# Logic and Information

*First published Mon Feb 3, 2014; substantive revision Thu Aug 3, 2023*

At their most basic, logic is the study of consequence, and
information is a commodity. Given this, the interrelationship between
logic and information will centre on the informational consequences of
logical actions or operations conceived broadly. The explicit
inclusion of the notion of *information* as an object of
logical study is a recent development. It was by the beginning of the
present century that a sizable body of existing technical and
philosophical work (with precursors that can be traced back to the
1930s) coalesced into the new emerging field of logic and information
(see Dunn 2001). This entry is organised thematically, rather than
chronologically. We survey major logical approaches to the study of
information, as well as informational understandings of logics
themselves. We proceed via three interrelated and complementary
stances: information-as-range, information-as-correlation, and
information-as-code.

The core intuition motivating the Information-as-range
stance, is that an
informational state may be characterised by the range of possibilities
or configurations that are compatible with the information available
at that state. Acquiring new information corresponds to a reduction of
that range, thus reducing uncertainty about the actual configuration
of affairs. With this understanding, the setting of possible-world
semantics for epistemic modal logics proves to be rewarding for the
study of various semantic aspects of information. A prominent
phenomenon here is *information update*, which may occur in
both individual and social settings, due to the interaction between
both agents and their environment via different types of *epistemic
actions*. We will see that an epistemic action is any action that
facilitates the flow of information, hence we will return to epistemic
actions themselves throughout.

The Information-as-correlation stance focuses
on information flow as it is licensed within structured systems formed
by systematically correlated components. For example: the number of
rings of a tree trunk can give you information about the time when the
tree was born, in virtue of certain regularities of nature that
‘connect’ the past and present of trees. Central themes of
this stance include the *aboutness, situatedness, and accessibility
of information in structured information environments*.

The key concern of the third stance, Information-as-code,
is the *syntax-like
structure* of information pieces (their *encoding*) and the
*inference and computation processes* that are licensed by
virtue (among other things) of that structure. A most natural logical
setting to study these informational aspects is the algebraic proof
theory underpinned by a range of *substructural logics*.
Substructural logics have always been a natural home for informational
analysis, and the recent developments in the area enrich the
information-as-code stance.

The three stances are by no means incompatible, but neither are they
necessarily reducible to each other. This will be expanded on later in
the entry, and some further topics of research will be illustrated,
but for a preview of how the three stances can live together, take the
case of a structured information system composed of several parts.
Firstly, the correlations between the parts naturally allow for
‘information flow’ in the sense of the
information-as-correlation stance. Secondly, they also give rise to a
local ranges of possibilities, since the local information available
at one part will be compatible with a certain range of global states
of the system. Thirdly, the combinatorial, syntax-like,
proof-theoretical aspects of information can be brought to this
setting in various ways. One of them is treating the correlational
flow of information as a sort of combinatorial system by which local
information states are combined in syntactic-like ways, fitting a
particular interpretation of substructural logic. One could also add
code-like-structure to the modelling explicitly, for example by
assigning local deductive calculi to either the components or local
states of the system. We begin however with *information as
range*

- 1. Information as Range
- 2. Information as Correlation: Situation Theory
- 3. Information as Code
- 4. Connections Between the Approaches
- 5. Special topics
- 6. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Information as Range

The understanding of information as range has its origins in
Bar-Hillel and Carnap’s theory of semantic information,
Bar-Hillel and Carnap
(1952).^{[1]}
It is here that the *inverse range principle* is given its
first articulation with regard to the informational content of a
proposition. The inverse range principle states that there is an
inverse relationship between the information contained by a
proposition on the one hand, and the likelihood of that proposition
being true on the other. That is, the more information carried by a
proposition, the less likely it is that the proposition is true.
Similarly, the more likely the truth of a proposition, the less
information it carries.

The likelihood of the truth of a proposition connects with information as range via a possible worlds semantics. For any contingent proposition, it will be supported by some possibilities (those where it is true) and not supported by others (those where it is false). Hence a proposition will be supported by a range of possibilities, an “information range”. Now suppose that there is a probability distribution across the space of possibilities, and for the sake of simplicity suppose that the distribution is uniform. In this case, the more worlds that support a proposition, the likelier the proposition’s truth, and, via the inverse relationship principle, the less information it carries. Although information as range has its origins in quantitative information theory, its role in contemporary qualitative logics of information cannot be overstated.

Consider the following example due to Johan van Benthem (2011). A waiter in a cafe receives an order for your table—an espresso and a soda. When the waiter arrives at your table, he asks “For whom is the soda?”. After your telling him that the soda is for you and his giving you your soda, the waiter does not need to ask about the espresso, he can just give it to your cafe-partner. This is because the information gained by the waiter from your telling him that you ordered the soda allows him to eliminate certain open possibilities from the total range of possibilities such that only one is left—your friend ordered the espresso.

The waiter case brings several facts about logic and information to
the fore. For one, language is used often to refine informational
options in the very way explained in the paragraph above. More subtly
however, and perhaps even prior to this, language is used to
*exchange* information, and we bring with us sometimes many
scenarios—specified informationally. These scenarios might be
neither known nor believed, but merely
*entertained*—those about which we *wonder*.
Recent work on *inquisitive semantics* (Ciardelli *et
al.* 2018) provides a logic of such information exchange based on
informational specifications of such wonderings.

Logics of information distinguish regularly between *hard
information* and *soft information*. The terminology is a
slight misnomer, as this distinction is not one between different
types of information *per se*. Rather it is one between
different types of information *storage*. Hard information is
*factive*, and unrevisable. Hard information is often taken to
correspond to *knowledge*. In contrast to hard information,
soft information is *non-necessarily-factive*, hence revisable
in the presence of new information. Soft information, in virtue of its
revisability, corresponds very closely to *belief*. The terms
knowledge and belief are conventional, but on the context of
information flow, the hard/soft information reading is convenient on
account of it bringing the informational phenomena to the foreground.
At the very least the terminology is increasingly popular, so being
clear on the distinction being one between types of information
storage as opposed to types of information is important. Although both
hard and soft information are important for our epistemic and doxastic
success, in this section we will concentrate mainly on logics of hard
information
flow.^{[2]}

In
section 1.1
we will see how it is that classic epistemic logics exemplify the
flow of hard information within the information as range framework. In
section 1.2
we will extend our exposition from logics of hard information-gain to
logics of the actions that facilitate the gain of such hard
information, dynamic epistemic logics. At the end of Section 1.2, we
will expound the important phenomenon of *private information*,
before examining how it is that information as range is captured in
various *quantitative frameworks*.

### 1.1 Epistemic logic

In this section we will explore how it is that the elimination of
possibilities corresponding to information-gain is the starting point
for research on logics of knowledge and belief that fall under the
heading of *epistemic logics*. We will begin with classic
single-agent epistemic logic, before exploring multi-agent epistemic
logics. In both cases, since we will be concentrating on logics of
knowledge as opposed to logics of belief, the information-gained will
be hard information.

Consider the waiter example in more detail. Before receiving the hard
information that the soda is for you (and for the sake of the example
we are assuming that the waiting is dealing with hard information
here), the waiter’s knowledge-base is modelled by a pair of
worlds (hereafter *information states*) \(x\) and \(y\) such
that in \(x\) you ordered the soda and your friend the espresso, and
in \(y\) you ordered the espresso and your friend the soda. After
receiving the hard information that the soda is for you, \(y\) is
eliminated from the waiter’s knowledge-base, leaving only \(x\).
As such, the reduction of the range of possibilities corresponds to an
information-gain for the waiter. Consider the truth condition for
*agent* \(\alpha\) *knows that* \(\phi\), written
\(K_{\alpha}\phi\):

The accessibility relation \(R_{\alpha}\) is an equivalence relation
connecting \(x\) to all information states \(y\) such that \(y\) is
indistinguishable from \(x\), *given* \(\alpha\)’s
*hard information at that state* \(x\). That is, given what the
waiter knows when he is in that state. So, if \(x\) was the
waiter’s information state before being informed that you
ordered the soda, \(y\) would have included the information that you
ordered the espresso, as each option was as good as the other until
the waiter was informed otherwise. There is an implicit assumption at
work here—that some state \(z\) say, where you ordered both the
soda and the espresso, is not in the waiter’s information-range.
That is, the waiter knows that \(z\) is not a possibility. Once
informed however, the information states supporting your ordering the
espresso are eliminated from the range of information corresponding to
the waiter’s knowledge.

Basic modal logic extends propositional formulas with modal operators such as \(K_{\alpha}\). If \(\mathbf{K}\) is the set of all Kripke models then we have the following:

\[\begin{align} \tag{A1} &\mathbf{K} \Vdash K_{\alpha}\phi \wedge K_{\alpha}(\phi \rightarrow \psi) \rightarrow K_{\alpha}\psi \\ \tag{A2} & \mathbf{K} \Vdash \phi \Rightarrow \mathbf{K} \Vdash K_{\alpha}\phi \end{align}\]
In hard information terms, (A1) states that hard information is closed
under (known) implications. Since the first conjunct states that all
states accessible by \(\alpha\) are \(\phi\) states, \(\alpha\)
possesses the hard information that \(\phi\), hence \(\alpha\) also
possesses the hard information that \(\psi\). (A2) states that if
\(\phi\) holds in the set of all models, then \(\alpha\) possesses the
hard information that \(\phi\). In other words, (A2) states that all
tautologies are known/hard stored by the agent, and (A1) states that
\(\alpha\) knows the logical consequences of all propositions that
\(\alpha\) knows (be they tautologies or otherwise). That is, the
axioms state that the agent is logical omniscient, or an *ideal
reasoner*, a property of agents that we will return to in detail
in the sections
below.^{[3]}

The framework explored so far concerns single-agent epistemic logic,
but reasoning and information flow are very often *multi-agent
affairs*. Consider again the waiter example. Importantly, the
waiter is only able to execute the relevant reasoning procedure
corresponding to a restriction of the range of information states
*on account of* your announcement to him with regard to the
espresso. That is, it is the verbal interaction between several agents
that facilitates the information flow that enabled the logical
reasoning to be undertaken.

It is at this point that multi-agent epistemic logic raises new questions regarding the information in a group. “Everybody in \(G\) possesses the hard information that \(\phi\)” (where \(G\) is any group of agents from a finite set of agents \(G^*)\) written as \(E_G\phi . E_G\) is defined for each \(G \subseteq G^*\) in the following manner:

\[\tag{2} E_G\phi = \bigwedge_{\alpha \in G} K_{\alpha}\phi \]
Group knowledge is importantly different from *common
knowledge* (Lewis 1969; Fagin et al. 1995). Common knowledge is
the condition of the group where *everybody knows that everybody
knows that everybody knows … that* \(\phi\). In other
words, common knowledge concerns the hard information that each agent
in the group possesses about the hard information possessed by the
other members of the group. That everybody in \(G\) possesses the hard
information that \(\phi\) does not imply that \(\phi\) is common
knowledge. With group knowledge each agent in the group may possess
the same hard information (hence achieving group knowledge) without
necessarily possessing hard information about the hard information
possessed by the other agents in the group. As noted by van Ditmarsh,
van der Hoek, and Kooi (2008: 30), “the number of iterations of
the \(E\)-operator makes a real difference in practice”.
\(C_G\phi\)—the common knowledge *that* \(\phi\) for
members of \(G\), is defined as follows:

To appreciate the difference between \(E\) and \(C\), consider the following “spy example” (originally Barwise 1988 with the envelope details due to Johan van Benthem).

There are a group of competing spies at a formal dinner. All of them are tasked with the mission of acquiring some secret information from inside the restaurant. Furthermore, it is common knowledge amongst them that they want the information. Given this much, compare the following:

- Each spy knows that the information is in an envelope on one of the other tables, but they don’t know that the other spies know this (i.e., it is not common knowledge).
- It is common knowledge amongst the spies that the information is in the envelope.

Very obviously, the two scenarios will elicit very different types of behaviour from the spies. The first would be relatively subtle, the latter dramatically less so. See Vanderschraaf and Sillari (2009) for further details.

A still more fine-grained use of S5 based epistemic logics is that of
Zhou (2016). Zhou demonstrates that S5 based epistemic logic may be
used to model the epistemic states of the agent from the perspective
of the agent themselves. Hence Zhou refers to such an epistemic logic
as *internally epistemic*. Zhou then uses a multi-valued logic
to model the relationship between the agent’s internal knowledge
base and their external informational environment. In his (2019), van
Benthem argues for an understanding of modal logics in general (both
epistemic and otherwise) as ariing from an *explicit *approach
to increasing a logic’s conceptual nuance — in the sense
that they are explicit extensions of classical logic. They wear their
new conceptual architechture on their sleaves, so to speak. This is in
contrast to those logics to which van Benthem refers as resulting from
an *implicit approach. *This implicit approach invloves a
reinterpretation of the meaning of logical vocabulary, as is the case
with intuitionistic logic and relevant logic as conceived of
traditionally. van Benthem’s method of translating between
equivalient (in a sense) implicit and explicit approaches has as an
instance that between Kit Fine’s (2017) hyperintensional
truth-maker semantics and informationalised modal logic. This is a
promising foray into such translations between a range of information
logics such as those addressed in this entry.

### 1.2 Dynamic epistemic logic, information change

See the full entry on
Dynamic Epistemic Logic.
As noted above, the waiter example from the beginning of this section
is as much about information-gain via announcements, *epistemic
actions*, as it is about information structures. In this section,
we will outline how it is that the expressive power of multi-agent
epistemic logic can be extended so as to capture epistemic
actions.

Hard information flow, that is, the flow of information between the
knowledge states of two or more agents, can be facilitated by more
than one epistemic action. Two canonical examples are
*announcements* and *observations*. When
“announcement” is restricted to *true and public
announcement*, its result on the receiving agent’s
knowledge-base is similar to that of an observation (on the assumption
that the agent believes the content of the announcement). The public
announcement that \(\phi\) will restrict the model of the
agent’s knowledge-base to the information states where \(\phi\)
is true, hence “announce \(\phi\)” is *an epistemic
state transformer* in the sense that it transforms the epistemic
states of the agents in the group, (see van Ditmarsh, van der Hoek,
and Kooi 2008:
74).^{[4]}

Dynamic epistemic logics extend the language of non-dynamic epistemic
logics with dynamic operators. In particular, *public announcement
logic* (PAL) extends the language of epistemic logics with the
dynamic announcement operator [\(\phi\)], where [\(\phi]\psi\) is read
“after announcement \(\phi\), it is the case that
\(\psi\)”. The key *reduction axioms* of PAL are as
follows:

RA1–RA5 capture the properties of the announcement operator by
connecting what is true before the announcement with what is true
after the announcement. The axioms are named ‘reduction’
axioms because the left-to-right hand direction reduces either the
number of announcement operators or the complexity of the formulas
within their scope. For an in depth discussion see Pacuit (2011). RA1
states that announcements are truthful. RA5 specifies the
epistemic-state-transforming properties of the announcement operator.
It states that \(\alpha\) knows that \(\psi\) after the announcement
that \(\phi\) *iff* \(\phi\) implies that \(\alpha\) knows that
\(\psi\) will be true after \(\phi\) is announced in all
\(\phi\)-states. The “after \(\phi\) is announced”
condition is there to account for the fact that \(\psi\) might change
its truth-value after the announcement. The interaction between the
dynamic announcement operator and the knowledge operator is described
completely by RA5 (see van Benthem, van Eijck, and Kooi 2006).

Just as adding the *common knowledge* operator \(C\) to
multi-agent epistemic logic extends the expressive capabilities of
multi-agent epistemic logic, adding \(C\) to PAL results in the more
expressive *public announcement logic with common knowledge*,
(PAC). The exact relationship between public announcements and common
knowledge is captured by the *announcement and common knowledge
rule* of the logic PAC as the following:

Again, PAC is the dynamic logic of hard information. The epistemic
logics dealing with *soft information* fall within the scope of
*belief revision theory* (van Benthem 2004; Segerberg 1998).
Recall that hard and soft information are not distinct types of
information *per se*, rather they are distinct types of
information *storage*. Hard-stored information is unrevisable,
whereas soft-stored information is revisable. Variants of PAL that
model soft information augment their models with
plausibility-orderings on information-states (Baltag and Smets 2008).
These orderings are known as *preferential models* in
non-monotonic logic and belief-revision theory. The logics can be made
dynamic in virtue of the orderings changing in the face of new
information (which is the mark of soft information as opposed to hard
information). Such plausibility-orderings may be modelled
qualitatively via partial orders etc., or modelled quantitatively via
probability-measures. Such quantitative measures provide a connection
to a broader family of quantitative approaches to semantic information
that we will examine below. Recent work by Allo (2017) ties the soft
information of dynamic epistemic logic to non-monotonic logics. This
is an intuitive move. Soft information is information that has been
stored in a revisable way, hence the revisable nature of conclusions
in non-monotonic arguments makes non-monotonic logics a natural fit.
On this very topic, see also Chapter 13.7 of van Benthem (2011).

** Private information**. Private information is
an equally important aspect of our social interaction. Consider
scenarios where the announcing agent is aware of the private
communication whilst other members of the group are not, such as
emails in Bcc. Consider also scenarios where the sending agent is

*not*aware of the private communication, such as a surveillance operation. The system of

*dynamic epistemic logic*(DEL) models events that turn on private (and public) information by modelling the agents’ information concerning the events

*taking place*in a given communicative scenario (see Baltag et al. 2008; van Ditmarsh et al. 2008; and Pacuit 2011). For an excellent overview and integration of all of the issues above, see the recent work of van Benthem (2016), where the author discusses multiple interrelated levels of logical dynamics, one level of update, and another of representation. For an extensive collection of papers extending this and related approaches, see Baltag and Smets (2014). Although research into public and private information, most especially with regard to information crossing the threshold from one to the other, has been carried out within the framework of dynamic epistemic logics, recent work explores public and private information and announcements within the framework of

*multi-valued*logics. See Yang

*et al.*(2021).

The modal information theory approach to multi-agent information flow is the subject of a great amount of research. The semantics is not always carried out in relational terms (i.e., with Kripke Frames) but is done often algebraically (see Blackburn et al. 2001 for details of the algebraic approach to modal logic). For more details on algebraic as well as type-theoretic approaches, see the subsection on algebraic and other approaches to modal information theory in the supplementary document Abstract Approaches to Information Structure.

### 1.3 Quantitative Approaches

Quantitative approaches to *information as range* also have
their origins in the inverse relationship principle. To
restate—the motivation being that the less likely the truth of a
proposition as expressed in a logical language with respect to a
particular domain, the greater the amount of information encoded by
the relevant formula. This is in contrast to the information measures
in the *mathematical theory of communication* (Shannon 1953
[1950]) where such measures are gotten via an inverse relationship on
the expectation of the receiver \(R\) of the receipt of a signal from
some source \(S\).

Another important aspect of the classical theory of information, is
that it is an entirely *static* theory—it is concerned
with the informational content and measure of particular formulas, and
not with information *flow* in any way at all.

The formal details of classical information theory turn on the
probability calculus. These details may be left aside here, as the
obvious conceptual point is that logical truths have a
truth-likelihood of 1, and therefore an information measure of 0.
Bar-Hillel and Carnap did not take this to mean that logical truths,
or deductions, were without information yield, only that their theory
of semantic information was not designed to capture such a property.
They referred to such a property with the term *psychological
information*. See Floridi (2013) for further details.

A quantitative attempt at specifying the information yield of
deductions was undertaken by Jaakko Hintikka with his theory of
*surface information* and *depth information* (Hintikka
1970, 1973). The theory of surface and depth information extends
Bar-Hillel and Carnap’s theory of semantic information from the
monadic predicate calculus all the way up to the full polyadic
predicate calculus. This itself is a considerable achievement, but
although technically astounding, a serious restriction of this
approach is that it is only a fragment of the deductions carried out
within full first-order logic that yield a non-zero information
measure. The rest of the deductions in the full polyadic predicate
calculus, as well as all of those in the monadic predicate calculus
and propositional calculus, measure 0, (see Sequoiah-Grayson 2008).
For recent elaborations upon Hintikka’s distinction between
suface and depth information, both formal and philosophical, see
Panahy (2023), Hernandez and Quiroz (2022 [Other Internet Resources]),
Negro (2022), and Ramos Mendonça (2022).

The obvious inverse situation with the theory of classical semantic
information is that logical contradictions, having a truth-likelihood
of 0, will deliver a maximal information measure of 1. Referred to in
the literature as the *Bar-Hillel-Carnap Semantic Paradox*, the
most developed quantitative approach to addressing it is the theory of
*strongly semantic information* (Floridi 2004). The conceptual
motivation behind strongly semantic information is that for a
statement to yield information, it must help us to narrow down the set
of possible worlds. That is, it must assist us in the search for the
actual world, so to speak (Sequoiah-Grayson 2007). Such a
*contingency requirement on informativeness* is violated by
both logical truths and logical contradictions, both of which measure
0 on the theory of strongly semantic information. See Floridi (2013)
for further details. See also Brady (2016) for recent work on the
relationship between quantitative accounts of information and
analyticity. For a new approach to connecting quantitative and
qualitative measures of information, see Harrison-Trainor *et
al*. (2018)

## 2. Information as Correlation: Situation Theory

The correlational take on information looks at how the existence of
systematic connections between the parts of a *structured
information environment* permits that one part may carry
information *about* another. For example: the pattern of pixels
that appear on the screen of a computer gives information (not
necessarily complete) *about* the sequence of keys that were
pressed by the person who is typing a document, and even a partial
snapshot of the clear starred sky your friend is looking at now will
give you information *about* his possible locations on Earth at
this moment. The focus on structured environments and the aboutness of
information goes hand in hand with a third main topic of the
information-as correlation approach, namely the *situatedness of
information*, that is, its dependence on the particular setting on
which an informational signal occurs. Take the starry sky as an
example again: the same pattern of stars, at different moments in time
and locations in space will in general convey different information
about the location of your friend.

Historically, the first paradigmatic setting of correlated information
was Shannon’s work on communication (1948), which we already
mentioned in the last section. Shannon considered a communication
system formed by two information sites, a source and a receiver,
connected via a noisy channel. He gave conclusive and extremely useful
answers to questions having to do with the construction of
communication codes that help maximising the effectiveness of
communication (in terms of bits of information that can be
transmitted) while minimizing the possibility of errors caused by
channel noise. As we previously said, Shannon’s concern was
purely quantitative. The logical approach to information as
correlation builds on Shannon’s ideas, but is concerned with
qualitative aspects of information flow, like the ones we highlighted
before: *what* information *about* a
‘remote’ site (remote in terms of space, time,
perspective, etc.) can be drawn out of information that is directly
available at a ‘proximal’ site?

*Situation theory* (Barwise and Perry 1983; Devlin 1991) is the
major logical framework so far that has made these ideas its starting
point for an analysis of information. Its origin and some of its
central insights can be found in the project of naturalization of mind
and the possibility of knowledge initiated by Fred Dretske (1981),
which soon influenced the inception of situation semantics in the
context of natural language (see Kratzer 2011).

Technically, there are two kinds of developments in situation theory:

- Set-theoretic and model-theoretic frameworks based on detailed ontologies, suitable for modelling informational phenomena in concrete applications.
- A mathematical theory of information flow as enabled by lawful
*channels*that connect parts of a whole. This theory takes a more abstract view on information as correlation, which is applicable (in principle) to all sorts of systems that can be decomposed into interrelated parts.

The next three subsections survey some of the basic notions from this tradition: the basic sites of information in situation theory (called situations), the basic notion of information flow based on correlations between situations, and the mathematical theory of classifications and channels mentioned in (b).

### 2.1 Situations and Supporting Information

The ontologies in (a) span a wide spectrum of entities. They are meant
to reflect a particular way in which an agent may carve up a system.
Here “a system” can be the world, or a part or aspect of
it, while the agent (or kind of agent) can be an animal species, a
device, a theorist, etc. The list of basic entities includes
individuals, relations (which come with roles attached to them),
temporal and spacial locations, and various other things. Distinctive
among them are the *situations* and *infons*.

Roughly speaking, situations are highly structured parts of a system, such as a class session, a scene as seen from a certain perspective, a war, etc. Situations are the basic supporters of information. Infons, on the other hand, are the informational issues that situations may or may not support. The simplest kind of informational issue is whether some entities \(a_1 , \ldots ,a_n\) stand (or do not stand) in a relation \(R\) when playing the roles \(r_1 , \ldots ,r_n\), respectively. Such basic infon is usually denoted as

\[ \llangle R, r_1 : a_1 , \ldots ,r_n : a_n, i\rrangle. \]where \(i\) is 1 or 0, according to whether the issue is positive or negative.

Infons are not intrinsic bearers of truth, and they are not claims either. They are simply informational issues that may or may not be supported by particular situations. We’ll write \(s \models \sigma\) to mean that the situation \(s\) supports the infon \(\sigma\). As an example, a successful transaction whereby Mary bought a piece of cheese in the local market is a situation that supports the infon

\[ \sigma = \llangle bought, what : cheese, who : Mary, 1\rrangle. \]
This situation does *not* support the infon

because Mary did buy cheese. Nor does the situation support the infon

\[ \llangle landed, who : Armstrong, where : Moon, 1\rrangle, \]because Armstrong is not part of the situation in question at all.

The discrimination or individuation of a situation by an agent does
not entail that the agent has full information about it: when we
wonder whether the local market is open, we have individuated a
situation about which we actually *lack* some information. See
Textor (2012) for a detailed discussion on the nature of
situation-like entities and their relation with other ontological
categories such as the possible worlds used in modal logic.

Besides individuals, relations, locations, situations and basic
infons, there are various kinds of parametric and abstract entities.
For example, there is a mechanism of *type abstraction*.
According to it, if \(y\) is a parameter for situations, then

is the type of situations where somebody buys cheese. There will be some basic types in an ontology, and many other types obtained via abstraction, as just described.

The collection of ontology entities also includes propositions and constraints. They are key in the formulation of the basic principles of information content in situation theory, to be introduced next.

### 2.2 Information flow and constraints

The following are typical statements about “information flow” as studied in situation theory:

- [
**E1**] The fact that the dot in the radar screen is moving upward indicates that flight A123 is moving northward. - [
**E2**] The presence of footprints of pattern \(P\) in Zhucheng indicates that a dinosaur lived in the region millions of years ago.

The general scheme has the form

- [
**IC**]*That*\(s : T\)*indicates that*\(p\).

where \(s : T\) is notation for “\(s\) is of type \(T\)”.
The idea is that it is concrete parts of the world that act as
carriers of information (the concrete dot in the radar or the
footprints in Zhucheng), and that they do so by virtue of being of a
certain type (the dot moving upward or the footprints showing a
certain pattern). What each of these concrete instances indicates is a
fact about another correlated part of the world. For the issues to be
discussed below it will suffice to consider cases where the indicated
fact— \(p\) in the formulation of **[IC]**—is
of the form \(s' : T '\), as in the radar example.

The conditions needed to verify informational signalling in the sense
of [\(\mathbf{IC}\)] rely on the existence of law-like
*constraints* such as natural laws, necessary laws such as
those of math, or conventions, thanks to which (in part) one situation
may serve as carrier of information about another one. Constraints
specify the *correlations* that exist between situations of
various types, in the following sense: if two types \(T\) and \(T '\)
are subject to the constraint \(T \Rightarrow T '\), then for every
situation \(s\) of type \(T\) there is a relevantly connected
situation \(s'\) of type \(T '\). In the radar example, the relevant
correlation would be captured by the constraint GoingUpward
\(\Rightarrow\) GoingNorth,
which says that each situation where a
radar point moves upward is connected with another situation where a
plane is moving to the north. It is the existence of this constraint
that allows a particular situation where the dot moves to indicate
something about the connected plane situation.

With this background, the verification principle for information signalling in situation theory can be formulated as follows:

**[IS Verification]** \(s : T\) indicates that \(s' :
T'\) if \(T \Rightarrow T '\) and \(s\) is *relevantly
connected* to \(s'\).

The relation \(\Rightarrow\) is transitive. This ensures that Dretske’s Xerox principle holds in this account of information transfer, that is, there can be no loss of semantic information through information transfer chains.

**[Xerox Principle]**: If \(s_1 : T_1\) indicates that
\(s_2 : T_2\) and \(s_2 : T_2\) indicates that \(s_3 : T_3\), then
\(s_1 : T_1\) indicates that \(s_3 : T_3\).

The **[IS Verification]** principle deals with
information that *in principle* could be acquired by an agent.
The access to some of this information will be blocked, for example,
if the agent is oblivious to the correlation that exists between two
kinds of situations. In addition, most correlations are not absolute,
they admit exceptions. Thus, for the signalling described in
**[E1]** to be really informational, the extra
*condition* that the radar system is working properly must be
met. Conditional versions of the **[IS Verification]**
principle may be used to insist that the carrier situation must meet
certain background conditions. The inability of an agent to keep track
of changes on these background conditions may lead to errors. So, if
the radar is broken, the dot on the screen may end up moving upward
while the plane is moving south. Unless the air controller is able to
recognise the problem, that is, unless she realises that the
background conditions have changed, she may end up giving absurd
instructions to the pilot. Now, instructions are tied to actions. For
a treatment of actions from the situation-theoretical view, we refer
the reader to Israel and Perry (1991).

### 2.3 Distributed information systems and channel theory

The basic notion of information flow sketched in the previous section can be lifted to a more abstract setting in which the supporters of information are not necessarily situations as concrete parts of the world, but rather any entity which, as in the case of situations, can be classified as being of or not of certain types. The mathematical theory of distributed systems (Barwise and Seligman 1997) to be described next takes this abstract approach by focusing on information transfer within distributed systems in general.

A model of a distributed system in this framework will actually be a
model of a *kind* of distributed system. Accordingly, the model
of the radar-airplane system that we will use as a running example
here will actually be a model of radar-airplane *systems* (in
plural). Setting such a model requires describing the architecture of
the system in terms of its parts and the way they are put together
into a whole. Once that is done, one can proceed to see how that
architecture enables the flow of information among its parts.

A part of a system (again, really its kind) is modelled by saying how
particular instances of it are classified according to a given set of
types. In other words, for each part of a system one has a
*classification*

where \(\models\) is a binary relation such that \(a \models T\) if the instance \(a\) is of type \(T\). In a simplistic analysis of the radar example, one could posit at least three classifications, one for the monitor screen, one for the flying plane, and one for the whole monitoring system:

A general version of a ‘part-of’ relation between
classifications is needed in order to model the way parts of a system
are assembled together. Consider the case of the monitoring systems.
That each one of them has a screen as one of its parts means that
there is a function that assigns to each instance of the
classification **MonitSit** an instance of
**Screens**. On the other hand, all the ways in which a
screen can be classified (the types of **Screens**)
intuitively correspond to ways in which the whole screening system
could be classified: if a screen is part of a monitoring system and
the screen is blinking, say, then the whole monitoring situation is
intuitively one of the type ‘its screen is blinking’.
Accordingly, a generalised ‘part-of’ relation between any
two arbitrary classifications \(\mathbf{A}, \mathbf{C}\) can be
modelled via two functions

the first of which takes every type in \(\mathbf{A}\) to its
counterpart in \(\mathbf{C}\), and the second of which takes every
instance \(c\) of \(\mathbf{C}\) to its
\(\mathbf{A}\)-component.^{[5]}

If \(f : \mathbf{A} \rightarrow \mathbf{C}\) is shortcut notation for
the existence of the two functions above (the pair \(f\) of functions
is called an *infomorphism*), then an arbitrary distributed
system will consist of various classifications related by
infomorphisms. For our purposes, it will suffice here to consider
three classifications \(\mathbf{A}, \mathbf{B}, \mathbf{C}\) together
with two infomorphisms

Then, in our example, a simple way to model the radar monitoring system would consist of the pair

\[\begin{align} f &: \mathbf{Screens} \rightarrow \mathbf{MonitSit} \\ g &: \mathbf{Planes} \rightarrow \mathbf{MonitSit}. \end{align}\]
The common codomain in these cases \((\mathbf{C}\) in the general case
and **MonitSit** in the example) works as a the core of a
*channel* that connects two parts of the system. The core
determines the correlations that obtain between the two parts, thus
enabling information flow of the kind discussed in
section 2.2.
This is achieved via two kinds of links. On the one hand, two
instances \(a\) from \(\mathbf{A}\) and \(b\) from \(\mathbf{B}\) can
be thought to be connected via the channel if they are components of
the same instance in \(\mathbf{C}\), so the instances of
\(\mathbf{C}\) act as connections between components. Thus, in the
radar example, a particular screen will be connected to a particular
plane if they belong to the same monitoring situation.

On the other hand, suppose that every instance in \(\mathbf{C}\)
verifies some relation between types that happen to be counterparts of
types from \(\mathbf{A}\) and \(\mathbf{B}\). Then such relation
captures a *constraint* on how the parts of the system are
correlated. In the radar example, the theory of the core
classification **MonitSit** would include constraints
such as PlainMovingNorth \(\Rightarrow\) DotGoingUp.
This regularity of monitoring
situations, which act as connections between radar screen-shots and
planes, reveals a way in which radar screens and monitored planes
correlate with each other. All this leads to the following version of
information transfer.

**Channel-enabled signalling:** Suppose that

Then instance \(a\) being of type \(T\) in \(\mathbf{A}\) indicates that instance \(b\) is of type \(T'\) in \(\mathbf{C}\) if \(a\) and \(b\) are connected by a instance from \(\mathbf{C}\) and the relation \(f^{\wedge}(T) \Rightarrow g^{\wedge}(T')\) between the counterpart interpreted types is satisfied by all instances of \(\mathbf{C}\).

Now, for each classification \(\mathbf{A}\), the collection

\[ L_A = \{T \Rightarrow T' \mid \text{ every instance of } \mathbf{A} \text{ of type } T \text{ is also of type } T'\} \]
formed by all the *global constraints* of the classification
can be thought of as a logic that is intrinsic to \(\mathbf{A}\). Then
a distributed system consisting of various classifications and
infomorphisms will have a logic of constraints attached to each part
of
it,^{[6]}
and more sophisticated questions about information flow within the
system can be formulated.

For example, suppose an infomorfism \(f : \mathbf{A} \rightarrow
\mathbf{C}\) is part of the distributed system under study. Then \(f\)
naturally transforms each global constraint \(T \Rightarrow T'\) of
\(L_{\mathbf{A}}\) into \(f^{\wedge}(T) \Rightarrow f^{\wedge}(T')\),
which can always be shown to be an element of \(L_{\mathbf{C}}\). This
means that one can reason within \(\mathbf{A}\) and then
*reliably* draw conclusions about \(\mathbf{C}\). On the other
hand, it can be shown that using preimages under \(f^{\wedge}\) in
order to translate global constraints of \(\mathbf{C}\) does
*not* always guarantee the result to be a global constraint of
\(\mathbf{A}\). It is then desirable to identify extra conditions
under which the reliability of the inverse translation can be
guaranteed, or at least improved. In a sense, these questions are
qualitatively close to the concerns Shannon originally had about noise
and reliability.

Another issue one may want to model is reasoning about a system from
the perspective of an agent that has only *partial* knowledge
about the parts of a system. As an example, think of a plane
controller who has only worked with ACME monitors and knows nothing
about electronics. The logic such an agent might use to reason about
part \(\mathbf{A}\) of a system (actually part
**Screens** in the case of the controller) will in
general consist of some constraints that may not even be global, but
satisfied only by some subset of instances (the ACME monitors). The
agent’s logic may be *incomplete* in the sense that it
might miss some of the global constraints of the classification (like
the ones involving inner components of the monitor). The agent’s
logic may also be *unsound*, in the sense that there might be
instances out of the awareness of the agent (say monitors of
unfamiliar brands) that falsify some of the agent’s constraints
(which do hold of all ACME monitors). A local logic \(L\) in
\(\mathbf{A}\) can be “moved” along an infomorphism \(f :
\mathbf{A} \rightarrow \mathbf{C}\) in the expected way, that is, its
constraints are transformed via \(f^{\wedge}\), while its instances
are transformed via \(f^{\vee}\). Natural questions studied in channel
theory concerning these notions include the preservation (or not),
under translation, of some desirable properties of local logics, such
as soundness.

A recent development in channel theory (Seligman 2014) uses a more
general definition of local logic, in which not all instances in the
logic need to satisfy all its constraints. This version of channel
theory is put to use in two important ways. Firstly, by using local
logics to stand for situations, and with a natural interpretation of
what an infon should then be, a reconstruction is produced of the core
machinery of situation theory (barely presented in
sections 2.1
and
section 2.2).
Secondly, it is shown that this version of channel theory can deal
with *probabilistic* constraints. The rough idea is that any
pair of a classification plus a probability measure over the set of
instances induces an extended classification with the same set of
types, and where a constraint holds if and only if the set of
counterexample instances has measure 0. Notice that this set of
counterexamples might not be empty. Having probabilistic constraints
is a crucial step towards the effort of formally relating channel
theory to Shannon’s theory of communication.

For an extensive development of the theory of channels sketched here,
plus several explorations towards applications, see Barwise and
Seligman (1997). See van Benthem (2000) for a study of conditions
under which constraint satisfiability is preserved under
infomorphisms, and Allo (2009) for an application of this framework to
an analysis of the distinction between cognitive *states* and
cognitive *commodities*. Finally, it must be mentioned that the
notion of classification has been around for some years now in the
literature, having being independently studied and introduced under
names such as Chu spaces (Pratt 1995) or Formal Contexts (Ganter and
Wille 1999).

## 3. Information as Code

For information to be computed, it must be handled by the
computational mechanism in question, and for such a handling to take
place, the information must be *encoded*. *Information as
code* is a stance that takes this encoding-condition very
seriously. The result is the development of fine-grained models of
information flow that turn on the syntactic properties of the encoding
itself.

To see how this is so, consider again cases involving information flow
via observations. Such observations are informative because we are not
omniscient in the normal, God-like sense of the term. We have to go
and observe that the cat is on the mat, for example, precisely because
we are not automatically aware of every fact in the universe.
Inferences work in an analogous manner. Deductions are informative for
us precisely because we are not *logically* omniscient. We have
to reason about matters, sometimes at great length, because we are not
automatically aware of the logical consequences of the body of
information with which we are reasoning.

To come full circle—reasoning explicitly with information requires handling it, where in this case such handling is cognitive act. Hence the information in question is encoded in some manner, hence Information as code underpins the development of fine-grained models of information flow that turn on the syntactic properties of the encoding itself, as well as the properties of the actions that underpin the various information-processing contexts involved.

Such information-processing contexts are not restricted to explicit
acts of inferential reasoning by human agents, but include
*automated reasoning* and *theorem proving*, as well as
machine-based computational procedures in general. Approaches to
modelling the properties of these latter information-processing
scenarios fall under *algorithmic information theory*.

In
section 3.1,
we will explore a major approach to modelling the properties of
information-processing within the information as code framework via
*categorial information theory*. In
section 3.2,
we will examine the more general approach to modelling information as
code of which categorial information theory is an instance, the
modelling of information as code via *substructural logics*. In
section 3.3
we will lay out the details of several other notable examples of
logics of information flow motivated by the information as code
approach.

### 3.1 Categorial Information Theory

*Categorial information theory* is a theory of fine-grained
information flow whose models are based upon those specified by the
categorial grammars underpinned by the Lambek Calculi, due originally
to Lambek (1958, 1961). The motivation for categorial information
theory is to provide a logical framework for modelling the properties
of the very cognitive procedures that underpin deductive
reasoning.

The conceptual origin of categorial information theory is found in van Benthem (1995: 186). Understanding van Benthem’s use of “procedural” to be synonymous with “dynamic”:

[I]t turns out that, in particular, the Lambek Calculus itself permits of procedural re-interpretation, and thus, categorial calculi may turn out to describe cognitive procedures just as much as the syntactic or semantic structures which provided their original motivation.

The motivation for categorial information theory is to model the
cognitive procedures constituting deductive reasoning. Consider as an
analogy the following example. You arrive home from IKEA with an
unassembled table that is still flat-packed in its box. Now the
question here is this, do you have your table? Well, there is a sense
in which you do, and a sense in which you do not. You have your table
in the sense that you have all of the pieces required to construct or
generate the table, but this is not to say that you have the table in
the sense that you are able to *use* it. That is, you do not
have the table in any useful form, you have merely pieces of a table.
Indeed, getting these table-pieces into their useful form, namely a
table, may be a long and arduous process…

The analogy between the table-example above and deductive reasoning is this. It is said often that the information encoded by (or “contained in” or “expressed by”) the conclusion of a deductive argument is encoded by the premises. So, when you possess the information encoded by the premises of some instance of deductive reasoning, do you possess the information encoded by the conclusion? Just as with the table-pieces, you do not possess the information encoded by the conclusion in any useful form, not until you have put the “information-pieces” constituting the premises together in the correct manner. To be sure, when you possess the information-pieces encoded by the premises, you possess some of the information required for the construction or generation of the information encoded by the conclusion. As with the table-pieces however, getting the information encoded by the conclusion from the information encoded by the premises may be a long and arduous process. You need also the instructional information that tells you how to combine the information encoded by the premises in the right way. This information-generation via deductive inference may be thought of also as the movement of information from implicit to explicit storage in the mind of the reasoning agent, and it is the cognitive procedures facilitating this storage transfer that motivate categorial information theory.

Categorial information theory is a theory of dynamic information
processing based on the *merge/fusion* \((\otimes)\) and
*typed function* \((\rightarrow , \leftarrow)\) operations from
categorial grammar. The conceptual motivation is to understand the
information in the mind of an agent as the agent reasons deductively
to be a database in much the same way as a natural language lexicon is
a database (see Sequoiah-Grayson (2013), (2016)). In this case, a
*grammar* will be understood as a set of processing constraints
so imposed as to guarantee information flow, or well-formed strings as
outputs. Recent research on proofs as *events* from a very
similar conceptual starting point may by found in Stefaneas and
Vandoulakis (2014).

Categorial information theory is strongly algebraic in flavour. Fusion
‘\(\otimes\)’ corresponds to the binary composition
operator ‘.’, and ‘\(\vdash\)’ to the partial
order ‘\(\le\)’ (see Dunn 1993). The merge and function
operations are related to each other via the familiar *residuation
conditions*:

In general, applications for directional function application will be restricted to algebraic analyses of grammatical structures, where commuted lexical items will result in non-well-formed strings.

Despite its algebraic nature, the operations can be given their evaluation conditions via “informationalised” Kripke frames (Kripke 1963, 1965). An information frame (Restall 1994) \(\mathbf{F}\) is a triple \(\langle S, \sqsubseteq, \bullet\rangle\). \(S\) is a set of information states \(x, y, z\ldots\) . \(\sqsubseteq\) is a partial order of informational development/inclusion such that \(x \sqsubseteq y\) is taken to mean that the information carried by \(y\) is a development of the information carried by \(x\), and \(\bullet\) is an operation for combining information states. In other words, we have a domain with a combination operation. The operation of information combination and the partial order of information inclusion interrelate as follows:

\[\tag{7} x \sqsubseteq y \text{ iff } x \bullet y \sqsubseteq y \]
Reading \(x \Vdash A\) as *state \(x\) carries information of type
\(A\)*, we have it that:

At the syntactic level, we read \(X \vdash A\) as *processing on
\(X\) generates information of type A*. In this case we are
understanding \(\vdash\) as an information processing mechanism as
suggested by Wansing (1993: 16), such that \(\vdash\) encodes not just
the output of an information processing procedure, but the properties
of the procedure itself. Just what this processing consists of will
depend on the processing constraints that we set up on our database.
These processing constraints will be imposed in order to guarantee an
output from the processing itself, or to put this another way, in
order to preserve information flow. Such processing constraints are
fixed by the presence or absence of various *structural rules*,
and structural rules are the business of *substructural
logics*.

### 3.2 Substructural logics and information flow

Categorial information theory is precipitated by giving the Lambek
calculi an informational semantics. At a suitable level of
abstraction, the Lambek calculi is seen to be a highly expressive
*substructural logic*. Unsurprisingly, by giving an
informational semantics for substructural logics in general, we get a
family of logics that exemplify the information as code approach. This
logical family is organised by expressive power, with the expressive
power of the logics in question being captured by the presence of
various *structural rules*.

A structural rule is of the following general form:

\[\tag{11} X \Leftarrow Y \]
We may read (11) as *any information generated by processing on
\(X\) is generated by processing on \(Y\) also*. Hence the
long-form of (11) is as follows:

Hence \(X\) is a structured body of information, or “data
structure” as Gabbay (1996: 423) puts it, where the actual
*arrangement* of the information plays a crucial role. The
structural rules will fix the structure of the information encoded by
\(X\), and as such impact upon the granularity of the information
being processed.

Consider Weakening, the most familiar of the structural rules (followed by its corresponding frame condition:

\[\begin{align} \tag{Weakening} &A \Leftarrow A \otimes B \\ &x\bullet y \sqsubseteq z \rightarrow x \sqsubseteq z \end{align}\]
With Weakening present, we loose track of which pieces of information
were actually used in an inference. This is precisely why it is that
the rejection of Weakening is the mark of relevant logics, where the
preservation of bodies of information relevant to the derivation of
the conclusion is the motivation. By rejecting Weakening, we highlight
a certain type of informational *taxonomy*, in the sense that
we know *which* bodies of information were used. To preserve
more structural detail than simply which bodies of information were
used, we need to consider rejecting further structural rules.

Suppose that we want to record not only which pieces of information were used in an inference, but also how often they were used. In this case we would reject Contraction:

\[\begin{align} \tag{Contraction} &A \otimes A \Leftarrow A \\ &x \bullet x \sqsubseteq x \end{align}\]Contraction allows the multiple use, without restriction, of a piece of information. So if keeping a record of the “informational cost” of the execution of some information processing is a concern, Contraction will be rejected. The rejection of Contraction is the mark of linear logics, which were designed for modelling just such processing costs (see Troelstra 1992).

If we wish to preserve the *order* of use of pieces of
information, then we will reject the structural rule of
Commutation:

Information-order will be of particular concern in temporal settings (consider action-composition) and natural language semantics (Lambek 1958), where non-commuting logics first appeared. Commutation comes also in a more familiar strong form:

\[\begin{align} \tag{Strong Commutation} &(A \otimes B) \otimes D \Leftarrow(A \otimes D) \otimes B \\ &\exists u(x \bullet z \sqsubseteq u \wedge u \bullet y \sqsubseteq w) \rightarrow\\ &\qquad \exists u(x \bullet y \sqsubseteq u \wedge u \bullet z \sqsubseteq w) \end{align}\]
The strong form of Commutation results from its combination with the
structural rule of
Association:^{[7]}

Rejecting Association will preserve the precise fine-grained properties of the combination of pieces of information. Non-associative logics were introduced originally to capture the combinatorial properties of language syntax (see Lambek 1961).

In the presence of Commutation, a double implication pair \((\rightarrow , \leftarrow)\) collapses into single implication \(\rightarrow\). In the presence of all of the structural rules, fusion, \(\otimes\), collapses into Boolean conjunction, \(\wedge\). In this case, the residuation conditions outlined in (5) and (6) collapse into a mono-directional function.

The choice of which structural rules to retain obviously depends on
just what informational phenomena is being modelled, so there is a
strong *pluralism* at work. By rejecting Weakening say, we are
speaking of *which* data were relevant to the process, but are
saying nothing about its multiplicity (in which case we would reject
Contraction), its order (in which case we would reject Commutation),
or the actual patterns of use (in which case we would reject
Association). By allowing Association, Commutation, and Contraction,
we have the taxonomy locked down. We might not know the order or
multiplicity of the data that were used, but we do know what types,
and exactly what types, were relevant to the successful processing.
The canonical contemporary exposition of such an information-based
interpretation of propositional relevant logic is Mares (2004). Such
an interpretation allows for an elegant treatment of the
contradictions encoded by relevant logics. By distinguishing between
*truth conditions* and *information conditions*, we
allow for an interpretation of \(x \Vdash A \wedge \neg A\) as
*\(x\) carries the information that \(A\) and not \(A\)*. For
an exploration of the distinction between truth-conditions and
information-conditions within *quantified* relevant logic, see
Mares (2009).

At such a stage, things are still fairly *static*. By shifting
our attention from static bodies of information, to the manipulation
*of* these bodies, we will reject structural rules beyond
Weakening, arriving ultimately at categorial information theory, as it
is encoded by the very weakest substructural logics. Hence the weaker
we go, the more “procedural” the flavour of the logics
involved. From a dynamic/procedural perspective, linear logics might
be thought of as a “half way point” between static
classical logic, and fully procedural categorial information theory.
For a detailed exposition of the relationship between linear logic and
other formal frameworks in the context of modelling information flow,
see Abramsky (2008).

Recent important work by Dunn (2015) ties substructural logics and
structural rules together with *informational relevance* in the
following way. Dunn makes a distinction between *programs* and
*data*, with the former being dynamic and the latter static. We
may think of programs as conditional statements of the form \(A
\rightarrow B\), and of data as atomic propositions \(A, B\) etc.
Given these two types of information artefacts, we have three possible
combinations, program to data combination, program to program
combination, and data to data combination. For program to data
combination, commutation will hold whilst weakening and association
will fail, and contraction not applying. For program to program
combination association will hold, whilst commutation, weakening fail.
As demonstrated in Sequoiah-Grayson (2016), the case of contraction
for program to program combination is more complicated. The exact
properties of data to data combination remain an interesting open
issue. The connection with informational relevance is made by
interpreting the partial order relation \(\sqsubseteq\) as marking
information relevance itself. In this case, \(x \sqsubseteq y\) is
read as *the information* x *is relevant to the
information* y. To what it is exactly that informational relevance
amounts will depend on the precise context of information processing
in question. Sequoiah-Grayson (2016) extends the framework about to
contexts of information processing by an agent as the agent reasons
explicitly. Given that the combination of information states \(x
\bullet y\) may sit on the left hand side of the partial order
relation, the extension is an account of the epistemic relevance of
epistemic actions. For a collection of recent papers exploring the
information as code approach in depth, see Bimbó (2016). See
Bimbó (2022) for a wide collection of recent papers on
informational relevance and reasoning.

### 3.3 Related Approaches

The information as code approach is a very natural perspective on information flow, hence there are a number of related frameworks that exemplify it.

One such approach to analysing information as code is to carry out such an analysis in terms of the computational complexity of various propositional logics. Such an approach may propose a hierarchy of propositional logics that are all decidable in polynomial time, with this hierarchy being structured by the increasing computational resources required for the proofs in the various logics. D’Agostino and Floridi (2009) carry out just such an analysis, with their central claim being that this hierarchy may be used to represent the increasing levels of informativeness of propositional deductive reasoning.

Gabbay’s (1993, 1996) framework of *labelled deductive
systems* exemplifies the information as code approach in manner
very similar to the informationalised substructural logics of
section 3.1.
An item of data (note that Gabbay refers to both atomic and
conditional information as data, in contrast to Dunn and
Sequoiah-Grayson in the section above) is given as a pair of the form
\(x : A\), where \(A\) is a piece of declarative information, and
\(x\) is a label for \(A. x\) is a representation of information that
is needed operate on or alter the information encoded by \(A\).
Suppose that we have also the data-pair \(y : A \rightarrow B\). We
may apply \(x\) to \(y\), resulting in the data-pair \(x + y : B\) In
this case, a database is a configuration of labelled formulas, or
data-pairs (Gabbay 1993: 72). The labels and their corresponding
application operation are organised by an algebra, and the properties
of this algebra will impose constraints on the applications operation.
Different constraints, of “meta-conditions” as Gabbay
calls them (Gabbay 1993: 77), will correspond to different logics. For
example, if we were to ignore the labels, then we would have classical
logic, if we were to accept only the derivations which used all of the
labelled assumptions, then we would have relevance logic, and if we
accepted only the derivations which used the labelled assumptions
exactly once, then we would have linear logic. Labels are behaving
very much like possible worlds here, and the short step from possible
worlds to information states makes it obvious how it is that the
meta-conditions on labels may be captured by structural rules.

Artemov’s (2008) framework of *justification logic*
shares many surface similarities with Gabbay’s system of
labelled deduction. The logic is composed of *justification
assertions* of the form \(x : A\), read as *\(x\) is a
justification for \(A\)*. Justifications themselves are evidential
bases of varying sorts that will vary depending on the context. They
might be mathematical proofs, sets of causes or counterfactuals, or
something else that fulfils the justificatory role. What it means for
\(x\) to justify \(A\) is not analysed directly in justification
logic. Rather, attempts are made to characterise the justification
relation \(x : A\) itself, via various operations and their axioms.
The application operation, ‘.’ mimics the application
operation ‘+’ from labelled deduction, or the fusion
‘\(\otimes\)’ operation from categorial information
theory. In justification logic, the symbol ‘+’ is reserved
for the representation of joint evidence. Hence ‘\(x +
y\)’ is read as ‘*the joint evidence of \(x\) and
\(y\)*’. Application and join are characterised in
justification logic by the following axioms respectively:

The latter axiom characterises the monotonicity of joint evidential bases. Apart from the commutativity of +, the structural properties of the justification operations are currently unexplored, although the potential for such an exploration is exciting. Justification logic is used to analyse notoriously difficult epistemic problems such as the Gettier cases and more. If we take our epistemology to be informationalised, then the constitution of evidential bases as information states places justification logics within the information as code approach in a straightforward manner. For further details, see Artemov and Fitting (2012).

Zalta’s work on object theory (Zalta 1983, 1993) provides a different way to analyse informational content—understood as propositional content—and its structure. Motivated by metaphysical considerations, object theory starts by proposing a theory of objects and relations (usually formulated in a second order quantified modal language). This theory can then be used to define and characterise states of affairs, propositions, situations, possible worlds, and other related notions. The resulting picture is one where all these things have internal structure, their algebraic properties are axiomatized, and one can therefore reason about them in a classical proof-theoretical way.

A philosophical point touched by this approach concerns the link
between the propositional content (information) expressed by sentences
and the idea of predication. Relevant to this entry is Zalta’s
(1993) development of a version of situation theory that follows this
approach, and where a key element is the usage of two forms of
predication. Briefly, the formula ‘\(Px\)’ corresponds to
the usual form of predication by exemplification (as in “Obama
is American”), while ‘\(xP\)’ corresponds to
predication via *encoding*. Abstract objects are then defined
to be (essentially) encodings of properties, in combinations which
might not even be made factual. These provisions enable the existence
of information about abstract, possible, or fictional entities. For
details on the tradition to which object theory belongs see Textor
(2012), McGrath (2012), and King (2012).

## 4. Connections Between the Approaches

While the three approaches discussed above (range, correlations, code) differ in that they emphasise different informational themes, the underlying notion they aim to clarify is the same (information). It is then natural to find that the similarities and synergies between the approaches invite the exploration of ways to combine them. Each one of the next subsections illustrates how one could bring together two out of the three approaches. Section 4.1 exemplifies the interface between the info-as-range and info-as-correlation views. Sections 4.2 and 4.3 do the same with the other two pairs of combinations, namely code and correlations, and code and ranges.

### 4.1 Ranges and correlations

A central intuition in the information-as-range view is the
correspondence that exists between information at hand (where this can
be qualified in various ways) and the range of possibilities which are
compatible with such information. On the other hand, a key feature of
the correlational approach to information is its reliance on a
structured information system formed by components that are
systematically connected. In general, many properties of a structured
system will actually be *local* properties, in that they are
determined by only some of the components (the fact that there is a
dot moving upwards in a radar can be determined only by looking at the
screen, even if this behaviour is correlated with the motion of a
remote plane, which is another component of the system). If one has
access to information pertaining to only a few of the many components
of a system, a natural notion of range of possibilities arises,
consisting of all the possible global configurations of the system
that are compatible with such local information. This subsection
expands on this particular way to link the two approaches, but as it
will be noted at the end, this is not the only one and the search for
other ways lies ahead as an open area of inquiry.

Formally, the link between ranges and correlations described above may
be approached by using a *restricted* product state space as a
model of the architecture of the system (van Benthem 2006, van Benthem
and Martinez 2008). The basic structures are *constraint
models*, versions of which have been around in the literature for
some years (for example Fagin et al. 1995 in the study of epistemic
logic, and Ghidini and Giunchiglia 2001 in the study of context
dependent reasoning). Constraint models have the form

Here, the basic component spaces are indexed by *Comp*, the
states of each component are taken from *States* (with
different components using maybe only a few of the elements of
*States*), and the global states of the system are global
valuations, that is, functions that assign a state to each basic
component *Comp*. Not all such functions are allowed, only
those in \(C\). Finally, *Pred* is a labelled family of
predicates (sets of global states).

To see how this fits with the information-as-correlation view,
consider again the example of planes being monitored by radars. As
before, each monitoring situation will be modelled as having only two
parts, now indexed by the members of \(Comp = \{ screen, plane\}\).
The actual instances of screening situations would correspond to
global states, which in this case — where we have only two
components — can be thought of as pairs \((s, b)\) where \(s\)
is a particular screen and \(b\) a particular plane. Hence, global
states connect instances of parts, so representing instances of a
whole system. But then a crucial restriction comes into play, because
not all screens are connected with all planes, only with those
belonging to the same monitoring situation. The set \(C\) selects only
such permissible pairs, thus playing a role similar to that of a
channel in
section 1.
Finally, *Pred* classifies global states into types, similar
to the classification relations of
section 2.3.

As we said before, some properties of systems are local properties, with only some of the components of the systems being relevant in determining whether they hold or not. That a monitoring situation is one where the plane is moving North depends only on the plane, not on the screen. In general, if a property is completely determined by subset of components \(\mathbf{x}\) then, in what concerns that property, any two global states that agree on \(\mathbf{x}\) should be indistinguishable. In fact, each such \(\mathbf{x}\) induces an equivalence relation of local property determination so that for every two global states \(\mathbf{s}, \mathbf{t}\):

\(\mathbf{s} \sim_{\mathbf{x}}\mathbf{t}\) if and only if the values of \(\mathbf{s}\) and \(\mathbf{t}\) at each one of the components in \(\mathbf{x}\) are the same.

In this way one gets not only a conceptual but also formal link to the
information-as-range approach, because constraint models can be used
to interpret a basic modal language with atomic formulas of the form
\(P\)—where \(P\) is one of the labels of predicates in
*Pred*—and with complex formulas of the form \(\neg \phi,
\phi \vee \psi, U\phi\), and \(\Box_{\mathbf{x}}\phi\), where
\(\mathbf{x}\) is a partial tuple of components and \(U\) is the
universal modality. More concretely, given a constraint model
\(\mathscr{M}\) and a global state \(s\), the crucial satisfaction
conditions are given by:

The resulting logic is axiomatised by the fusion of \(S_5\) modal logics for the universal modality \(U\) and each one of the \(\Box_{\mathbf{x}}\) modalities, plus the addition of axioms of the form \(U \phi \rightarrow \Box_{\mathbf{x}}\phi\), and \(\Box_{\mathbf{x}}\phi \rightarrow \Box_{\mathbf{y}}\phi\) whenever \(\sim_{\mathbf{y}} \subseteq \sim_{\mathbf{x}}\).

The information-as-range research agenda includes other topics, such
as agency and the dynamics of information update, which can in
principle be incorporated to the constraint models setting. For
example, in the case of agency, to the architectural structure of a
state system captured by a constraint model one could add epistemic
accessibility relations for a group of agents \(\mathcal{A}\), so to
obtain *epistemic constraint models* of the form

where \(\approx_a\) is the equivalence accessibility relation of agent \(a\). Here one could refine the planes and radar example above by adding some agents, say the controller and the pilot. By relying only on the controls each agent can see, the controller will not be able to distinguish states that agree on the direction of the plane but differ, say, on the metereological conditions around the plane. Those states will be related by the controller’s relation in the model, but not by the pilot’s relation. In principle, this merge of modal epistemic models and constraint models allows one to study, in a single setting, aspects of both the information-as-range and information-as-correlation points of view. The corresponding logical language for epistemic constraint models is the same as for basic constraint models, expanded with the \(K_i\) modal operators, one per agent. The logic is the fusion of the constraint logic from above and a \(S_5\) logic per each agent \(a\).

There are some newer, different approaches to information modelling that sit at the intersection of the information as range and information as correlation perspectives. One is van Benthem’s work on information tracking (van Benthem 2016). Tracking is a new perspective that addresses both the connections between different representations of information on the one hand, and the updates on these connections on the other.

Another development (Baltag 2016) comes from a line of work that
studies how to capture, in the style of epistemic logics such as those
described in
section 1,
the properties and dynamics of knowledge *de re* (Wang and Fan
2014). Identifying this kind of knowledge with knowledge of the value
of a variable, Baltag’s insight is to add, to the language of
basic epistemic logic, the usual first-order resources for
constructing terms and basic formulas (that is, symbols of constants,
functions, relations, and variables), plus, crucially, a generalised
conditional knowledge operator \(K_{a}^{t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n}\). The
extended language has now formulas \(K_{a}^{t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n} t\) and
\(K_{a}^{t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n} \phi\), with the intended meaning that
agent \(a\) knows the value of term \(t\) (or knows that \(\phi\), for
the second formula), provided it knows the values of terms \(t_1
,\ldots ,t_n\). To be able to capture this idea on the semantic side,
Kripke models are enriched so that, in addition to the usual set of
information states, interpretations for propositional letters, and
agents relations, we will also have a domain of objects over which
terms and basic relational formulas are locally interpreted at each
state (that is, the interpretations can vary from state to state, but
the underlying domain is the same across states). A sound and complete
axiomatisation exists, and the resulting logical system is a sort of a
general, yet decidable, dependence logic where information about
correlations can be captured via the conditional knowledge operators.
Dynamic versions are also obtained where, in addition to the public
announcement operator \([\phi]\), one has value announcement operators
\([t_1,\ldots ,t_n]\), with formula \([t_1,\ldots ,t_n] \phi\) being
read as “after the simultaneous announcement of the values of
terms \(t_1,\ldots ,t_n\), it is the case that \(\phi\)”.

*local*dependence that recruits semantic insights like the ones just described so far in this subsection (constraint models and a enriched modal semantics), and shows that they can be seen as two faces of the same coin.

Yet other links between the approaches have also be found, which are
motivated by other kind of questions and use formalisms that are
closer to the situation-theoretic ones. For example, consider a
setting in which agents have *incomplete* information about an
intended subset of a set of epistemic states. How can a relation of
accessibility arise from such a setting? (Notice that this is
different to the setting of epistemic constraint models described
above, where agents do have complete information about what holds true
of all the epistemically accessible worlds). One way to address this
question (Barwise 1997) is to consider a fixed classification \(A\),
the instances of which are the epistemic states, plus a local logic
per agent attached to each state. For some states these local logics
may be incomplete (see
section 2.3),
so agents may not have information about everything that holds true
of the intended range of states. Then, roughly, the states accessible
from a given state \(s\) and agent \(a\) will be those whose
properties (types) do not contradict the local logic of \(a\) in
\(s\). With these epistemic relations in place, classification \(A\)
can be used to interpret a basic modal language.

### 4.2 Code and correlations

Logical frameworks that crossover information as code and information
as correlation get their most explicit representation in work that
does just this—model the crossover between the two frameworks.
Restall (1994) and Mares (1996) give independent proofs of the
representability of Barwise’s information as correlation
channel-theoretic framework within the information as code approach as
exemplified by the substructural logics framework. In this section we
will trace the motivations and the main details of the proof, before
demonstrating the connection with *category theory*.

The basic steps are these—if we understand information channels to be information states of a special sort, namely the sort of information state that carries information of conditional types, then there is an obvious meeting point between information as correlation as exemplified by channel theory, and information as code as exemplified by informationalised substructural logics. The intermediate step is to reveal the connection between channel semantics for conditional types, and the frame semantics for conditionals given by relevance logics.

Starting with the channel theoretic analysis of conditionals, as noted
already, the running motivation behind Barwise’s
channel-theoretic framework is that information flow is underpinned by
an information channel. Barwise understood conditionals as
*constraints* in the sense that \(A \rightarrow B\) is a
constraint from \(A\) to \(B\) in the sense of \(A \Rightarrow B\)
from
section 2.2
above. If the information that \(A\) is combined with the information
encoded by the constraint, then the result or output is the
information that \(B\).

The information that \(A\) and that \(B\) is carried by the situations \(s_1, s_2\ldots\). and the information encoded by the constraint is carried by an information channel \(c\). Given this, Barwise’s evaluation condition for a constraint is as follows (the condition is given here in Barwise’s notation from his later work on conditionals, although in earlier writings such conditions appeared in the notation given in section 2.2 above):

\[\tag{15} c \models A \rightarrow B \text{ iff for all } s_1, s_2, \text{ if } s_1 \stackrel{c}{\mapsto} s_2 \text{ and } s_1 \models A, \text{ then } s_2 \models B, \]where \(s_1 \stackrel{c}{\mapsto} s_2\) is read as

the information carried by the channel \(c\), when combined with the information carried by the situation \(s_1\), results in the information carried by the situation \(s_2\).

Obviously enough, this is very close in spirit to (9) in the section on information as code above.

As noted above, the intermediate step concerns the ternary relation \(R\) from the early semantics for relevance logic. The semantic clause for the conditional from relevance logic is:

\[\tag{16} x \Vdash A \rightarrow B \text{ iff for all } y, z \in \mathbf{F} \text{ s.t. } Rxyz, \text{ if } y \Vdash A \text{ then } z \Vdash B. \]\(Rxyz\) is, by itself, simply an abstract mathematical entity. One way or reading it, the way that became popular in relevance logic circles, is

\(Rxyz\) iff the result of combining \(x\) with \(y\) is true at \(z\).

Given that the points of evaluation in relevance logics were understood originally as impossible situations (since they may be both inconsistent and incomplete), the main conceptual move was to understand channels to be special types of situations. The full proofs may be found in Restall (1994) and Mares (1996), and these demonstrate that the expressive power of Barwise’s system may be captured by the frame semantics of relevance logic. What it is that such “combining” of \(x\) and \(y\) amounts to depends on, of course, which structural rules are operating on the frame in question. As explained in the previous section above, the choice of which rules to include will depend on the properties of the phenomena being modelled.

The final step required for locating the meeting point between information as code and information as correlation is as follows. Contemporary approaches to relevance and other substructural logics understand the points of evaluation (impossible situations) to be information states. There is certainly no constraint on information that it be complete or consistent, so the expressibility of impossible situations it not sacrificed. Such an informational reading (Paoli 2002; Restall 2000; Mares 2004) lends itself to multiple applications of various substructural frameworks, and also does away with the ontological baggage brought by questions like “what are impossible situations?” in the “What are possible worlds?” spirit. An information-state reading of \(Rxyz\) will be something like

the result of combining the information carried by \(x\) and \(y\) generates the informations carried by \(z\).

Making this explicit results in \(Rxyz\) being written down as \(x \bullet y \sqsubseteq z\), in which case (15) is, via (16), equivalent to (9).

An important structural rule for the composition operation on information channels, that is, on information states that carry information of conditional types, is that it is associative. What this means is that:

\[\tag{17} z \stackrel{x \bullet (y \bullet v)}{\longmapsto} w = z \stackrel{(x \bullet y) \bullet v}{\longmapsto} w. \]
Where \(z \Vdash A\) and \(w \Vdash D\), this will be the case for all
\(x, y, v\) s.t. \(x \Vdash A \rightarrow\), \(y \Vdash B \rightarrow
C\), \(v \Vdash C \rightarrow D\). This is just the first step
required to demonstrate that channel theory, and its underlying
substructural logic, form a *category*.

Category theory is an extremely powerful tool in its own right. For a
thorough introduction see Awodey (2006). For more work on the
relationship between various substructural logics and channel theory,
see Restall (1994a, 1997, 2006). Further category-theoretic work on
information flow may be found in Goguen (2004—see Other Internet
Resources). Recent important work on category-theoretic frameworks for
information flow that extend to *quantifiable/probabilistic*
frameworks is due to Seligman (2009). Perhaps the most in depth
treatment of information flow in category theoretic terms is to be
found in the work of Samson Abramsky, and an excellent overview may be
found in his “Information, Processes, and Games” (2008).
Recent work on the intersection between information as code and
information as correlation uses substructural logics (relevance and
linear logics in particular) to model logical proofs as information
sources themselves. A proof is a source of information *par
excellence*, and the contributions in the area by Mares (2016) are
vital.

### 4.3 Code and ranges

Excitingly, there has been a recent surge in the recent development of
information logics that combine the flexibility of categorial
information theory with the subject matter of dynamic epistemic logics
in order to design *substructural epistemic logics*. Sedlar
(2015) combines the modal epistemic logics of implicit knowledge and
belief with substructural logics in order to capture the availability
of evidence for the agent. Aucher (2015, 2014) redefines dynamic
epistemic logic as a substructural logic corresponding to the Lambek
Calculi of categorial information theory. Aucher shows also that the
semantics for DEL can be understood as providing a conceptual
foundation for the semantics of substructural logics in general. See
Hjortland and Roy (2016) for an extension of Aucher’s approach
to soft information.

In general, information logic approaches to dynamic epistemic
phenomena that combine the DEL of section 1.2 and the substructural
logics of section 3.2 above have grown in popularity considerably. See
for example Aucher (2016, 2014), Tedder and Bilková
(*forthcoming*), Tedder (2021, 2017), Sedlár,
Punčochář, and Tedder (2023),
Punčochář, and Sedlár (2021), and
Sedlár (2021, 2019).

Other logical frameworks that model information as code and range along with information about encoding have been developed by Velázquez-Quesada (2009), Liu (2009), Jago (2006), and others. The key element to all of these approaches is the introduction of some syntactic code to the conceptual architecture of the information as range approach.

Taking Velázquez-Quesada (2009) as a working example, start
with a *modal-access model* \(M =\langle S, R, V, Y, Z\rangle\)
where \(\langle S, R, V \rangle\) is a Kripke Model, \(Y\) is the
*access set function*, and \(Z\) is the *rule set
function* s.t. (where \(I\) is the set of classical propositional
language based on a set of atomic propositions):

- \(Y : W \rightarrow \wp(I)\) assigns a set of formulas of \(I\) to each \(x \in S\).
- \(Z : W \rightarrow \wp(R)\) assigns a set of rules based on \(I\) to each \(x \in S\).

A modal-access model is a member of the class of modal access models \(\mathbf{MA}\) iff it satisfies truth for formulas and truth preservation for rules. \(\mathbf{MA}_k\) models are those \(\mathbf{MA}\) models such that \(R\) is an equivalence relation.

From here, inference is represented as a modal operation adding the rule’s conclusion to the access set of information states of the of the agent such that the agent can access both the rule and its premises. Where \(Y(x)\) is the access set at \(x\), and \(Z(x)\) is the rule set at \(x\):

**Inference on knowledge**: Where \(M = \langle S, R, V,
Y, Z\rangle \in \mathbf{MA}_k\), and \(\sigma\) is a rule, \(M_k\sigma
= \langle S, R, V, Y', Z\rangle\) differs from \(M\) in \(Y'\), given
by \(Y'(x) := Y(x) \cup \{\)conc\((\sigma)\}\) if
\(\text{prem}(\sigma) \subseteq Y(x)\) and \(\sigma \in Z(x)\), and by
\(Y'(x) := Y(x)\) otherwise.

The dynamic logic for inference on knowledge then incorporates the
ability to represent “*there is a knowledge inference
with* \(\sigma\) *after which* \(\phi\)
*holds*” (Velázquez-Quesada 2009). It is in just
this sense that such modal information theoretical approaches model
the outputs of inferential processes, as opposed to the properties of
the inferential processes that generate such outputs (see the section
on *categorial information theory* for models of such dynamic
properties).

Jago (2009) proposes a rather different approach based upon the
elimination of worlds *considered* possible by the agent as the
agent reasons deductively. Such epistemic (doxastic) possibilities
structure an epistemic (doxastic) space under bounded rationality. The
connection with information as code is that the modal space is
individuated syntactically, with the worlds corresponding to possible
results of step-wise rule-governed inferences. The connection with
information as range is that the rules that he agent does or does not
have access to will impact upon the range of discrimination for the
agent. For example, if the agent’s epistemic-base contains two
worlds, a \(\neg \phi\) world and a \(\phi \vee \psi\) world say, then
can refine their epistemic base only if they have access to the
disjunctive syllogism rule.

A subtle but important contribution of Jago’s is the following:
the modal space in question will contain only those epistemic options
which are not *obviously* impossible. However, what is or is
not obviously impossible will vary from both agent to agent, as well
as for a single agent over time as that agent refines its logical
acumen. This being the case, the modal space in question has
*fuzzy* boundaries.

## 5. Special topics

There is a varied list of special topics pertaining to the logical
approach to information. This section briefly illustrates just a
couple of them, which are important regardless of the particular
stance one takes (information as range, as correlation, as code). The
first topic is the issue of informational equivalence: when are two
structures in the logical approach one is using indistinguishable in
terms of the information they are meant to encode, convey, or carry?
And, when should two pieces of information be taken as equivalent or
not? The answers to this last question touch on the issue of how
information (or information carriers, or information supporters) can
be combined or structured. This, in turn, has an impact on the
properties logical connectives are expected to behave. The second
topic in this section focuses on one of the connectives. Namely, it
concerns the various ways in which the idea of *negative*
information can be understood conceptually, and properly dealt with
formally.

### 5.1 Information Structures and Equivalence

Every logical approach to information comes with its own kind of information structures. Depending on the particular stance and the aspect of information to be stressed, these structures may stand for informational states, structured syntactic representations, pieces of information understood as commodities, or global structures made up from local interrelated informational states or stages. Under which conditions can two informational structures be considered to be informationally equivalent?

Addressing this question brings out the need to have it clear at which
*level of granularity* one is testing for equivalence. The
classical extensional notion of logical equivalence is a coarse, in
that informationally different claims such as 2 *is even* and 2
*is prime* cannot be distinguished, as their extensions will
coincide. Equivalence given by identity at the level of
representations (say syntactic equality) is, on the contrary, too
fine-grained in some cases: to a bilingual speaker, the information
that the shop is closed would be equally conveyed by a sign saying
“Closed” as by a sign saying
“*Geschlossen*”, even if the two words are
different.

An intermediate notion of equivalence that has proved central to the range, correlational, and code views on information is the relation of bisimulation between structures. A bisimulation relation between two graphs \(G\) and \(H\) (where both the arrows and nodes of the graphs are labelled) is a binary relation \(R\) between the nodes of the graphs with the property that whenever a node \(g\) of \(G\) is related to a node \(h\) of \(H\), then:

- \(g\) and \(h\) have the same labels, and
- For every relation label \(L\) and every L-child \(g'\) of \(g\), there must be a L-child \(h'\) of \(h\) such that \(h\) and \(h'\) are related by \(R\). The analogous condition must hold for every \(L\)-child of \(h\).

A simple example would be the relation between the following two graphs (empty set of labels) that relates the point \(x\) with \(a\) and the point \(y\) with the points \(b, c, d\).

\[\genfrac{}{}{0}{1}{x \longrightarrow y}{\phantom{x \longrightarrow}\circlearrowright} \qquad \text{ and } \qquad \genfrac{}{}{0}{1}{a \longrightarrow b \longrightarrow c \longrightarrow d}{\phantom{a \longrightarrow b \longrightarrow c \longrightarrow} \circlearrowright} \]Bisimulation is naturally a central notion for the information-as-range perspective because the Kripke models of section 1 are precisely labelled graphs. It is a classical result of modal logic that if two states of two models are related by a bisimulation, then the states will satisfy exactly the same modal formulas, and in addition a first order property of states is definable in the basic modal language if and only if the property is preserved under bisimulation.

As for the correlational stance, in situation theory bisimulation turns out to be the right notion in determining whether two infons that might look structurally different are actually the same as pieces of information. For example, one possible analysis of Liar-like claims leads to infons that are nested in themselves, such as

\[ \sigma = \llangle \text{True}, \text{what} : \sigma , 0\rrangle. \]One can naturally depict the structure of \(\sigma\) as a labelled graph, which will be bisimilar to the graph associated with the apparently different infon

\[ \psi = \llangle \text{True}, \text{what} : \llangle \text{True}, \text{what} : \psi , 0\rrangle , 0\rrangle. \]The notion of bisimulation appeared independently in computer science, so it so no surprise that it also features in matters related to the information-as-code approach, with its focus on representation and computation. In particular, several versions of bisimulation have been applied to classes of automata to determine when two of them are behaviourally equivalent, and data encodings such as

\[ L =\langle 0, L\rangle \text{ and } L = \langle 0, \langle 0, L\rangle \rangle, \]both of which represent the same object (an infinite list of zeroes), can be identified as such by noticing that the graphs that depict the structure of these two expressions are bisimilar. See Aczel (1988), Barwise and Moss (1996), and Moss (2009) for more information about bisimulation an circularity, connections with modal logic, data structures, and coalgebras.

But there is much more to be said about informational equivalence and the right level of granularity. To reiterate, the themes highlighted by the various stances on information (partiality, aboutness, encoding, range, dynamics, agency) pose many challenges. For another example: ‘3 is prime’, and ‘the sum of the angles of a triangle is 180 degrees’ are logically equivalent in the standard sense, as they are both mathematical truths. But they should not be always taken to be informationally equivalent in general. First, they are about different topics. Second, an agent might know that 3 is prime, and yet not know that 180 is the sum of the angles of a triangle, due to its having only partial knowledge about triangles. Third, even if the agent had enough current knowledge to eventually infer that the sum of the angles of a triangle is 180 degrees, the inference might be hard for this agent, so being told that the sum of the angle is 180 would be informative in a way that being told that 3 is prime would not.

Information, just as content, meaning, knowledge, belief, and many agent attitudes (seeing that, suspecting that…) exhibit hyperintensional properties. There is an active line of research that studies how formal systems can capture these phenomena (see the entry on hyperintensionality). Here, we just note that the formal approaches to hyperintensionality most closely related to this entry follow some of these strategies:

- Extending possible-world semantics by allowing impossible worlds and adding a notion of topics. Given a formula, one does not consider only its truth conditions (the range of words that make it true) but a pair , so formulas with the same truth conditions may be told apart by virtue of being associated to different topics. See Yablo (2014), Jago (2015), Berto and Jago (2019).
- Defining models based on states (not worlds) that can be partial and/or inconsistent with respect to the information they validate. The models give a relation of “parthood” between states, and a binary fusion operation on states. The truth conditions of a formula is a pair \(\langle \textit{truthmakers}, \textit{falsifiers} \rangle\) of subsets of states that make a formula true and false, respectively. There is also a formal way to define the topic of a formula. As before, topics give a way to differentiate formulas with the same truth conditions. The partiality of states and the definition of truth conditions allow for another way to make differences, because two formulas may have the same set of verifiers but a different set of falsifiers. This approach is close in spirit to the situation theory tradition. See Fine (2017) and Fine and Jago (2020).
- Using relevant logics to take advantage of the particularities of its semantics (see Mares 2004).

*\(\psi\) is knowable on the basis of information \(\psi\)*, and Berto and Jago (2019) for a discussion on the use of impossibilities to treat issues such as informative sentences and inferences. In section 4.2 we already referred to Mares (2004) and the informational interpretation of relevant logic. Jago (2020), on the other hand, presents a truthmaker semantics for relevant logic. There are also some proposals of more general frameworks for hyperintensionality for which (1) and (2) above can be seen as particular cases or applications (see Sedlar 2021 and Leitbeg 2018), and van Benthem (2019) exemplifies how truthmaker semantics may be translated into a modal information logic. The more general point (van Benthem 2019) illustrates is that there are, roughly speaking, two natural and complementary styles of logical systems one can use to analyse a new notion. Some systems are more explicit, in that they extend an existing system (e.g. modal logic) with laws for new vocabulary that is directly related to the new notion one wants to analyze, without changing the previously existing logical notions. In contrast, a more implicit way of dealing with a new notion is to use a nonstandard reasoning system, so making changes on what the allowed reasoning patterns are, rather than adding new vocabulary. The use of one or other style, as well as the existence or not of translations between them, may help shed light on what philosophical claims may or may not be made about the notion one is studying. An example of a relevant question, in our context, is to what extent hyperintensionality may or may not be captured by the explicit style of classical modal informational logics.

### 5.2 Negative information

This entry has focused mostly on *positive information*.
Formally speaking, *negative information* is simply the
extension-via-negation of the positive fragment of any logic built
around information-states. Different negation-types will constrain the
behaviour of negative information in various ways. Informally,
negative information may be thought of variously as what is
canonically expressed with sentential negation, process exclusion
(both propositional and sub-propositional) and more. Even when we
restrict ourselves to a single conceptual notion, there may be
vigorous philosophical debate as to which formal construction best
captures the notion in question. In this section, we run though
several formal analyses of negative information, we examine some of
the philosophical debates surrounding the suitability of various
formal constructions with respect to particular applications, and
examine the related topic of failure of information flow in the
situation-theoretic sense, which may give raise to misinformation or
lack of information in particular settings.

Non-constructive intuitionistic negation, is aimed towards accounting for negative information in the context of information flow via observation. For more details on this point, see the subsection intuitionistic logics and Beth and Kripke models in the supplementary document: Abstract Approaches to Information Structure.

Working with the frames from section 3.1, non-constructive intuitionistic negation is defined in terms of the constructive implication, (21), which is combined with bottom, \(\mathbf{0}\), which holds nowhere, as specified by its frame condition:

\[\tag{18} x \Vdash \mathbf{0} \text{ for no } x \in \mathbf{F} \]Hence intuitionistic negation is defined as follows:

\[\tag{19} -A := A \rightarrow \mathbf{0} \]Hence the frame condition for \(-A\) is as follows:

\[\tag{20} x \Vdash -A [A \rightarrow 0] \text{ iff for all } y \in \mathbf{F}, \text{ s.t. } x \sqsubseteq y, \text{ if } y \Vdash A \text{ then } y \Vdash 0 \](20) states that if \(x\) carries the information that \(-A\), then there no state \(y\) such that \(y\) is an informational development of \(x\) where \(y\) carries the information that \(A\).

The definition of \(-A\) in terms of \(A \rightarrow \mathbf{0}\)
throws up an asymmetry between positive and negative information. In
an information model \(-A\) holds at \(x \in \mathbf{F}\) iff \(A\)
does not hold at any \(y \in \mathbf{F}\) such that \(x \sqsubseteq
y\). Whilst the verification of \(A\) at \(x \in \mathbf{F}\) only
involves checking \(x\), verifying \(-A\) at \(x \in \mathbf{F}\)
involves checking all \(y \in \mathbf{F}\) such that \(x \sqsubseteq
y\). According to Gurevich (1977) and Wansing (1993), this asymmetry
means that intuitionistic logic does not provide an adequate treatment
of negative information, since, unlike the verification of \(A\),
there is no way of verifying \(-A\) “on the spot” so to
speak. Gurevich and Wansing’s objection to this asymmetry is a
critical response to Grzegorczyk (1964). For arguments in support of
Grzegorczyk’s asymmetry between positive and negative
information, see Sequoiah-Grayson (2009). A fully constructive
negation that allows for falsification “on the spot” is
known also as *Nelson Negation* on account of it being embedded
within Nelson’s constructive systems (Nelson 1949, 1959). For a
contemporary development of these constructive systems, see section
2.4.1 of Wansing (1993).

In a static logic setting, negation is, at the very least, used to
rule out truth (if not to express explicit falsity). In a dynamic
setting, negation will be used to rule out particular
*processes*. For a development negative information as process
exclusion in the context of categorial information theory see
Sequoiah-Grayson (2013). This idea has its origins in the Dynamic
Predicate Logic of Groenendijk and Stokhof (1991), in particular with
their development of negative information via negation as
*test-failure*. For an exploration between the conceptions of
negative information as process exclusion and test-failure, see
Sequoiah-Grayson (2010).

In any logic for negation as process-exclusion, the process-exclusion
will be *non-directional* if the logic in question is
commutative. Directional process-exclusion will result when we remove
the structural rule of commutation. For a discussion of the
relationship between the formalisation of directional process
exclusion as commutation-failure along with symmetry-failure on
compatibility and incompatibility relations on information states, see
Sequoiah-Grayson (2011). For an extended discussion of negative
information in the context of categorial grammars, see Buszkowski
(1995).

## 6. Conclusion

There is a bi-directional relation between logic and information. On the one hand, information underlies the intuitive understanding of standard logical notions such as inference (which may be thought of as the process that turns implicit information into explicit informaiton) and computation. On the other hand, logic provides a formal framework for the study of information itself.

The logical study of information focuses on some of the most fundamental qualitative aspects of information. Different stances on information naturally highlight some of these aspects more than others. Thus, the information-as-range stance most naturally highlights agency and the dynamics of information in settings with multiple agents that can interact with each other. The aboutness of information (information is always about something) is a central theme in the information-as-correlation stance. The topic of encoding information and its processing (as in the case of formal inference) is at the core of the information-as-code stance. None of these qualitative aspects of information is exclusive to just one of the stances, even if some stress certain topics more than others. Some themes such as the structure of information and its relation with information content are equally pertinent regardless of the stance. The ways in which information is studied in this entry differs from other important formal frameworks that study information quantitatively. For example, Shannon’s statistical theory of information is concerned with things such as optimizing the amount of data that can be transmitted via a noisy channel, and the Kolmogorov’s complexity theory quantifies the informational complexity of a string as the length of the shortest program that outputs it when executed by a fixed universal Turing machine.

The logical analysis of information includes fruitful reinterpretations of known logical systems (such as epistemic logic or relevance logic), and new systems that result from attempts to capture further aspects of information. Still other logical approaches to the analysis of information result from combining aspects of two different stances, as with the constraint systems of section 4. New frameworks (situation theory in the 80s) have also resulted from exploring from scratch what sort of inferences — including those that are novel and non-classical — one should allow in order to model certain aspects of information.

Looking for interfaces between the three stances is still a nascent direction of inquiry, discussed here in section 4. A complementary issue is whether the stances can be unified. There are several formal frameworks that, beyond serving as potential settings for exploring the issue of unification, are abstract mathematical theories of information in their own right. Each of these goes well beyond the scope of this entry:

- Domain Theory (Abramsky and Jung 1994): it has been used to study the processes of unraveling or “improvement” of informational states in terms of partial orderings of information states that naturally arise across the stances.
- Point-free topology: it has deep connections with computer science and it can actually be motivated as a logic of information (Vickers 1996).
- Chu Spaces (Pratt 1995): in category theory they are presented as generalizations of topologies. The immediate link with things discussed in this entry is that the classifications used in situation theory are simply Chu spaces, discovered independently and with different aims.
- Coalgebra: another branch of category theory that has also been presented as the “mathematics of sets and observations” (Jacobs 2012, Other Internet Resources). This framework has strong links with many notions discussed in this entry, in particular modal logic (section 1) and bisimulation (section 5.1).
- Probability Theory: it is clearly at the center of abstract
*quantitative*approaches to information. Various versions of the inverse relationship principle that lead to measures of*semantic*information (see section 1.3 and Floridi 2013) descend from the version used by Shannon (1953 [1950]): in a communication setting via noisy channels, the less expected a received message is, the more informative it is.

The logical study of information resembles in spirit other more traditional endeavours, such as the logical study of the concept of truth or computation: in all these cases the object of logical study plays a central role in the intuitive understanding of logic itself. The three perspectives on qualitative information presented in this entry (ranges, correlations, and code) portrait the diverse state of the art in this field, where many directions of research are open, both as a way of searching for unifying or interfacing settings for the different stances, and of deepening the understanding of the main qualitative features of information (dynamics, aboutness, encoding, interaction, etc.) within each stance itself.

Interested readers may wish to pursue the topics in the supplementary document

Abstract Approaches to Information Structure

which covers the topics intuitionistic logic, Beth and Kripke models, and algebraic and other approaches to modal information theory and related areas.

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## Other Internet Resources

- Goguen, J., 2004, “Information Integration in Institutions,” online manuscript.
- Hernandez, N. A. N., and Quiroz, F. H., 2022, “Justification Logic and the Epistemic Contribution of Deduction”, online manuscript, 29 December 2022
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### Acknowledgments

The authors would like to extend their thanks to the Editors of the Stanford Encyclopaedia of Philosophy, as well as to Johan van Benthem, Olivier Roy, and Eric Pacuit. Their assistance and advice has been invaluable.