence Zhou refers to such an epistemic logic as internally epistemic. Zhou then uses a multi-valued logic to model the relationship between the agent’s internal knowledge base and their external informational environment. In his (2019), van Benthem argues for an understanding of modal logics in general (both epistemic and otherwise) as ariing from an explicit approach to increasing a logic’s conceptual nuance — in the sense that they are explicit extensions of classical logic. They wear their new conceptual architechture on their sleaves, so to speak. This is in contrast to those logics to which van Benthem refers as resulting from an implicit approach. This implicit approach invloves a reinterpretation of the meaning of logical vocabulary, as is the case with intuitionistic logic and relevant logic as conceived of traditionally. van Benthem’s method of translating between equivalient (in a sense) implicit and explicit approaches has as an instance that between Kit Fine’s (2017) hyperintensional truth-maker semantics and informationalised modal logic. This is a promising foray into such translations between a range of information logics such as those addressed in this entry.

1.2 Dynamic epistemic logic, information change

See the full entry on Dynamic Epistemic Logic. As noted above, the waiter example from the beginning of this section is as much about information-gain via announcements, epistemic actions, as it is about information structures. In this section, we will outline how it is that the expressive power of multi-agent epistemic logic can be extended so as to capture epistemic actions.

Hard information flow, that is, the flow of information between the knowledge states of two or more agents, can be facilitated by more than one epistemic action. Two canonical examples are announcements and observations. When “announcement” is restricted to true and public announcement, its result on the receiving agent’s knowledge-base is similar to that of an observation (on the assumption that the agent believes the content of the announcement). The public announcement that \(\phi\) will restrict the model of the agent’s knowledge-base to the information states where \(\phi\) is true, hence “announce \(\phi\)” is an epistemic state transformer in the sense that it transforms the epistemic states of the agents in the group, (see van Ditmarsh, van der Hoek, and Kooi 2008: 74).[4]

Dynamic epistemic logics extend the language of non-dynamic epistemic logics with dynamic operators. In particular, public announcement logic (PAL) extends the language of epistemic logics with the dynamic announcement operator [\(\phi\)], where [\(\phi]\psi\) is read “after announcement \(\phi\), it is the case that \(\psi\)”. The key reduction axioms of PAL are as follows:

\[\begin{alignat}{2} \tag{RA1} &[\phi]p &\text{ iff } &\phi \rightarrow p \text{ (where \(p\) is atomic)} \\ \tag{RA2} &[\phi]\neg \psi &\text{ iff } &\phi \rightarrow \neg[\phi]\psi \\ \tag{RA3} &[\phi](\psi \wedge \chi) &\text{ iff } &[\phi]\psi \wedge[\phi]\chi \\ \tag{RA4} &[\phi][\psi]\chi &\text{ iff } &[\phi \wedge[\phi]\psi]\chi \\ \tag{RA5} &[\phi]K_{\alpha}\psi &\text{ iff } &\phi \rightarrow K_{\alpha}(\phi \rightarrow [\phi]\psi) \end{alignat}\]

RA1–RA5 capture the properties of the announcement operator by connecting what is true before the announcement with what is true after the announcement. The axioms are named ‘reduction’ axioms because the left-to-right hand direction reduces either the number of announcement operators or the complexity of the formulas within their scope. For an in depth discussion see Pacuit (2011). RA1 states that announcements are truthful. RA5 specifies the epistemic-state-transforming properties of the announcement operator. It states that \(\alpha\) knows that \(\psi\) after the announcement that \(\phi\) iff \(\phi\) implies that \(\alpha\) knows that \(\psi\) will be true after \(\phi\) is announced in all \(\phi\)-states. The “after \(\phi\) is announced” condition is there to account for the fact that \(\psi\) might change its truth-value after the announcement. The interaction between the dynamic announcement operator and the knowledge operator is described completely by RA5 (see van Benthem, van Eijck, and Kooi 2006).

Just as adding the common knowledge operator \(C\) to multi-agent epistemic logic extends the expressive capabilities of multi-agent epistemic logic, adding \(C\) to PAL results in the more expressive public announcement logic with common knowledge, (PAC). The exact relationship between public announcements and common knowledge is captured by the announcement and common knowledge rule of the logic PAC as the following:

\[\tag{4} \text{From } \chi \rightarrow[\phi]\psi \text{ and } (\chi \wedge \phi) \rightarrow E_G\chi, \text{ infer } \chi \rightarrow [\phi]C_G\psi. \]

Again, PAC is the dynamic logic of hard information. The epistemic logics dealing with soft information fall within the scope of belief revision theory (van Benthem 2004; Segerberg 1998). Recall that hard and soft information are not distinct types of information per se, rather they are distinct types of information storage. Hard-stored information is unrevisable, whereas soft-stored information is revisable. Variants of PAL that model soft information augment their models with plausibility-orderings on information-states (Baltag and Smets 2008). These orderings are known as preferential models in non-monotonic logic and belief-revision theory. The logics can be made dynamic in virtue of the orderings changing in the face of new information (which is the mark of soft information as opposed to hard information). Such plausibility-orderings may be modelled qualitatively via partial orders etc., or modelled quantitatively via probability-measures. Such quantitative measures provide a connection to a broader family of quantitative approaches to semantic information that we will examine below. Recent work by Allo (2017) ties the soft information of dynamic epistemic logic to non-monotonic logics. This is an intuitive move. Soft information is information that has been stored in a revisable way, hence the revisable nature of conclusions in non-monotonic arguments makes non-monotonic logics a natural fit. On this very topic, see also Chapter 13.7 of van Benthem (2011).

Private information. Private information is an equally important aspect of our social interaction. Consider scenarios where the announcing agent is aware of the private communication whilst other members of the group are not, such as emails in Bcc. Consider also scenarios where the sending agent is not aware of the private communication, such as a surveillance operation. The system of dynamic epistemic logic (DEL) models events that turn on private (and public) information by modelling the agents’ information concerning the events taking place in a given communicative scenario (see Baltag et al. 2008; van Ditmarsh et al. 2008; and Pacuit 2011). For an excellent overview and integration of all of the issues above, see the recent work of van Benthem (2016), where the author discusses multiple interrelated levels of logical dynamics, one level of update, and another of representation. For an extensive collection of papers extending this and related approaches, see Baltag and Smets (2014). Although research into public and private information, most especially with regard to information crossing the threshold from one to the other, has been carried out within the framework of dynamic epistemic logics, recent work explores public and private information and announcements within the framework of multi-valued logics. See Yang et al. (2021).

The modal information theory approach to multi-agent information flow is the subject of a great amount of research. The semantics is not always carried out in relational terms (i.e., with Kripke Frames) but is done often algebraically (see Blackburn et al. 2001 for details of the algebraic approach to modal logic). For more details on algebraic as well as type-theoretic approaches, see the subsection on algebraic and other approaches to modal information theory in the supplementary document Abstract Approaches to Information Structure.

1.3 Quantitative Approaches

Quantitative approaches to information as range also have their origins in the inverse relationship principle. To restate—the motivation being that the less likely the truth of a proposition as expressed in a logical language with respect to a particular domain, the greater the amount of information encoded by the relevant formula. This is in contrast to the information measures in the mathematical theory of communication (Shannon 1953 [1950]) where such measures are gotten via an inverse relationship on the expectation of the receiver \(R\) of the receipt of a signal from some source \(S\).

Another important aspect of the classical theory of information, is that it is an entirely static theory—it is concerned with the informational content and measure of particular formulas, and not with information flow in any way at all.

The formal details of classical information theory turn on the probability calculus. These details may be left aside here, as the obvious conceptual point is that logical truths have a truth-likelihood of 1, and therefore an information measure of 0. Bar-Hillel and Carnap did not take this to mean that logical truths, or deductions, were without information yield, only that their theory of semantic information was not designed to capture such a property. They referred to such a property with the term psychological information. See Floridi (2013) for further details.

A quantitative attempt at specifying the information yield of deductions was undertaken by Jaakko Hintikka with his theory of surface information and depth information (Hintikka 1970, 1973). The theory of surface and depth information extends Bar-Hillel and Carnap’s theory of semantic information from the monadic predicate calculus all the way up to the full polyadic predicate calculus. This itself is a considerable achievement, but although technically astounding, a serious restriction of this approach is that it is only a fragment of the deductions carried out within full first-order logic that yield a non-zero information measure. The rest of the deductions in the full polyadic predicate calculus, as well as all of those in the monadic predicate calculus and propositional calculus, measure 0, (see Sequoiah-Grayson 2008). For recent elaborations upon Hintikka’s distinction between suface and depth information, both formal and philosophical, see Panahy (2023), Hernandez and Quiroz (2022 [Other Internet Resources]), Negro (2022), and Ramos Mendonça (2022).

The obvious inverse situation with the theory of classical semantic information is that logical contradictions, having a truth-likelihood of 0, will deliver a maximal information measure of 1. Referred to in the literature as the Bar-Hillel-Carnap Semantic Paradox, the most developed quantitative approach to addressing it is the theory of strongly semantic information (Floridi 2004). The conceptual motivation behind strongly semantic information is that for a statement to yield information, it must help us to narrow down the set of possible worlds. That is, it must assist us in the search for the actual world, so to speak (Sequoiah-Grayson 2007). Such a contingency requirement on informativeness is violated by both logical truths and logical contradictions, both of which measure 0 on the theory of strongly semantic information. See Floridi (2013) for further details. See also Brady (2016) for recent work on the relationship between quantitative accounts of information and analyticity. For a new approach to connecting quantitative and qualitative measures of information, see Harrison-Trainor et al. (2018)

2. Information as Correlation: Situation Theory

The correlational take on information looks at how the existence of systematic connections between the parts of a structured information environment permits that one part may carry information about another. For example: the pattern of pixels that appear on the screen of a computer gives information (not necessarily complete) about the sequence of keys that were pressed by the person who is typing a document, and even a partial snapshot of the clear starred sky your friend is looking at now will give you information about his possible locations on Earth at this moment. The focus on structured environments and the aboutness of information goes hand in hand with a third main topic of the information-as correlation approach, namely the situatedness of information, that is, its dependence on the particular setting on which an informational signal occurs. Take the starry sky as an example again: the same pattern of stars, at different moments in time and locations in space will in general convey different information about the location of your friend.

Historically, the first paradigmatic setting of correlated information was Shannon’s work on communication (1948), which we already mentioned in the last section. Shannon considered a communication system formed by two information sites, a source and a receiver, connected via a noisy channel. He gave conclusive and extremely useful answers to questions having to do with the construction of communication codes that help maximising the effectiveness of communication (in terms of bits of information that can be transmitted) while minimizing the possibility of errors caused by channel noise. As we previously said, Shannon’s concern was purely quantitative. The logical approach to information as correlation builds on Shannon’s ideas, but is concerned with qualitative aspects of information flow, like the ones we highlighted before: what information about a ‘remote’ site (remote in terms of space, time, perspective, etc.) can be drawn out of information that is directly available at a ‘proximal’ site?

Situation theory (Barwise and Perry 1983; Devlin 1991) is the major logical framework so far that has made these ideas its starting point for an analysis of information. Its origin and some of its central insights can be found in the project of naturalization of mind and the possibility of knowledge initiated by Fred Dretske (1981), which soon influenced the inception of situation semantics in the context of natural language (see Kratzer 2011).

Technically, there are two kinds of developments in situation theory:

  1. Set-theoretic and model-theoretic frameworks based on detailed ontologies, suitable for modelling informational phenomena in concrete applications.
  2. A mathematical theory of information flow as enabled by lawful channels that connect parts of a whole. This theory takes a more abstract view on information as correlation, which is applicable (in principle) to all sorts of systems that can be decomposed into interrelated parts.

The next three subsections survey some of the basic notions from this tradition: the basic sites of information in situation theory (called situations), the basic notion of information flow based on correlations between situations, and the mathematical theory of classifications and channels mentioned in (b).

2.1 Situations and Supporting Information

The ontologies in (a) span a wide spectrum of entities. They are meant to reflect a particular way in which an agent may carve up a system. Here “a system” can be the world, or a part or aspect of it, while the agent (or kind of agent) can be an animal species, a device, a theorist, etc. The list of basic entities includes individuals, relations (which come with roles attached to them), temporal and spacial locations, and various other things. Distinctive among them are the situations and infons.

Roughly speaking, situations are highly structured parts of a system, such as a class session, a scene as seen from a certain perspective, a war, etc. Situations are the basic supporters of information. Infons, on the other hand, are the informational issues that situations may or may not support. The simplest kind of informational issue is whether some entities \(a_1 , \ldots ,a_n\) stand (or do not stand) in a relation \(R\) when playing the roles \(r_1 , \ldots ,r_n\), respectively. Such basic infon is usually denoted as

\[ \llangle R, r_1 : a_1 , \ldots ,r_n : a_n, i\rrangle. \]

where \(i\) is 1 or 0, according to whether the issue is positive or negative.

Infons are not intrinsic bearers of truth, and they are not claims either. They are simply informational issues that may or may not be supported by particular situations. We’ll write \(s \models \sigma\) to mean that the situation \(s\) supports the infon \(\sigma\). As an example, a successful transaction whereby Mary bought a piece of cheese in the local market is a situation that supports the infon

\[ \sigma = \llangle bought, what : cheese, who : Mary, 1\rrangle. \]

This situation does not support the infon

\[ \llangle bought, what : cheese, who : Mary, 0\rrangle \]

because Mary did buy cheese. Nor does the situation support the infon

\[ \llangle landed, who : Armstrong, where : Moon, 1\rrangle, \]

because Armstrong is not part of the situation in question at all.

The discrimination or individuation of a situation by an agent does not entail that the agent has full information about it: when we wonder whether the local market is open, we have individuated a situation about which we actually lack some information. See Textor (2012) for a detailed discussion on the nature of situation-like entities and their relation with other ontological categories such as the possible worlds used in modal logic.

Besides individuals, relations, locations, situations and basic infons, there are various kinds of parametric and abstract entities. For example, there is a mechanism of type abstraction. According to it, if \(y\) is a parameter for situations, then

\[ T_y = [y \mid y \models \llangle bought, what : cheese, who : x, 1\rrangle] \]

is the type of situations where somebody buys cheese. There will be some basic types in an ontology, and many other types obtained via abstraction, as just described.

The collection of ontology entities also includes propositions and constraints. They are key in the formulation of the basic principles of information content in situation theory, to be introduced next.

2.2 Information flow and constraints

The following are typical statements about “information flow” as studied in situation theory:

  • [E1] The fact that the dot in the radar screen is moving upward indicates that flight A123 is moving northward.
  • [E2] The presence of footprints of pattern \(P\) in Zhucheng indicates that a dinosaur lived in the region millions of years ago.

The general scheme has the form

  • [IC] That \(s : T\) indicates that \(p\).

where \(s : T\) is notation for “\(s\) is of type \(T\)”. The idea is that it is concrete parts of the world that act as carriers of information (the concrete dot in the radar or the footprints in Zhucheng), and that they do so by virtue of being of a certain type (the dot moving upward or the footprints showing a certain pattern). What each of these concrete instances indicates is a fact about another correlated part of the world. For the issues to be discussed below it will suffice to consider cases where the indicated fact— \(p\) in the formulation of [IC]—is of the form \(s' : T '\), as in the radar example.

The conditions needed to verify informational signalling in the sense of [\(\mathbf{IC}\)] rely on the existence of law-like constraints such as natural laws, necessary laws such as those of math, or conventions, thanks to which (in part) one situation may serve as carrier of information about another one. Constraints specify the correlations that exist between situations of various types, in the following sense: if two types \(T\) and \(T '\) are subject to the constraint \(T \Rightarrow T '\), then for every situation \(s\) of type \(T\) there is a relevantly connected situation \(s'\) of type \(T '\). In the radar example, the relevant correlation would be captured by the constraint GoingUpward \(\Rightarrow\) GoingNorth, which says that each situation where a radar point moves upward is connected with another situation where a plane is moving to the north. It is the existence of this constraint that allows a particular situation where the dot moves to indicate something about the connected plane situation.

With this background, the verification principle for information signalling in situation theory can be formulated as follows:

[IS Verification] \(s : T\) indicates that \(s' : T'\) if \(T \Rightarrow T '\) and \(s\) is relevantly connected to \(s'\).

The relation \(\Rightarrow\) is transitive. This ensures that Dretske’s Xerox principle holds in this account of information transfer, that is, there can be no loss of semantic information through information transfer chains.

[Xerox Principle]: If \(s_1 : T_1\) indicates that \(s_2 : T_2\) and \(s_2 : T_2\) indicates that \(s_3 : T_3\), then \(s_1 : T_1\) indicates that \(s_3 : T_3\).

The [IS Verification] principle deals with information that in principle could be acquired by an agent. The access to some of this information will be blocked, for example, if the agent is oblivious to the correlation that exists between two kinds of situations. In addition, most correlations are not absolute, they admit exceptions. Thus, for the signalling described in [E1] to be really informational, the extra condition that the radar system is working properly must be met. Conditional versions of the [IS Verification] principle may be used to insist that the carrier situation must meet certain background conditions. The inability of an agent to keep track of changes on these background conditions may lead to errors. So, if the radar is broken, the dot on the screen may end up moving upward while the plane is moving south. Unless the air controller is able to recognise the problem, that is, unless she realises that the background conditions have changed, she may end up giving absurd instructions to the pilot. Now, instructions are tied to actions. For a treatment of actions from the situation-theoretical view, we refer the reader to Israel and Perry (1991).

2.3 Distributed information systems and channel theory

The basic notion of information flow sketched in the previous section can be lifted to a more abstract setting in which the supporters of information are not necessarily situations as concrete parts of the world, but rather any entity which, as in the case of situations, can be classified as being of or not of certain types. The mathematical theory of distributed systems (Barwise and Seligman 1997) to be described next takes this abstract approach by focusing on information transfer within distributed systems in general.

A model of a distributed system in this framework will actually be a model of a kind of distributed system. Accordingly, the model of the radar-airplane system that we will use as a running example here will actually be a model of radar-airplane systems (in plural). Setting such a model requires describing the architecture of the system in terms of its parts and the way they are put together into a whole. Once that is done, one can proceed to see how that architecture enables the flow of information among its parts.

A part of a system (again, really its kind) is modelled by saying how particular instances of it are classified according to a given set of types. In other words, for each part of a system one has a classification

\[ \mathbf{A} = \langle Instances, Types, \models \rangle, \]

where \(\models\) is a binary relation such that \(a \models T\) if the instance \(a\) is of type \(T\). In a simplistic analysis of the radar example, one could posit at least three classifications, one for the monitor screen, one for the flying plane, and one for the whole monitoring system:

\[\begin{align} \mathbf{Screens} &= \langle Monitor-Screens, Types\: of\: Screen\: Configurations, \models_M\rangle \\ \mathbf{Planes} &= \langle Flying\: Planes, Types\: of\: Flying\: Planes, \models_P\rangle \\ \mathbf{MonitSit} &= \langle Monitoring\: Situations, Types\: of\: Monitoring\: Situations, \models_M\rangle \end{align}\]

A general version of a ‘part-of’ relation between classifications is needed in order to model the way parts of a system are assembled together. Consider the case of the monitoring systems. That each one of them has a screen as one of its parts means that there is a function that assigns to each instance of the classification MonitSit an instance of Screens. On the other hand, all the ways in which a screen can be classified (the types of Screens) intuitively correspond to ways in which the whole screening system could be classified: if a screen is part of a monitoring system and the screen is blinking, say, then the whole monitoring situation is intuitively one of the type ‘its screen is blinking’. Accordingly, a generalised ‘part-of’ relation between any two arbitrary classifications \(\mathbf{A}, \mathbf{C}\) can be modelled via two functions

\[\begin{align} f^{\wedge} &: \textit{Types}_A \rightarrow \textit{Types}_C \\ f^{\vee} &: \textit{Instances}_C \rightarrow \textit{Instances}_A, \end{align}\]

the first of which takes every type in \(\mathbf{A}\) to its counterpart in \(\mathbf{C}\), and the second of which takes every instance \(c\) of \(\mathbf{C}\) to its \(\mathbf{A}\)-component.[5]

If \(f : \mathbf{A} \rightarrow \mathbf{C}\) is shortcut notation for the existence of the two functions above (the pair \(f\) of functions is called an infomorphism), then an arbitrary distributed system will consist of various classifications related by infomorphisms. For our purposes, it will suffice here to consider three classifications \(\mathbf{A}, \mathbf{B}, \mathbf{C}\) together with two infomorphisms

\[\begin{align} f &: \mathbf{A} \rightarrow \mathbf{C} \\ g &: \mathbf{B} \rightarrow \mathbf{C}. \end{align}\]

Then, in our example, a simple way to model the radar monitoring system would consist of the pair

\[\begin{align} f &: \mathbf{Screens} \rightarrow \mathbf{MonitSit} \\ g &: \mathbf{Planes} \rightarrow \mathbf{MonitSit}. \end{align}\]

The common codomain in these cases \((\mathbf{C}\) in the general case and MonitSit in the example) works as a the core of a channel that connects two parts of the system. The core determines the correlations that obtain between the two parts, thus enabling information flow of the kind discussed in section 2.2. This is achieved via two kinds of links. On the one hand, two instances \(a\) from \(\mathbf{A}\) and \(b\) from \(\mathbf{B}\) can be thought to be connected via the channel if they are components of the same instance in \(\mathbf{C}\), so the instances of \(\mathbf{C}\) act as connections between components. Thus, in the radar example, a particular screen will be connected to a particular plane if they belong to the same monitoring situation.

On the other hand, suppose that every instance in \(\mathbf{C}\) verifies some relation between types that happen to be counterparts of types from \(\mathbf{A}\) and \(\mathbf{B}\). Then such relation captures a constraint on how the parts of the system are correlated. In the radar example, the theory of the core classification MonitSit would include constraints such as PlainMovingNorth \(\Rightarrow\) DotGoingUp. This regularity of monitoring situations, which act as connections between radar screen-shots and planes, reveals a way in which radar screens and monitored planes correlate with each other. All this leads to the following version of information transfer.

Channel-enabled signalling: Suppose that

\[\begin{align} f &: \mathbf{A} \rightarrow \mathbf{C} \\ g &: \mathbf{B} \rightarrow \mathbf{C}. \end{align}\]

Then instance \(a\) being of type \(T\) in \(\mathbf{A}\) indicates that instance \(b\) is of type \(T'\) in \(\mathbf{C}\) if \(a\) and \(b\) are connected by a instance from \(\mathbf{C}\) and the relation \(f^{\wedge}(T) \Rightarrow g^{\wedge}(T')\) between the counterpart interpreted types is satisfied by all instances of \(\mathbf{C}\).

Now, for each classification \(\mathbf{A}\), the collection

\[ L_A = \{T \Rightarrow T' \mid \text{ every instance of } \mathbf{A} \text{ of type } T \text{ is also of type } T'\} \]

formed by all the global constraints of the classification can be thought of as a logic that is intrinsic to \(\mathbf{A}\). Then a distributed system consisting of various classifications and infomorphisms will have a logic of constraints attached to each part of it,[6] and more sophisticated questions about information flow within the system can be formulated.

For example, suppose an infomorfism \(f : \mathbf{A} \rightarrow \mathbf{C}\) is part of the distributed system under study. Then \(f\) naturally transforms each global constraint \(T \Rightarrow T'\) of \(L_{\mathbf{A}}\) into \(f^{\wedge}(T) \Rightarrow f^{\wedge}(T')\), which can always be shown to be an element of \(L_{\mathbf{C}}\). This means that one can reason within \(\mathbf{A}\) and then reliably draw conclusions about \(\mathbf{C}\). On the other hand, it can be shown that using preimages under \(f^{\wedge}\) in order to translate global constraints of \(\mathbf{C}\) does not always guarantee the result to be a global constraint of \(\mathbf{A}\). It is then desirable to identify extra conditions under which the reliability of the inverse translation can be guaranteed, or at least improved. In a sense, these questions are qualitatively close to the concerns Shannon originally had about noise and reliability.

Another issue one may want to model is reasoning about a system from the perspective of an agent that has only partial knowledge about the parts of a system. As an example, think of a plane controller who has only worked with ACME monitors and knows nothing about electronics. The logic such an agent might use to reason about part \(\mathbf{A}\) of a system (actually part Screens in the case of the controller) will in general consist of some constraints that may not even be global, but satisfied only by some subset of instances (the ACME monitors). The agent’s logic may be incomplete in the sense that it might miss some of the global constraints of the classification (like the ones involving inner components of the monitor). The agent’s logic may also be unsound, in the sense that there might be instances out of the awareness of the agent (say monitors of unfamiliar brands) that falsify some of the agent’s constraints (which do hold of all ACME monitors). A local logic \(L\) in \(\mathbf{A}\) can be “moved” along an infomorphism \(f : \mathbf{A} \rightarrow \mathbf{C}\) in the expected way, that is, its constraints are transformed via \(f^{\wedge}\), while its instances are transformed via \(f^{\vee}\). Natural questions studied in channel theory concerning these notions include the preservation (or not), under translation, of some desirable properties of local logics, such as soundness.

A recent development in channel theory (Seligman 2014) uses a more general definition of local logic, in which not all instances in the logic need to satisfy all its constraints. This version of channel theory is put to use in two important ways. Firstly, by using local logics to stand for situations, and with a natural interpretation of what an infon should then be, a reconstruction is produced of the core machinery of situation theory (barely presented in sections 2.1 and section 2.2). Secondly, it is shown that this version of channel theory can deal with probabilistic constraints. The rough idea is that any pair of a classification plus a probability measure over the set of instances induces an extended classification with the same set of types, and where a constraint holds if and only if the set of counterexample instances has measure 0. Notice that this set of counterexamples might not be empty. Having probabilistic constraints is a crucial step towards the effort of formally relating channel theory to Shannon’s theory of communication.

For an extensive development of the theory of channels sketched here, plus several explorations towards applications, see Barwise and Seligman (1997). See van Benthem (2000) for a study of conditions under which constraint satisfiability is preserved under infomorphisms, and Allo (2009) for an application of this framework to an analysis of the distinction between cognitive states and cognitive commodities. Finally, it must be mentioned that the notion of classification has been around for some years now in the literature, having being independently studied and introduced under names such as Chu spaces (Pratt 1995) or Formal Contexts (Ganter and Wille 1999).

3. Information as Code

For information to be computed, it must be handled by the computational mechanism in question, and for such a handling to take place, the information must be encoded. Information as code is a stance that takes this encoding-condition very seriously. The result is the development of fine-grained models of information flow that turn on the syntactic properties of the encoding itself.

To see how this is so, consider again cases involving information flow via observations. Such observations are informative because we are not omniscient in the normal, God-like sense of the term. We have to go and observe that the cat is on the mat, for example, precisely because we are not automatically aware of every fact in the universe. Inferences work in an analogous manner. Deductions are informative for us precisely because we are not logically omniscient. We have to reason about matters, sometimes at great length, because we are not automatically aware of the logical consequences of the body of information with which we are reasoning.

To come full circle—reasoning explicitly with information requires handling it, where in this case such handling is cognitive act. Hence the information in question is encoded in some manner, hence Information as code underpins the development of fine-grained models of information flow that turn on the syntactic properties of the encoding itself, as well as the properties of the actions that underpin the various information-processing contexts involved.

Such information-processing contexts are not restricted to explicit acts of inferential reasoning by human agents, but include automated reasoning and theorem proving, as well as machine-based computational procedures in general. Approaches to modelling the properties of these latter information-processing scenarios fall under algorithmic information theory.

In section 3.1, we will explore a major approach to modelling the properties of information-processing within the information as code framework via categorial information theory. In section 3.2, we will examine the more general approach to modelling information as code of which categorial information theory is an instance, the modelling of information as code via substructural logics. In section 3.3 we will lay out the details of several other notable examples of logics of information flow motivated by the information as code approach.

3.1 Categorial Information Theory

Categorial information theory is a theory of fine-grained information flow whose models are based upon those specified by the categorial grammars underpinned by the Lambek Calculi, due originally to Lambek (1958, 1961). The motivation for categorial information theory is to provide a logical framework for modelling the properties of the very cognitive procedures that underpin deductive reasoning.

The conceptual origin of categorial information theory is found in van Benthem (1995: 186). Understanding van Benthem’s use of “procedural” to be synonymous with “dynamic”:

[I]t turns out that, in particular, the Lambek Calculus itself permits of procedural re-interpretation, and thus, categorial calculi may turn out to describe cognitive procedures just as much as the syntactic or semantic structures which provided their original motivation.

The motivation for categorial information theory is to model the cognitive procedures constituting deductive reasoning. Consider as an analogy the following example. You arrive home from IKEA with an unassembled table that is still flat-packed in its box. Now the question here is this, do you have your table? Well, there is a sense in which you do, and a sense in which you do not. You have your table in the sense that you have all of the pieces required to construct or generate the table, but this is not to say that you have the table in the sense that you are able to use it. That is, you do not have the table in any useful form, you have merely pieces of a table. Indeed, getting these table-pieces into their useful form, namely a table, may be a long and arduous process…

The analogy between the table-example above and deductive reasoning is this. It is said often that the information encoded by (or “contained in” or “expressed by”) the conclusion of a deductive argument is encoded by the premises. So, when you possess the information encoded by the premises of some instance of deductive reasoning, do you possess the information encoded by the conclusion? Just as with the table-pieces, you do not possess the information encoded by the conclusion in any useful form, not until you have put the “information-pieces” constituting the premises together in the correct manner. To be sure, when you possess the information-pieces encoded by the premises, you possess some of the information required for the construction or generation of the information encoded by the conclusion. As with the table-pieces however, getting the information encoded by the conclusion from the information encoded by the premises may be a long and arduous process. You need also the instructional information that tells you how to combine the information encoded by the premises in the right way. This information-generation via deductive inference may be thought of also as the movement of information from implicit to explicit storage in the mind of the reasoning agent, and it is the cognitive procedures facilitating this storage transfer that motivate categorial information theory.

Categorial information theory is a theory of dynamic information processing based on the merge/fusion \((\otimes)\) and typed function \((\rightarrow , \leftarrow)\) operations from categorial grammar. The conceptual motivation is to understand the information in the mind of an agent as the agent reasons deductively to be a database in much the same way as a natural language lexicon is a database (see Sequoiah-Grayson (2013), (2016)). In this case, a grammar will be understood as a set of processing constraints so imposed as to guarantee information flow, or well-formed strings as outputs. Recent research on proofs as events from a very similar conceptual starting point may by found in Stefaneas and Vandoulakis (2014).

Categorial information theory is strongly algebraic in flavour. Fusion ‘\(\otimes\)’ corresponds to the binary composition operator ‘.’, and ‘\(\vdash\)’ to the partial order ‘\(\le\)’ (see Dunn 1993). The merge and function operations are related to each other via the familiar residuation conditions:

\[\begin{align} \tag{5} A \otimes B \vdash C &\text{ iff } B \vdash A \rightarrow C \\ \tag{6} A \otimes B \vdash C &\text{ iff } A \vdash C \leftarrow B \end{align}\]

In general, applications for directional function application will be restricted to algebraic analyses of grammatical structures, where commuted lexical items will result in non-well-formed strings.

Despite its algebraic nature, the operations can be given their evaluation conditions via “informationalised” Kripke frames (Kripke 1963, 1965). An information frame (Restall 1994) \(\mathbf{F}\) is a triple \(\langle S, \sqsubseteq, \bullet\rangle\). \(S\) is a set of information states \(x, y, z\ldots\) . \(\sqsubseteq\) is a partial order of informational development/inclusion such that \(x \sqsubseteq y\) is taken to mean that the information carried by \(y\) is a development of the information carried by \(x\), and \(\bullet\) is an operation for combining information states. In other words, we have a domain with a combination operation. The operation of information combination and the partial order of information inclusion interrelate as follows:

\[\tag{7} x \sqsubseteq y \text{ iff } x \bullet y \sqsubseteq y \]

Reading \(x \Vdash A\) as state \(x\) carries information of type \(A\), we have it that:

\[\begin{align} \tag{8} x \Vdash A \otimes B &\text{ iff for some } y, z, \in \mathbf{F} \text{ s.t. } y \bullet z \sqsubseteq x, y \Vdash A \text{ and } z \Vdash B. \\ \tag{9} x \Vdash A \rightarrow B &\text{ iff for all } y, z \in \mathbf{F} \text{ s.t. } x \bullet y \sqsubseteq z, \text{ if } y \Vdash A \text{ then } z \Vdash B. \\ \tag{10} x \Vdash B \leftarrow A &\text{ iff for all } y, z \in \mathbf{F} \text{ s.t. } y \bullet x \sqsubseteq z, \text{ if } y \Vdash A \text{ then } z \Vdash B. \end{align}\]

At the syntactic level, we read \(X \vdash A\) as processing on \(X\) generates information of type A. In this case we are understanding \(\vdash\) as an information processing mechanism as suggested by Wansing (1993: 16), such that \(\vdash\) encodes not just the output of an information processing procedure, but the properties of the procedure itself. Just what this processing consists of will depend on the processing constraints that we set up on our database. These processing constraints will be imposed in order to guarantee an output from the processing itself, or to put this another way, in order to preserve information flow. Such processing constraints are fixed by the presence or absence of various structural rules, and structural rules are the business of substructural logics.

3.2 Substructural logics and information flow

Categorial information theory is precipitated by giving the Lambek calculi an informational semantics. At a suitable level of abstraction, the Lambek calculi is seen to be a highly expressive substructural logic. Unsurprisingly, by giving an informational semantics for substructural logics in general, we get a family of logics that exemplify the information as code approach. This logical family is organised by expressive power, with the expressive power of the logics in question being captured by the presence of various structural rules.

A structural rule is of the following general form:

\[\tag{11} X \Leftarrow Y \]

We may read (11) as any information generated by processing on \(X\) is generated by processing on \(Y\) also. Hence the long-form of (11) is as follows:

\[\tag{12} \frac{X \vdash A}{Y \vdash A} \]

Hence \(X\) is a structured body of information, or “data structure” as Gabbay (1996: 423) puts it, where the actual arrangement of the information plays a crucial role. The structural rules will fix the structure of the information encoded by \(X\), and as such impact upon the granularity of the information being processed.

Consider Weakening, the most familiar of the structural rules (followed by its corresponding frame condition:

\[\begin{align} \tag{Weakening} &A \Leftarrow A \otimes B \\ &x\bullet y \sqsubseteq z \rightarrow x \sqsubseteq z \end{align}\]

With Weakening present, we loose track of which pieces of information were actually used in an inference. This is precisely why it is that the rejection of Weakening is the mark of relevant logics, where the preservation of bodies of information relevant to the derivation of the conclusion is the motivation. By rejecting Weakening, we highlight a certain type of informational taxonomy, in the sense that we know which bodies of information were used. To preserve more structural detail than simply which bodies of information were used, we need to consider rejecting further structural rules.

Suppose that we want to record not only which pieces of information were used in an inference, but also how often they were used. In this case we would reject Contraction:

\[\begin{align} \tag{Contraction} &A \otimes A \Leftarrow A \\ &x \bullet x \sqsubseteq x \end{align}\]

Contraction allows the multiple use, without restriction, of a piece of information. So if keeping a record of the “informational cost” of the execution of some information processing is a concern, Contraction will be rejected. The rejection of Contraction is the mark of linear logics, which were designed for modelling just such processing costs (see Troelstra 1992).

If we wish to preserve the order of use of pieces of information, then we will reject the structural rule of Commutation:

\[\begin{align} \tag{Commutation} &A \otimes B \Leftarrow B \otimes A \\ &x \bullet y \sqsubseteq z \rightarrow y \bullet x \sqsubseteq z \end{align}\]

Information-order will be of particular concern in temporal settings (consider action-composition) and natural language semantics (Lambek 1958), where non-commuting logics first appeared. Commutation comes also in a more familiar strong form:

\[\begin{align} \tag{Strong Commutation} &(A \otimes B) \otimes D \Leftarrow(A \otimes D) \otimes B \\ &\exists u(x \bullet z \sqsubseteq u \wedge u \bullet y \sqsubseteq w) \rightarrow\\ &\qquad \exists u(x \bullet y \sqsubseteq u \wedge u \bullet z \sqsubseteq w) \end{align}\]

The strong form of Commutation results from its combination with the structural rule of Association:[7]

\[\begin{align} \tag{Association} &A \otimes(B \otimes C) \Leftarrow(A \otimes B) \otimes C \\ &\exists u(x \bullet y \sqsubseteq u \wedge u \bullet z \sqsubseteq w) \rightarrow \\ &\qquad \exists u(y \bullet z \sqsubseteq u \wedge x \bullet u \sqsubseteq w) \end{align}\]

Rejecting Association will preserve the precise fine-grained properties of the combination of pieces of information. Non-associative logics were introduced originally to capture the combinatorial properties of language syntax (see Lambek 1961).

In the presence of Commutation, a double implication pair \((\rightarrow , \leftarrow)\) collapses into single implication \(\rightarrow\). In the presence of all of the structural rules, fusion, \(\otimes\), collapses into Boolean conjunction, \(\wedge\). In this case, the residuation conditions outlined in (5) and (6) collapse into a mono-directional function.

The choice of which structural rules to retain obviously depends on just what informational phenomena is being modelled, so there is a strong pluralism at work. By rejecting Weakening say, we are speaking of which data were relevant to the process, but are saying nothing about its multiplicity (in which case we would reject Contraction), its order (in which case we would reject Commutation), or the actual patterns of use (in which case we would reject Association). By allowing Association, Commutation, and Contraction, we have the taxonomy locked down. We might not know the order or multiplicity of the data that were used, but we do know what types, and exactly what types, were relevant to the successful processing. The canonical contemporary exposition of such an information-based interpretation of propositional relevant logic is Mares (2004). Such an interpretation allows for an elegant treatment of the contradictions encoded by relevant logics. By distinguishing between truth conditions and information conditions, we allow for an interpretation of \(x \Vdash A \wedge \neg A\) as \(x\) carries the information that \(A\) and not \(A\). For an exploration of the distinction between truth-conditions and information-conditions within quantified relevant logic, see Mares (2009).

At such a stage, things are still fairly static. By shifting our attention from static bodies of information, to the manipulation of these bodies, we will reject structural rules beyond Weakening, arriving ultimately at categorial information theory, as it is encoded by the very weakest substructural logics. Hence the weaker we go, the more “procedural” the flavour of the logics involved. From a dynamic/procedural perspective, linear logics might be thought of as a “half way point” between static classical logic, and fully procedural categorial information theory. For a detailed exposition of the relationship between linear logic and other formal frameworks in the context of modelling information flow, see Abramsky (2008).

Recent important work by Dunn (2015) ties substructural logics and structural rules together with informational relevance in the following way. Dunn makes a distinction between programs and data, with the former being dynamic and the latter static. We may think of programs as conditional statements of the form \(A \rightarrow B\), and of data as atomic propositions \(A, B\) etc. Given these two types of information artefacts, we have three possible combinations, program to data combination, program to program combination, and data to data combination. For program to data combination, commutation will hold whilst weakening and association will fail, and contraction not applying. For program to program combination association will hold, whilst commutation, weakening fail. As demonstrated in Sequoiah-Grayson (2016), the case of contraction for program to program combination is more complicated. The exact properties of data to data combination remain an interesting open issue. The connection with informational relevance is made by interpreting the partial order relation \(\sqsubseteq\) as marking information relevance itself. In this case, \(x \sqsubseteq y\) is read as the information x is relevant to the information y. To what it is exactly that informational relevance amounts will depend on the precise context of information processing in question. Sequoiah-Grayson (2016) extends the framework about to contexts of information processing by an agent as the agent reasons explicitly. Given that the combination of information states \(x \bullet y\) may sit on the left hand side of the partial order relation, the extension is an account of the epistemic relevance of epistemic actions. For a collection of recent papers exploring the information as code approach in depth, see Bimbó (2016). See Bimbó (2022) for a wide collection of recent papers on informational relevance and reasoning.

3.3 Related Approaches

The information as code approach is a very natural perspective on information flow, hence there are a number of related frameworks that exemplify it.

One such approach to analysing information as code is to carry out such an analysis in terms of the computational complexity of various propositional logics. Such an approach may propose a hierarchy of propositional logics that are all decidable in polynomial time, with this hierarchy being structured by the increasing computational resources required for the proofs in the various logics. D’Agostino and Floridi (2009) carry out just such an analysis, with their central claim being that this hierarchy may be used to represent the increasing levels of informativeness of propositional deductive reasoning.

Gabbay’s (1993, 1996) framework of labelled deductive systems exemplifies the information as code approach in manner very similar to the informationalised substructural logics of section 3.1. An item of data (note that Gabbay refers to both atomic and conditional information as data, in contrast to Dunn and Sequoiah-Grayson in the section above) is given as a pair of the form \(x : A\), where \(A\) is a piece of declarative information, and \(x\) is a label for \(A. x\) is a representation of information that is needed operate on or alter the information encoded by \(A\). Suppose that we have also the data-pair \(y : A \rightarrow B\). We may apply \(x\) to \(y\), resulting in the data-pair \(x + y : B\) In this case, a database is a configuration of labelled formulas, or data-pairs (Gabbay 1993: 72). The labels and their corresponding application operation are organised by an algebra, and the properties of this algebra will impose constraints on the applications operation. Different constraints, of “meta-conditions” as Gabbay calls them (Gabbay 1993: 77), will correspond to different logics. For example, if we were to ignore the labels, then we would have classical logic, if we were to accept only the derivations which used all of the labelled assumptions, then we would have relevance logic, and if we accepted only the derivations which used the labelled assumptions exactly once, then we would have linear logic. Labels are behaving very much like possible worlds here, and the short step from possible worlds to information states makes it obvious how it is that the meta-conditions on labels may be captured by structural rules.

Artemov’s (2008) framework of justification logic shares many surface similarities with Gabbay’s system of labelled deduction. The logic is composed of justification assertions of the form \(x : A\), read as \(x\) is a justification for \(A\). Justifications themselves are evidential bases of varying sorts that will vary depending on the context. They might be mathematical proofs, sets of causes or counterfactuals, or something else that fulfils the justificatory role. What it means for \(x\) to justify \(A\) is not analysed directly in justification logic. Rather, attempts are made to characterise the justification relation \(x : A\) itself, via various operations and their axioms. The application operation, ‘.’ mimics the application operation ‘+’ from labelled deduction, or the fusion ‘\(\otimes\)’ operation from categorial information theory. In justification logic, the symbol ‘+’ is reserved for the representation of joint evidence. Hence ‘\(x + y\)’ is read as ‘the joint evidence of \(x\) and \(y\)’. Application and join are characterised in justification logic by the following axioms respectively:

\[\begin{align} \tag{13} &x : (A \rightarrow B) \rightarrow(y : A \rightarrow(x{.}y) : B) \\ \tag{14} &x : A \rightarrow(x + y) : A, \text{ and } x : A \rightarrow(y + x) : A \end{align}\]

The latter axiom characterises the monotonicity of joint evidential bases. Apart from the commutativity of +, the structural properties of the justification operations are currently unexplored, although the potential for such an exploration is exciting. Justification logic is used to analyse notoriously difficult epistemic problems such as the Gettier cases and more. If we take our epistemology to be informationalised, then the constitution of evidential bases as information states places justification logics within the information as code approach in a straightforward manner. For further details, see Artemov and Fitting (2012).

Zalta’s work on object theory (Zalta 1983, 1993) provides a different way to analyse informational content—understood as propositional content—and its structure. Motivated by metaphysical considerations, object theory starts by proposing a theory of objects and relations (usually formulated in a second order quantified modal language). This theory can then be used to define and characterise states of affairs, propositions, situations, possible worlds, and other related notions. The resulting picture is one where all these things have internal structure, their algebraic properties are axiomatized, and one can therefore reason about them in a classical proof-theoretical way.

A philosophical point touched by this approach concerns the link between the propositional content (information) expressed by sentences and the idea of predication. Relevant to this entry is Zalta’s (1993) development of a version of situation theory that follows this approach, and where a key element is the usage of two forms of predication. Briefly, the formula ‘\(Px\)’ corresponds to the usual form of predication by exemplification (as in “Obama is American”), while ‘\(xP\)’ corresponds to predication via encoding. Abstract objects are then defined to be (essentially) encodings of properties, in combinations which might not even be made factual. These provisions enable the existence of information about abstract, possible, or fictional entities. For details on the tradition to which object theory belongs see Textor (2012), McGrath (2012), and King (2012).

4. Connections Between the Approaches

While the three approaches discussed above (range, correlations, code) differ in that they emphasise different informational themes, the underlying notion they aim to clarify is the same (information). It is then natural to find that the similarities and synergies between the approaches invite the exploration of ways to combine them. Each one of the next subsections illustrates how one could bring together two out of the three approaches. Section 4.1 exemplifies the interface between the info-as-range and info-as-correlation views. Sections 4.2 and 4.3 do the same with the other two pairs of combinations, namely code and correlations, and code and ranges.

4.1 Ranges and correlations

A central intuition in the information-as-range view is the correspondence that exists between information at hand (where this can be qualified in various ways) and the range of possibilities which are compatible with such information. On the other hand, a key feature of the correlational approach to information is its reliance on a structured information system formed by components that are systematically connected. In general, many properties of a structured system will actually be local properties, in that they are determined by only some of the components (the fact that there is a dot moving upwards in a radar can be determined only by looking at the screen, even if this behaviour is correlated with the motion of a remote plane, which is another component of the system). If one has access to information pertaining to only a few of the many components of a system, a natural notion of range of possibilities arises, consisting of all the possible global configurations of the system that are compatible with such local information. This subsection expands on this particular way to link the two approaches, but as it will be noted at the end, this is not the only one and the search for other ways lies ahead as an open area of inquiry.

Formally, the link between ranges and correlations described above may be approached by using a restricted product state space as a model of the architecture of the system (van Benthem 2006, van Benthem and Martinez 2008). The basic structures are constraint models, versions of which have been around in the literature for some years (for example Fagin et al. 1995 in the study of epistemic logic, and Ghidini and Giunchiglia 2001 in the study of context dependent reasoning). Constraint models have the form

\[ \mathscr{M} = \langle Comp, States, C, Pred\rangle. \]

Here, the basic component spaces are indexed by Comp, the states of each component are taken from States (with different components using maybe only a few of the elements of States), and the global states of the system are global valuations, that is, functions that assign a state to each basic component Comp. Not all such functions are allowed, only those in \(C\). Finally, Pred is a labelled family of predicates (sets of global states).

To see how this fits with the information-as-correlation view, consider again the example of planes being monitored by radars. As before, each monitoring situation will be modelled as having only two parts, now indexed by the members of \(Comp = \{ screen, plane\}\). The actual instances of screening situations would correspond to global states, which in this case — where we have only two components — can be thought of as pairs \((s, b)\) where \(s\) is a particular screen and \(b\) a particular plane. Hence, global states connect instances of parts, so representing instances of a whole system. But then a crucial restriction comes into play, because not all screens are connected with all planes, only with those belonging to the same monitoring situation. The set \(C\) selects only such permissible pairs, thus playing a role similar to that of a channel in section 1. Finally, Pred classifies global states into types, similar to the classification relations of section 2.3.

As we said before, some properties of systems are local properties, with only some of the components of the systems being relevant in determining whether they hold or not. That a monitoring situation is one where the plane is moving North depends only on the plane, not on the screen. In general, if a property is completely determined by subset of components \(\mathbf{x}\) then, in what concerns that property, any two global states that agree on \(\mathbf{x}\) should be indistinguishable. In fact, each such \(\mathbf{x}\) induces an equivalence relation of local property determination so that for every two global states \(\mathbf{s}, \mathbf{t}\):

\(\mathbf{s} \sim_{\mathbf{x}}\mathbf{t}\) if and only if the values of \(\mathbf{s}\) and \(\mathbf{t}\) at each one of the components in \(\mathbf{x}\) are the same.

In this way one gets not only a conceptual but also formal link to the information-as-range approach, because constraint models can be used to interpret a basic modal language with atomic formulas of the form \(P\)—where \(P\) is one of the labels of predicates in Pred—and with complex formulas of the form \(\neg \phi, \phi \vee \psi, U\phi\), and \(\Box_{\mathbf{x}}\phi\), where \(\mathbf{x}\) is a partial tuple of components and \(U\) is the universal modality. More concretely, given a constraint model \(\mathscr{M}\) and a global state \(s\), the crucial satisfaction conditions are given by:

\[\begin{alignat}{3} \mathscr{M}, \mathbf{s} &\models P &\text{ iff } &\mathbf{s} \in P \\ \mathscr{M}, \mathbf{s} &\models U \phi &\text{ iff } &\mathscr{M}, \mathbf{t} \models \phi \text{ for all } \mathbf{t} \\ \mathscr{M}, \mathbf{s} &\models \Box_{\mathbf{x}} \phi &\text{ iff } &\mathscr{M}, \mathbf{t} \models \phi \text{ for all } \mathbf{t} \sim_{\mathbf{x}} \mathbf{s} \end{alignat}\]

The resulting logic is axiomatised by the fusion of \(S_5\) modal logics for the universal modality \(U\) and each one of the \(\Box_{\mathbf{x}}\) modalities, plus the addition of axioms of the form \(U \phi \rightarrow \Box_{\mathbf{x}}\phi\), and \(\Box_{\mathbf{x}}\phi \rightarrow \Box_{\mathbf{y}}\phi\) whenever \(\sim_{\mathbf{y}} \subseteq \sim_{\mathbf{x}}\).

The information-as-range research agenda includes other topics, such as agency and the dynamics of information update, which can in principle be incorporated to the constraint models setting. For example, in the case of agency, to the architectural structure of a state system captured by a constraint model one could add epistemic accessibility relations for a group of agents \(\mathcal{A}\), so to obtain epistemic constraint models of the form

\[ \mathscr{M} = \langle Comp, States, C, Pred, \{\approx_{a}\}_{a\in \mathcal{A}}\rangle. \]

where \(\approx_a\) is the equivalence accessibility relation of agent \(a\). Here one could refine the planes and radar example above by adding some agents, say the controller and the pilot. By relying only on the controls each agent can see, the controller will not be able to distinguish states that agree on the direction of the plane but differ, say, on the metereological conditions around the plane. Those states will be related by the controller’s relation in the model, but not by the pilot’s relation. In principle, this merge of modal epistemic models and constraint models allows one to study, in a single setting, aspects of both the information-as-range and information-as-correlation points of view. The corresponding logical language for epistemic constraint models is the same as for basic constraint models, expanded with the \(K_i\) modal operators, one per agent. The logic is the fusion of the constraint logic from above and a \(S_5\) logic per each agent \(a\).

There are some newer, different approaches to information modelling that sit at the intersection of the information as range and information as correlation perspectives. One is van Benthem’s work on information tracking (van Benthem 2016). Tracking is a new perspective that addresses both the connections between different representations of information on the one hand, and the updates on these connections on the other.

Another development (Baltag 2016) comes from a line of work that studies how to capture, in the style of epistemic logics such as those described in section 1, the properties and dynamics of knowledge de re (Wang and Fan 2014). Identifying this kind of knowledge with knowledge of the value of a variable, Baltag’s insight is to add, to the language of basic epistemic logic, the usual first-order resources for constructing terms and basic formulas (that is, symbols of constants, functions, relations, and variables), plus, crucially, a generalised conditional knowledge operator \(K_{a}^{t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n}\). The extended language has now formulas \(K_{a}^{t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n} t\) and \(K_{a}^{t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n} \phi\), with the intended meaning that agent \(a\) knows the value of term \(t\) (or knows that \(\phi\), for the second formula), provided it knows the values of terms \(t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n\). To be able to capture this idea on the semantic side, Kripke models are enriched so that, in addition to the usual set of information states, interpretations for propositional letters, and agents relations, we will also have a domain of objects over which terms and basic relational formulas are locally interpreted at each state (that is, the interpretations can vary from state to state, but the underlying domain is the same across states). A sound and complete axiomatisation exists, and the resulting logical system is a sort of a general, yet decidable, dependence logic where information about correlations can be captured via the conditional knowledge operators. Dynamic versions are also obtained where, in addition to the public announcement operator \([\phi]\), one has value announcement operators \([t_1,\ldots ,t_n]\), with formula \([t_1,\ldots ,t_n] \phi\) being read as “after the simultaneous announcement of the values of terms \(t_1,\ldots ,t_n\), it is the case that \(\phi\)”.

There is recent work (Baltag and van Benthem 2021) that achieves a general logic of local dependence that recruits semantic insights like the ones just described so far in this subsection (constraint models and a enriched modal semantics), and shows that they can be seen as two faces of the same coin.

Yet other links between the approaches have also be found, which are motivated by other kind of questions and use formalisms that are closer to the situation-theoretic ones. For example, consider a setting in which agents have incomplete information about an intended subset of a set of epistemic states. How can a relation of accessibility arise from such a setting? (Notice that this is different to the setting of epistemic constraint models described above, where agents do have complete information about what holds true of all the epistemically accessible worlds). One way to address this question (Barwise 1997) is to consider a fixed classification \(A\), the instances of which are the epistemic states, plus a local logic per agent attached to each state. For some states these local logics may be incomplete (see section 2.3), so agents may not have information about everything that holds true of the intended range of states. Then, roughly, the states accessible from a given state \(s\) and agent \(a\) will be those whose properties (types) do not contradict the local logic of \(a\) in \(s\). With these epistemic relations in place, classification \(A\) can be used to interpret a basic modal language.

4.2 Code and correlations

Logical frameworks that crossover information as code and information as correlation get their most explicit representation in work that does just this—model the crossover between the two frameworks. Restall (1994) and Mares (1996) give independent proofs of the representability of Barwise’s information as correlation channel-theoretic framework within the information as code approach as exemplified by the substructural logics framework. In this section we will trace the motivations and the main details of the proof, before demonstrating the connection with category theory.

The basic steps are these—if we understand information channels to be information states of a special sort, namely the sort of information state that carries information of conditional types, then there is an obvious meeting point between information as correlation as exemplified by channel theory, and information as code as exemplified by informationalised substructural logics. The intermediate step is to reveal the connection between channel semantics for conditional types, and the frame semantics for conditionals given by relevance logics.

Starting with the channel theoretic analysis of conditionals, as noted already, the running motivation behind Barwise’s channel-theoretic framework is that information flow is underpinned by an information channel. Barwise understood conditionals as constraints in the sense that \(A \rightarrow B\) is a constraint from \(A\) to \(B\) in the sense of \(A \Rightarrow B\) from section 2.2 above. If the information that \(A\) is combined with the information encoded by the constraint, then the result or output is the information that \(B\).

The information that \(A\) and that \(B\) is carried by the situations \(s_1, s_2\ldots\). and the information encoded by the constraint is carried by an information channel \(c\). Given this, Barwise’s evaluation condition for a constraint is as follows (the condition is given here in Barwise’s notation from his later work on conditionals, although in earlier writings such conditions appeared in the notation given in section 2.2 above):

\[\tag{15} c \models A \rightarrow B \text{ iff for all } s_1, s_2, \text{ if } s_1 \stackrel{c}{\mapsto} s_2 \text{ and } s_1 \models A, \text{ then } s_2 \models B, \]

where \(s_1 \stackrel{c}{\mapsto} s_2\) is read as

the information carried by the channel \(c\), when combined with the information carried by the situation \(s_1\), results in the information carried by the situation \(s_2\).

Obviously enough, this is very close in spirit to (9) in the section on information as code above.

As noted above, the intermediate step concerns the ternary relation \(R\) from the early semantics for relevance logic. The semantic clause for the conditional from relevance logic is:

\[\tag{16} x \Vdash A \rightarrow B \text{ iff for all } y, z \in \mathbf{F} \text{ s.t. } Rxyz, \text{ if } y \Vdash A \text{ then } z \Vdash B. \]

\(Rxyz\) is, by itself, simply an abstract mathematical entity. One way or reading it, the way that became popular in relevance logic circles, is

\(Rxyz\) iff the result of combining \(x\) with \(y\) is true at \(z\).

Given that the points of evaluation in relevance logics were understood originally as impossible situations (since they may be both inconsistent and incomplete), the main conceptual move was to understand channels to be special types of situations. The full proofs may be found in Restall (1994) and Mares (1996), and these demonstrate that the expressive power of Barwise’s system may be captured by the frame semantics of relevance logic. What it is that such “combining” of \(x\) and \(y\) amounts to depends on, of course, which structural rules are operating on the frame in question. As explained in the previous section above, the choice of which rules to include will depend on the properties of the phenomena being modelled.

The final step required for locating the meeting point between information as code and information as correlation is as follows. Contemporary approaches to relevance and other substructural logics understand the points of evaluation (impossible situations) to be information states. There is certainly no constraint on information that it be complete or consistent, so the expressibility of impossible situations it not sacrificed. Such an informational reading (Paoli 2002; Restall 2000; Mares 2004) lends itself to multiple applications of various substructural frameworks, and also does away with the ontological baggage brought by questions like “what are impossible situations?” in the “What are possible worlds?” spirit. An information-state reading of \(Rxyz\) will be something like

the result of combining the information carried by \(x\) and \(y\) generates the informations carried by \(z\).

Making this explicit results in \(Rxyz\) being written down as \(x \bullet y \sqsubseteq z\), in which case (15) is, via (16), equivalent to (9).

An important structural rule for the composition operation on information channels, that is, on information states that carry information of conditional types, is that it is associative. What this means is that:

\[\tag{17} z \stackrel{x \bullet (y \bullet v)}{\longmapsto} w = z \stackrel{(x \bullet y) \bullet v}{\longmapsto} w. \]

Where \(z \Vdash A\) and \(w \Vdash D\), this will be the case for all \(x, y, v\) s.t. \(x \Vdash A \rightarrow\), \(y \Vdash B \rightarrow C\), \(v \Vdash C \rightarrow D\). This is just the first step required to demonstrate that channel theory, and its underlying substructural logic, form a category.

Category theory is an extremely powerful tool in its own right. For a thorough introduction see Awodey (2006). For more work on the relationship between various substructural logics and channel theory, see Restall (1994a, 1997, 2006). Further category-theoretic work on information flow may be found in Goguen (2004—see Other Internet Resources). Recent important work on category-theoretic frameworks for information flow that extend to quantifiable/probabilistic frameworks is due to Seligman (2009). Perhaps the most in depth treatment of information flow in category theoretic terms is to be found in the work of Samson Abramsky, and an excellent overview may be found in his “Information, Processes, and Games” (2008). Recent work on the intersection between information as code and information as correlation uses substructural logics (relevance and linear logics in particular) to model logical proofs as information sources themselves. A proof is a source of information par excellence, and the contributions in the area by Mares (2016) are vital.

4.3 Code and ranges

Excitingly, there has been a recent surge in the recent development of information logics that combine the flexibility of categorial information theory with the subject matter of dynamic epistemic logics in order to design substructural epistemic logics. Sedlar (2015) combines the modal epistemic logics of implicit knowledge and belief with substructural logics in order to capture the availability of evidence for the agent. Aucher (2015, 2014) redefines dynamic epistemic logic as a substructural logic corresponding to the Lambek Calculi of categorial information theory. Aucher shows also that the semantics for DEL can be understood as providing a conceptual foundation for the semantics of substructural logics in general. See Hjortland and Roy (2016) for an extension of Aucher’s approach to soft information.

In general, information logic approaches to dynamic epistemic phenomena that combine the DEL of section 1.2 and the substructural logics of section 3.2 above have grown in popularity considerably. See for example Aucher (2016, 2014), Tedder and Bilková (forthcoming), Tedder (2021, 2017), Sedlár, Punčochář, and Tedder (2023), Punčochář, and Sedlár (2021), and Sedlár (2021, 2019).

Other logical frameworks that model information as code and range along with information about encoding have been developed by Velázquez-Quesada (2009), Liu (2009), Jago (2006), and others. The key element to all of these approaches is the introduction of some syntactic code to the conceptual architecture of the information as range approach.

Taking Velázquez-Quesada (2009) as a working example, start with a modal-access model \(M =\langle S, R, V, Y, Z\rangle\) where \(\langle S, R, V \rangle\) is a Kripke Model, \(Y\) is the access set function, and \(Z\) is the rule set function s.t. (where \(I\) is the set of classical propositional language based on a set of atomic propositions):

  • \(Y : W \rightarrow \wp(I)\) assigns a set of formulas of \(I\) to each \(x \in S\).
  • \(Z : W \rightarrow \wp(R)\) assigns a set of rules based on \(I\) to each \(x \in S\).

A modal-access model is a member of the class of modal access models \(\mathbf{MA}\) iff it satisfies truth for formulas and truth preservation for rules. \(\mathbf{MA}_k\) models are those \(\mathbf{MA}\) models such that \(R\) is an equivalence relation.

From here, inference is represented as a modal operation adding the rule’s conclusion to the access set of information states of the of the agent such that the agent can access both the rule and its premises. Where \(Y(x)\) is the access set at \(x\), and \(Z(x)\) is the rule set at \(x\):

Inference on knowledge: Where \(M = \langle S, R, V, Y, Z\rangle \in \mathbf{MA}_k\), and \(\sigma\) is a rule, \(M_k\sigma = \langle S, R, V, Y', Z\rangle\) differs from \(M\) in \(Y'\), given by \(Y'(x) := Y(x) \cup \{\)conc\((\sigma)\}\) if \(\text{prem}(\sigma) \subseteq Y(x)\) and \(\sigma \in Z(x)\), and by \(Y'(x) := Y(x)\) otherwise.

The dynamic logic for inference on knowledge then incorporates the ability to represent “there is a knowledge inference with \(\sigma\) after which \(\phi\) holds” (Velázquez-Quesada 2009). It is in just this sense that such modal information theoretical approaches model the outputs of inferential processes, as opposed to the properties of the inferential processes that generate such outputs (see the section on categorial information theory for models of such dynamic properties).

Jago (2009) proposes a rather different approach based upon the elimination of worlds considered possible by the agent as the agent reasons deductively. Such epistemic (doxastic) possibilities structure an epistemic (doxastic) space under bounded rationality. The connection with information as code is that the modal space is individuated syntactically, with the worlds corresponding to possible results of step-wise rule-governed inferences. The connection with information as range is that the rules that he agent does or does not have access to will impact upon the range of discrimination for the agent. For example, if the agent’s epistemic-base contains two worlds, a \(\neg \phi\) world and a \(\phi \vee \psi\) world say, then can refine their epistemic base only if they have access to the disjunctive syllogism rule.

A subtle but important contribution of Jago’s is the following: the modal space in question will contain only those epistemic options which are not obviously impossible. However, what is or is not obviously impossible will vary from both agent to agent, as well as for a single agent over time as that agent refines its logical acumen. This being the case, the modal space in question has fuzzy boundaries.

5. Special topics

There is a varied list of special topics pertaining to the logical approach to information. This section briefly illustrates just a couple of them, which are important regardless of the particular stance one takes (information as range, as correlation, as code). The first topic is the issue of informational equivalence: when are two structures in the logical approach one is using indistinguishable in terms of the information they are meant to encode, convey, or carry? And, when should two pieces of information be taken as equivalent or not? The answers to this last question touch on the issue of how information (or information carriers, or information supporters) can be combined or structured. This, in turn, has an impact on the properties logical connectives are expected to behave. The second topic in this section focuses on one of the connectives. Namely, it concerns the various ways in which the idea of negative information can be understood conceptually, and properly dealt with formally.

5.1 Information Structures and Equivalence

Every logical approach to information comes with its own kind of information structures. Depending on the particular stance and the aspect of information to be stressed, these structures may stand for informational states, structured syntactic representations, pieces of information understood as commodities, or global structures made up from local interrelated informational states or stages. Under which conditions can two informational structures be considered to be informationally equivalent?

Addressing this question brings out the need to have it clear at which level of granularity one is testing for equivalence. The classical extensional notion of logical equivalence is a coarse, in that informationally different claims such as 2 is even and 2 is prime cannot be distinguished, as their extensions will coincide. Equivalence given by identity at the level of representations (say syntactic equality) is, on the contrary, too fine-grained in some cases: to a bilingual speaker, the information that the shop is closed would be equally conveyed by a sign saying “Closed” as by a sign saying “Geschlossen”, even if the two words are different.

An intermediate notion of equivalence that has proved central to the range, correlational, and code views on information is the relation of bisimulation between structures. A bisimulation relation between two graphs \(G\) and \(H\) (where both the arrows and nodes of the graphs are labelled) is a binary relation \(R\) between the nodes of the graphs with the property that whenever a node \(g\) of \(G\) is related to a node \(h\) of \(H\), then:

  1. \(g\) and \(h\) have the same labels, and
  2. For every relation label \(L\) and every L-child \(g'\) of \(g\), there must be a L-child \(h'\) of \(h\) such that \(h\) and \(h'\) are related by \(R\). The analogous condition must hold for every \(L\)-child of \(h\).

A simple example would be the relation between the following two graphs (empty set of labels) that relates the point \(x\) with \(a\) and the point \(y\) with the points \(b, c, d\).

\[\genfrac{}{}{0}{1}{x \longrightarrow y}{\phantom{x \longrightarrow}\circlearrowright} \qquad \text{ and } \qquad \genfrac{}{}{0}{1}{a \longrightarrow b \longrightarrow c \longrightarrow d}{\phantom{a \longrightarrow b \longrightarrow c \longrightarrow} \circlearrowright} \]

Bisimulation is naturally a central notion for the information-as-range perspective because the Kripke models of section 1 are precisely labelled graphs. It is a classical result of modal logic that if two states of two models are related by a bisimulation, then the states will satisfy exactly the same modal formulas, and in addition a first order property of states is definable in the basic modal language if and only if the property is preserved under bisimulation.

As for the correlational stance, in situation theory bisimulation turns out to be the right notion in determining whether two infons that might look structurally different are actually the same as pieces of information. For example, one possible analysis of Liar-like claims leads to infons that are nested in themselves, such as

\[ \sigma = \llangle \text{True}, \text{what} : \sigma , 0\rrangle. \]

One can naturally depict the structure of \(\sigma\) as a labelled graph, which will be bisimilar to the graph associated with the apparently different infon

\[ \psi = \llangle \text{True}, \text{what} : \llangle \text{True}, \text{what} : \psi , 0\rrangle , 0\rrangle. \]

The notion of bisimulation appeared independently in computer science, so it so no surprise that it also features in matters related to the information-as-code approach, with its focus on representation and computation. In particular, several versions of bisimulation have been applied to classes of automata to determine when two of them are behaviourally equivalent, and data encodings such as

\[ L =\langle 0, L\rangle \text{ and } L = \langle 0, \langle 0, L\rangle \rangle, \]

both of which represent the same object (an infinite list of zeroes), can be identified as such by noticing that the graphs that depict the structure of these two expressions are bisimilar. See Aczel (1988), Barwise and Moss (1996), and Moss (2009) for more information about bisimulation an circularity, connections with modal logic, data structures, and coalgebras.

But there is much more to be said about informational equivalence and the right level of granularity. To reiterate, the themes highlighted by the various stances on information (partiality, aboutness, encoding, range, dynamics, agency) pose many challenges. For another example: ‘3 is prime’, and ‘the sum of the angles of a triangle is 180 degrees’ are logically equivalent in the standard sense, as they are both mathematical truths. But they should not be always taken to be informationally equivalent in general. First, they are about different topics. Second, an agent might know that 3 is prime, and yet not know that 180 is the sum of the angles of a triangle, due to its having only partial knowledge about triangles. Third, even if the agent had enough current knowledge to eventually infer that the sum of the angles of a triangle is 180 degrees, the inference might be hard for this agent, so being told that the sum of the angle is 180 would be informative in a way that being told that 3 is prime would not.

Information, just as content, meaning, knowledge, belief, and many agent attitudes (seeing that, suspecting that…) exhibit hyperintensional properties. There is an active line of research that studies how formal systems can capture these phenomena (see the entry on hyperintensionality). Here, we just note that the formal approaches to hyperintensionality most closely related to this entry follow some of these strategies:

  1. Extending possible-world semantics by allowing impossible worlds and adding a notion of topics. Given a formula, one does not consider only its truth conditions (the range of words that make it true) but a pair , so formulas with the same truth conditions may be told apart by virtue of being associated to different topics. See Yablo (2014), Jago (2015), Berto and Jago (2019).
  2. Defining models based on states (not worlds) that can be partial and/or inconsistent with respect to the information they validate. The models give a relation of “parthood” between states, and a binary fusion operation on states. The truth conditions of a formula is a pair \(\langle \textit{truthmakers}, \textit{falsifiers} \rangle\) of subsets of states that make a formula true and false, respectively. There is also a formal way to define the topic of a formula. As before, topics give a way to differentiate formulas with the same truth conditions. The partiality of states and the definition of truth conditions allow for another way to make differences, because two formulas may have the same set of verifiers but a different set of falsifiers. This approach is close in spirit to the situation theory tradition. See Fine (2017) and Fine and Jago (2020).
  3. Using relevant logics to take advantage of the particularities of its semantics (see Mares 2004).
From the formal point of view, approaches (1), (2), (3) are closer to the formal systems used in the information-as-range, information-as-correlation, and information-as-code stances, respectively. Most of the work has been on hyperintensionality in general, not specifically about information. However, see Berto and Hawke (2021) for a semantics for an operator of knowability relative to information, where the construction \(K_\phi \psi\) is understood as saying that \(\psi\) is knowable on the basis of information \(\psi\), and Berto and Jago (2019) for a discussion on the use of impossibilities to treat issues such as informative sentences and inferences. In section 4.2 we already referred to Mares (2004) and the informational interpretation of relevant logic. Jago (2020), on the other hand, presents a truthmaker semantics for relevant logic. There are also some proposals of more general frameworks for hyperintensionality for which (1) and (2) above can be seen as particular cases or applications (see Sedlar 2021 and Leitbeg 2018), and van Benthem (2019) exemplifies how truthmaker semantics may be translated into a modal information logic. The more general point (van Benthem 2019) illustrates is that there are, roughly speaking, two natural and complementary styles of logical systems one can use to analyse a new notion. Some systems are more explicit, in that they extend an existing system (e.g. modal logic) with laws for new vocabulary that is directly related to the new notion one wants to analyze, without changing the previously existing logical notions. In contrast, a more implicit way of dealing with a new notion is to use a nonstandard reasoning system, so making changes on what the allowed reasoning patterns are, rather than adding new vocabulary. The use of one or other style, as well as the existence or not of translations between them, may help shed light on what philosophical claims may or may not be made about the notion one is studying. An example of a relevant question, in our context, is to what extent hyperintensionality may or may not be captured by the explicit style of classical modal informational logics.

5.2 Negative information

This entry has focused mostly on positive information. Formally speaking, negative information is simply the extension-via-negation of the positive fragment of any logic built around information-states. Different negation-types will constrain the behaviour of negative information in various ways. Informally, negative information may be thought of variously as what is canonically expressed with sentential negation, process exclusion (both propositional and sub-propositional) and more. Even when we restrict ourselves to a single conceptual notion, there may be vigorous philosophical debate as to which formal construction best captures the notion in question. In this section, we run though several formal analyses of negative information, we examine some of the philosophical debates surrounding the suitability of various formal constructions with respect to particular applications, and examine the related topic of failure of information flow in the situation-theoretic sense, which may give raise to misinformation or lack of information in particular settings.

Non-constructive intuitionistic negation, is aimed towards accounting for negative information in the context of information flow via observation. For more details on this point, see the subsection intuitionistic logics and Beth and Kripke models in the supplementary document: Abstract Approaches to Information Structure.

Working with the frames from section 3.1, non-constructive intuitionistic negation is defined in terms of the constructive implication, (21), which is combined with bottom, \(\mathbf{0}\), which holds nowhere, as specified by its frame condition:

\[\tag{18} x \Vdash \mathbf{0} \text{ for no } x \in \mathbf{F} \]

Hence intuitionistic negation is defined as follows:

\[\tag{19} -A := A \rightarrow \mathbf{0} \]

Hence the frame condition for \(-A\) is as follows:

\[\tag{20} x \Vdash -A [A \rightarrow 0] \text{ iff for all } y \in \mathbf{F}, \text{ s.t. } x \sqsubseteq y, \text{ if } y \Vdash A \text{ then } y \Vdash 0 \]

(20) states that if \(x\) carries the information that \(-A\), then there no state \(y\) such that \(y\) is an informational development of \(x\) where \(y\) carries the information that \(A\).

The definition of \(-A\) in terms of \(A \rightarrow \mathbf{0}\) throws up an asymmetry between positive and negative information. In an information model \(-A\) holds at \(x \in \mathbf{F}\) iff \(A\) does not hold at any \(y \in \mathbf{F}\) such that \(x \sqsubseteq y\). Whilst the verification of \(A\) at \(x \in \mathbf{F}\) only involves checking \(x\), verifying \(-A\) at \(x \in \mathbf{F}\) involves checking all \(y \in \mathbf{F}\) such that \(x \sqsubseteq y\). According to Gurevich (1977) and Wansing (1993), this asymmetry means that intuitionistic logic does not provide an adequate treatment of negative information, since, unlike the verification of \(A\), there is no way of verifying \(-A\) “on the spot” so to speak. Gurevich and Wansing’s objection to this asymmetry is a critical response to Grzegorczyk (1964). For arguments in support of Grzegorczyk’s asymmetry between positive and negative information, see Sequoiah-Grayson (2009). A fully constructive negation that allows for falsification “on the spot” is known also as Nelson Negation on account of it being embedded within Nelson’s constructive systems (Nelson 1949, 1959). For a contemporary development of these constructive systems, see section 2.4.1 of Wansing (1993).

In a static logic setting, negation is, at the very least, used to rule out truth (if not to express explicit falsity). In a dynamic setting, negation will be used to rule out particular processes. For a development negative information as process exclusion in the context of categorial information theory see Sequoiah-Grayson (2013). This idea has its origins in the Dynamic Predicate Logic of Groenendijk and Stokhof (1991), in particular with their development of negative information via negation as test-failure. For an exploration between the conceptions of negative information as process exclusion and test-failure, see Sequoiah-Grayson (2010).

In any logic for negation as process-exclusion, the process-exclusion will be non-directional if the logic in question is commutative. Directional process-exclusion will result when we remove the structural rule of commutation. For a discussion of the relationship between the formalisation of directional process exclusion as commutation-failure along with symmetry-failure on compatibility and incompatibility relations on information states, see Sequoiah-Grayson (2011). For an extended discussion of negative information in the context of categorial grammars, see Buszkowski (1995).

Wansing (2016) uses the informational interpretation of substructural logics to launch a thorough investigation of the issues surrounding negative information outlined above. Wansing’s conclusion is that the symmetry between positive and negative information survives all existent arguments to the contrary. At the time of writing, this debate is lively and ongoing.

6. Conclusion

There is a bi-directional relation between logic and information. On the one hand, information underlies the intuitive understanding of standard logical notions such as inference (which may be thought of as the process that turns implicit information into explicit informaiton) and computation. On the other hand, logic provides a formal framework for the study of information itself.

The logical study of information focuses on some of the most fundamental qualitative aspects of information. Different stances on information naturally highlight some of these aspects more than others. Thus, the information-as-range stance most naturally highlights agency and the dynamics of information in settings with multiple agents that can interact with each other. The aboutness of information (information is always about something) is a central theme in the information-as-correlation stance. The topic of encoding information and its processing (as in the case of formal inference) is at the core of the information-as-code stance. None of these qualitative aspects of information is exclusive to just one of the stances, even if some stress certain topics more than others. Some themes such as the structure of information and its relation with information content are equally pertinent regardless of the stance. The ways in which information is studied in this entry differs from other important formal frameworks that study information quantitatively. For example, Shannon’s statistical theory of information is concerned with things such as optimizing the amount of data that can be transmitted via a noisy channel, and the Kolmogorov’s complexity theory quantifies the informational complexity of a string as the length of the shortest program that outputs it when executed by a fixed universal Turing machine.

The logical analysis of information includes fruitful reinterpretations of known logical systems (such as epistemic logic or relevance logic), and new systems that result from attempts to capture further aspects of information. Still other logical approaches to the analysis of information result from combining aspects of two different stances, as with the constraint systems of section 4. New frameworks (situation theory in the 80s) have also resulted from exploring from scratch what sort of inferences — including those that are novel and non-classical — one should allow in order to model certain aspects of information.

Looking for interfaces between the three stances is still a nascent direction of inquiry, discussed here in section 4. A complementary issue is whether the stances can be unified. There are several formal frameworks that, beyond serving as potential settings for exploring the issue of unification, are abstract mathematical theories of information in their own right. Each of these goes well beyond the scope of this entry:

  • Domain Theory (Abramsky and Jung 1994): it has been used to study the processes of unraveling or “improvement” of informational states in terms of partial orderings of information states that naturally arise across the stances.
  • Point-free topology: it has deep connections with computer science and it can actually be motivated as a logic of information (Vickers 1996).
  • Chu Spaces (Pratt 1995): in category theory they are presented as generalizations of topologies. The immediate link with things discussed in this entry is that the classifications used in situation theory are simply Chu spaces, discovered independently and with different aims.
  • Coalgebra: another branch of category theory that has also been presented as the “mathematics of sets and observations” (Jacobs 2012, Other Internet Resources). This framework has strong links with many notions discussed in this entry, in particular modal logic (section 1) and bisimulation (section 5.1).
  • Probability Theory: it is clearly at the center of abstract quantitative approaches to information. Various versions of the inverse relationship principle that lead to measures of semantic information (see section 1.3 and Floridi 2013) descend from the version used by Shannon (1953 [1950]): in a communication setting via noisy channels, the less expected a received message is, the more informative it is.

The logical study of information resembles in spirit other more traditional endeavours, such as the logical study of the concept of truth or computation: in all these cases the object of logical study plays a central role in the intuitive understanding of logic itself. The three perspectives on qualitative information presented in this entry (ranges, correlations, and code) portrait the diverse state of the art in this field, where many directions of research are open, both as a way of searching for unifying or interfacing settings for the different stances, and of deepening the understanding of the main qualitative features of information (dynamics, aboutness, encoding, interaction, etc.) within each stance itself.

Interested readers may wish to pursue the topics in the supplementary document

Abstract Approaches to Information Structure

which covers the topics intuitionistic logic, Beth and Kripke models, and algebraic and other approaches to modal information theory and related areas.


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Other Internet Resources


The authors would like to extend their thanks to the Editors of the Stanford Encyclopaedia of Philosophy, as well as to Johan van Benthem, Olivier Roy, and Eric Pacuit. Their assistance and advice has been invaluable.

Copyright © 2023 by
Maricarmen Martinez <m.martinez@uniandes.edu.co>
Sebastian Sequoiah-Grayson <sequoiah@gmail.com>

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