Lucrezia Marinella

First published Fri Nov 2, 2012; substantive revision Fri Feb 2, 2018

Lucrezia Marinella was a Venetian author of the sixteenth century, who published prolifically in a range of genres, primarily devotional literature (in prose and verse) and philosophical polemics. Her work, La nobiltà et l’eccellenza delle donne, co’ difetti et mancamenti de gli uomini, (The Nobility and Excellence of Women and the Defects and Vices of Men), published in 1600, was one of the first polemical treatises written by a woman in Italian as part of an ongoing debate about the nature and worth of women, often called the querelle des femmes (the debate about women).[1] The Nobility and Excellence of Women is an erudite recapitulation of the arguments and evidence brought forward to support claims for the merits of women, but it is more than a summary. Marinella provides a cogent, extended argument for the superiority of women’s intellectual and moral capacities, effectively constructing an account of a nature proper to women and distinct from the nature of man.

The Nobility and Excellence of Women is remarkable in several respects, aside from its philosophical and rhetorical skill. First, although several of Marinella’s predecessors on the pro-woman side of the debate had argued both that men and women were equal in so far as they shared a rational soul, and also that women were superior, they had failed to address adequately the tension between the claims of equality and of superiority; Marinella addresses it directly and persuasively. Her argument takes the bodies of women as a starting point, from which she adduces evidence to demonstrate that women’s moral characters are better than those of men, and that the moral superiority of women leads to an intellectual superiority. Second, Marinella advances the case being made by women and their supporters beyond a demand for sympathy and respect from men to a demand for freedom, power, and equality (Cox 1995, 520). Although she did not propose concrete reforms, she did analyze the situation of women in explicitly political terms. Third, although many had decried the viciousness of those who argued for the inferiority of women, Marinella was one of the first to supply an explanation of the motives of men who published misogynist works, and to connect those motives to the exclusion of women from public life (Jordan 1990, 259; Cox 1995, 516).

1. Life

Lucrezia Marinella was born in Venice in 1571, and lived there until her death in 1653. Her father, Giovanni Marinelli, was a physician, and the author of a number of medical treatises, two of which concerned women. He encouraged her intellectual interests, and allowed her access to biological and medical works, as well as works of philosophy (natural and moral) and literature. She was thus able to obtain a good education. Marinella composed works in a number of different genres, including lyric and narrative poetry, and devotional literature, but her skill as a philosophical polemicist demonstrated direct knowledge of the classical literary tradition and training in rhetoric and dialectic, all of which were unusual among women at the time (Panizza and Wood 2000, 65). Marinella’s first published work appeared in 1595; her most important work, the treatise entitled The Nobility and Excellence of Women and the Defects and Vices of Men (hereafter The Nobility) was published in Venice in 1600, revised and expanded in 1601, and reprinted in 1620. She continued writing and publishing until her death.

Marinella married another physician, Girolomo Vacca, relatively late in life. In the sixteenth century political and economic conditions in Venice, and their impact on marriage opportunities, gave women more liberty, which may have favored feminist polemics (see Cox 1995). In that context, Marinella’s late marriage may have afforded her greater opportunities for education and a measure of independence. There is some evidence that she was accepted as part of a group of intellectuals who formed the second Venetian academy, and that the academy supported and encouraged the expression of her feminist ideas (Kolsky 2001, 976). Marinella was commissioned to write The Nobility, either by Lucio Scarano, to whom it is dedicated (also a physician, and a philosopher) or by its publisher, Giovanni Battista Ciotti (Kolsky 2001, 975; Ross 2009, 291). It was intended as a response to a treatise by Giuseppe Passi, I donneschi diffetti (The Defects of Women). The commission attests both to the reputation Marinella enjoyed as an intellectual, and to the support she received from a wider circle.

In the sixteenth century the Italian vernacular increasingly replaced Latin as the language appropriate to a broad range of topics and genres (Panizza and Wood 2000, 65, 195), so Marinella was not eccentric in her choice of the vernacular (her father also wrote in Italian, and had publicly urged others to do so). The choice did, nonetheless, mean that her treatise in defense of women was available to more people, especially women. In her own time she was renowned as learned and eloquent, and she acquired a reputation as a rigorous scholar and a skillful philosopher; this was certainly in part due to the merits of her published work, but the respect she enjoyed—very unusual for a feminist—may have had something to do with the seclusion of her life and a reputation for sexual modesty.

2. The Nobility and Excellence of Women and the Defects and Vices of Men: context, sources, and structure

Although many of Marinella’s works, especially the long poem L’Enrico, overo Bisantio acquistato (1635), include philosophical themes, The Nobility stands as her most important, and perhaps her only uncontestable, contribution to philosophy. It is a contribution to a debate about the nature and the merits of women, which had its origin in The Book of the City of Ladies (1405) by Christine de Pizan (an argument for the moral superiority of her sex) written in response to The Romance of the Rose (~1275) by Guillaume de Lorris and Jean de Meun, in which women were vilified. Polemical works arguing that men were superior to women, or that women were superior to men, had proliferated in subsequent centuries, in French, Italian, Latin, German, Spanish and English. Such treatises generally relied on some combination of argument (usually drawn from ancient sources), examples, and citations from scripture and from literary or philosophical authorities.

The Nobility appeared when the debate had been running for two hundred years. Marinella was responding directly to the treatise by Giuseppe Passi, I donneschi diffetti (The Defects of Women), published in 1599 in Venice and Milan, and so the structure and methodology of The Nobility mirror those of The Defects of Women (Kolsky 2001, 974). Passi had cited a variety of ancient and medieval authorities, many of whom cite Aristotle as the source of their arguments, which may explain Marinella’s particular concern both to use and to discredit Aristotle; at any rate, she takes Passi to be a contemporary representative of a misogynist tradition beginning with Aristotle and extending forward through Boccaccio. The Defects of Women stands as an extreme example of the genre of attacks on women, with Passi claiming that women are covered from head to toe in vices and defects (Passi 1599, 240). The argument of the treatise begins with the claim that the female is imperfect, created only as a ‘necessary evil’. The imperfection of women is fundamentally that they are especially subject to passion (8). The heat of women’s bodies is both the source and the sign of her subjection to passion (29). Because women are in thrall to their passions, they may not, strictly speaking, be rational animals (216). This possibility is suggested and legitimized by Aristotle’s assertion that the deliberative faculty of women has no authority (215). Passi satirizes intellectual women (278–9), and comes close to suggesting that women are a different species from men, insisting that women should be treated like animals because both women and animals lack reason and virtue (Malpezzi Price and Ristaino 2008, 108). The Defects of Women treatise is remarkable for its virulence, but in no way original in substance.

There were precedents for many of Marinella’s claims and arguments in The Nobility, perhaps as early as Christine de Pizan (although there is no evidence that Marinella had read Pizan—see Ross 2009, 326 (n.6)), but certainly in the work of Henricus Agrippus, De nobilitate et praecellentia foeminei sexus (On the Nobility and Excellence of the Feminine Sex), published in Latin in 1529 and translated soon after into Italian (in 1549 by Alessandro Piccolomini), and the treatise Il Cortegione (The Courtier) (1528) by Baldassare Castiglione. Agrippa drew an analogy between the subjection of women and political tyranny, and this may have paved the way for Marinella’s political approach to the issue of women’s nature. Castiglione, using the form of the dialogue, offers a refutation of certain Aristotelian claims about the imperfection of women (through the voice of Giuliano de’ Medici), and an exposition of Neoplatonic love theory as popularized by Marsilio Ficino (through the voice of Pietro Bembo). Marinella also draws on the work of Leone Ebreo, the Dialoghi d’amore (1535), in which love is a cosmic force infusing all of creation, and the love between men and women, and not only between men, is recognized as a route to divinity. Another important source for Marinella’s treatise is the dialogue by Lodovico Domenichi entitled La nobiltà delle donne (The Nobility of Women), published in Venice in 1549. This work features characters who voice opinions from both sides of the debate about women; it includes arguments for the superior physiology of women that Marinella revises and elaborates in her treatise. While she drew on these works extensively, her argument marks a philosophical advance because it is detailed, systematic, and cogent. Although The Nobility was published in the same year that Moderata Fonte’s dialogue (Il merito delle donne) defending women, was published, Il merito had been written some years before. Marinella makes several references to Fonte, but none to Il merito. It is impossible to know how well acquainted she was with Fonte’s work, or what she thought of it. (For a discussion of Marinella’s knowledge of Fonte’s work see Kolsky 2001, 981–2).

In The Nobility Marinella argues that there is a feminine nature that is different from, and superior to, masculine nature. It was a commonplace that a person was called to a certain office in life by God; the nobility of a person was a function of that office and how well one carried out its duties. “Questions of virtue thus inevitably allude to a social hierarchy that was generally accepted as a reflection of the hierarchy of creation, an order in nature or of nature, instituted not fortuitously but providentially, and therefore not subject to alteration by human beings,” (Jordan 1990, 21). In this intellectual context, arguing that women were superior in nature to men was a way of arguing that the office in life that women were intended by God to fulfill was itself better.

Marinella’s central claim in The Nobility is, “…that the female sex is nobler and more excellent than the male,” (1601b, 39). More precisely, she says that she will show “…that they [women] surpass men in the nobility of their names, causes, nature, operations and the things men say about them,” (41). That names might indicate something about the things to which they refer was a commonplace of the Renaissance, with origins in the interpretation of Plato’s Cratylus. The causes of a phenomenon were similarly taken to indicate something important of the phenomenon itself—better causes producing better effects. The “nature” of woman Marinella shows to be, on the one hand, a nature shared with men and, on the other, a distinct nature; as the formal cause of a substance, the nature determines the worth of that substance. The “operations” of women are the things they are able to do insofar as they are ensouled beings rather than inanimate objects. Since Marinella argues that women have better souls than men, she takes as evidence for this the superior merit of the activities that they perform with the soul. Finally, Marinella’s objective to demonstrate that men themselves make evident the superiority of women (by means of “the things they say about women”) represents her most important strategy: to take the evidence usually adduced by men to demonstrate the inferiority of women, and reveal through interpretation that in fact it demonstrates the superiority of women.

The Nobility is divided into two parts, the first of which demonstrates the nobility and excellence of women, the second of which sets out the defects and failings of men. Both the respects in which she claims superiority for women and the contrast she draws between the excellences of women and the vices of men are standard in the contributions to the querelle des femmes that take the side of women. What is unusual with Marinella is the learning, the sophistication, and the systematic and cogent development of the arguments. Unlike most pro-woman authors, she makes no concessions to the convention of masculine excellence, asserting the superiority of women in all respects. The argument for women’s superiority is largely set out in the first part of the treatise. But the second part, on the defects of men, is not incidental to the central claim that women are nobler. Marinella details the defects of men, and in particular their evil motives, in order to support her positive argument for women’s nobility, by demonstrating that the motives men have for denigrating women are ignoble, stem from defects of nature, and are thus evidence of the inferiority of men. So the defects of men are introduced not only so that women might appear more excellent in comparison, but also, and more importantly, to show that the deficiencies attributed to women by men are more properly the deficiencies of male nature, and that those very deficiencies are responsible for the fallacious claims about women made by some men (Aristotle and Passi in particular). So Marinella offers an explanation for the misogynist claims to which she is responding, and that explanation supports her claim that women are better than men in certain precise respects.

3. Nobility as a function of causes

Marinella draws on both Platonist and Aristotelian accounts of causation, interpreted through ancient, medieval, and Renaissance commentators (she cites Plotinus, Lombard, Ebreo, and Ficino), when she argues that women are superior to men with respect to the causes that have generated them. Aristotle had posited four kinds of cause: material, formal, efficient, and final. In the case of an unqualified change, such as the generation of a substance (e.g., a person or a squirrel), the causes can be understood as follows: the material cause is the stuff out of which the substance is made, which remains as a constituent of the substance; the formal cause is the principle of organization that bestows on the individual substance both its form and its function, making it a member of a natural kind, with the characteristic properties and behaviors of that kind; the efficient cause initiates the process of generation; the final cause is the aim or end point of the process, which will often be in effect the same as the formal cause, because the aim of a process of generation is the mature and perfected form and function of the substance. Consider the example of the generation of an individual belonging to a natural kind, the squirrel (a natural substance). The material cause of the squirrel is the flesh, bone, blood, etc. from which the squirrel is constituted; the formal cause of the squirrel is its shape and function; the efficient cause of the squirrel is the male parent of that squirrel (because, on Aristotle’s view it is the male parent that initiates the process of generation of offspring); and the final cause is to be a mature squirrel and carry out the functions of a squirrel (whatever those may prove to be).

Marinella, following this tradition, distinguishes the “efficient or productive cause” from the material cause in the production of every creature, among which she includes woman, and man. On her view, all created things (for example, all angels, heavenly bodies, people, elements—earth, water, fire and air—and animals) ultimately have the same productive or efficient cause, namely God. With respect to the efficient cause, then, created things differ not at all. But there are distinctions in worth among created kinds (and also among individuals, insofar as the causes of two individuals of the same kind might differ), and these distinctions are a function of the differences in the ideas of God, whom Marinella compares to an architect or painter, who effects the production of buildings or art-works through the formulation of an idea or plan. The ideas are the formal causes, which, as we have seen, are the principles of organization that bestow on the individual substance both its form and its function; these produce the different kinds of creatures, and the differences among individuals within a kind. On this account, then, God’s creative process resembles the production of artifacts: in the same way that the painter will have better and worse ideas (in the sense that the ideas for the paintings will be ideas of better and worse things), so too God will have ideas of better and worse things that he brings into being: what God creates is not of uniform value. (The conception of ‘ideas’ here, while clearly Platonic in origin, parallels Aristotelian formal causes.)

In describing the important differences among ideas in the mind of God, and hence among formal causes, Marinella adverts in particular to the different purposes that different kinds are to serve:

That same courteous hand created angels, heavens, men, and the rude, dull earth, all in varying degrees of perfection….It is the creator who decides which things are of less value and which are worthier, and more particularly, which have a less noble purpose and which a more remarkable one. (Marinella 1601b, 52 (references to Marinella are all to 1601b))

That is, while God as the productive cause of every created thing is one and the same, the formal causes—the ideas in the mind of God—will be different, and of different value. Moreover, the ends to which the productive cause, God, intended to put each creature are different, and so the final causes responsible for the creation of different creatures will also be different. Marinella does not immediately conclude that women are superior to men; rather she concludes that it is possible:

Different degrees of perfection can be found, therefore…in everything in the world…If this is the case…why should not woman be nobler than man and have a rarer and more excellent purpose than he, as indeed can be manifestly understood from her nature? (1601b, 53)

In other words, if (i) the ideas of created kinds in God’s mind differ with respect to the intrinsic worth of the kind and with respect to the purpose of the kind, and if (ii) God’s idea of woman was different from God’s idea of man and so women have a different divinely determined purpose from that of men—then (iii) it is possible that women are nobler than men.

Women and men might then be different with respect to the idea and purpose (the formal and final causes) in the mind of God, but they are not different with respect to the efficient cause that brings them into being—God himself. Marinella’s discussion of the fourth kind of cause, the material cause, forms an important part of her argument, in which she makes a number of distinct points about the body as material cause of the ensouled being. She believes women are better than men with respect to the material cause, first citing an argument made by Christine de Pizan and restated by Agrippa: because woman was created from the rib of man, and man was already an ensouled being, and hence a living being, the material cause of woman is better than that of man, who was made from earth, which is lifeless matter.[2] This argument depends on the implicit premise that ensouled beings are superior to inanimate beings, but that was a view of the hierarchy of being current since antiquity, and so one that Marinella believes herself entitled to use. This is only the first demonstration of the superiority of women’s bodies to men; Marinella has quite a lot to add on the subject of the material or bodily superiority of women (discussed in Section 5 below), insofar as that superiority is a sign or mark of a better soul.

4. The different natures of men and women

To demonstrate that women are superior in nature to men, Marinella has to establish that it is possible for members of the same species to have souls that are the same in kind and yet different in merit. She acknowledges the widely accepted view that a species form is the same in every individual:

…if we speak as philosophers, we will say that man’s soul is equally noble to woman’s because both are of the same species and therefore of the same nature and substance, (1601b, 55);


…if we wished to apply the common reasoning, we would say that women’s souls are equal to men’s. (1601b, 57)

She is adverting here to Moderata Fonte and again to Agrippa, who had begun his Proclamation by claiming that God

has attributed to both man and woman an identical soul, which sexual difference does not at all affect…Thus, there is no preeminence of nobility of one sex over the other by reason of the nature of the soul; rather, inwardly free, each is equal in dignity, (Agrippa 1529, 43);

she likely also has in mind Castiglione, who wrote

the male will not be more perfect than the female as regards their formal substance, because the one and the other are included under the species man, and that in which the one differs from the other is an accident and is not of the essence. (Castiglione 1528, 214)

She agrees that women have the same rational souls as men, and belong to the same species, but denies that it follows from this that their souls are no nobler than the souls of men. That is, she argues, on the basis of the theory of causation that she set out, that

it is not impossible that within the same species there should be souls that are from birth nobler and more excellent than others…I say that women’s souls were created nobler than men’s. (1601b, 55)

Marinella quite explicitly rejects, then, the idea that men and women must be equal in nobility because they belong to the same species; but she also anticipates the objection that because the species essence, the rational faculty of soul, is the same in every individual person, we might expect that men and women would be equal in worth. It follows, and again she recognizes this, that she must assert that the form of a species is not without diversity, and so she explicitly argues for variations in the idea or form or soul of the human species. “Women’s souls can, therefore, be nobler and more prized in their creation than men’s,” (1601b, 57). In light of what she has said about ideas in the mind of God as productive causes of created beings, this must mean: the idea of woman (or perhaps the ideas of individual women) in the mind of God is an idea of something with a nobler and better purpose, with the result that the creature produced is nobler and more excellent. This is consistent with the claim that men and women have the same rational souls, if we allow that the human soul is constituted by something more than the faculty of reason, and so two human (and hence rational) souls might be put to different purposes. Marinella seeks to show that the purposes to which a rational soul is put will depend, at least in part, on the desires of the rational agent.

The question she confronts is, then, if men and women have souls that make them the same in species—the same in rational capacity—how can women be superior to men? Marinella’s answer depends on distinctions in the faculties of soul, and in particular on a distinction between the rational part and the desiring part, in which moral virtues are located. She aims to show that women are morally superior to men, and that this causes them to be “even better than men at learning the same arts and sciences,” (1601b, 83). That is, her argument is that the moral superiority of women has an impact on their rational faculties, which causes them to be intellectually superior (better at the same arts and sciences) although they are created with the same rational faculty. The argument depends ultimately on Marinella’s views about the causal role of bodily temperature on the soul’s functions, and about the moral status of the actions that issue from the soul’s functioning, views that will be elaborated in the following section. But Marinella produces a variety of kinds of evidence that, with respect to the moral virtues, and especially with respect to the control of the passions, women are superior. First, she claims that women are superior to men with respect to a variety of individual moral and intellectual virtues, and provides evidence in the form of examples of excellent women who manifest these virtues (“It is a fact known to everyone that women are continent and temperate, for we never see or read about them getting drunk or spending all day in taverns, as dissolute men do, nor do they give themselves unrestrainedly to other pleasures,” (1601b, 94).) Second, she points out that since men, whatever they might say about women, treat women with signs of honor, and since “nobody honors another person unless they know that the person has some gift or quality that is superior to his own” (1601b, 69), we should conclude that men themselves recognize the superiority of women. But, as we will see in the next section, she ultimately traces the moral superiority of women, which is responsible for their intellectual superiority, to differences in men’s and women’s bodies.

Marinella clearly suggests, then, that both deliberative and speculative reason are exercised more effectively by women because of the moral advantages of their sex. Granting that women and men have the same rational faculties of soul, if women are morally superior to men, they will also thereby attain intellectual superiority, making them better at learning the same arts and sciences. Although the souls of women are “still nobler” than those of men with respect in particular to the moral faculty, that nobility will have an impact on the rational faculty with the result that women are better than men intellectually and not only morally.

So while Marinella asserts (on the authority of Aristotle and scripture) that we can know the souls of men and women to be forms of the same species, rational souls, and equal in that respect, she also insists that this fundamental sameness allows nonetheless for distinctions in merit. Women’s souls are superior to those of men, because the moral character of women makes their faculty of desire, and ultimately also their faculty of reason, better than men’s. The superiority of women’s desires she traces to their temperate physiology, and she takes the proof of the superiority of their souls to be manifested in the beauty of their bodies.

5. The evidence from bodies that the sexes have different natures

Although the souls of men and women are identical with respect to the rational faculty, Marinella claims that women have better souls than men because (i) they have better desires which in turn (ii) affect the capacity for reason, effectively rendering women better able to access and act on their reason, so that (iii) women behave better—and in particular, they behave with more moderation. She also argues that the female body offers evidence of the superiority of women’s souls, both as a cause and as an effect, despite the equality of rational capacity enjoyed by men and women.

She adopts the common distinction between body and soul:

Women, like men, consist of two parts. One, the origin and cause of all noble deeds, is referred to by everyone as the soul. The other is the transitory and mortal body. (1601b, 55)

The soul, on her view, commands the body (or ought to); at the same time, it is dependent on the body for its operations (55). That is, the operations of the soul—including desires, thoughts, decisions, and actions—require the body. Because the soul relies on the body for its operations, the body manifests or expresses the character of the soul and its faculties, in a variety of ways.

When feminist philosophers first considered the question of sexual difference in the Renaissance, they were writing in response to overtly misogynistic claims (in Marinella’s case, the claims of Passi), which centred on the physical, moral and intellectual failings of women. One question feminists then had to face was whether to concede the facts, and dispute the explanation, or to dispute the facts. The question was whether it was better (i) to concede that women might appear to be inferior to men in a variety of ways (to be, for example, more foolish or more focused on frivolous pursuits) but to dispute that nature made them such or (ii) to dispute that women were more foolish, morally weak, or physically incapable in fact. Marinella by and large adopts the second strategy, arguing that women in fact display in their behavior not ignorance, unreason, vanity or flightiness, but on the contrary all the moral excellences that their detractors accuse them of lacking. At the same time, she does believe that men have suppressed the abilities and limited the opportunities of women, particularly with respect to intellectual endeavours, and that is a reason to expect that women might not be able to speak for themselves—their souls cannot express themselves directly (Marinella 1601b, 80; Malpezzi Price and Ristaino 2008, 116). The suppression of women’s abilities, and the concrete suppression of their speech, justifies in Marinella’s view moving to consider the evidence of women’s bodies in order to understand their souls, and to argue for the superiority of women on that basis. Because the soul of a person operates through the body, the body manifests certain characteristics of the soul, and so stands to offer evidence of the character of the soul.

Marinella intends then to demonstrate the superiority of women’s souls through the superiority of their bodies. She appeals to two physical indications of the greater nobility of women’s souls: (i) the moderate temperature of the female body, and (ii) their bodily beauty. Consider her claim that “the greater nobility and worthiness of a woman’s body is shown by its delicacy, its complexion, and its temperate nature, as well as by its beauty,” (1601b, 57). She believes the delicacy and complexion peculiar to women’s bodies are caused by the more moderate temperature of the body, so—despite this list—there are only two fundamental differences in the bodies of men and women, temperature and beauty.

5.1 Temperature

Temperature, on Marinella’s view, is the physical cause (the material cause) of the superiority of women’s souls:

it is necessary that I should clarify to some extent the nature of the body, because nearly all of its virtues and defects depend on its temperature, so that reason, even though it is master, is frequently dazzled and blinded by the senses. (1601b, 77)

The right, moderate, temperature, will ensure that reason is not blinded by the senses, and hence will allow reason to retain control over desire; and moderate temperature is, on Marinella’s account, most often found in women. The philosophical foundation for the claim that the temperature of women’s bodies is a sign of their virtue is an interpretation of Aristotle’s natural philosophy. (It is possible that she also had Galen in mind.) Marinella claims that the lower temperature of women’s bodies causes them to have superior moral virtues, and in this she is original; Castiglione had argued that women were more temperate physiologically, but he did not draw the connection to moral temperance so explicitly (see Castiglione 1528, 219). Marinella reports that Aristotle says that women are “Less hot than men and therefore more imperfect and less noble,” (130). She agrees with Aristotle that relative to men women are cooler in temperature, but she disagrees that women are cold in absolute terms. She then develops an argument that demonstrates, in part by pointing out discrepancies in Aristotle’s own account of the effects of heat and cold on certain soul functions, that the relative coolness of the female is a moral, and ultimately an intellectual, advantage.

Aristotle believed that the fundamental difference between male and female animals was a different capacity to concoct excess blood in the body into semen through a process that involved the transmission of heat to the blood; ultimately this difference was caused by a difference in heat, or the capacity to transmit heat, in the hearts of males and females (Marinella cites History of Animals IX, but there is considerable evidence for this view in the Generation of Animals as well; see, for example GA IV. 1 766a31–6). That is, the distinction between male and female animals resides in their heart, which is the source of natural heat, such that women are less capable of producing vital heat.

Aristotle consistently says that animals that are more intelligent have the “purest” blood; and more generally, he asserts that the quality of blood affects the intelligence and temperament of animals (see, e.g., Generation of Animals 2.6 744a28–32, Parts of Animals 2.4 650b19–25, 651a12–16). Moreover, Aristotle suggests that these differences in blood occur not only across animal species, but also between the sexes in a species. His claim is that hot, thin, pure blood is best, because such blood correlates both with courage (manliness) and with practical wisdom (Parts of Animals II. 2 748a2–14). The implication is clearly that those animals that benefit from hot, thin, pure blood are superior both with respect to deliberative reasoning and with respect to the moral virtue of courage. So men, in virtue of their body temperature, have an advantage, both intellectual and moral, over women.

But Aristotle’s views on the effects of temperature on the blood, and through the blood on the soul’s faculties, present certain challenges of interpretation: in the same passage of the Parts of Animals just cited, Aristotle says first that cold, thin blood is best for intelligence, and then that hot, thin blood is best. Marinella exploits this ambiguity, elaborating on Castiglione’s point that women are, in themselves, temperate rather than cold (see Castiglione 1528, 219). She agrees that women are colder, and embraces the notion that cold blood is intelligent blood. But she goes further than Castiglione in asserting that hot blood is associated with intemperate passions, and deduces the superiority of women with respect to intelligence, temperance, and general virtue or nobility. She says,

I now believe that Aristotle did not consider the workings of heat with a mature mind, nor what it signifies to be more or less hot, nor what good and bad effects derive from this. (1601b, 130)

She links here maturity with femininity, and femininity with relative coldness of temperature, thus extending the claim that cold blood supports greater intelligence to the claim that cold blood supports superior moral strength, by claiming that cooler blood encourages temperance with respect to pleasure and desire. Passi, and other opponents of women, accused women of intemperance, lasciviousness, and inconstancy; Marinella argues in response that the cooler temperature women enjoy allows them to keep their desires in check so that they can reason more effectively than men, who are over-heated relative to women.

The degree of heat in a living body affects directly the specific character of the operations of the soul, making, for example, reasoning or desiring more or less principled, or more or less impulsive. Marinella asserts (citing Plutarch as her authority) that “heat is an instrument of the soul,” (1601b, 130). That is, the soul will operate in some instances through the mechanism of heat; the soul must use the body’s heat as an instrument to conduct its operations—where those operations are not only rational activities, but are also the operations of desire and appetite. Now, since these operations of the soul affect in turn the actions that a person takes, the effects of body temperature extend beyond the direct effects on the activities of the soul, to the choices and actions the person takes, causing them to be virtuous or vicious. This is borne out by what Marinella says about the relation between temperate body heat and both moral and intellectual virtues. “Little and failing heat, as in old people, is powerless for the soul’s operations,” whereas excessive heat “makes souls precipitous and unbridled,” (1601b, 130). So insufficient heat makes the soul’s operations (cognitive and moral) ineffectual, but excessive heat makes the soul’s operations unprincipled and impulsive. Now, the effects of insufficient or excessive heat are deeds, good or bad. Insufficient heat will lead to inaction, and excessive heat will lead to vicious action.

In response, then, to Passi and Aristotle, Marinella concedes the empirical point, that women are colder but (i) disputes that women are colder absolutely (because, as Castiglione pointed out, temperature is relative, and hence women might be colder than men and yet temperate ‘in themselves’), and (ii) disputes the relation between heat and nobility, first citing various examples of those who are hotter than, but not nobler than, some others. She points out that regional climactic differences historically considered to affect body temperature exceed and confound sex differences—so African and Spanish women will be hotter than German men. If, as Marinella’s opponents believe, greater heat necessarily leads to greater virtue, then they should concede that African women will be more virtuous than German men. But those who argue that women are less noble than men because they have less heat than men, will not allow that men living in colder climates are less noble than women living in warmer climates. So they should abandon the general principle that heat correlates with greater nobility. Moreover, Marinella claims that some individuals will have had ‘natures’ hotter than Plato and Aristotle (it is not clear what the evidence for this is, but it is clear that she supposes there is some independent measure of heat other than virtue). And she assumes we can all agree that no one has ever been more virtuous than Plato and Aristotle. So, once again, her opponents must concede that it is not a universal truth that greater heat leads to greater virtue. We might expect Marinella, having disputed the relation between heat and nobility, to abandon any attempt to argue that women are superior to men in virtue of their body temperature. But she does not acknowledge an inconsistency in arguing both that there is no correlation between greater heat and greater virtue and that women are superior because they are colder. If one were to object to her argument that men who live in colder climates ought to be cooler than women who live in warmer climates, and therefore better than those women, she would reply that those men had effectively become women:

…if a man performs excellent deeds it is because his nature is similar to a woman’s, possessing temperate but not excessive heat, and because his years of virile maturity have tempered the fervor of that heat he possessed in his youth and made his nature more feminine so that it operates with greater wisdom and maturity. (1601b, 131)

This suggests also that in those places where women become hotter because of the climate, they will become worse—but not relative to men who live in the same climate. If there is a correlation between lower body temperature and virtue, and one allows that in warmer climates everyone will have a higher body temperature, but that women will generally have a lower body temperature than men in the same climate, then women will be more virtuous than men in any given region.

Marinella argues, then, that Aristotle was correct to conclude that women are usually, if not always, cooler than men, but she insists that women are temperate rather than cold. She then links, causally, the physical state of a cooler body temperature with a capacity to execute the soul’s operations with sufficient force, but without excessive passion: those who are physically temperate are also psychologically and morally temperate. When men succeed in virtuous deeds, it will be because they have become more feminine—more moderate in temperature—often with maturity, which Marinella assumes brings with it moderation in temperature. If women are (generally) the right temperature for virtue, and men are (generally) hotter than women, then clearly men are too hot. Moreover, there is independent evidence for men’s excessive heat in their actions, in particular in the intemperance they exhibit and the passionate love they indulge in. The greater nobility of women’s moral character allows them to perform more noble intellectual acts, because of the relation between desire and intellect. A person has a better character when the faculty of desire submits willingly to the faculty of reason. And when that is the case, reason is freer to exercise its own functions, without interference from desire. So the nobler moral character of women permits their intellects to focus on rational activities, without the distraction of having to control unbridled or mistaken desires. This accounts for the greater intellectual ability, as well as the superior moral character, that Marinella attributes to women.

5.2 Beauty

The passionate love men experience for women is excited by the beauty of women, and that beauty is the second of the fundamental differences Marinella cites between the bodies of women and those of men, as evidence of the superiority of women’s souls and ultimately of women themselves. While temperature is a cause of superiority, beauty is a manifestation of the superior character of the souls of women, and evidence of the nobility of the idea in the mind of God that is the form of woman: “…the Idea of women is nobler than that of men. This can be seen by their beauty and goodness, which is known to everybody” (1601b, 53). Marinella understands the body to manifest the character of the soul, so she believes that we can know that women’s souls are nobler than men’s through “the effect they [the souls] have and from the beauty of their bodies,” (55). The beauty is an effect of “a grace or splendor proceeding from the soul as well as from the body,” (57). And Marinella states quite explicitly, “The soul…is the cause and origin of physical beauty,” (58). Taken together, these assertions suggest that the soul bestows grace or beauty on the body, and that those qualities then ‘proceed’ from the body as well as from the soul. If we accept that the soul is the cause of physical beauty, and we assume that effects resemble causes, then we can learn something about the character of the soul from the character of the body. To understand how Marinella conceives of beauty, and her philosophical purposes in appealing to beauty as evidence of moral and intellectual superiority, we need to consider her sources, and also the relation between beauty, heat, and the virtues of women as she contrasts them with the vices of men. We should also notice that she claims on the one hand that all women are beautiful, and that no man is: “I say that compared to women all men are ugly,” (63); and on the other hand, that she allows that there are variations in beauty between individual women, and that men can be more or less beautiful (167).

The philosophical sources for the view that women’s beauty is a sign of a virtuous soul are interpretations of Plato’s dialogue, the Symposium. Ficino’s translation of the Symposium was especially influential at the time Marinella was writing, and she does refer to it, but she seems to have based much of her discussion on Leone Ebreo’s Dialoghi d’amore. Two aspects of Platonic theory are pertinent here. The first is the view that particular beings in this world have the features they do by means of participation in ideal Forms. So women are beautiful because they participate in the Form of the Beautiful Itself; and their beauty is itself a mark or sign of their participation. “Divine beauty is…the first and principal cause of women’s beauty,” (1601b, 60). The Platonist understanding of causation allows that while divine being is the first and principal cause, there are creaturely causes which mediate the effects of that first cause, so that the soul of a woman can be the immediate cause and origin of her physical beauty while divine beauty is its first cause. Marinella cites Ebreo for the claim that corporeal beauty is an image of divine beauty, and then argues:

If it [corporeal beauty] came solely from the body, each body would be beautiful, which it is not. Beauty and majesty of body are, therefore, born of superior reason. (1601b, 59)

The second aspect of Platonic theory that serves Marinella’s argument from beauty to the superiority of women is the view that erotic desire, understood as a response to (and a desire for) beauty, is an impulse which leads us ultimately to the Form of Good Itself, by means of particular good things, which are identified with beautiful things. Agrippa had made a similar argument, which may have influenced Marinella. He wrote

Since beauty itself is nothing other than the refulgence of the divine countenance and light which is found in things and shines through a beautiful body, women—who reflect the divine—were much more lavishly endowed and furnished with beauty than man (Agrippa 1529, 50),

and adds that “all are dazzled by her beauty and love and venerate her on many accounts” (51). Marinella reports that ‘Platonists’ say: “External beauty is the image of divine beauty,” (1601b, 58). She agrees with the poets who say that beauty is a path that guides us directly to the contemplation of divine wisdom; and in her own voice asserts that beauty is a golden chain, that “always raises us toward God, from whom it is derived,” (64–5). So the fact that men experience desire for women, because they perceive them as beautiful, is a sign that men recognize that women are good, and indeed better than men. This is because we desire to possess the good forever, and we do not desire what we already have. If, then, men desire women it must be that women are better than men, and closer to the divine.

Marinella’s own account of beauty is simply this: it is “a ray of light from the soul that pervades the body in which it finds itself,” citing Plotinus as the source. She also cites Ficino’s letters, and a variety of poets, in support of the view that beauty is a kind of light—or like a ray of light—from the soul, which is compared to the sun. On this account, then, beauty does not lie in the symmetry of features, or youth, or indeed in any material feature of women’s bodies. It is rather an ineffable aura that pervades womankind. Marinella has support for this view from Platonist philosophers, and indeed from those who oppose her and yet allow that “women’s lovely faces shine with the grace and splendor of paradise” and she uses it to undermine the claim for superiority of men. If men were in fact superior to women, then it would be women who desired men, not men who desired women, whereas in fact,

they [men] are forced to love them [women] for this beauty, while women are not forced to love men, because that which is less beautiful, or ugly, is not by nature worthy of being loved…They [men] would not be loved by women were it not for our courteous and benign natures, to which it seems discourteous not to love our male admirers a little. (1601b, 63)

Marinella thus appears to assert that women do not desire men, but experience only a polite reciprocal affection for those men who love them. This is likely to have been a strategic claim, aimed as a retort against Passi and other men writing against women, who often accused women of lasciviousness and promiscuity. Marinella is claiming that sexual desire is so foreign to women (at least to most women) that they are incapable of lascivious sentiments or acts.

If women are beautiful and temperate in their bodies, it is because their souls are better organized than the souls of men; in particular, it is because their desires are obedient to reason. And men are susceptible to woman’s beauty because of the intemperate heat of the male body, which is both produced by the deficiency of the male soul, and a manifestation of that deficiency:

I wish to go further and show that men are obliged and forced to love women, and that women are not obliged to love them back, except merely from courtesy. I also wish to demonstrate that the beauty of women is the way by which those men who are moderate creatures are able to raise themselves to the knowledge and contemplation of the divine essence. (1601b, 62)

So Marinella turns the arguments of men—both the argument that women are defective and colder, and the argument that women are defective and weak of will—to her own purposes, demonstrating that women are better for being cooler, and are less weak of will than are men, who succumb to the passionate desire for beauty much more readily than do women.

6. Methods and issues of interpretation

Marinella demonstrated extraordinary scholarship by the standards of her day, particularly with respect to the variety of sources she was able to cite, and with greater accuracy than many of her contemporaries. Many defenders of women had contented themselves with responding to vaguely defined opponents; Marinella, by contrast, cited her authors and their texts with some precision. This indicates both that she had access to the texts themselves, and not only to reports on the texts, and also that she understood the scholarly force of accurately and precisely representing the claims of an author. This is one aspect of her methodology that serves as a strength, and singles her out from the crowd of pro-woman writers (see Ross 2009, 289). Her extensive use of citation served not only to exhibit those claims with which she was to take issue, but also to allow her to interpret for her own purposes the claims of authors with whom she disagreed. She often cites the same author both as an authority in support of her arguments, and as a target against whom she argues—and the effect of this is to undermine the authority of that source.

Marinella was then engaged in establishing the unreliability of the very authorities whose work was supposed to support the inferiority of women. If Aristotle did not maintain a coherent account of the relation between temperature and rational capacity, we should not trust his assessment of the relative merits of men and women.

What is unusual about Marinelli’s historicism is that it undermines an important and representative authority for patriarchy, and consequently links historicism to feminism. She denies the whole category of the authoritative with its implied opposition, the category of the specious, and substitutes her own concept of the author—one whose claim to the truth is no more than contingent. (Jordan 1990, 258)

Marinella’s methodical use of oppositions in the work of a single author, the most powerful case being that of Aristotle, leaves room for her to suggest that experience may be a better source of our knowledge of women, their capacities and natures.

If one effect of Marinella’s marshalling of the evidence for both sides of the woman question is to undermine the authority of those authors most frequently cited by her opponents, another effect is to raise the possibility of a skeptical agenda. Like many pro-woman authors, Marinella begins by accepting the claim that the rational souls of men and women are the same, before going on to argue for the superiority of women. We might wonder why she, and others, were not content to rest with the claim of equality at the level of the rational soul. To put the question another way: Did Marinella truly believe that women are better than men, or did she argue for that position for other reasons? It is possible that the arguments for superiority are intended to raise skeptical doubts in the minds of her audience, doubts which would make them reluctant to decide the question of superiority between men and women. If it seemed preposterous to argue that women were superior to men, and yet one could do so using unimpeachable authorities, then arguments for the superiority of men over women, constructed on the foundations of those same authorities, might seem less convincing. So, although many contemporary and later interpreters assume that The Nobility is a treatise in support of the superiority of women, there is some evidence to suggest that Marinella may have argued for the claim of superiority not so much to establish its truth as to call into skeptical doubt the truth of the claim of superiority for men made by her opponents (see O’Neill 2007 for an argument that skepticism informed the work of another sixteenth century feminist, Marie de Gournay).

Some evidence that Marinella’s methods are not entirely transparent lies in her late work, Essortationi alle donne (Exhortations to women), which on the surface appears to be a palinode, a rejection of a lifetime dedicated to study and writing—she specifically urges women not to aspire to a literary career. Some interpreters have, however, detected in this work “a residue of defiance combined with the possibility of unmasking male techniques of domination,” (Kolsky 2001, 984). Several kinds of evidence point to the possibility that Marinella did not intend to subvert the claims of The Nobility: her use of “irony, paradox and contradiction,” together with a prefatory remark instructing readers to look below the surface of the text, and the reputation of the printer of the Essortationi as one who was infamous for publishing “layered discourses” (Ross 2009, 296–8; Malpezzi Price and Ristaino 2008, 120–55).


Works by Marinella

  • Marinella, L. , 1595, La Colomba sacra, Poema eroico. Venice.
  • –––, 1597, Vita del serafico et glorioso San Francesco. Descritto in ottava rima. Ove si spiegano le attioni, le astinenze e i miracoli di esso, Venice.
  • –––, 1598, Amore innamorato ed impazzato, Venice.
  • –––, 1601a, La nobiltà et l’eccellenza delle donne co’ diffetti et mancamenti de gli uomini. Discorso di Lucrezia Marinella in due parti diviso, G , Venice.
  • –––, 1601b, The Nobility and Excellence of Women, and the Defects and Vices of Men, Dunhill, A. (ed. and trans.), Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1999.
  • –––, 1602, La vita di Maria vergine imperatrice dell’universo. Descritta in prosa e in ottava rima, Venice.
  • –––, 1603, Rime sacre, Venice.
  • –––, 1605, L’Arcadia felice, Venice.
  • –––, 1605a, L’Arcadia felice, F. Lavocat (ed.), Florence: Accademia toscana di scienze e lettere, ‘La Colombaria’ 162, 1998.
  • –––, 1605b, Vita del serafico, et glorioso San Francesco. Descritto in ottava rima, Venice.
  • –––, 1606, Vita di Santa Giustina in ottava rima, Florence.
  • –––, 1617, La imperatrice dell’universo. Poema heroico, Venice.
  • –––, 1617a, La vita di Maria Vergine imperatrice dell’universo, Venice.
  • –––, 1617b, Vite de’ dodeci heroi di Christo, et de’ Quatro Evangelisti, Venice.
  • –––, 1624, De’ gesti heroici e della vita meravigliosa della serafica Santa Caterina da Siena, Venice.
  • –––, 1635, L’Enrico ovvero Bisanzio acquistato. Poema heroico, Venice.
  • –––, 1645a, Essortationi alle donne et a gli altri se a loro saranno a grado di Lucretia Marinella. Parte Prima, Venice.
  • –––, 1645b, Exhortations to Women and to Others if They Please, L. Benedetti (ed. and trans.), Toronto: Centre for Reformation and Renaissance Studies, 2012.

Other Primary Sources

  • Agrippa, H. C., 1529, Declamation on the Nobility and Preeminence of the Female Sex, A. Rabil, Jr. (ed. and trans.), Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1996.
  • Castiglione, B., 1528, The Book of the Courtier, Singleton, C. S. (trans.), New York: Doubleday, 1959.
  • Domenichi, L., 1549, La nobiltà delle donne, Venice.
  • Passi, G., 1599, I donneschi diffetti nuovamente formati e posti in luce da Giuseppe Passi Ravenate nell’Academia de’ Signori Informi di Ravenna L’Ardito, Milan.
  • Pizan, C. de, 1405, The Book of the City of Ladies, Richards, E. J. (trans.), New York: Persea Books, 1982.

Secondary Literature

  • Allen, P. and Salvatore, F., 1992, “Lucrezia Marinella and Woman’s Identity in Late Italian Renaissance,” Renaissance and Reformation/Renaissance et Réforme, 16(4): 5–39.
  • Benson, P. J., 1992, The Invention of the Renaissance Woman: The Challenge of Female Independence in the Literature and Thought of Italy and England, University Park, PA.: The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Chemello, A. 1983, “La donna, il modello, l’immaginario: Moderata Fonte e Lucrezia Marinella,” in Nel cherchio della luna: Figure di donna in alcuni testi del XVI secolo, Venice: Marsilio.
  • –––, 1991, “Lucrezia Marinella,” in Le stanze ritrovate: Antologia di scrittrici venete dal quattrocento al novecento, A. Arslan, A. Chemello, and G. Pizzamiglio (eds.), Milan: Eidos, pp. 95–108.
  • –––, 2000, “The rhetoric of eulogy in Marinella’s La nobiltà e l’eccelenza delle donne,” in Women in Italian Renaissance Culture and Society, Panniza, L. (ed.), London: Legenda, pp. 463–77.
  • Cox, V., 1995, “The Single Self: Feminist Thought and the Marriage Market in Early Modern Venice,” Renaissance Quarterly, 48 (3): 513–81.
  • Deslauriers, M., 2017, “Marinella and Her Interlocutors: Hot Blood, Hot Words, Hot Deeds,” Philosophical Studies, 174(10): 2525–2537. doi: 10.1007/s11098-016-0730-3
  • Ferguson, M. W., M. Quilligan, and N. J. Vickers, 1986, Rewriting the Renaissance: The Discourses of Sexual Difference in Early Modern Europe, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Jordan, C., 1990, Renaissance Feminism: Literary Texts and Political Models, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Kelly, J., 1984, Women, History and Theory: The Essays of Joan Kelly, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Kraye, J., 1994, “The Transformation of Plato in the Renaissance,” in Platonism and the English Imagination, A. Baldwin and S. Hutton (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • King, M., 1980, “Book-Lined Cells: Women and Humanism in the Early Italian Renaissance,” in Beyond Their Sex: Learned Women of the European Past, P. H. Labalme (ed.), New York and London: XXX, pp. 66–90.
  • Kolsky, S., 2001, “Moderata Fonte, Lucrezia Marinella, Guiseppe Passi: An Early Seventeenth-Century Feminist controversy,” The Modern Language Review, 96 (4): 973–89.
  • Maclean, I., 1980, The Renaissance Notion of Woman: A Study in the Fortunes of Scholasticism and Medical Science in European Intellectual Life, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Malpezzi Price, P. and C. Ristaino, 2008, Lucrezia Marinella and the “Querelle des Femmes” in Seventeenth-Century Italy, Madison: Fairleigh Dickinson University Press.
  • O’Neill, E., 2007, “Justifying the Inclusion of Women in our Histories of Philosophy: The Case of Marie de Gournay,” in The Blackwell Guide to Feminist Philosophy, L. M. Alcoff and E. F. Kittay (eds.), Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Panizza, L. and S. Wood, 2000, A History of Women’s Writing in Italy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Ray, M. K., 2015, Daughters of Alchemy: Women and Scientific Culture in Early Modern Italy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Ross, S. G., 2009, The Birth of Feminism: Woman as Intellect in Renaissance Italy and England, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Shapiro, L., 2013, “The Outward and Inward Beauty of Early Modern Women,” Revue Philosophique de la France et de l’Étranger, 203(3): 327–46.
  • Zancan, M. (ed.), 1983, Nel cerchio della luna: Figure di donna in alcuni testi del XVI secolo, Venice: Marsilio.

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