Notes to Love

1. This way of making the distinction between eros and agape seems to originate in Brentlinger (1970/1989), who poses the Euthyphro-like question, “Do we love someone because she is valuable, or is she valuable because we love her?” Eros, of course, is the former style of love, and agape is the latter. (Singer (1994) seems to reject this way of making the distinction, as he offers an account of love that combines both eros and agape; see Section 4).

2. For a detailed history of the concept(s) of love, see Singer (1984a,b, 1989); for a discussion of friendship as a particular relationship essentially involving a kind of love, see entry on friendship.

3. On a straightforward interpretation this seems bizarre, for the “we” formed by my wife and myself did not learn about love as union just because she left Nozick’s book for me to read. Perhaps Nozick takes it for granted that the lovers will discuss matters relevant to their shared interests, so that in this way “we” can register what only I have read.

4. Of course, to say that there is no principled reason why this is impossible is far from having a positive account, and more work needs to be done on the union (or any other) view of love to explain what concern for the other for his sake consists in. See Annas (1977) for further discussion of the difficulties here.

5. Taylor’s view is here categorized as a robust concern view, though it should be acknowledged that she thinks love is an emotion, albeit a special emotion that, unlike others, is not “occasional” (p. 161); for this reason she could be classified as understanding love as an emotion proper (cf. Section 5.1).

6. Like Stump, Thomas (1989, 1991, 1993) offers a robust-concern account of love that appeals to the importance of loving relationships, though he understands those relationships very differently: what is desired in loving someone is “mutual caring, sharing, and physical expression with the individual in question” (1991, p. 470). An important implication of this, Thomas claims, is that a loving relationship involves a “bond of trust” that is in part cemented by mutual self-disclosure. For criticisms of Thomas’ understanding of the role of self-disclosure in friendship, see entry on friendship, Section 1.2.

7. Of course, this is granting Badhwar’s implicit premise that the dead cannot be harmed or benefited; Aristotle, for example, denied this, and it is still a matter of some dispute.

8. However, it might seem that accounting for the “depth” of love by finding the effects love has on one’s own identity to be an essential part of love would be to give up on the central place desire has in love and so blur the line between the robust concern view and the union view.

9. Note how the criticism previously offered of Velleman fits into this criticism as a special case: to distinguish love from respect, Velleman appeals to the effects love but not respect has, yet he can offer no non-circular explanation as to why love has these effects.

10. Singer seems to deny this, saying, “Appraisal contributes to love directly, and not merely as a causal factor” (1994, p. 141). But in spelling out what he means here by “contributing to love directly,” he seems to say only that in order to bestow value and so come to value the beloved’s “desires and ideals” for their own sake, we must first know what these desires and ideals are; this is a matter for appraisal. Such an epistemic contribution is not merely a causal factor, but it does not seem to help us understand the selectivity of love.

11. Others not listed here claim to offer an account of love as an emotion; these include Solomon (1976, 1981, 1988), who was classified above as offering a union view, and Taylor (1976), who was classified as having a robust concern view.

12. Brown seems not to notice that the account of love he provides by the end of the book is not an account of the kind of occurrent mental state he describes emotions as being. Presumably, he intends the sort of love that persists over long stretches of time to be something like a disposition to feel occurrent emotions of love. Moreover, it’s not clear why Brown thinks an appeal to the emotions is necessary for making sense of the “open-endedness” of love: all that is needed for this is that the object of love be the person rather than her qualities. See the discussion in Section 6.

13. This conception of love as a primordial emotion is something like Descartes’ view in Passions of the Soul, §79: “Love is an emotion of the soul caused by a movement of the spirits, which impells the soul to join itself willingly [de volonté] to objects that appear to be agreeable to it.”

14. See Cocking & Kennett (1998) for what seems to be a development of Rorty’s account of the kinds of effects our friends can have on us in terms of notions of ‘direction’ and ‘interpretation’.

15. An exception is one form of the union view, according to which love is the actual (and not just desired) formation of a significant union, for presumably the formation of such a union is a historical process. However, little emphasis is placed on the shared history in such views.

16. Such an account of our beloveds’ responses to us as having merely epistemic significance may seriously underestimate the kind of impact our beloveds can have on us. For, as Cocking & Kennett (1998) argue (see entry on friendship, Section 1.2), through a kind of identification with our friends, we can be changed by and through their responses to us.

17. Willigenburg (2005), following Frankfurt (1999), argues that love provides a kind of concern that is necessary as the background of reasoning by making certain considerations salient and important to us. Nonetheless, he argues, love itself does not stand in need of justification, though we may indirectly challenge our loves via a kind of critical scrutiny. For similar reflections on Frankfurt’s account of love that understands it as providing self-grounded reasons, see Bransen 2006 and Ortiz-Millán 2007.

18. Notice that this worry is distinct from the first insofar as there is no suggestion here that these properties are the object of love. Rather, the issue here concerns whether the justification of love and the continuation of love appeals exclusively to the beloved’s being a certain type of person (and hence fungible) or whether such justification can somehow make ineliminable appeal to the beloved’s being this particular person. (But see Kraut 1986 for arguments that worries about whether love is de re rather than de dicto should be resolved by addressing the worry about fungibility.)

19. Exactly when one is justified in abandoning or dissolving a particular love—a correlative of (3) broached above in the quotation from Thomas (1991)—is not specifically addressed in the literature. Perhaps the implicit reason is that an understanding of when it is appropriate to dissolve a love depends on a prior understanding of when it is appropriate to continue a love; nonetheless, it is not obvious that the two questions shouldn’t be addressed together.

20. Similarly, Brink (1999, p. 272) distinguishes between the object and the manner of love, arguing in response to Vlastos that particular people are the objects of our love, and “priz[ing] and promot[ing] their virtue” is, at least in some cases, the manner in which we love them. Unlike Whiting, however, Brink does not think love can be understood to be a matter of disinterested affection: that would be to “assign only extrinsic significance to special concern. … By contrast, common sense attaches intrinsic significance to special relationships” (1999, p. 269).

21. Bagley (2018, 462) argues for a more pluralistic account of reasons for love that appeals not only to valuable historical relationships but also to “reasons for intimate gratitude, admiration, and trust” as well as “dynamically shared values”, both of which can help respond to the fungibility worry, as well as to one’s basic humanity and other properties like beauty. Bagley’s claim is that these provide distinctive kinds of justifications for love that should not be conflated.

Copyright © 2021 by
Bennett Helm <>

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