Mally’s Deontic Logic

First published Fri Apr 5, 2002; substantive revision Tue Mar 26, 2019

In 1926, Mally presented the first formal system of deontic logic. His system had several consequences which Mally regarded as surprising but defensible. It also had a consequence (“A is obligatory if and only if A is the case”) which Menger (1939) and almost all later deontic logicians have regarded as unacceptable. We will not only describe Mally’s system but also discuss how it may be repaired.

1. Introduction

In 1926, the Austrian philosopher Ernst Mally (1879-1944) proposed the first formal system of deontic logic. In the book in which he presented this system, The Basic Laws of Ought: Elements of the Logic of Willing, Mally gave the following motivation for his enterprise:

In 1919, everybody was using the word self-determination. I wanted to obtain a clear understanding of this word. But then, of course, I immediately stumbled on the difficulties and obscurities surrounding the concept of Ought, and the problem changed. The concept of Ought is the basic concept of the whole of ethics. It can only serve as a usable foundation for ethics when it is captured in a system of axioms. In the following I will present such an axiomatic system.[1]

As Mally’s words indicate, he was not primarily interested in deontic logic for its own sake: he mainly wanted to lay the foundation of “an exact system of pure ethics” (eine exakte reine Ethik). More than half of his book is devoted to the development of this exact system of ethics. In the following, we will, however, concentrate on the formal part of his book, both because it is its “hard core” and because it is the part that has attracted the most interest.

2. Mally’s Formal Language

Mally based his formal system on the classical propositional calculus as formulated in Whitehead’s and Russell’s Principia Mathematica (vol. 1, 1910).

The non-deontic part of Mally’s system had the following vocabulary: the sentential letters A, B, C, P and Q (these symbols refer to states of affairs), the sentential variables M and N, the sentential constants V (the Verum, Truth) and Λ (the Falsum, Falsity), the propositional quantifiers ∃ and ∀, and the connectives ¬, &, ∨, → and ↔. Λ is defined by Λ = ¬V.

The deontic part of Mally’s vocabulary consisted of the unary connective !, the binary connectives f and ∞, and the sentential constants U and ∩.

  • Mally read !A as “A ought to be the case” (A soll sein) or as “let A be the case” (es sei A).
  • He read A f B as “A requires B” (A fordert B).
  • He read A ∞ B as “A and B require each other.”
  • He read U as “the unconditionally obligatory” (das unbedingt Geforderte).
  • He read ∩ as “the unconditionally forbidden” (das unbedingt Verbotene).

f, ∞ and ∩ are defined by:

Def. f . A f B = A → !B (Mally 1926, p. 12)
Def. ∞ . A ∞ B = (A f B) & (B f A)
Def. ∩. ∩ = ¬U

Mally did not only read !A as “it ought to be the case that A.” Because a person’s willing that a given state of affairs A be the case is often expressed by sentences of the form “A ought to be the case” (for example, someone might say “it ought to be the case that I am rich and famous” to indicate that she wants to be rich and famous), he also read !A as “A is desirable” or “I want it to be the case that A.” As a result, his formal system was as much a theory about Wollen (willing) as a theory about Sollen (ought to be the case). This explains the subtitle of his book. In modern deontic logic, the basic deontic connective O is seldom read in this way.

We have just described one respect in which Mally’s deontic logic was different from more modern proposals. There are two other conspicuous differences:

  • Mally was only interested in the deontic status of states of affairs; he paid no special attention to the deontic status of actions. Thus, his Deontik was a theory about Seinsollen (what ought to be the case) rather than Tunsollen (what ought to be done). Modern authors often regard the concept of Tunsollen as fundamental.
  • In modern deontic logic, the notions of prohibition F, permission P and waiver W are usually defined in terms of obligation O: FA = O¬A, PA = ¬FA, WA = ¬OA. Such definitions are not to be found in Mally’s book.

3. Mally’s Axioms

Mally adopted the following informal deontic principles (Mally 1926, pp. 15-19):

(i) If A requires B and if B then C, then A requires C.
(ii) If A requires B and if A requires C, then A requires B and C.
(iii) A requires B if and only if it is obligatory that if A then B.
(iv) The unconditionally obligatory is obligatory.
(v) The unconditionally obligatory does not require its own negation.

Mally did not offer much support for these principles. They simply seemed intuitively plausible to him.

Mally formalized his principles as follows (Mally 1926, pp. 15-19):

I. ((A f B) & (B → C)) → (A f C)
II. ((A f B) & (A f C)) → (A f (B & C))
III. (A f B) ↔ !(A → B)
IV. ∃U !U
V. ¬(U f ∩)

Axiom IV is strange:

  • !U is a more natural formalization of (iv).
  • Axiom IV seems redundant: !A → !A is a tautology, so we have !A f A by Def. f, whence !(!A → A) by Axiom III(→), whence ∃M !M by existential generalization. Axiom IV seems to add nothing to this.
  • Axiom IV is the only axiom or theorem mentioned by Mally in which U occurs as a bound variable: in Axiom V and in theorems (15)–(17), (20)–(21), (23), (23′) and (27)–(35) (to be displayed below), U is either a constant or a free variable. One should treat it in the same way in the formalization of (iv).

For these reasons, we replace Axiom IV by the following axiom:[2]

IV. !U

Mally could hardly have objected to this version of Axiom IV because it is equivalent with his theorem (23′), i.e., V f U, in virtue of Def. f. In the following “Axiom IV” will always refer to our version of Axiom IV rather than Mally’s.

Using Def. f, Axioms I-V may also be written as follows (Mally 1926, pp. 15-19 and p. 24):

I′. ((A → !B) & (B → C)) → (A → !C)
II′. ((A → !B) & (A → !C)) → (A → !(B & C))
III′. (A → !B) ↔ !(A → B)
IV′. V f U
V′. ¬(U → !∩)

4. Mally’s Theorems

Mally derived the following theorems from his axioms (Mally 1926, pp. 20-34).[3]

(1) (A f B) → (A f V)
(2) (A f Λ) ↔ ∀M (A f M)
(3) ((M f A) ∨ (M f B)) → (M f (A ∨ B))
(4) ((M f A) & (N f B)) → ((M & N) f (A & B))
(5) !P ↔ ∀M (M f P)
(6) (!P & (P → Q)) → !Q
(7) !P → !V
(8) ((A f B) & (B f C)) → (A f C)
(9) (!P & (P f Q)) → !Q
(10) (!A & !B) ↔ !(A & B)
(11) (A ∞ B) ↔ !(A ↔ B)
(12) (A f B) ↔ (A → !B) ↔ !(A → B) ↔ !¬(A & ¬B) ↔ !(¬A ∨ B)
(13) (A → !B) ↔ ¬(A & ¬!B) ↔ (¬A ∨ !B)
(14) (A f B) ↔ (¬B f ¬A)
(15) ∀M (M f U)
(16) (U → A) → !A
(17) (U f A) → !A
(18) !!A → !A
(19) !!A ↔ !A
(20) (U f A) ↔ (A ∞ U)
(21) !A ↔ (A ∞ U)
(22) !V
(23) V ∞ U
(23′) V f U
(24) A f A
(25) (A → B) → (A f B)
(26) (A ↔ B) → (A ∞ B)
(27) ∀M (∩ f ¬M)
(28) ∩ f ∩
(29) ∩ f U
(30) ∩ f Λ
(31) ∩ ∞ Λ
(32) ¬(U f Λ)
(33) ¬(U → Λ)
(34) U ↔ V
(35) ∩ ↔ Λ

5. Surprising Consequences

Mally called theorems (1), (2), (7), (22) and (27)–(35) “surprising” (befremdlich) or even “paradoxical” (paradox). He viewed (34) and (35) as the most surprising of his surprising theorems. But Mally’s reasons for calling these theorems surprising are puzzling if not confused.

Consider, for example, theorem (1). Mally interpreted this theorem as follows: “if A requires B, then A requires everything that is the case” (Mally 1926, p. 20). He regarded this as a surprising claim, and we agree. However, Mally’s interpretation of (1) is not warranted. (1) only says that if A requires B, then A requires the Verum. The expression “if A requires B, then A requires everything that is the case” is to be formalized as

(1′) (A f B) → (C → (A f C))

This formula is an immediate consequence of (1) in virtue of Axiom I. In other words, Mally should have reasoned as follows: (1′) is surprising; but (1′) is an immediate consequence of (1) in virtue of Axiom I; Axiom 1 is uncontroversial; so (1) is to be regarded as surprising.

A similar pattern is to be seen in many of Mally’s other remarks about theorems which surprised him. He generally read too much into them and confused them with some of the consequences they had in his system:

  • Mally was surprised by (2) because he thought that it says that if A requires B and B is not the case, then A requires every state of affairs whatsoever (Mally 1926, p. 21). But (2) says no such thing. Mally’s paraphrase is a paraphrase of (A f B) → (¬B → (A f C)) (a consequence of (2) in virtue of Axiom I) rather than (2).
  • Mally paraphrased (7) as “if anything is required, then everything that is the case is required” (Mally 1926, p. 28), which is indeed surprising. However, Mally’s paraphrase corresponds with !A → (B → !B) (a consequence of (7) in virtue of Axiom I) rather than (7).
  • Mally paraphrased (22) as “the facts ought to be the case” (Mally 1926, p. 24). We grant that this is a surprising claim. But the corresponding formula in Mally’s language is A → !A (a consequence of (22) in virtue of Axiom I), not (22).
  • Mally read (27) as “if something which ought not to be the case is the case, then anything whatsoever ought to be the case” (Mally 1926, pp. 24, 33), but this is a paraphrase of !¬A → (A → !B) (a theorem of Mally’s system) rather than (27).
  • Mally paraphrased (33) as “what is not the case is not obligatory” (Mally 1926, p. 25) and as “everything that is obligatory is the case” (Mally 1926, p. 34). These assertions are indeed surprising, but Mally’s readings of (33) are not warranted. They are paraphrases of !A → A rather than (33).
  • Mally made the following remark about (34) and (35):

    The latter sentences, which seem to identify being obligatory with being the case, are surely the most surprising of our “surprising consequences.”[4]

    However, (34) and (35) do not assert that being obligatory is equivalent with being the case, for the latter statement should be formalized as A ↔ !A. The latter formula is a theorem of Mally’s system, as will be shown in a moment, but it is not to be found in Mally’s book.

Mally regarded theorems (28)–(32) as surprising because of their relationships with certain other surprising theorems:

  • (28)–(30) are instantiations of (27). But this is not sufficient to call these theorems surprising. Mally actually viewed (28) as less surprising than (27): one might use it to justify retaliation and revenge (Mally 1926, p. 24).
  • (31) implies (28)–(30) and is therefore at least as surprising as those theorems.
  • Mally viewed (32) as surprising because the surprising theorem (33) is an immediate consequence of (32) and the apparently non-surprising theorem (25).

Mally’s list of surprising theorems seems too short: for example, (24) is equivalent with A → !A in virtue of Def. f. But A → !A may be paraphrased as “the facts ought to be the case,” an assertion which Mally regarded as surprising (Mally 1926, p. 24). So then why didn’t he call (24) surprising? Did it not surprise him after (22)?

Even though Mally regarded many of his theorems as surprising, he thought that he had discovered an interesting concept of “correct willing” (richtiges Wollen) or “willing in accordance with the facts” which should not be confused with the notions of obligation and willing used in ordinary discourse. Mally’s “exact system of pure ethics” was mainly concerned with this concept, but we will not describe this system because it belongs to the field of ethics rather than deontic logic.

6. Menger’s Criticism

Mally’s enterprise was received with little enthusiasm. As early as 1926, it was noted that “Mr. Mally’s deductions are frequently so amazingly obtuse and irrelevant that (despite his elaborate symbolic apparatus) it is only necessary to state one or two of them to show how far his discussion has strayed from its self-appointed task” (Laird 1926, p. 395).

In 1939, Karl Menger published a devastating attack on Mally’s system. He first pointed out that A ↔ !A is a theorem of this system. In other words, if A is the case, then A is obligatory, and if A ought to be the case then A is indeed the case. As we have already noted in connection with theorems (34) and (35), Mally made the same claim in informal terms, but the formula A ↔ !A does not occur in his book.

Menger’s theorem A ↔ !A may be proven as follows (Menger’s proof was different; PC denotes the propositional calculus).

First, A → !A is a theorem:

1. A → ((!B → !B) & (B → A)) [ PC ][5]
2. ((!B → !B) & (B → A)) → (!B → !A) [ I′ ]
3. A → (!B → !A) [ 1, 2, PC ]
4. !B → (A → !A) [ 3, PC ]
5a. !U [ Ax. IV ]
5b. !(!A → A) [ III′(→), PC ]
6. A → !A [ 4, either 5a or 5b, PC ]

Second, !A → A is a theorem:

1. ((U → !A) & (A → ∩)) → (U → !∩) [ I′ ]
2. ¬((U → !A) & (A → ∩)) [ 1, V′, PC ]
3. ¬((U → !A) & (A → ∩)) → (!A → A) [ PC ][6]
4. !A → A [ 2, 3, PC ]

Because A → !A and !A → A are theorems, A ↔ !A is a theorem as well.

Menger gave the following comment:

This result seems to me to be detrimental for Mally’s theory, however. It indicates that the introduction of the sign ! is superfluous in the sense that it may be cancelled or inserted in any formula at any place we please. But this result (in spite of Mally’s philosophical justification) clearly contradicts not only our use of the word “ought” but also some of Mally’s own correct remarks about this concept, e.g. the one at the beginning of his development to the effect that p → (!q or !r) and p → !(q or r) are not equivalent. Mally is quite right that these two propositions are not equivalent according to the ordinary use of the word “ought.” But they are equivalent according to his theory by virtue of the equivalence of p and !p (Menger 1939, p. 58).

Almost all deontic logicians have accepted Menger’s verdict. After 1939, Mally’s deontic system has seldom been taken seriously.

7. Where Did Mally Go Wrong?

Where did Mally go wrong? How could one construct a system of deontic logic which does more justice to the notion of obligation used in ordinary discourse? Three types of answers are possible:

  • Mally should not have added his deontic axioms to classical propositional logic;
  • Some of his deontic principles should be modified; and
  • Both of the above. Menger advocated the latter view: “One of the reasons for the failure of Mally’s interesting attempt is that it was founded on the 2-valued calculus of propositions” (Menger 1939, p. 59).

The first two suggestions turn out to be sufficient, so the third proposal is overkill.

In the following we will point out three facts:

First, if Mally’s deontic principles are added to a system in which the so-called paradoxes of material and strict implication are avoided, many of the “surprising” theorems (such as (34) and (35)) are no longer derivable and A ↔ !A is no longer derivable either (section 8).

Second, if Mally’s deontic principles are added to a system in which the so-called law of the excluded middle is avoided, the unacceptable consequence A ↔ !A is no longer derivable, but almost all theorems that Mally derived himself are still derivable (section 9).

Third, if Mally’s deontic principles, e.g., Def. f and Axiom I, are slightly modified, the resulting system is almost identical with the system nowadays known as standard deontic logic (section 10).

8. Alternative Non-Deontic Bases 1: Relevance Logic

Mally’s informal postulates (i)–(iii) and (v) are conditionals or negations of conditionals, i.e., of the form “if … then —” or “not: if … then —.” Føllesdal and Hilpinen (1981, pp. 5-6) have suggested that such conditionals should not be formalized in terms of material implication and that some sort of strict implication would be more appropriate. But this suggestion is not altogether satisfactory, for both A → !A and A ↔ !A are derivable in the very weak system S0.90 plus I′ and III′, where → is the symbol of strict implication.[7]

In systems of strict implication the so-called paradoxes of material implication (such as A → (B → A)) are avoided, but the so-called paradoxes of strict implication (such as (A & ¬A) → B) remain. What would happen to Mally’s system if both kinds of paradoxes were avoided? This question can be answered by adding Mally’s axioms to a system in which none of the so-called “fallacies of relevance” can be derived (see the entry on relevance logic).

In the following, we will add Mally’s axioms to the prominent relevance logic R. The result is better than in the case of strict implication: most of the theorems which Mally regarded as surprising are no longer derivable, and Menger’s theorem A ↔ !A is not derivable either. But many “plausible” theorems can still be derived.

Relevant system R with the propositional constant t (“the conjunction of all truths”) has the following axioms and rules (Anderson & Belnap 1975, ch. V; ↔ is defined by A ↔ B = (A → B) & (B → A)):

Self-implication. A → A
Prefixing. (A → B) → ((C → A) → (C → B))
Contraction. (A → (A → B)) → (A → B)
Permutation. (A → (B → C)) → (B → (A → C))
& Elimination. (A & B) → A, (A & B) → B
& Introduction. ((A → B) & (A → C)) → (A → (B & C))
∨ Introduction. A → (A ∨ B), B → (A ∨ B)
∨ Elimination. ((A → C) & (B → C)) → ((A ∨ B) → C)
Distribution. (A & (B ∨ C)) → ((A & B) ∨ C)
Double Negation. ¬¬A → A
Contraposition. (A → ¬B) → (B → ¬A)
Ax. t. A ↔ (t → A)
Modus Ponens. A, A → B / B
Adjunction. A, B / A & B

A relevant version RD of Mally’s deontic system may be defined as follows:

  • The language is the same as the language of R, except that we write V instead of t, add the propositional constant U and the unary connective !, and define Λ, ∩, f and ∞ as in Mally’s system.
  • Axiomatization: add Mally’s Axioms I-V to the axioms and rules of R.

RD has the following properties.

  • Axioms I, II and III may be replaced by the following three simpler axioms:[8]
    I*. (A → B) → (!A → !B)
    II*. (!A & !B) → !(A & B)
    III*. !(!A → A)
  • Formulas I′–V′, (3), (4), (6), (8)–(11), (14), (16)–(18), (23′) and (30) are theorems of RD.[9]
  • Formulas (1), (2), (5), (7), (12), (13), (15), (19)–(23), (24)–(29), (31)–(35), A → !A and !A → A are not derivable.[10]
  • There are 12 mismatches between RD and Mally’s expectations: (5), (12)–(13), (15), (19)–(21), (23) and (24)–(26) are not derivable even though Mally did not regard these formulas as surprising, and (30) is a theorem even though Mally viewed it as surprising.
  • Formulas (34) and (35) (the formulas which Mally viewed as the most surprising theorems of his system) are in a sense stranger than Menger’s theorem A ↔ !A because the latter theorem is derivable in RD supplemented with (34) or (35) while neither (34) nor (35) is derivable in RD supplemented with A ↔ !A.[11]

Although most of Mally’s surprising theorems are not derivable in RD, this has nothing to do with Mally’s own reasons for regarding these theorems as surprising. They are not derivable in RD because they depend on fallacies of relevance. Mally never referred to such fallacies to explain his surprise. His considerations were quite different, as we have already described.

RD is closely related to Anderson’s relevant deontic logic ARD, which is defined as R supplemented with the following two axioms (Anderson 1967, 1968, McArthur 1981; Anderson used the unary connective O instead of !):

ARD1. !A ↔ (¬A → ∩)
ARD2. !A → ¬!¬A
  • All theorems of RD are theorems of ARD.[12]
  • ARD1( → ) is not a theorem of RD+ARD2.[13] This formula does not occur in Mally’s book. According to Anderson, Bohnert (1945) was the first one to propose it.[14]
  • ARD2 is not a theorem of RD+ARD1.[15] This formula does not occur in Mally’s book, but Mally endorsed the corresponding informal principle: “a person who wills correctly does not will (not even implicitly) the negation of what he wills; correct willing is free of contradictions.”[16]
  • RD supplemented with ARD1( → ) and ARD2 has the same theorems as ARD.[17]

Anderson’s system has several problematical features (McArthur 1981, Goble 1999, 2001) and RD shares most of these features. But we will not go into this issue here. It is at any rate clear that RD is better than Mally’s original system.

9. Alternative Non-Deontic Bases 2: Intuitionistic Logic

It was recently pointed out that it is also possible to base Mally’s deontic logic on intuitionistic propositional logic IPC rather than classical propositional logic (Lokhorst 2013; see also Centrone 2013).

Heyting’s intuitionistic propositional calculus IPC has the following axioms and rules (see Van Dalen 2002 and the entry on intuitionistic logic):

A → (B → A)
(A → (B → C)) → ((A → B) → (A → C))
(A & B) → A
(A & B) → B
A → (B → (A & B))
A → (A ∨ B)
B → (A ∨ B)
(A → C) → ((B → C) → ((A ∨ B) → C))
⊥ → A
modus ponens

If we add to these axioms and rules the following:

Abbreviations: ¬ A = A → ⊥, A ↔ B = (A → B) & (B → A), T = A → A,

then we can formulate ID (an intuitionistic reformulation of Mally’s deontic logic) as IPC plus Mally’s axioms I – V and

(34) U ↔ T
VI !(A ∨ ¬ A)

Axiom VI follows from Mally’s theorem (12d) (see Mally 1926, ch. 2, sec. 5, p. 29 and Morscher 1998, p. 122).[18]

FACT 1. ID can alternatively be axiomatized as IPC plus axioms !A ↔ ¬ ¬ A and (34).[19]

Classical propositional logic, CPC, is IPC plus A ∨ ¬ A. MD (“Mally’s Deontik”) is ID plus CPC.

FACT 2. A ↔ !A is a theorem of MD.[20]

In modern deontic logic, P A (“it is permitted that A”) is defined as P A = ¬ !¬ A. If we adopt this definition, ID provides !A ↔ P A (because IPC provides ¬ ¬ A ↔ ¬ ¬ ¬ ¬ A). Mally did not discuss permission. His approval of !A → ¬ !¬ A (which is usually regarded as characteristic for deontic logic) is clear from Mally 1926, ch. 4, sec. 10, p. 49, ad (V).

Mally objected to !(A ∨ B) → (!A ∨ !B) and Menger objected to A ↔ !A (see Mally 1926, ch. 2, sec. 4, p. 27, ad (II) and the quote in Section 6 above). ID avoids these objections:

FACT 3. Neither !(A ∨ B) → (!A ∨ !B) nor !A → A is a theorem of ID.[21]

Only one of the theorems presented by Mally is not derivable in ID, namely (13b): ¬ (A & ¬ !B) ↔ (¬ A ∨ !B).[22]

FACT 4. For any extension X of ID (in the language of ID): X provides (13b) if and only if X provides !(A ∨ B) → (!A ∨ !B).[23]

ID plus (13b) does not provide !A → A.[24]

The intuitionistic reformulation of Mally’s deontic logic that we have proposed is successful in so far as it avoids both Menger’s and Mally’s own objections while preserving almost all the theorems that Mally noticed himself. However, it is unacceptable as a system of deontic logic in its own right. We mention only two reasons:

1. Theorem A → !A is intuitively invalid. No deontic system, except Mally’s, has this theorem.

2. It is unclear how permission is to be represented. If we use the standard definition (P A = ¬ !¬ A), then P A ↔ !A is a theorem, but P A and !A are not equivalent according to the ordinary use of the words “permitted” and “obligatory.”

The relevantist reformulation of Mally’s system that was discussed above does not have these defects.

Although ID is unacceptable as a system of deontic logic, it does make sense as a system of lax logic, as we will now show. Lax logic is used in the areas of hardware verification in digital circuits and access control in secure systems, where ! expresses a notion of correctness up to constraints. The term “lax” was chosen “to indicate the looseness associated with the notion of correctness up to constraints” (Fairtlough and Mendler 1997, p. 3). There is a considerable literature on lax logic (Goldblatt 2011).

Propositional lax logic PLL is defined as IPC plus (A → !B) ↔ (!A → !B) (Fairtlough and Mendler 1997, p. 4, Lemma 2.1). Lax logic PLL* is PLL plus !A ↔ ¬ ¬ A (Fairtlough and Mendler 1997, p. 23).

FACT 5. ID is an alternative axiomatization of lax logic PLL* plus (34).[25]

Mally’s deontic logic and lax logic arose from quite different considerations. It is therefore remarkable that the intuitionistic reformulation of Mally’s logic that we have discussed is identical with lax logic PLL* plus (34).

10. Alternative Deontic Principles

Instead of changing the non-deontic propositional basis of Mally’s system, one might also modify the specifically deontic axioms and rules. This might of course be done in various ways, but the following approach works well without departing too much from Mally’s original assumptions.[26]

First, regard f as primitive and replace Mally’s definition of f in terms of → and ! (Def. f, the very first specifically deontic postulate in Mally’s book) by the following definition of ! in terms of V and f :

Def. !. !A = V f A

Second, replace Axiom I, which may also be written as (B → C) → ((A f B) → (A f C)), with the following rule of inference:

Rule f. B → C / (A f B) → (A f C)

We may then derive:

1. B → C / !B → !C [ Def. !, R f ]
2. (!A & !B) → !(A & B) [ Def. !, Ax. II ]
3. !V [ 1, Ax. IV, PC ]
4. ¬!Λ [ 1, Ax. III(←), Ax. V, PC (ex falso) ]

The so-called standard system of deontic logic KD is defined as PC supplemented with 1-4 (except that ! is usually written as O: see the entry on deontic logic), so the new system is at least as strong as KD. It is not difficult to see that it is in fact identical with KD supplemented with OU (Mally’s Axiom IV) and the following definition of f : A f B = O(A → B). In modern deontic logic, the notion of commitment is sometimes defined in this way.

In the new system, Mally’s theorems have the following status.

  • II′, IV′, (1)–(5), (7)–(11), (13)–(15), (17), (20)–(24) and (27)–(32) are derivable.
  • I′, III′, V′, (6), (12), (16), (18)–(19), (25)–(26), (33)–(35), A → !A and !A → A are not derivable.
  • There are 20 mismatches with Mally’s deontic expectations: 10 “plausible” formulas are no longer derivable, namely I′, III′, V′, (6), (12), (16), (18)–(19) and (25)–(26), and 10 “surprising” theorems are still derivable, namely (1), (2), (7), (22) and (27)–(32).
  • Although (34) and (35) are not derivable, adding them would by no means lead to the theoremhood of A ↔ !A.

There were only 12 mismatches in the case of RD, so the new system does less justice to Mally’s deontic expectations than RD did. But it agrees better with his general outlook because it is still based on classical propositional logic, a system to which Mally did not object (not that he had much choice in the 1920s).

Many of Mally’s surprising theorems are derivable in KD, but they have, as it were, lost their sting: those theorems lead to surprising consequences when combined with Mally’s Axiom I and his definition of f , but they are completely harmless without these postulates.

The standard system of deontic logic has several problematical features. The fact that each provable statement is obligatory is often regarded as counterintuitive, and there are many other well-known “paradoxes.” The revised version of Mally’s system shares these problematical features. But we will not discuss these issues here. The standard system is at any rate better than Mally’s original proposal.

11. Conclusion

Mally’s deontic logic is unacceptable for the reasons stated by Menger (1939). But it is not as bad as it may seem at first sight. Only relatively minor modifications are needed to turn it into a more acceptable system. One may either change the non-deontic basis to get either a system that is similar to Anderson’s system or a system that is identical with intuitionistic or constructive propositional logic with double negation as an obligation-like operator, or apply two patches to the deontic postulates to obtain a system similar to standard deontic logic.

Some authors have refused to view Mally’s deontic logic as a “real” deontic system and say that they “mention it only by way of curiosity” (Meyer and Wieringa 1993, p. 4). The above shows that this judgment is too harsh. It is only a small step, not a giant leap, from Mally’s system to modern systems of deontic logic, so Mally’s pioneering effort deserves rehabilitation rather than contempt.


  • Anderson, Alan Ross, 1967, “Some nasty problems in the formal logic of ethics,” Noûs, 1: 345–360.
  • –––, 1968, “A new square of opposition: Eubouliatic logic,” in Akten des XIV. Internationalen Kongresses für Philosophie (Volume 2), Vienna: Herder, pp. 271–284.
  • Anderson, Alan Ross, and Nuel D. Belnap, Jr., 1975, Entailment: The Logic of Relevance and Necessity (Volume 1), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Anderson, Alan Ross, Nuel D. Belnap, Jr., and J. Michael Dunn, 1992, Entailment: The Logic of Relevance and Necessity (Volume 2), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Bentham, Jeremy, 1782 [1945], The Limits of Jurisprudence Defined, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Bohnert, Herbert G., 1945, “The semiotic status of commands,” Philosophy of Science, 12: 302–315.
  • Centrone, Stefania, 2013, “Notes on Mally’s deontic logic and the collapse of Seinsollen and Sein,” Synthese, 190: 4095–4116.
  • Fairtlough, Matt, and Michael Mendler, 1997, “Propositional lax logic,” Information and Computation, 137: 1–33.
  • Føllesdal, Dagfinn, and Risto Hilpinen, 1981, “Deontic logic: An introduction,” in Risto Hilpinen (ed.), Deontic Logic: Introductory and Systematic Readings, second edition, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 1–35.
  • Gabbay, D.M., 1981, Semantical Investigations in Heyting’s Intuitionistic Logic, Dordrecht: D.Reidel.
  • Goble, Lou, 1999, “Deontic logic with relevance,” in Paul McNamara and Henry Prakken (eds.), Norms, Logics and Information Systems: New Studies on Deontic Logic and Computer Science, Amsterdam: IOS Press, pp. 331–345,
  • –––, 2001, “The Andersonian reduction and relevant deontic logic,” in Brown Byson and John Woods (eds.), New Studies in Exact Philosophy: Logic, Mathematics and Science — Proceedings of the 1999 Conference of the Society of Exact Philosophy, Paris: Hermes Science Publications, pp. 213–246.
  • Goldblatt, Robert, 2011, “Cover semantics for quantified lax logic,” Journal of Logic and Computation, 21: 1035–1063.
  • Hacking, Ian, 1963, “What is strict implication?,” Journal of Symbolic Logic, 28: 51–71.
  • Höfler, Alois, 1917, “Abhängigkeitsbeziehungen zwischen Abhängigkeitsbeziehungen,” Sitzungsberichte der kaiserlichen Akademie der Wissenschaften in Wien, Philosophisch-historische Klasse, 181(4): 1–56.
  • –––, 1922, Logik, 2nd expanded edn, with contributions by Ernst Mally, Vienna: Hölder-Pichler-Tempsky; Vienna and Leipzig: Freytag.
  • Laird, John, 1926, Review of Mally’s Grundgesetze des Sollens, Mind (New Series), 35(139): 394–395.
  • Leibniz, G.W., 1678–81 [1999], Modalia et elementa juris naturalis. In: Leibniz: Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe (Series 6, Volume 4), Berlin: Akademie Verlag, pp. 2758–2766.
  • Lepage, François, 2016, “A square of oppositions in intuitionistic logic with strong negation,”, Logica Universalis, 10: 327–338.
  • Lokhorst, Gert-Jan C., 1999, “Ernst Mally’s Deontik (1926),” Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 40: 273–282.
  • –––, 2006, “Andersonian deontic logic, propositional quantification, and Mally,” Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 47: 385–395.
  • –––, 2010, “Where did Mally go wrong?,” in G. Governatori & G. Sartor, eds., DEON 2010 (Lecture Notes in Artificial Intelligence (LNAI): Volume 6181), Berlin and Heidelberg: Springer-Verlag, pp. 247–258.
  • –––, 2013, “An intuitionistic reformulation of Mally’s deontic logic,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 42: 635–641.
  • Lokhorst, Gert-Jan C., and Lou Goble, 2004, “Mally’s deontic logic”, Grazer philosophische Studien, 67: 37–57.
  • Mally, Ernst, 1926, Grundgesetze des Sollens: Elemente der Logik des Willens, Graz: Leuschner und Lubensky, Universitäts-Buchhandlung; reprinted in Ernst Mally, Logische Schriften: Großes Logikfragment, Grundgesetze des Sollens, Karl Wolf and Paul Weingartner (eds.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1971, pp. 227–324.
  • McArthur, Robert P., 1981, “Anderson’s deontic logic and relevant implication,” Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 22: 145–154.
  • McCune, W., 2005–2010, Prover9 and Mace4, version 2009–11a, available online.
  • McKinsey, John Charles Chenoweth, 1939, “Proof of the independence of the primitive symbols of Heyting’s calculus of propositions,” Journal of Symbolic Logic, 4: 155–158.
  • Menger, Karl, 1939, “A logic of the doubtful: On optative and imperative logic,” in Reports of a Mathematical Colloquium (2nd series, 2nd issue), Notre Dame, Indiana: Indiana University Press, pp. 53–64.
  • Meyer, John-Jules Ch., and Roel J. Wieringa, 1993, “Deontic logic: A concise overview,” in John-Jules Ch. Meyer and Roel J. Wieringa (eds.), Deontic Logic in Computer Science, Chichester: John Wiley and Sons, pp. 3–16.
  • Moore, G.E., 1903, Principia Ethica, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Morscher, Edgar, 1998, “Mallys Axiomsystem für die deontische Logik: Rekonstruktion und kritische Würdigung,” Ernst Mally: Versuch einer Neubewertung (ProPhil—Projekte zur Philosophie, Volume 2), Alexander Hieke (ed.), Sankt Augustin: Academia Verlag, pp. 81–165.
  • Nelson, David, 1949, “Constructible falsity,” The Journal of Symbolic Logic, 14: 16–26.
  • Ray, J., 1926, Essai sur la structure logique du code civil français, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • Van Dalen, Dirk, 2002, “Intuitionistic logic,” in D. Gabbay and F. Günthner, eds., Handbook of Philosophical Logic (Volume 5), 2nd edition, Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 1–114.
  • Weinberger, Ota, 2001, “Ernst Mallys Deontik: Ein kritischer Rückblick und ein konstruktiver Ausblick nach einem dreiviertel Jahrhundert,” in Thomas Binder, Reinhard Fabian, Ulf Höfer and Jutta Valent (eds.), Bausteine zu einer Geschichte der Philosophie an der Universität Graz, Amsterdam/Atlanta: Rodopi, pp. 289–303.
  • Whitehead, Alfred North, and Bertrand Russell, 1910, Principia Mathematica (Volume 1), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Woleński, Jan, 1998, “Remarks on Mally’s Deontik,” Ernst Mally: Versuch einer Neubewertung (ProPhil–Projekte zur Philosophie, Volume 2), A. Hieke (ed.), Sankt Augustin: Academia Verlag, pp. 73–80.

Other Internet Resources

  • Basic information page on Ernst Mally (Edward Zalta, Stanford University).


The author is very grateful to Lou Goble, whose extensive comments on two earlier drafts led to many substantial improvements. The author would also like to thank Lou Goble and Edgar Morscher for making their papers on Anderson’s and Mally’s deontic logic available to him, Robert K. Meyer for helping him find the matrices used in note 10, and John Slaney for providing him with the proof of II* mentioned in note 8.

Copyright © 2019 by
Gert-Jan Lokhorst <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free