Mary Shepherd

First published Sun May 28, 2017; substantive revision Mon Mar 13, 2023

Mary Shepherd (1777–1847) advocates a systematic metaphysics and theory of knowledge which were highly regarded by her contemporaries. Well versed in the doctrines of leading eighteenth century British empiricists, she finds them unable to sustain scientific inquiry, everyday practical reasoning, and belief in an almighty deity. She aims to replace them with a theory of perceptual knowledge that is reliable and supported by reasons. She urges a theory on which sensation, the reception of impressions by means of the senses, and understanding, the ability to deploy ideas that represent entities distinct from impressions, work together to yield perceptual knowledge. In this respect, her system is more like that of Kant than those of her other predecessors. But her doctrines express a highly distinctive analysis of perception and the reality of its objects.

Causality is the center of her metaphysical and epistemic systems. Shepherd contends that the relation between cause and effect is one of efficacy, necessity, and simultaneity. She is an essentialist whose ontology recognizes basic capacities, powers, and compound objects in natural kinds. It anticipates recent essentialist theories on which properties of objects in natural kinds are individuated as powers or dispositions (Fantl 2016; Wilson forthcoming) The first of her two books, Essay upon the Relation of Cause and Effect (Shepherd 1824 abbreviated “ERCE”), is chiefly concerned with deriving and developing this doctrine while pointing to errors in the reasoning of Hume and his followers. Her second volume, Essay on the Perception of an External Universe (Shepherd 1827, abbreviated “EPEU”) includes a main text that uses causal reasoning to explain our knowledge of a universe of objects external to ourselves. It has a second part containing several short essays on related topics including Berkeley’s idealism, final causes in nature, and why sensible qualities cannot be causes.

1. Biography

The main source of information about Shepherd’s life is a family memoir written by her daughter and published for private use (Brandreath 1886). Shepherd was born on an estate near Edinburgh where she lived until she married in 1808. We know she was taught Latin, geography, mathematics, and history by a private tutor who also discussed some philosophy (Brandreath 1886: 26). As a student, she choose to write essays on metaphysics often faulting the logic of Hume’s atheistic writings and Priestly’s Unitarianism (Brandreath 1881: 28–9). Her published works were written after her marriage. But in 1802, a controversy in Edinburgh made a lasting impression on her. The incident prompted Thomas Brown to publish the first of several tracts defending Hume against the charge of atheism and advocating a universal constant conjunction account of cause and effect. Shepherd mentions this in her first book as a sign of the public’s susceptibility to the pernicious influence of Hume and a motive for her literary project. ERCE devotes a chapter to objections to Brown’s regularity theory of causes and another to detailed critique of the empirical results regarding the cause of sentience announced by William Lawrence, a physiologist who adopted Hume’s account of causation (on the latter, see Boyle 2021, Paoletti 2011, LoLordo forthcoming).

In the early 1820s, Shepherd accompanied her husband to Cambridge while he studied for a master’s degree awarded in 1823. Although there seems to be no record of the people she conversed with there, it might well be that William Whewell, who held a university fellowship at that time, was among them. The family history records that he used one of her books as a text book. He was deeply interested in devising a workable and productive method of empirical inquiry but it was not until 1860 that he achieved his theory of induction (see the entry on William Whewell; on Shepherd’s interest in shoring up scientific practice, see McRobert 2002). Her daughter reports that he was a frequent guest of the couple who resided in London. The Shepherds corresponded with Charles Babbage, who wrote a treatise on computational mathematical induction (Babbage, 1989). The couple’s social circle included men and women of science, literary figures, and others of intellectual accomplishment. She was known for her unanswerable logic and passion for abstract metaphysical reasoning.

In addition to works mentioned above, Shepherd published three articles: critical remarks on the metaphysics of John Fearn, a retired naval officer (Shepherd 1828a), a very effective reply to Fearn’s counter-critique of her metaphysics (Shepherd 1832), and an article on the single and erect object of vision (Shepherd 1827b). In the present article, we focus on her two main philosophical works.[1]

The merits of her work were publicly acknowledged in several ways. There is good evidence that one of her monographs was used as a textbook at Cambridge. Her part of a sharp philosophical dispute was published in a monthly magazine. Her theory of mind and self are the subject of an entry in Robert Blakey’s multi-volume History of the Philosophy of Mind (1850). After her death and before its recent recovery, her philosophy dropped from view for reasons that are not entirely clear (Atherton 2005; Paoletti 2011).

2. Doctrine of Cause and Effect

2.1 Everything that begins to exist must have a cause

Shepherd’s account of causality is advertised as contrary to David Hume’s in point of metaphysics, psychology, and epistemology. Where Hume holds that common causal beliefs are due to repetitious experience and acquired habits of imagination, she urges they are caused and justified by perception and reasoning. Where Hume holds that abstract ideas are impossible, Shepherd insists that science and philosophical analysis are impossible without abstraction. Against Hume, she argues that an uncaused change in the course of nature is impossible and produces a proof that everything that begins to exist must have a cause. According to her, the proof articulates a line of reasoning the human mind is disposed to use, implicitly or explicitly, in forming causal beliefs, attaining knowledge of causal principles. and perceiving particular instances of them (e.g. EPEU [2020: 314–316; Fantl 2016: 88). Incipient notions of causal power and necessary connection arise as children form their earliest beliefs about sensible objects (e.g. EPEU: [2020: 314–24]).

It would not be correct to say this begs the question against Hume. She has several reasons for rejecting his views on the relation of cause and effect. Perhaps the two most fundamental are the impoverishment of a theory of mind that limits what we can apprehend to sensory and reflective impressions and things that resemble them, and the assumption that our ability to separate the idea of a cause from that of an effect in imagination shows the ideas are separable in nature and experience (Bolton 2010: 244–6; 2019: 132–38; Landy 2020b). Her theory of causality and causal induction are expounded in ERCE; her account of the cause and justification of belief in the external world is developed in EPEU. This section is mainly concerned with the former.

The first metaphysical tenet is the causal principle: it is necessary that a thing that begins to exist has a cause (hereafter “CP”). The argument for this begins with a clarification. The notion of an effect is semantically tied to that of a cause. To avoid this implication, Shepherd characterizes an effect as a thing that begins to exist; so clearly stated, the question is whether “a thing that begins to exist owes its existence to a cause” (ERCE [2020: 34). She proposes a thought experiment. Imagine an object different in nature from all objects we know except for the capacity for its existence, that is, the ground of the possibility of its existing when it does not yet exist. Suppose the universe is an utter blank; nothing exists.With this understood, she argues, it is impossible for the thing to begin to exist. This is because its beginning to exist “cannot appear but as a capacity some nature hath to alter the presupposed nonentity and to act for itself whilst it is not in being.” (ERCE [2020: 36). One way to understand the reductive argument is this: (a) the beginning of x must be an act; (b) the act must be the property of an object which exists and has the capacity to actualize x; (c) x does not yet exist; (d) nothing exists (supposition); so x cannot begin to exist. This is valid but premises (a) and (b) seem to assume what the argument is supposed to prove (Bolton 2017; Fantl (2016: 98) also finds the argument circular). However, Rickless (forthcoming) is among those who object to this charge; he argues it is doubtful the pair of premises means the same thing as the conclusion. Arguably, though, Shepherd assumes it does. She assumes that her idea of what is needed to begin x specifies a state of affairs that satisfies her (controversial) idea of a cause. Nothing shows that this is a fact about the world.

Jennifer Wilson (forthcoming) interprets the argument as an effort to articulate the metaphysical reasoning behind the intuition that nothing comes from nothing. Like Shepherd, she stresses that anything that begins to exist must have a beginning: a transition from the non-existence to the existence of the entity in view. Wilson notes that this act, or event, need not be the property of an object, but there must be one or more things that perform it. This is said to explain the intuition because it is independently plausible, metaphysically possible, and no worse off epistemically than the alternative, This is consistent with the interpretation just offered, but focused on a different issue: the need to connect non-being and being in direct opposition to Hume’s principle of the separability of all things that are different, by contrast with the modal notions of metaphysical possibility and actuality,

Rickless (forthcoming) takes the main task of Shepherd’s argument to be refuting the opinion that a thing’s beginning is other than its not existing at one moment and existing at the next. (Hume asserts something like this but in terms of contraries “non-existent” and “existent” (T [2000:])). Shepherd claims a thing begins only if there is something that acts to begin it. Rickless suggests the strongest case that can be made for this is illustrated by the fact that verbs such as “to walk”, “to sing”, and “to campaign” signify acts or activities that begin only if a subject starts to do them; e.g., a walk begins if an ambient being starts to walk, and not otherwise. The generalization of this pattern is the implicit premise of the argument as Rickless interprets it, One might object that an agent that single handedly begins to do an activity is not a cause by Shepherd’s definition, so this argument may not prove anything she wants to hold. Rickless goes on to make an important point about Shepherd’s argument: it treats “exists” as a predicate. This makes it vulnerable to Hume’s doctrine that the idea of existence is the same as the idea of the object that exists; to think of an object is to think of it as existent (T [2000:]). So even though Shepherd’s argument, as Rickless understands it, is cogent, Hume has ground on which to resist it (as does Kant). This is true, but she has a case to make. Shepherd respects Hume’s preference for “non-existent” rather than “not in existence” (see ERCE [2000: 37–8]). But she herself holds we have ideas of existence that are modally and temporally qualified and explicitly argues that we have a general idea of existence (EPEU [2020: 82–6]).

All derivations of the argument for CP found in the texts have premises formulated in the terminology of the theory of cause and effect Shepherd promotes. Most of them refer to things that begin to exist as “qualities” of “objects.” According to Shepherd’s list of non-Humean definitions: a cause is “such an action of an object, as shall enable it, in conjunction with another, to form a new nature, capable of exhibiting qualities varying from those of either object in separation from the other. This is really to be a producer of new being” (ERCE [2000: 63]). An effect is defined as “the produced quality exhibited to the senses, as the essential property of natures so conjoined.” An object is defined as “a combined mass of qualities; the result of proportional unknown circumstances in nature, meeting with the human senses” (ERCE [2000: 64]). According to these definitions, we can say a cause is part of a configuration comprising: first, the antecedent existence of two or more objects that taken together ground the possibility of the existence of some quality Q when it does not yet exist; second, the two objects’ uniting and thereby forming a new object that is the cause of newly existent Q; and third, the object’s being perceived with Q as its essential property.

A distinctive, perhaps unique, feature of Shepherd’s metaphysics is that the objects we believe to exist in the world are partly in us (mind dependent) and partly unknown, exterior to, and independent of minds and sensory organs. Objects, for her, are objects as we perceive them; they are not fully formed unless perceived (see e.g. EPEU [2020: 72–3, 93]). That is, sensible qualities such as figures and colors are not external properties of mind independent objects (as e.g. Locke wants to say), nor sensations existing only in minds (as Berkeley maintains), but relations that span the mind and scarcely known entities outside the mind. She faults Berkeley for holding that sensible objects are only ideas, not for holding that they are ideas (e.g. EPEU [2020; 195–213]). (Atherton1996 and Rickless 2018 disagree about whether Shepherd misunderstands Berkeley’s idealism.)

In regard to ontology, the preexisting entities that ground the possibility of the existence of so far non-existent qualities are regularly called “objects”, “natures”, “masses of qualities”, or “unknown circumstances in nature;” occasionally, they are designated by other terms (e.g. “substance” (ERCE [2000: 53; EPEU [2020: 388)). Also, “power” is synonymous with “efficient cause, or productive principle;” it stands for “the property that lies in the secret nature of objects, when unobserved by the senses, and which determines the qualities that can be exhibited to them upon every new conjunction” (ERCE [2000: 63–4]). Jeremy Fantl (2016) takes this to suggest an ontology in which objects are bundles of qualities, powers are basic (unreduced), and qualities are individuated by the causal powers contributed by these qualities. If this is right, it is natural to assume that objects are individuated by their causal powers or the qualities their powers determine (Fantl proposes the former). Shepherd does not use the term “individuate”, but relies on the notion of properties that are essential to individuals (see especially ERCE [2000; 48, 57, 63; EPEU [2020; 242, 243–3]). (Fields (forthcoming) argues that Shepherd does not have a bundle theory.)

The secondary literature has little to say about Shepherd’s essentialism but there are many indications that it is heavily influenced by a doctrine of Locke: “Essence may be taken for the very being of anything, whereby it is what it is. And thus the real internal, but generally in Substances, unknown Constitutions of Things, whereon their discoverable Qualities Depend, may be called their Essence” (E [1975: 3.3.15]); this motivates Locke’s distinction between real and nominal essences of kinds). LoLordo (2200: 5–9) brings out Shepherd’s interest in downplaying Locke’s worry that the observable qualities of individual bodies fail to display divisions that might be regarded as delineating inner constitutions; she also argues that Shepherd regards herself as the true heir of Locke’s legacy. Beyond that, however, her metaphysical system seems to have been inspired, at least in part, by Locke’s notion of essence. Shepherd is convinced that the patterns of change we observe among sensible objects manifest what they essentially are, namely causes that essentially produce the effects they do (e.g. ERCE [2000: 43–5, 47–9]). For instance, “Fire … must of necessity burn as much as it must be red, otherwise the red object were not fire” (ERCE [2000: 54]). It is true that some similar passages add that the stuff would not be properly called “fire” but this is because it would not be fire. Shepherd expresses the modal demand an essence makes on an object by the term “obligation” and uses it to define what Hume calls “necessary connection” of cause and effect (ERCE [2000; 63]). This strongly suggests the necessity she ascribes to causality is an expression of her essentialism.

The synchrony of cause and effect follows from the non-Humean definitions of cause, effect, object, and power. The union of two antecedently separate objects forms a new mass of qualities that includes at least one quality that did not previously exist. The newly formed mass is the mass that includes the novel quality. The new object does not exist until the union is complete. As Shepherd puts it, “[I]n their union, there exists those newly formed objects, or masses of qualities called Effects, … for in this union Cause and Effect are synchronous, and they are but different words for the same Essence” (ERCE [2000: 57]). As interpreted here, the newly formed object and newly formed quality have synchronous existence: one exists at a time if and only if the other does.

David Landy (2020a) offers a different interpretation of the argument for synchrony which he uses to construct a defense against Hume’s contention that if causes and effects were contemporaneous, then all objects would exist at the same time (see T [2000:]). On this reading, if a quality begins to exist, the transition from two separate objects to one unified object passes through a “vanishingly short instant” in which the antecedents and their union overlap and “all three must exist synchronically” (Landy 2020a: 4). This is problematic because synchrony for a moment is too brief for the relation between an object and one of its essential qualities (compare Landy 2020a: 4, note 8). We might also mention that if the separate antecedents and the unified object literally existed at the same time, the union of antecedents would be complete and incomplete at that time (see ERCE [2000: 50]).

2.2 Similar causes must have similar effects

Shepherd propounds a second causal maxim which we can call the “Causal Similarity Principle” (hereafter “CSP”): similar causes must have similar effects (ERCE [2000: 43–9, 53–5]). Some scholars assume CSP and CP are on an epistemic par, both known a priori on the basis of nothing but Shepherd’s concept of causality (LoLordo 2019: 11; Bolton 2019: 149). This has prompted the objection that CSP does not solve Hume’s epistemic problem. He asks for the necessary connection between things such as smoke and fire which have been regularly conjoined in experience: what entitles us to infer other cases will be the same? To reply that CSP is a general conceptual truth is empty—as if to say, otherwise the instances in question would not be the same (see Ott 2011, quoted and glossed by LoLordo 2019). There seems to be a disqualifying objection to this: CSP is not an a priori truth based on nothing but concepts. It is derived from CP but in conjunction with an a posteriori premise with existential import.

Before we look at this, it is worth mention that Tanner (2022) suggests that although Shepherd’s causal metaphysics implies that nature is uniform, i.e. things in the same kind must have similar effects, in the absence of a reason to believe the metaphysical theory, she offers nothing that answers Hume’s demand to be shown a reason to believe the similarity thesis.This weakness is overcome, Tanner suggests, if the causal metaphysics is conjoined with a principle of parsimony that governs the number of natural kinds we should recognize, The conjunction is not the sort of reason Hume has in view, but it is a rational justification for belief of the similarity thesis. This may be true, but there is textual evidence that the causal principles themselves are epistemically founded on perceptual knowledge of the world (see below in this section and the next)..

The argument for CSP is made in several ways, but all of them have two parts. One reviews the circumstances in which we come to believe there is a particular cause when observing that a quality begins to exist. This introduces a premise with modal and referential features that set her account of causal beliefs apart from Hume’s. The second part offers Shepherd’s reflection on an object similar to one we believe to cause a certain quality to begin its existence: if the two are in similar circumstance, what effects can the duplicate have in view of CP? The upshot is that the derivation of CSP has a premise that limits its scope to objects that exist,

One derivation of CSP argues, contra Hume, that when we first perceive some kind of thing, we may very well discover something about its cause by “reasoning on an experiment” (ERCE [2000: 45]). When we are aware that some quality begins to exist and believe it has a particular cause, we typically observe qualities of objects that are present shortly before it appears. In favorable circumstances, there are two and only two discernible objects which coalesce at the moment the new quality begins to exist. For example, if you pour vinegar into milk and see that it immediately breaks into curds and whey, you are likely to believe the mixture of the two was the cause of newly curdled milk.[2] The second part of the derivation is a reflection on two similar liquids mixed in the same way. Shepherd argues that if the second did not have the same effect as the first, then either something caused an alteration in the second, so they are not the same, or it caused an alteration in itself, which is impossible according to CP (ERCE [2000: 45, 46, 48–9]). We should ask why this matters given that the proposition just asserted is circular and without extensional import.

In another derivation of CSP, the first part invokes definitions that accrue to particular objects that we believe to cause specific effects: “If then an existence now in being, conjoined with any other, forms thereby a new nature, capable of exhibiting new qualities, these new qualities must enter into the definition of the objects; they become part of their natures” (ERCE [2000: 47]). Compiled from the experiences that inform us of the existence of particular causes, such definitions report the sensible qualities and other circumstances observed just prior to the novel appearance of one or more qualities and record the observed effects of the newly formed object. Provided the antecedently observed sensible qualities are probable indicators of the kinds of previously existing objects from which the new object results, a definition specifies two markers of the kind to which the new object belongs. We can call on them in collecting evidence that two objects are similar and predicting their effects under various circumstances. This is the case whether or not any of the antecedent natures (powers) are included in the constitution of the newly formed nature (see ERCE [2000: 189]). So the definition of an object purports to pick out all and only objects that are exactly alike in respect of the powers they amass. (To be clear, the subjects of definitions are particular objects; the definition of a particular object is the definition of the natural kind to which it belongs if kinds are individuated by causal powers; see section 2.1, Fantl 2016),)

That CSP is made true by the constituents of actual objects is also shown by the reflection that completes this derivation. Shepherd argues that elicited objects are determined as composites: e.g. when a fire is elicited from the juncture of two other objects, the “combined qualities” that begin to exist are “the whole qualities that fire, in every circumstance is capable of producing” (ERCE [2000: 49, 54]).[3] The truth of CSP is founded on the doctrine that the method of its formation fixes the constitution of the resulting object, so similar formative origins determine similar constitutions. Rounding the derivation out: so on another occasion, the same pre-conditions are “necessarily compelled” to be attended with the same effects, or combined qualities: otherwise there would be the “beginnings of existence by themselves” (ERCE [2000 49, 47–48, 52–55]). Although the circular maxim has a part here, it is not what makes CSP true.

Definitions of objects are used to rebuff Hume’s contention that the course of nature can change spontaneously, without a cause that alters it. She argues against his examples. He claims it is possible that a body otherwise like snow should burn the skin and taste salty; again, fruit trees that have regularly borne fruit in warm weather may someday be productive in freezing cold. Shepherd counters that although the stuff otherwise like snow may well be possible, it would not be snow; rather than marking a change in natures’ course, it would be a different object with qualities arising from different circumstances depending on nature’s course. Again, “once the proof has been afforded” that the nature of fruit trees requires warmth if they are to grow and flower, it must be considered impossible for them to have qualities “not originally in their natures” (ERCE [2000; 81]).

At bottom, Shepherd’s causal metaphysics rests on the intuition that the formation of an object renders it what it is. It applies also in mathematics (EPEU [2020:: 279]). Shepherd takes mathematical objects to be particular things constructed by placing physical items in spatial relations or relations understood to be arithmetical. Their properties are known by inspection, comparison, and the like: “my whole notion of the relation of cause and effect is aptly imagined by the nature of the necessary results, included in the juxtaposition of quantities” (EPEU [2020: 282]). Shepherd holds that the general truths of natural science for which we have empirical evidence are necessary and the necessary truths of arithmetic and geometry are believed partly on the basis of experience (Bolton 2019: 149–52; LoLordo 2019: 11).

2.3 Definitions and other a posteriori necessary truths

Definitions of objects have attracted attention for several reasons. One is that they. are holistic in the minimal sense that any given kind of object is defined in terms of other kinds of objects or qualities. For instance, fire can be defined as the object elicited by concussion of flint and steel, and flint can be defined as the object that, combined with steel, gives rise to fire. Some scholars worry that Shepherd’s definitions of natural kinds form a closed system that is impervious to refutation and seek a solution to the problem. It seems those who have this worry assume the definitions in question are descriptive and to some extent formed without empirical guidance—Locke’s nominal essences in effect, As interpreted here, however, the definitions Shepherd has in view are formed on the basis of experience; they state the essential properties of actual objects. She may think the meanings of names of kinds in a natural language are based on them.

Definitions have also attracted attention because they are a posteriori necessary truths. Kant has an account of how we can know such truths, but Shepherd does not follow him in distinguishing analytic and synthetic judgments (LoLordo 2019: 10, note 25). She does not address this issue in the direct sort of way we might expect. The issue for her is how we acquire knowledge and belief of the existence of the external world and the causal principles that are its foundations. It turns out that this is knowledge of roughly the sort Kant found he needed to explain. Perceptual knowledge is the topic of section 3.1.

3. Knowledge of the existence of an external world

3.1 Perceptual knowledge and reason

There is considerable evidence that Shepherd has a foundational theory of perceptual knowledge, e.g. “Reason does establish this beautiful and certain proposition, which is the foundation of all our knowledge—That like causes must ever produce like Effects” (ERCE [2000: 143–4]). The principles of the theory of causation “regulate every opinion speculative and practical” (EPEU [2020: xiii, 190]). The epistemic foundations of our knowledge are the basic causal principles. Because knowledge of causal principles is secured somehow by reason, she wants to suggest, they are less subject to doubt than those offered by Hume (EPEU [2020: 27–8]). Yet the most sharply focused issue about Shepherd’s epistemology discussed in the literature is the part reason plays in knowledge.

As we saw, Shepherd holds we have an idea of a cause adequate for an argument for CP. Fantl (2016) and Bolton (2019) assume this is an example of knowing a principle by reason. But this is difficult to make out. Fantl interprets the argument as a thought experiment supposed to reduce the denial of CP to a contradiction, but finds no unproblematic way to state the argument. Bolton interprets it as a valid, but circular, argument which implies nothing about what happens in the world.

Folescu (2020) objects to these accounts mainly because they take the argument to confer knowledge. She finds the view that CP is a foundational principle, i.e. a proposition known without basis in knowledge of another proposition, to be in tension with the view that CP is established by an argument. As Folescu understands it, the argument for CP is analytic yet we are said to know the principle; she concludes it is known without proof. This is confirmed by the fact that shortly after stating this argument, Shepherd asks readers to grant the causal principle so she can use it in making her points against Hume (ERCE [2000: 39]; EPEU [2020: 164, note 9]). So, Folescu maintains, although Shepherd sometimes seems to say causal principles can be demonstrated, she ought not to (e.g. Folescu: 13–14). To my mind, this is right and helpful.

Then what does reason contribute to our knowledge of the existence of the external world? As Folescu interprets it, reason constructs arguments which have a role similar to that of proofs in the practice of early twentieth century mathematicians who built axiomatic theories about neglected subjects such as sets. She provides an instructive picture of their use of proofs to motivate acceptance of certain propositions as axioms by bringing out the benefits it brings, e.g. adopting an axiom may greatly increase the usefulness of the theory (Folescu 17–19 ). But our interest is in Shepherd’s account of knowledge of foundational principles, or first principles. Folescu quotes a neglected passage which states that first principles are a sort of perception: “First principles are the perceptions of the corollaries, inclusions, or necessary relations of our simple impressions, and infants who have not a capacity fitted to generate such perceptions are born idiots” (EPEU [2020: 314], quoted in Folescu (2020: 11). Taking this to say first principles are known without proof and characterizing this as a sort of intuitive knowledge, Folescu mentions two sources known to Shepherd that might have influenced her: Locke and Reid. Locke contrasts intuitive and demonstrative knowledge. Briefly put, he holds we know a proposition by intuition just in case when we join two ideas in accord with a proposition-making relation, we perceive relations among the combined representations which are sufficient to show the proposition is true; we have demonstrative knowledge if the truth is perceived only with aid of intuitive perception of intermediary truths (E [1975: 4.2.1–3; 4.7.1]). We might say, intuition presents us with representational evidence of truth. According to Reid’s doctrine that we have intuitive knowledge of the principles of common sense, a proposition known by intuition is believed as soon as it is understood; it is known without seeking evidence or inferring it from something else; knowledge of a principle is “the work of nature, and our original powers.” (EPI [2002: 452: quoted by Folescu (2020: 12). According to Reid, intuitive knowledge is self evident in that it neither has nor needs evidence of the proposition’s truth.

Folescu argues that Shepherd’s position has more in common with Reid’s theory than Locke’s. She notes that Reid recognizes the utility of arguments about epistemically basic principles that bring out the advantages of endorsing them as axioms; in this connection, he explicitly mentions reductio proofs. She suggests Shepherd intends CP to make the fundamental principle accessible to reasoning and to bring out its self-evident truth. Folescu admits Shepherd is critical of Reid’s appeal to human nature or instinct to explain the foundations of knowledge. But, Folescu explains, Shepherd misses the point that Reid’s theory is not unlike her own. On this interpretation, Shepherd maintains that first principles are known by intuition in the manner of Reid and she recognizes that psychological explanations of belief of first principles are useful for the general advancement of knowledge,

This brief summary does not do justice to the sophistication and subtlety of Folescu’s discussion of the interplay of psychology and epistemology in Shepherd’s thought. But the interpretation is open to the objection that Shepherd’s critique of Reid is squarely addressed to the doctrine he holds, and on many occasions. For instance, Reid “cuts the knot instead of untying it” by referring belief in the existence of body to a natural instinct. This is because it offers no satisfactory reason for belief or detail about how it arises ([EPEU [2020: 5, 111–12]). Shepherd propounds a more complex account:

The class of ideas which Dr. Reid terms instinctive … I consider to be the conclusions of a latent reasoning: as the mere results and corollaries, included in the relation of those ideas and sensations already existing in the mind, and which were previously formed by the senses. (EPEU [2020: 170])

As she sees it, perception is not a primitive inexplicable disposition; but it is “no more than an observation of the simplest relations of our ideas—It is but a simple inference of the understanding…” (EPEU [2020: 113, 3, 8]) This and other texts strongly suggest that reason confers knowledge because it is the ability to grasp a relation between ground and consequent. Yet reason is the means by which we perceive the existence of external objects. Although Folescu’s reading neatly resolves a tension between the foundational status of CP and view that we know the principle by means of an argument, it can also be seen as opening the way for an alternative resolution, namely, that Shepherd recognizes more than one basis on which reason can respond to an epistemic relation between ground and consequent and rests causal and perceptual knowledge on one of them.

Before saying more about this, we should get clear about what Shepherd means by “perception.” She explicitly disagrees with Reid’s theory that sensations always precede acts of perception but are entirely extrinsic to them; for him, sensations are intentional blanks that merely trigger the mind’s formation of the concept of an object and firm belief in its existence. By contrast, when she uses the word “perception” it is “in the sense of ‘a consciousness of sensation’, a SENSATION TAKEN NOTICE OF BY THE MIND” ([EPEU [2020: 6–9]).

The continuation of one of Shepherd’s objections to Reid partially quoted above is more forthcoming. The gist is that perception is “the observation of the simplest relations of our ideas”; this is analyzed as “a simple inference of the understanding;” this is broken down to “the perception of the CONSCIOUS SENSE (which takes notice when it is affected)” together with “the perception of THE UNDERSTANDING” to the effect that the sense organs and mind must be affected by objects external to both. Shepherd adds: “this inference … is knowledge rather than instinct” (EPEU [2020: 113]).

This is no more than a sketch, but three things are clear. First, we have two types of perceptual knowledge: consciousness of juxtaposed sensations and understanding that some sensations are caused by particular objects distinct from the amassed sensations. Second, the relations discovered by understanding are inferred from the—presumably temporal—relations of juxtaposition perceived by consciousness; i.e. the order among a mass of sensations known by consciousness provides some sort of basis from which understanding infers the existence of a particular object that causes certain sensations. (See especially the objection to Brown’s theory of instinctive belief (ERCE [2000: 138, 146]).) Third, if two or more sensations are juxtaposed in consciousness, their relation is part of a more comprehensive relation between items of consciousness and objects unavailable to consciousness which is the locus of the causal relation (see the dichotomy of inner and outer existences, section 3.2). An interpretation on which reason confers perceptual knowledge because it is inferential has considerable textual support.

It is clear, Shepherd holds we can, and sometimes do, deliberately argue from observed relations among things we perceive by sense to conclusions about relations among the (unknown) objects that cause them. She holds that although sensations are essentially felt and can be essentially like nothing but sensations, they have non-essential relations to other things, such as variety, sameness, contrariety, and proportionality. She argues that there must be relations among sensible quality sensations accumulated in experience that are similar to relations among their respective causes. This is because if the sensory system and the mind are functioning well, they always operate in the same way, so the differences among temporally ordered sensations must be due to corresponding differences among their causes taken in the same order (EPEU [2020: 4749, 63–165, 703–704]). Not that the corresponding relations must be exactly the same, but the same in some respect. Shepherd likens this to the London diorama, an elaborate three dimensional walk-in illusion of the city famous in her day; she often makes an analogy with algebraic signs used to calculate the values of their significations under an interpretation, and sometimes a language that needs interpretation (e.g. Boyle, 2020: 100),

3.2 Psychology of belief in the external world

“All we know must be by means of consciousness, or sensations,” according to Shepherd (EPEU [2020: 7]). In her usage, “sensation” is a general term for everything of which a sentient being is conscious (EPEU [2020: 6, 133–60]). There are two classes of sensations: those that are sensible qualities (colors, figures, etc.) and sensations of ideas. Sensations that are sensible qualities are always caused in part by the use of organs of sense and attended by sensations caused by using them. They have an “immediate incontrovertible evidence” (EPEU [2020:142, 700]). Ideas, but not sensations of them, refer to things distinct from sensations. Strictly speaking, an idea is “the result of that reasoning or observation which shows that there must needs to an existence when we cannot perceive it” (EPEU [2020: 133–4]).

Shepherd undertakes to explain three common beliefs about the objects of perception: their existence is continued, outside the mind, and mind-independent. What is to be explained is how sensations can lead to these beliefs about objects in view of the discrepancy between what we know about the former and the properties we ascribe to the latter. The first issue is: “Whence we know of any continued existence, when we can immediately know nothing but our sensations” (EPEU [2020; 20]). Sensations are interrupted, for example, by dreamless sleep and by their constantly arising, perishing, and being replaced. Her general procedure is to argue that sensations we acquire in experience display various patterns that must have causes with the properties just mentioned. The aim is to show that reasoning provides reasons, or motives. for holding the common beliefs. The reasons may not have propositional form and they have various degrees of perspicuity, but all mentally competent human beings, regardless of age, are conscious of them e.g. EPEU: [2020: 16–17, 71, 106)]. Because Shepherd gives minds to all sentient organisms, they too are said to be conscious of reasons to believe the things they perceive are continued, external, and independent (Fasko forthcoming).

With regard to continued existence, a mass of sensations exhibits many series of sensible qualities that recur. For instance when you look at a house while walking by, you are conscious of a series of visual images and if you happen to retrace your steps, the same series appears in reverse order. Shepherd argues that whenever we are conscious of a series of sensible quality sensations that is repeated, we comprehend that each repetition must have a cause that continues to exist “ready to answer the irregular call of the senses” (EPEU: [2020: 15–16]). Otherwise, each would have a cause created explicitly for the purpose of being ready to mix with sensory organs when needed; or if not, different recurrences would begin of themselves. Consciousness of his reasoning enables us to have an idea of existence continued unperceived but only consciousness of interrupted sensations (EPEU [2020: 134]).

We say we perceive “external” objects. Shepherd offers to clarify the difference between what is external and internal: .“Inward existence is the capacity for sensation in general; outward existence is the exciting cause of some sensation in particular” (EPEU [2020: 40]). The capacity for sensation in general is the mind. The cause of a particular sensation results from the mixing of the mind and an object that needs to be outside the mind in order to mix with it. Accordingly, sensations are inward, interrupted, and can be known by only one subject, whereas what is outward has continued existence and can be perceived by more than one human being, if other human beings are possible (EPEU [2020: 40]). So one reason to believe that the causes of sensible quality sensations exist outside the mind is that we infer it from the belief that they continue to exist unperceived. Others are offered as well.

Shepherd takes a particular interest in explaining why, despite our conviction that sensations exist if only if they are perceived, we somehow assume that sensations exist outside the mind. For instance, a colored, figured, extended object is commonly considered to exist in its colored, figured, extended state when it is no longer perceived. Yet color, figure and extension are mental affections (EPEU [2020: 39]). Shepherd denies that this can be understood or even believed because of its manifest impossibility. The doxastic performance is said to be due to our belief that the particular object that causes a particular sensible quality must be outside the mind, on one hand, and the paucity of our resources for recalling the object, on the other hand. After we perceive, say, an apple, our only way to think of it or distinguish it from other objects is under the form of its sensible qualities. This is said to produce a natural association of thought that links sensations and their causes so tightly that philosophical analysis is required to pry them apart. She reports several extravagant and mutually inconsistent theories philosophers have proposed in the effort to separate sensations and objects outside the mind; Reid, Malebranche, Leibniz, as well as Berkeley and Hume are mentioned (EPEU [2020: 45–6]). She easily uncouples the association by stressing the difference between inward and outward existence based on her theory of the relation of cause and effect (EPEU [2020: 71, 114]).

Shepherd advances three reasons that motivate belief that perceptual objects are mind independent.[4] One is that we believe objects we perceive undergo change of sensible qualities when we are not perceiving them. Another is, in brief, we believe there are beings like ourselves who have the power of thought and feeling, and we perceive that one external object can affect many such beings; (EPEU [2020: 76–81]). She also constructs an argument intended to show that we can form an abstract general idea of existence, or the notion of “indefinite unknown existence” which enables us to have thoughts of continued, external, and entirely independent existence (EPEU [2020: 82–26]).

3.3 The phenomena of dreams and only possible basis of skepticism

The phenomena of dreams are thought to pose an objection to belief in the existence of the external world because we may credit the illusory images with continued, external, independent existence. This is reason to doubt the existence of all perceptual objects unless we have better evidence for their reality than we have for that of the seeming objects of dreams. Shepherd dispatches the objection. She grants that sensations that occur in dreams are like those that occur in waking experience although she denies that dreams can cause the same sensations in the same order as those caused by objects existing in nature (EPEU [2020: 99–100]). She argues that when dreaming, a person’s ability to collect a large number of sensations is limited. When awake, we can move our eyes and limbs and find the supposed object does not fulfill its definition (e.g. EPEU [2020: 29–33]). She allows that assuming we are awake, it is difficult to know whether an object that has fulfilled its presumed definition so far will do so later on. Judgments on this question can be supported by observations that make them more or less probable and thus subject to an appropriate level of doubt (ERCE [2020: 99–114]). Still, she admits there is one (but only one) possible basis for skepticism about the reality of perceptual objects: experience cannot show that the causes of all a person’s sensations are not necessarily mixed with the causes of her dreams (EPEU [2020: 118–19]).

4. Mind, body, and self

4.1 Minds and bodies

Mind is the capacity for sensation in general, that is, the capacity for thought and feeling. We ourselves are individual minds (EPEU [2020: 14, 24]). Many of Shepherd’s predecessors hold that the potentiality of causal capacities is ultimately grounded in substances in which the capacities inhere. Shepherd rarely uses the term “substance” (but see EPEU [2020: 388]; ERCE [2000: 162) but she ascribes a substance-like property to minds. This is the upshot of two arguments based on the idea that the mind is a dual capacity, for both particular sensations, which continuously vanish and are followed by others, and for sensation as such, which is resumed after periods of dreamless sleep. The argument comes down to this: there would be no reason for the existence of sensation unless there were a continuous being that is specifically “indifferent to sensations [and] capable of being excited when interfered with by qualities fitted to produce it.—Such a being is the subject of successive sensations,—such is the capacity for sensation,—such is the mind” (EPEU [2020: 375–6; also 56–7]). A mind endures—it is one subject of different successive states each dependent for existence on it. But unlike a traditional substance, its successive states are effects rather than powers; it is a dispositional rather than categorical entity; and a mind is external to each of its states and can exist with no states at all. “Thus the pronoun I is ever abstract and stands for a BEING exterior to, and independent of all the changes of which it is conscious.” (EPEU [2020: 57]). This seems to show Shepherd has no use for traditional substances (see LoLordo (forthcoming); but Boyle 2020: 101, note 19; 104) finds that minds inhere in natures in the substance theoretical sense.).

The conclusion that a mind is the continually existing subject of successive states proves its eternality. It seems the “mysterious eternal power of feeling” is inherited by each individual member of a species: “as a continuous existence it must be an eternal power in nature and as immortal for the future as it must have been without beginning in the past” (EPEU [2020: 377]). This is motivated by an implicit appeal to CP: “there would be no reason”, i.e. cause, for sensations if there were no continuing subject matter ready to be interfered with by other suitable objects (EPEU [2020: 375–6]), partly quoted in the previous paragraph; [2020: 56–7]). More generally, it is a principle of Shepherd’s metaphysics that capacities for being are eternal (EPEU [2020: 389–390]). Matter and time are eternal capacities (EPEU [2020: 127, 389–390]). The consequences of this principle for the causal structure of the universe have not, to my knowledge, been discussed in the literature. Shepherd uses the principle in stating her argument for the existence of God (EPEU [2020: 389–392; also 190–191]). This argument, which includes a version of the teleological argument used to show there must be an eternal entity with mental powers, purports to show that God is the continuously existing subject of all changes (Loscano (2019) offers an account). The details of the dependence relation between the infinite subject of all changes and the objects that begin and cease to exist in nature are of considerable interest. LoLordo (forthcoming) brings out similarities to Spinoza’s metaphysics; Garrett (forthcoming) considers it in connection with the question whether Shepherd is able to reconcile her denial of idealism with the causality of God, but finds the texts inconclusive.

Shepherd argues that minds are not material beings on the evidence that bodies in general do not feel in circumstances in which individual minds do, e.g. a rock does not feel pain when it breaks. According to Shepherd: “the definition of matter is the capacity of exhibiting upon a sentient nature, the sense of solid EXTENSION in general”, and “that of mind, a capacity fitted to be excited to any sensation in particular” (EPEU [2020: 242]). To be clear, solid extension is a sensation; its name is given also to the unknown powers of external objects that partly cause it (Shepherd (1832); EPEU [2020, 697]). Accordingly, matter is also defined as the capacity for unperceived motion (EPEU [2020: 14–16]). On Shepherd’s theory, mind and matter do not have mutually incompatible absolute essences, as Descartes maintains; their absolute “real essences” are unknown (EPEU [2020: 242–244]). Nor is mind-body causal interaction a problem. If a mind and organized matter form a union, each capacity realizes the other; a human being has powers to feel, think, move and resist motion just as other kinds of objects are defined by a number of different powers (EPEU [2020: 310–311]). Within a human being, Shepherd explains, a conscious sensation of forming a plan and deciding to carry it out is united with all the powers that co-exist with it, so the bodily part of the human being starts a motion which is guided by the conscious decision; the cause of this motion must satisfy CSP, but the efficient cause of an effect is always unknown on her theory (EPEU [2020: 403–405]). See LoLordo (forthcoming) for further comparison of this theory and mind-body substance dualism.)

4.2 Selves

According to Shepherd, we are individual capacities for sensation in general (EPEU [2020: 14, 42)] who use “I” to refer to a capacity external to all the sensations of which we are conscious (EPEU: 56–7). Although Boyle (2020: 105) is right that it seems reasonable that “I” refers to oneself, Shepherd wants to say a self is a much more complex entity, an enduring object with physical and psychological powers that mixes with other objects with the result that various feelings, thoughts, bodily motions, and mechanical interactions with external objects are registered in it. A self comprises particular sensations including consciousness of its continued existence, that is the feeling of the continued existence of its mind and its body. Consciousness of the former is analyzed as, first, the sensation of the idea of the continually existing (partial) cause of sensations and, second, consciousness of the power to remember previous sensations, i.e. the feeling of the power to unite a present sensation with the idea of a past sensation (mass of qualities) and the passage of time (EPEU [2020: 98, 153–154, 133). Consciousness of the continued existence of the body is the sense of the extension of the body and its being sufficient to sustain the powers of life and consciousness, “especially those which determine the union of memory with sense” (EPEU [2020: 153–154). The upshot is that our belief that we can remember our previous mental states gives us the sense of our identity over time. Shepherd offers no account of personal identity as such, but she concludes: “identity, therefore, has nothing to do with sameness of particles”, or physical constituents of the self. It is not incorrect to say the sense of identity depends on the power of memory, but more fundamentally, it depends on the eternality of an individual human mind (compare LoLordo (forthcoming)).

What happens to an individual mind when its present body dies? The individual mind is immortal, but it is uncertain whether it will remain dormant, “lost in the eternal ocean of mind” or “retain its individual consciousness of personality” (EPEU [2020: 378]), In the latter case, it may mix with some matter to form the cause of new sensations and sustain the power to unite ideas of memory with its present sensations or it may mix with some other sort of entity to produce sensations detached from memory; even now we use knowledge when we have forgotten how we got it (see LoLordo (forthcoming) for a more detailed discussion). Although Shepherd mentions analogies that make it probable that memory and personality will be restored, she finds philosophy can go no further than that (EPEU [2020: 379–88]).


Works by Mary Shepherd

  • [PWMS] 2000, Philosophical Writings of Mary Shepherd (facsimile reproductions), edited with Introduction by Jennifer McRobert, 2 volumes, Bristol: Thoemmes Press.
  • [ERCE] 1824, An Essay upon the Relation of Cause and Effect, London: T. Hookam; Reprinted in Shepherd 2000, v. 1.
  • [EPEU] 1827, Essays on the Perception of an External Universe and Other Subjects Connected with the Doctrine of Causation, London: John Hatchard and Son. Reprinted in Shepherd 2000, v. 2. Also reprinted in Essays on the Perception of the External Universe, Antonia LoLordo (ed.) with Introduction. Citations refer to marginal page numbers which are the same as in PWMS, v. 2.
  • 1828a, “Observations by Lady Mary Shepherd on the ‘First Lines of the Human Mind’,” Pariana: 624–627.
  • 1828b, “On the Causes of Single and Erect Vision,” Philosophical Magazine and Annals of Philosophy (n.s.), June: 406–16.,
  • 1832, “Lady Mary Shepherd’s Metaphysics,” Fraser’s Magazine for Town and Country, 5(30): 697–708. Reprinted in Shepherd 2020.

Works by Other Authors

  • Atherton, Margaret, 1996, “Lady Mary Shepherd’s Case Against Berkeley”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 4(2): 348–366. doi:10.1080/09608789608570945
  • –––, 2005, “Reading Lady Mary Shepherd”, Harvard Philosophy Review, 13(2):73–85. doi:10.5840/harvardreview20051327
  • Babbage, Charles, 1989, The Ninth Bridgewater Treatise: A Fragment, NYU Press.
  • Blakey, Robert, 1850, History of the Philosophy of Mind, London: Longman, Brown, Green and Longmans.
  • Brandreath, Mary Elizabeth Shepherd, 1886, Some Family and Friendly Recollections of 70 Years, Westerham: Printed by C. Hooker.
  • Brown, Thomas, 1805, Observations on the Nature and Tendency of the Doctrine of Mr. Hume, etc., Edinburgh: Mundell and Son. (2nd edn reprinted in facsimile, Lewis White Beck (ed.), 1806, New York, Garland).
  • –––, 1822, Inquiry into the Relation of Cause and Effect, Andover: Flagg and Gould Printers.
  • Bolton, Martha Brandt, 2010, “Causality and Causal Induction: the Necessitarian Theory of Lady Mary Shepherd”, in Causation in Modern Philosophy, Keith Allen and Tom Stoneham (eds.), London: Routledge: 242–261.
  • –––, 2019, “Lady Mary Shepherd and David Hume on Cause and Effect”, in Feminist History of Philosophy: The Recovery and Evaluation of Women’s Philosophical Work, Eileen O’Neill and Marcy Lascano (eds,), Cham: Springer: 129–152.
  • –––, 2017, “Mary Shepherd”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2017 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Boyle, Deborah, 2020a, “Mary Shepherd on Mind, Soul and Self”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 58(1): 93–112.
  • –––, 2021, “Mary Shepherd on the Meaning of ‘Life’”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 29(2): 208–225.
  • –––, 2020b, “A Mistaken Attribution to Mary Shepherd”, Journal of Modern Philosophy, 2(1): 93–12.
  • Fantl, Jeremy, 2016, “Mary Shepherd on Causal Necessity”, Metaphysica, 17(1): 87–108.
  • Fasko, Manuel, forthcoming, “‘The Meanest Worm must Feel and Think’—Mary Shepherd’s Understanding of Non-Human Cognition” in Essays on Mary Shepherd: Causation, Mind, and Knowledge, K. Fields (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fields, Keota, forthcoming, “Is Mary Shepherd a Bundle Theorist?” in Essays on Mary Shepherd: Causation, Mind, and Knowledge, K. Fields (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Folescu, M., 2022, “Mary Shepherd on the Role of Proofs in our Knowledge of First Principles”, Noûs, 56(2): 473–493.
  • Garrett, Don, forthcoming, “External Existence and the Rejection of Idealism in Hume and Shepherd”, in Essays on Mary Shepherd: Causation, Mind, and Knowledge, K. Fields (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • [T] Hume, David, 1739 [2000], A Treatise of Human Nature. Reprinted David F. Norton and Mary J. Norton (eds.), Oxford, OUP, 2000 Citations consist of Part, Chapter, Section, and Paragraph numbers.
  • Landy, David, 2020a, “Shepherd on Hume’s Argument for the Possibility of Uncaused Existence,” Journal of Modern Philosophy, 2(1): 1–14.
  • –––, 2020b, “A Defense of Shepherd’s Account of Cause and Effect as Synchronous,” Journal of Modern Philosophy, 2(1): 1–15.
  • Lascano, Marcy (2019), “Early Modern Women on the Cosmological Argument: a Case Study in Feminist History of Philosophy”, in Feminist History of Philosophy: The Recovery and Evaluation of Women’s Historical Texts, Eileen O’Neill and Marcy Lascano (eds.), Cham, Springer: 23–47.
  • [E] Locke, John, 1689–90 [1975], An Essay concerning Human Understanding, London. Reprinted Peter H. Nidditch (ed.), Oxford Clarendon Press, 1975, Abbreviated “E” in citations. Book, Chapter, and Section numbers are included in citations.
  • LoLordo, Antonia, 2019, “Mary Shepherd on Causation, Induction, and Natural Kinds”, Philosopher’s Imprint, 19(52): 1–14.
  • –––, forthcoming, “Mary Shepherd’s Account of the Mind: Its Opponents and Implications”, in Essays on Mary Shepherd: Causation, Mind, and Knowledge, K. Fields (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • McRobert, Jennifer, 2000, “Introduction”, in PWMS, v. 1: v–xxvi.
  • Ott, Walter (2011), “Review” of Keith Allen and Tom Stoneham (eds.), Causation and Modern Philosophy, Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews, philosophy .
  • Paoletti, Christina, 2011, “Restoring Necessary Connections: Lady Mary Shepherd on Hume and the Early Nineteenth-Century Debate on Causality”, I Castelli di Yale, 11: 47–59.
  • Rickless, Samuel, forthcoming, “Shepherd’s Argument for the Causal Maxim: ‘There is No Object Which Begins to Exist, But Must Owe Its Existence to Some Cause’” in Essays on Mary Shepherd: Causation, Mind, and Knowledge, K. Fields (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Tanner, Travis, 2022, “How Good was Shepherd’s Response to Hume’s Epistemological Challenge?”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy (30.1): 71–89.
  • [EIP] Reid, Thomas, 1785 [2002], Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, Dublin. Reprinted Derek Brookes (ed. and annotation) and Knud Haakonssen (annotation and Introduction), University Park, PA, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2002.
  • Snyder, Laura J., 2012 “William Whewell”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2012 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Wilson, Jennifer, forthcoming, “On Mary Shepherd’s Essay upon the Relation of Cause and Effect”, in Neglected Classics of Philosophy, II, Eric Schliesser (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Other Internet Resources


The author thanks Jennifer McRobert for sharing some of her research on Shepherd and Antonia LoLordo, Keota Fields, and Sam Rickless for discussion and correspondence, and participants in many conferences, meetings, and colloquia on Shepherd’s philosophy.

Copyright © 2023 by
Martha Bolton <>

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