Mathematical Explanation

First published Sun Apr 6, 2008; substantive revision Fri Jul 21, 2023

The philosophical analysis of mathematical explanation concerns itself with two different, although connected, areas of investigation. The first area addresses the problem of whether mathematics can play an explanatory role in the natural and social sciences. The second deals with the problem of whether mathematical explanation occurs within mathematics itself. Accordingly, this entry surveys the contributions to both areas, it shows their relevance to the history of philosophy, mathematics, and science, it articulates their connection, and points to the philosophical pay-offs to be expected by deepening our understanding of the topic.

1. Mathematical explanation in the empirical sciences

Nearly all of our most successful empirical sciences employ a great deal of mathematics. In addition, scientists often emphasize the value of explaining some phenomenon that they have discovered. It is natural to wonder, then, if mathematics is well-suited to contribute to the explanation of natural phenomena and what these contributions might be. In the philosophy of science most accounts of explanation identify an explanation with an appropriate description of a cause (see Salmon 1984, Cartwright 1989, Woodward 2003, Strevens 2008, and Beebee, Hitchcock & Menzies 2010 for an overview). Nearly everyone can admit that mathematical tools are an excellent means of tracking or representing causes. For example, mathematics can be used to explain why Halley’s comet’s orbit has a period of 75 years. Much of the debate about mathematical explanation in the empirical sciences has focused on more contentious cases: what role might mathematics play in non-causal explanations, if there are any, and how might these cases challenge this or that account of causal explanation (Reutlinger & Saatsi 2018)?

One kind of case that has been emphasized aims to explain the possibility or impossibility of some process. For example, why can we not divide our 23 strawberries equally among three friends (Lange 2013), or why can we arrange 81 stamps into a 9 by 9 array? The legitimate explanations seem to be that 23 is not divisible by 3 without remainder and that \(9 \times 9 = 81.\) Neither mathematical fact is a cause of the feature of the process in question, so we seem to have a non-causal explanation where mathematics is part of the explanation. The possibility or impossibility of other processes are explained by other areas of mathematics that investigate structures or formal features of natural systems. For example, why can we not make a circuit of the bridges of Königsberg that involves crossing each of the bridges exactly once (Pincock 2007, Molinini 2012)? This is explained by the abstract structure of the bridge network. Why is it possible for there to be stable planetary orbits? One explanation that has been proposed appeals to the dimensions of space-time (Woodward 2003).

Another kind of non-causal mathematical explanation deals with a striking or surprising feature of a phenomenon, where that feature can be identified through a mathematical analysis of the situation. The feature may be tied to a minimization process, or be especially resilient or stable for what is arguably a mathematical reason. Perhaps the most discussed case is the length in years of the life-cycle of three species of periodic cicada: why are these lengths either 13 or 17 years (Baker 2005, 2017)? An explanation is that 13 and 17 are prime numbers and that prime numbered life-cycles confer a relative fitness advantage in avoiding predators and competition for scarce resources like food. Other broadly evolutionary cases include the hexagonal shape of honeycomb cells (Lyon & Colyvan 2008, Räz 2017, Wakil & Justus 2017) and the pattern of seeds in a sunflower (Lyon 2012). There is an extensive literature on how these optimality explanations might work in biology and economics (Potochnik 2007, Rice 2015, 2021). However, this explanatory contribution from mathematics can be found in other domains as well. For example, why do soap films obey Plateau’s laws (Lyon 2012, Pincock 2015a)? This can be explained through a process of surface minimization, subject to constraints. The mathematics of the situation is central to the character that the laws take on. Other cases turn on a mathematical analysis of the stability or instability of some process. For example, why do the so-called Kirkwood gaps appear in our solar system’s asteroid belt (Colyvan 2010)? Occupying some spatial regions is unstable, so that an asteroid that starts in such a region is overwhelmingly likely to leave it. Similar analyses explain patterns in the rings of Saturn or the collapse of an engineered structure like a bridge. (See also Ashbaugh, Chicone & Cushman 1991, Colyvan 2001, Lipton 2004, Baker 2015a and Lange 2017 for a range of other examples.)

The rest of section 1 will consider some of the history of the debates about non-causal mathematical explanations (section 1.1) and their significance for various theories of scientific explanation (1.2). The section then turns to two other debates that are closely related to these features of these explanations: how mathematical models may explain despite their highly idealized character (1.3) and how the explanatory role of mathematics in science could support a platonistic interpretation of pure mathematics (1.4).

1.1 Some historical remarks

Does mathematics help explain the physical world or does it actually hinder a grasp of the physical mechanisms that explain the how and why of natural phenomena? It is not possible here to treat this topic in its full complexity but a few remarks will help the reader appreciate the historical importance of the question.

Aristotle describes his ideal of scientific knowledge in “Posterior Analytics” in terms of, among other things, knowledge of the cause:

We suppose ourselves to possess unqualified scientific knowledge of a thing, as opposed to knowing it in the accidental way in which the sophist knows, when we think that we know the cause on which the fact depends as the cause of the fact and of no other, and further, that the fact could not be other than it is. (BWA, 111, Post. An. I.1, 71b 5–10)

The causes [aitia] in question are the four Aristotelian causes: formal, material, efficient, and final. Nowadays, translators and commentators of Aristotle prefer to translate aition [aitia] as ‘explanation[s]’, so that the theory of the four causes becomes an account of four types of explanations. For instance, here is Barnes’ translation of the passage quoted earlier: “We think we understand a thing simpliciter (and not in the sophistic fashion accidentally) whenever we think we are aware both that the explanation because of which the object is is its explanation, and that it is not possible for this to be otherwise.” (CWA, 115, Post. An. I.1, 71b 5–10)

But how do we obtain scientific knowledge? Scientific knowledge is obtained through demonstration. However, not all logically cogent proofs provide us with the kind of demonstration that yields scientific knowledge. In a scientific demonstration “the premisses must be true, primary, immediate, better known and prior to the conclusion, which is further related to them as effect to causes.” (BWA, 112, Post. An. I.1, 71b 20–25) In Barnes’ translation: “If, then, understanding is as we posited, it is necessary for demonstrative understanding in particular to depend on things which are true and primitive and immediate and more familiar than and prior to and explanatory of the conclusion.” (CWA, 115, Post. An. I.1, 71b 20–25)

Accordingly, in “Posterior Analytics” I.13, Aristotle distinguished between demonstrations “of the fact” and demonstrations “of the reasoned fact”. Although both are logically cogent only the latter mirror the causal structure of the phenomena under investigation, and thus provide us with knowledge. We can call them, respectively, “non-explanatory” and “explanatory” demonstrations.

In Aristotle’s system, physics was not mathematized although causal reasonings were proper to it. However, Aristotle also discussed extensively the so-called mixed sciences, such as optics, harmonics, and mechanics, characterizing them as “the more physical of the mathematical sciences”. There is a relation of subordination between these mixed sciences and areas of pure mathematics (see Dear 2011). For instance, harmonics is subordinated to arithmetic and optics to geometry. Aristotle is in no doubt that there are mathematical explanations of physical phenomena:

For here it is for the empirical scientist to know the fact and for the mathematical to know the reason why; for the latter have the demonstrations of the explanations, and often they do not know the fact, just as those who consider the universal often do not know some of the particulars through lack of observation. (CWA, vol. I, 128, Post. An. I.13, 79a1–79a7)

However, the topic of whether mathematics could give explanations of natural phenomena was one on which there was disagreement. As the domains to which mathematics could be applied grew, so also did the resistance to it. One source of tension consisted in trying to reconcile the Aristotelian conception of pure mathematics, as abstracting from matter and motion, with the fact that both physics (natural philosophy) and the mixed sciences are all conversant about natural phenomena and thus dependent on matter and motion. For instance, an important debate in the Renaissance, known as the Quaestio de Certitudine Mathematicarum, focused in large part on whether mathematics could play the explanatory role assigned to it by Aristotle (Mancuso 1996, ch. 1). Some argued that lacking causality, mathematics could not be the ‘explanatory’ link in the explanation of natural phenomena (see also sections 1.2 and 1.3).

By the time we reach the seventeenth century and the Newtonian revolution in physics, the problem reappears in the context of a change of criteria of explanation and intelligibility. This has been beautifully described in an article by Y. Gingras (2001). Gingras argues that “the use of mathematics in dynamics (as distinct from its use in kinematics) had the effect of transforming the very meaning of the term ‘explanation’ as it was used by philosophers in the seventeenth century” (2001, 385). What Gingras describes, among other things, is how the mathematical treatment of force espoused by Newton and his followers – a treatment that ignored the mechanisms that could explain why and how this force operated – became an accepted standard for explanation during the eighteenth century. After referring to the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries’ discussions on the mechanical explanation of gravity, he remarks:

This episode shows that the evaluation criteria for what was to count as an acceptable ‘explanation’ (of gravitation in this case) were shifting towards mathematics and away from mechanical explanations. Confronted with a mathematical formulation of a phenomenon for which there was no mechanical explanation, more and more actors chose the former even at the price of not finding the latter. This was something new. For the whole of the seventeenth century and most of the eighteenth, to ‘explain’ a physical phenomenon meant to give a physical mechanism involved in its production. … The publication of Newton’s Principia marks the beginning of this shift where mathematical explanations came to be preferred to mechanical explanations when the latter did not conform to calculations. (Gingras 2001, 398)

Among those who resisted this confusion between “physical explanations” and “mathematical explanations” was the Jesuit Louis Castel. In “Vrai système de physique générale de M. Isaac Newton” (1734), he discussed Principia’s proposition XIII of Book III (on Kepler’s law of areas). He granted that the proposition connected mathematically the inverse square law to the ellipticity of the course of the planets. However, he objected that “the one is not the cause, the reason of the other” (Castel 1734, 97) and that Newton had not provided any physical explanation, only a mathematical one. Indeed “physical reasons are necessary reasons of entailment, of linkages, of mechanism. In Newton, there is none of this kind.” (Castel 1734, 121)

Some contemporary discussions bear close proximity to these worries. Consider Morrison’s book Unifying Scientific Theories (2000). One of the major theses of the book is that unification and explanation often pull in different directions and come apart (contrary to what is claimed by unification theories of explanation). One of the examples discussed in her introduction reminds us of Castel’s objections:

Another example is the unification of terrestrial and celestial phenomena in Newton’s Principia. Although influenced by Cartesian mechanics, one of the most striking features of the Principia is its move away from explanations of planetary motions in terms of mechanical causes. Instead, the mathematical form of force is highlighted; the planetary ellipses discovered by Kepler are “explained” in terms of a mathematical description of the force that produces those motions. Of course, the inverse-square law of gravitational attraction explains why the planets move in the way they do, but there is no explanation of how this gravitational force acts on bodies (how it is transported), nor is there any account of its causal properties. (Morrison 2000, 4)

Using several case studies (Maxwell’s electromagnetism, the electroweak unification, etc.), Morrison argues that the mathematical structures involved in the unification “often supply little or no theoretical explanation of the physical dynamics of the unified theory” (Morrison 2000, 4). In short, the mathematical formalism facilitates unification but does not help us explain the how and why of physical phenomena.

We have to close these historical remarks here, although it would be interesting to pursue these questions in a more systematic way into the nineteenth and the twentieth centuries (see however Dorato 2017 for a wide-ranging claim concerning “explanatory switches” at crucial junctions in the history of physics).

The aim of the above was to prepare the ground for showing how in contemporary discussions in philosophy of science, to which we now turn, we are still confronted with such issues.

1.2 Theories of explanation

Two legacies of the Aristotelian tradition surveyed in section 1.1 are that explanations require causes and that providing an explanation requires giving an argument that turns on laws. Debates in the philosophy of science since the 1960s have shown how one can privilege one legacy over another (Salmon 1989). Hempel’s deductive-nomological analysis of explanation requires that an explanation be a deductively valid argument from true premises, where at least one premise is a scientific law (Hempel 1965). Hempel and other empiricists in this broad tradition are wary of making causes central to explanation. This is apparent even in some of Hempel’s critics such as Kitcher, who emphasizes the unifying power of explanations. For Kitcher, an explanation is an instance of a deductive argument scheme, where the schemes to adopt are identified on the basis of global features of the claims we accept (Kitcher 1989, see section 2.2.2 for additional discussion).

By contrast, Salmon’s work has persuaded many philosophers of science that explanations need only provide causal information about the explanatory target (Salmon 1984, 1989). For Salmon and others in this tradition, explanations do not require laws and need not even be arguments. One development of this approach preserves Salmon’s emphasis on causal mechanisms as a special sort of process. The so-called “new mechanists” endorse a broader notion of causal mechanism than Salmon allowed for, and identify an explanation of some target with a mechanism that produces it (Machamer, Darden & Craver 2000). Other approaches to causal explanation include David Lewis’ counterfactual analysis of causation (Lewis 2004) and Woodward’s interventionist theory (Woodward 2003, 2021a). Despite their differences, Lewis and Woodward allow for causal explanations in the absence of mechanisms. This makes their approaches to explanation easier to generalize to non-causal cases.

Philosophical discussions of non-causal mathematical explanation can be classified based on how they are related to these debates about scientific explanation more generally. One position argues for the need to restore something like Hempel’s emphasis on laws or Kitcher’s claims about unification (Baron 2019). Another position generalizes from an account of causal explanation so that it can include these mathematical cases (Saatsi & Pexton 2013, Reutlinger 2016). Yet a third position is pluralist about explanation, and argues that explanations come in a variety of distinct sorts that cannot be fit into one or the other of these two options (Pincock 2018, 2023).

Lange’s extensive discussions of non-causal explanations can be seen as a valiant attempt to preserve the law-based approach to scientific explanation that goes back to Hempel (and Aristotle) (Lange 2013, 2017). Lange’s work on laws emphasizes how to identify claims with the right kind of modal strength to contribute to explanations (Lange 2009). Consider the contrast between “All gold cubes are less than 1 cubic mile in volume” and “All Ur-235 cubes are less than 1 cubic mile in volume”. The former statement is contingent, while the latter statement has some degree of necessity. This allows the latter statement to contribute to an explanation. Lange’s approach to mathematical explanation extends this point so that mathematical claims can function in explanations in a distinctive way due to their special degree of necessity. This allows mathematics to contribute to what Lange calls explanations by constraint that show how some outcome is guaranteed to arise (Lange 2017, ch. 2). This is how Lange treats the strawberry division case and also cases like the bridges of Königsberg. Other mathematical explanations turn on the dimensions of the quantities involved or the statistical features of some process (Lange 2017, ch. 5, 6). In each of these types of cases, the modal character of the mathematical claim allows it to explain just as the modal character of ordinary scientific laws allow them to explain.

Unsurprisingly, many philosophers have challenged Lange’s proposals in ways that are reminiscent of how Salmon objected to Hempel’s deductive-nomological account (Pincock 2015a, Reutlinger 2017b, Saatsi 2018). For example, Craver and Povich object that, in the absence of a causal constraint on explanation, Lange’s proposals lack any suitable worldly basis, and so count too many representations of some target as explanatory (Craver & Povich 2017, Lange 2018a). As a mechanist about explanation quite generally, Craver seems inclined to dismiss the possibility of non-causal mathematical explanations (Craver 2014). His co-author Povich has offered a more constructive proposal for these cases that allows for explanations with a variety of worldly or ontic bases (Povich 2020, 2021). Povich deploys a version of what amounts to a new consensus for handling non-causal explanations: if a proposed explanation relates to the right counterfactuals in the right way, then it is legitimate (Woodward 2018, Rice 2021). However, there is as yet no agreement on what sorts of counterfactual tests are sufficient for explanation (see Lange 2021a for some objections to this approach).

One option is to treat a mathematical claim like a law that governs some situation, and to credit the mathematics with explanatory power whenever it allows us to assess a range of counterfactual scenarios. This is Reutlinger’s proposal, which deliberately loosens the requirements that Woodward places on interventions (Reutlinger 2016, 2017a, 2018, Reutlinger, Colyvan & Krzyzanowska 2022). For example, in the bridges of Königsberg case, the mathematical claim indicates that a circuit of the bridges would be possible in the counterfactual scenario where some of the actual bridges were absent. Reutlinger concludes that the mathematical claim thus explains what is going on in the actual world by indicating what makes a difference to the feature of interest. Arguably, though, this approach is too liberal. Suppose we ask why we have \(81\) stamps. It is a mathematical truth that \(9 \times 9 = 81,\) and so we can arrange our stamps in a \(9 \times 9\) array. So if we could not arrange our stamps in a \(9 \times 9\) array, then we would not have \(81\) stamps. But the truth that \(9 \times 9 = 81\) does not explain why we have \(81\) stamps.

Another option is to treat a mathematical claim like a cause. Then the claim will be explanatory when a “counter-mathematical” that supposes that this claim is false winds up making a difference to the target in question. This sort of counter-mathematical involves impossible worlds where necessary truths come out false. This is the option that Povich takes (Povich 2020, 2021). Another family of proposals along these lines has been developed by Baron in collaboration with Colyvan and Ripley (Baron, Colyvan & Ripley 2017, 2020). Baron et al. draw on David Lewis’ procedure for evaluating counterfactuals tied to causation: consider the scenario that arises through a miraculous change that is just enough of a change to make the antecedent of the counterfactual true. In addition, Baron et al. require that the features of the natural world that are implicated in this shift in the mathematics be changed in a corresponding way. For example, for the cicada case, the central mathematical claim is that prime periods minimize intersections when compared to non-prime periods. So among the years 12, 13, 14, 15, 16, 17, and 18 (that are identified by ecological constraints), the primes 13 and 17 stand out as comparatively more fit. Baron et al. consider the consequences of supposing that 13 is not prime. If 13 was not prime, they argue, then it would have factors besides 1 and 13, and so having a 13-year life cycle would not confer any relative fitness advantage. Thus, in this impossible world, the cicadas would not have evolved a 13-year life cycle. This is meant to show that 13’s being prime makes a difference to the evolution of 13-year life cycle cicadas. (See also section 2.2.1 for a parallel debate for pure mathematics.)

There are pressing questions for these proposals about the nature of impossible worlds and our epistemic access to them (Kasirzadeh 2021a). Another sort of objection has been raised by Baron himself in work that develops another account of mathematical explanation (Baron 2020). Baron, like Baker and Lange, aims to identify a special class of genuinely or distinctively mathematical explanations of natural phenomena (Baker 2005, 2009a, Lange 2013). What is special about these cases is that the mathematics explains, but not by representing or describing some non-mathematical explainers such as causes or other worldly difference makers. Baron’s general worry is that simply using countermathematicals fails to distinguish explanations that employ mathematics from these genuinely mathematical explanations. We can see this using our original stamp case: why can we arrange our stamps in a \(9 \times 9\) array? Because we have \(81\) stamps and \(9 \times 9 = 81.\) This case passes Baron et al.’s countermathematical test, for were \(9 \times 9\) not equal to \(81\), then our \(81\) stamps could not be arranged in a \(9 \times 9\) array. However, the mathematical claim here seems to be simply tracking the non-mathematical features of the stamps, and so Baron and others would not want to count this as a special sort of mathematical explanation.

Baron concludes that some additional requirements must be imposed beyond the truth of the relevant countermathematical. Here Baron reaches back to Kitcher’s idea that explanations are instances of a special sort of argument scheme (Kitcher 1989), where the schemes are found through a process of appropriately unifying the claims that we accept (for objections to this proposal see Pincock 2023 and Povich forthcoming). Other recent work on non-causal mathematical explanations also seems to be returning to some of the original sources of these debates. For example, Lange argues that the best way to make sense of the explanatory power of pure mathematics in the empirical sciences is to adopt an Aristotelian interpretation of pure mathematics (Lange 2021b).

Lyon proposed another way of relating mathematical explanations to causal explanations by adapting Jackson and Pettit’s notion of a “program explanation” (Jackson & Pettit 1990). A program explanation does not invoke a property that causes the outcome of interest. Instead, the explanation appeals to a property \(A\) that guarantees the presence of some member of a family of properties, where some such property \(B\) causes the outcome of interest. As Lyon summarizes his proposal, “An explanation of an empirical fact is mathematical – i.e., it has mathematics doing explanatory work – if the explanation is a program explanation that uses mathematics in a way that is indispensable to the program” (Lyon 2012, 568). One concern with this proposal is that it includes cases where the mathematics merely represents some causally relevant property, as with the stamps case noted above: programming is too indiscriminate a relation to avoid this worry (Saatsi 2012).

A sweeping way of dealing with the apparent tension between causes and mathematics has been pursued by some ontic structural realists (Ladyman & Ross 2007, French 2014). They identify the fundamental metaphysical structure of the world with a mathematical structure. If one adopted this kind of structural realism, then the explanatory power of mathematics in the empirical sciences would receive a satisfying analysis. In fundamental physics, scientists would be working with the fundamental mathematical structure directly, and so explanations there would be essentially mathematical. In non-fundamental domains such as biology or economics, scientists would be investigating features of the world that are ultimately grounded in some mathematical structure. So again it would make sense for many of the explanations in non-fundamental sciences to be mathematical. Causal explanations would then turn out to be perfectly consistent with more fundamental mathematical explanations. Few philosophers are willing to adopt such a metaphysical position in order to resolve questions about mathematical explanation, although at least one physicist has defended this approach (Tegmark 2014).

Another, less metaphysical, solution to these difficulties is to retain an account of how causal explanations work and to simply supplement it with a distinct account of how various kinds of non-causal explanations arise (Pincock 2015a, Pincock 2018, with criticisms from Knowles 2021a). This sort of explanatory pluralism is also reminiscent of one aspect of the Aristotelian tradition. One challenge for the explanatory pluralist is to make sense of the value that scientists ascribe to explanations: how can there be some special value in having an explanation if explanations come in different kinds that have nothing in common? One response to this challenge is that grasping an explanation produces scientific understanding, but the nature and value of this scientific understanding remains a subject of active debate (Rice & Rohwer 2021). Another response is to defend a restrictive form of explanatory monism. It may turn out that this monism about explanation is so restrictive that there are no mathematical explanations in science (Zelcer 2013, Kuorikoski 2021). This is reminiscent of one side of the Renaissance debate noted in section 1.1.

Another sort of pluralism arises from supposing that causal explanations involve the mechanisms championed by the new mechanists, and then allowing for other sorts of explanations that work in different ways. One type of case that has received extensive discussion is so-called “topological” explanation. These explanations appeal to structural or network-based features to explain an aspect of a system (Kostic 2020, 2023, Ross 2021). One position is that topological explanations are non-causal, non-mechanical explanations that are based on a different kind of explanatorily relevant feature. For example, Kostic and Khalifa argue that a non-ontic approach that privileges scientist’s explanatory goals is needed to make sense of topological explanation (Kostic & Khalifa 2021, 2022). Another position is that an appropriately flexible notion of mechanism can count genuine topological explanations as mechanical explanations (Bechtel & Abrahamsen 2010, Bechtel 2020, Huneman 2010, 2018, Brigandt 2013, Green et al. 2018). As with the debates arising from Woodward’s and Lewis’ counterfactual approaches to causal explanation, the main question is what counts as a mechanism and how non-mechanisms can be explanatory (Janson 2018, Janson & Saatsi 2019, Andersen 2020, Jha et al. 2022).

More recently, some authors have tried to restore some kind of explanatory monism by arguing that all scientific explanations turn on non-representational, expressive elements (McCullough-Benner 2022, Hunt forthcoming). If this was right, then there would be no difficulty making sense of mathematical explanations so long as mathematics can be seen to perform whatever expressive function an author identifies. The viability of an expressive approach thus turns on questions about the interpretation of pure mathematics that are considered in sections 1.4 and 2.2.

1.3 Mathematical models and idealization

One assumption of the Aristotelian tradition that is often unquestioned in the work summarized in section 1.2 is that whatever provides the explanation (i.e. the explanans) must be true. Philosophical investigations of scientific models and how these models may explain have convinced many that an explanans need not be true. The argument for this conclusion is straightforward: Scientific models explain and scientific models are not true. So, truth is not required for explanation (Bokulich 2011; see also Cartwright 1983, Morrison 2015, Rice 2018 and Yablo 2020).

A traditional response to this argument is that even though models are not true, a model can only explain if it generates some truths about the target of explanation (Colyvan 2010, see section 1.4 for more discussion). That is, a model explains only when it represents its target to be a certain way. The debate thus turns on the options for making sense of how models represent, especially when those models are mathematical, and if the representational aspects of models are sufficient to make sense of model-based explanation. One proposal is that a model explains when the model represents a target system to be a certain way and also represents something else that explains why the system is that way. For example, a causal model of outcome \(E\) needs to represent \(E\) and some cause \(C\) of \(E\). However, there is no consensus on what it takes for a model to represent something.

As a model is distinct from its target, and the model and target are often composed of different materials, it is natural to conclude that structural relations are central to what a model represents. However, it is hard to maintain that a model represents a target just in case there is a structural relation between the model and target (Suárez 2010, 2015). For example, a model is isomorphic to itself, and so it stands in a structural relation to itself. But we do not want to say that a model represents itself. There are also model-target relations that lack any clear structural characterization. For example, a model may represent the solar system, and yet contain only two point particles moving on trajectories that fail to stand in any non-trivial structural relation to anything in the actual solar system. So it seems that standing in a structural relation is neither necessary nor sufficient for a model to represent a target.

One response to these problems is that a model represents a target when agents claim that a structural relation obtains between the model and the target, where that relation may be quite selective and involve reinterpretations of various elements of the model (Pincock 2012, ch. 2, Frigg & Nguyen 2020). For example, the projection relating a map to some country may be fairly complicated, and involve various conventions for what symbols on the map indicate about the country. Some authors associate the relations that agents establish between model and target with inferential principles (Bueno & Colyvan 2011, Bueno & French 2018). So according to these various proposals, a model explains a feature of a target when either some representational relationship or inferential licenses from model to target have been established by agents, and these connections genuinely explain that feature (e.g. they are causes of the feature). For example, a suitably interpreted map can explain the impossibility of train travel between two cities by accurately representing the train network that fails to link those cites.

The different approaches to explanation surveyed in section 1.2 can then be used to identify explanatory models and what they explain. A mechanist about explanation can allow that mathematical models explain by representing mechanisms, while difference-making views will require an explanatory model to represent difference-making, i.e. how changing factor \(X\) will go along with a change in outcome \(Y\). All of these proposals will argue that scientific models do not need to be true in order to explain. All that needs to occur is for the model to provide some truths by representing the right things about the target. So the presence of falsehoods that the model also provides about the target does not stand in the way of the model’s explanatory power.

This approach to explanatory models and idealization has been called into question by Batterman. One argument from Batterman is that there are explanatory models that do not explain in virtue of an element of the model representing some explanatorily relevant factor such as a cause or more exotic non-causal difference maker. Instead, in such cases, “while we have a genuine mathematical explanation of physical phenomena, there is no appeal to the existence of mathematical entities or their properties. Instead, the appeal is to a mathematical idealization resulting from a limit operation that relates one model … to another” (2010, 7–8). The case that Batterman is discussing here involves an operation (known as taking the thermodynamic limit) that transforms a “finite statistical mechanical model” into a “continuum thermodynamic model”. This is central to the explanation of the universality of some features of phase transitions that include liquid/gas transitions and magnetization. The features are universal in the sense that they arise across systems with very different microphysical features, and so seem especially puzzling.

One point that Batterman is making here is that mathematical operations that connect models can be significant for a mathematical explanation of an empirical phenomena (see also Batterman & Rice 2014, Batterman 2019, Batterman 2021). The defenders of traditional approaches to model explanation often focus on cases where a single mathematical structure is used to explain. However, the basic ideas of the traditional approach can be extended to deal with the explanatory significance of some mathematical operations. For example, one mathematical model may be transformed into another mathematical model through a mathematical operation. If this operation reflects something of explanatory significance, then the two models and the operation connecting them may be central to the explanation. Some idealizations are associated with these operations, as in the case where an ocean is treated as infinitely deep or a planet is modeled as a point particle. In such cases, the operations function by changing or removing the interpretation of the elements of the model.

Batterman also develops another point that poses a more significant challenge to traditional approaches to model explanation. This is that the “mathematical idealization” that results from this operation, and that is tied to one of these models, is essential to the whole explanation. In the ocean case, there is no temptation to say that the ocean being infinitely deep in one model is explanatorily relevant to the character of the waves on the surface of the actual ocean. All that this idealization turns on is that the depth is above some threshold. Other cases can be handled using similar “Galilean” idealizations that eliminate the falsehood from the genuine explanation (Weisberg 2007). But in Batterman’s cases, such as the phase transition case, he is clear that he takes the idealization to be essential to the explanation: “These nontraditional idealizations play essential explanatory roles involving operations or mathematical processes without representing the system(s) in question” (2010, 23). If this point is accepted, then these cases would undermine the scope of the traditional approach.

In the philosophy of physics there has been an extensive discussion of how essential these idealizations are to the explanations in question (Belot 2005, Bokulich 2008, Norton 2012, Lange 2015a, Franklin 2018, Sullivan 2019, Strevens 2019, Rodriguez 2021. See also Easwaran et al. 2021). Some critics of Batterman have argued that these cases can be dealt with using explanations that avoid these idealizations or that treat these idealizations in the manner that we treated the infinitely deep ocean. Other critics of Batterman have argued that a more selective approach to what these models represent allows one to admit that the idealizations are essential to generating the explanation, but that they are not literally to be included in the explanation itself. For example, a counterfactual approach to these cases would identify the explanation with some counterfactuals that are generated by the model. Batterman and others, in turn, have responded that all of these criticisms fail to do justice to the phenomena in question or what scientists say about their explanations (Morrison 2018, Batterman 2019, McKenna 2021).

Other alternatives to a traditional approach to mathematical modeling and explanation have been developed using other sorts of cases as their primary motivations (Rizza 2013, Berkovitz 2020, Kasirzadeh 2021b, McKenna 2022). One theme of this work is a generalization of Batterman’s point that scientific explanations often involve many models whose representational relation to the explanatory target is more involved than what is usually allowed. For example, Kasirzadeh considers a case with two mathematical models, with different spatial scales, of a process of skin color pattern formation (Kasirzadeh 2021b). Biologists asked for an explanation of how the two processes related to one another. Kasirzadeh argues that this explanation required additional “bridge mathematics” over and above the mathematics found in the original two models. The additional mathematics contributed to the explanation by characterizing how the microscopic processes gave rise to the unexpected macroscopic structures. McKenna goes further and argues for the importance of cases where “models cannot be stitched together in purely mathematical terms” (McKenna 2022). In McKenna’s main case various models of sea ice permeability are developed for the purposes of large-scale climate modeling. No single mathematical model of sea ice proved to be adequate to supply the right parameters to the large-scale model. Instead, different models of sea ice were used in conjunction with high-resolution empirical data about samples of sea ice formations. The significance of these cases for the explanations that arise from these modeling techniques is likely to be a subject of ongoing debate.

1.4 Explanatory indispensability arguments

Many philosophers are interested in non-causal mathematical explanations in science because they seem to support an explanatory indispensability argument for a platonist interpretation of pure mathematics. Colyvan and Baker have been the most ardent defenders of such an argument (Colyvan 2001, 2010, Baker 2005, 2009a, 2022). In his 2001 book Colyvan presented a general indispensability argument for the existence of mathematical entities like the natural numbers:

We ought to have ontological commitment to all and only those entities that are indispensable to our best scientific theories;
Mathematical entities are indispensable to our best scientific theories.


We ought to have ontological commitment to mathematical entities (Colyvan 2001, 11).

This notion of ontological commitment was first articulated by Quine (Quine 2004, Putnam 2010). These commitments reflect what one should believe exists. Premise 1 is tied to a naturalistic approach to these beliefs that claims they should be determined by the character of our best scientific theories. For Quine, one’s ontological commitments are settled by the best regimentation of one’s scientific theories into first-order logic, where what makes a regimentation the best is determined by ordinary scientific criteria like consistency and simplicity. Some of Colyvan’s cases in his book invoked the explanatory contribution that mathematical entities make to our best theories. If we suppose that one aim of science is to explain, then a regimentation may be the best in part because it affords explanations of various scientific phenomena.

An explanatory version of this indispensability argument became more prominent after Melia’s exchange with Colyvan (Melia 2000, 2002, Colyvan 2002). Melia argued that indispensable quantification over mathematical entities was not sufficient for ontological commitment. Any such commitments could be canceled by a “weaseling” maneuver that added “but I do not accept the existence of any mathematical entities.” For example, one could use numbers to count how many apples and pears one has and conclude that there are more apples than pears. But Melia would then add that he rejected the existence of natural numbers, thereby canceling that commitment. Colyvan replied that such an addition was incoherent when the mathematical entities were explaining something, and Melia agreed: “Were there clear examples where the postulation of mathematical objects results in an increase in the same kind of utility as that provided by the postulation of theoretical entities, then it would seem that the same kind of considerations that support the existence of atoms, electrons and space-time equally supports the existence of numbers, functions and sets” (Melia 2002, 75–76). The debate about indispensability and platonism then largely turned to the evaluation of cases.

Baker took up Melia’s challenge by reformulating the argument so that the explanatory question became central. Baker also introduced new cases like the cicada case where the parallel between atoms and numbers was meant to be clearer. In Baker’s formulation, the argument is:

We ought rationally to believe in the existence of any entity that plays an indispensable explanatory role in our best scientific theories.
Mathematical objects play an indispensable explanatory role in science.
Hence, we ought rationally to believe in the existence of mathematical objects (Baker 2009a, 613, premises renumbered).

The emphasis on explanation in premise 1′ is of course consistent with Quine’s process of regimentation. For example, we opt for the theory of cicadas that best explains their character. If we then work out the best regimentation of this theory, we will find that it will entail that prime numbers exist. All premise 1′ maintains, then, is that one should endorse whatever these ontological commitments turn out to be. However, a second way to support premise 1′ is available: one could appeal to inference to the best explanation and its use to support scientific realism about unobservable entities like electrons. Baker sometimes ties the appeal of his indispensability argument to scientific realism: “A crucial plank of the scientific realist position involves inference to the best explanation (IBE) to justify the postulation in particular cases of unobservable theoretical entities … the indispensability debate only gets off the ground if both sides take IBE seriously, which suggests that explanation is of key importance in this debate” (Baker 2005, 225). The appeal to IBE avoids the Quinean process of regimentation by directing our attention to some explanatory target such as the length of the life-cycles of some species of cicada. If we are scientific realists, then we accept the use of IBE in support of our claims about the existence of various entities. So if we find that the best explanation also includes abstract objects like prime numbers, then we should also accept their existence.

Three worries about this explanatory indispensability argument can be fruitfully distinguished. The first worry is that the argument is somehow circular, begs the question or else fails to correctly identify the basis for our knowledge of the existence of mathematical entities. The point was forcefully presented by Steiner in 1978. Steiner argues for the existence of mathematical explanations and also claims to know of the existence of abstract, mathematical entities. However, “no explanatory argument can establish the existence of mathematical entities” (1978b, 20). The reason for this is attributed to Morgenbesser: “We cannot say what the world would be like without numbers, because describing any thinkable experience (except for utter emptiness) presupposes their existence” (1978b, 19–20). The point seems to be that we must be able to compare mathematical and non-mathematical explanations of some target in order to get an explanatory argument going. But if the target always “presupposes” the existence of some mathematical entities, then this comparison is not possible. Bangu has developed this point by noting how many of the cases discussed have targets that are mathematical in character, as with the prime periods of the cicadas (Bangu 2008, 2012, see Baker 2021a for a response). So, the worry continues, mathematical explanations are only indispensable in science if we have used mathematical entities to characterize the target phenomena. Pincock has a somewhat similar concern: if the targets are characterized in weak mathematical terms, then only weak mathematical theories will be needed to explain these targets, and these theories can be easily supplied with a nominalistic interpretation that preserves these theories’ explanatory power (Pincock 2012, see Baker 2015b for a reply to these worries).

Another worry accepts that there are in some sense mathematical explanations in science. However, premise 2′ is rejected because these explanations fail to involve the existence of any mathematical objects. Saatsi has developed this criticism by claiming that mathematics only explains by representing some non-mathematical features of the physical world (Saatsi 2007, 2011). On this reading, premise 2′ requires the existence of some “distinctively” or “genuinely” mathematical explanations, but there are no such explanations. As Saatsi puts the worry, “what really matters for the indispensability argument – all that matters! – is whether or not mathematics plays the kind of explanatory role that we should take as ontologically committing” (Saatsi 2016, 1051). Until the defenders of the argument clarify what distinctively mathematical explanations are and how they involve mathematical objects, it seems that premise 2′ is in trouble. Other versions of this objection may be found in Daly & Langford 2009, Rizza 2011, Tallant 2013, Liggins 2016, Busch & Morrison 2016, Barrantes 2019 and Boyce 2021 (see also Panza & Sereni 2016 for a helpful overview of these debates).

A third kind of worry about premise 2′ is developed by mathematical fictionalists like Yablo and Leng (Leng 2010, 2021, Yablo 2012, 2020). Fictionalists accept the existence of distinctively mathematical explanations and yet argue that these explanations do not presuppose the existence of any mathematical objects. For example, Leng argues that “we can generate mathematical explanations of physical phenomena that do not appeal to any abstract mathematical objects, but instead only require modal truths about what follows logically from our mathematical assumptions, together with the recognition that the assumptions of our mathematical theories are true when interpreted as about the physical system under examination” (Leng 2021, 10437). Leng can thus endorse the very same unified derivation of the features of Baker’s cicadas, and yet refrain from accepting the existence of mathematical objects. While Saatsi takes the physical features of the system to be the genuine explainers, Leng uses those same features to interpret the mathematical theories that are doing the explanatory work. Either way, premise 2′ of the indispensability argument comes out false.

Colyvan and Baker’s strategy for supporting premise 2′ has largely involved cases where it appears that mathematical objects play a role in the explanation that is analogous to what unobservable entities like electrons play in other explanations. For example, in the cicada case, the prime numbers afford a unified derivation of the target of the explanation. This strategy would be most effective against representational approaches to mathematical explanation. The basic idea is that scientists value these explanations, and so any reinterpretation of them in non-mathematical terms risks privileging an unmotivated philosophical theory over some legitimate scientific practice. As Baker and Colyvan put the point in a reply directed at Daly and Langford (2009): “Commitments to philosophical theories such as nominalism, a causal theory of explanation, or the ‘indexing’ view of mathematical applications are not good reasons for rejecting well-supported scientific and mathematical claims” (Baker & Colyvan 2011, 332).

A second strategy that Colyvan has pursued is to challenge critics to recast these explanations in non-mathematical terms. The refusal to do this involves an “easy road” to nominalism that Colyvan thinks is untenable: “when some piece of language is delivering an explanation, either that piece of language must be interpreted literally or the non-literal reading of the language in question stands proxy for the real explanation” (Colyvan 2010, 300). This strategy is most effective against fictionalists. It involves a conception of scientific explanation that requires that every genuine explanation be presentable in literal, non-metaphorical language: to say why something is the case, we must literally say what is responsible for what, and so it must be in principle possible to avoid fictional or metaphorical tools. If fictionalists are right about pure mathematics, then mathematics is simply such a tool, and so they should be able to sketch a non-mathematical version of the explanations at issue. The fictionalist response is to deny this conception of explanation.

Yet another kind of criticism of premise 2′ accepts both the existence of mathematical explanations and that these explanations involve mathematical objects, but maintains that these explanations are dispensable from our best science. That is, either the best regimentation of our scientific theories will avoid quantification over mathematical objects or no appeal to IBE will actually support adopting such an explanation. This sort of criticism can be traced back to Field’s pioneering Science without numbers (Field 1980). There Field contrasts “intrinsic” explanations with “extrinsic” explanations. He claims that all mathematical explanations are extrinsic and that for every extrinsic explanation of some target, there is a superior, intrinsic explanation of that very target (Field 1980, 43–44; see Marcus 2013). The explanations championed by Colyvan, Baker and others suggest that it is not clear that a mathematical explanation is always extrinsic or that a non-mathematical explanation that is intrinsic is superior in all respects. Consider again the non-causal explanation of the impossibility of traversing the bridges of Königsberg or the evolutionary explanation of the prime periods of the cicada. While some non-mathematical derivation of these targets is surely available, this does not settle whether or not these derivations should count as explanations or what their explanatory virtues might be.

Perhaps the most promising defense of premise 2′ would be to provide a positive account of distinctively mathematical explanations that would clarify how endorsing such explanations commits one to the existence of some mathematical objects. The recent literature on this issue again seems to lead to a kind of standoff. Consider, for example, Baron’s “Pythagorean” proposal for these explanations (Baron forthcoming). Baron defines a Pythagorean to be someone who not only believes in mathematical objects as abstract entities, but who claims that some of the intrinsic properties of these abstract entities are also possessed by concrete entities. This is possible because the salient intrinsic properties of the mathematical entities are structural properties that are found in the concrete world whenever the concrete entities are arranged in the right structure. These shared, structural properties and their necessary mathematical relations thus enable mathematical truths to explain features of physical systems such as the bridges or cicadas. In addition, Baron is clear that “Structural properties on my account make indispensable reference to abstract objects” (Baron forthcoming, 25). So one defense of premise 2′ involves adopting Baron’s Pythagoreanism.

Other accounts of distinctively mathematical explanation support the rejection of premise 2′. For example, Lange’s modal interpretation of distinctively mathematical explanations leads him to endorse what he calls an “Aristotelian realist” interpretation of pure mathematics in terms of a special kind of abstract property, without the recourse to any abstract objects (Lange 2021b, see also Franklin 2008). According to Lange, the best way to make sense of the explanatory power of mathematical truths is to suppose that “mathematics concerns mathematical properties possessed by physical systems” (Lange 2021b, 50). As with Baron, these mathematical properties can help to explain why these physical systems have some other properties. For Lange the main benefit of such an Aristotelian interpretation is that the salient modal features of the physical systems arise from the presence of the mathematical properties. This helps to clarify in what sense the mathematical truth and the properties it invokes may be explanatorily prior to some target property. Crucially, though, for Lange this interpretation of pure mathematics eliminates the need to invoke abstract objects. If Lange is right, then, premise 2′ of the explanatory indispensability argument is false. (See also Knowles & Saatsi 2021, Knowles 2021a, Knowles 2021b and Baker 2022 on additional challenges to this premise.)

One diagnosis of the problems with indispensability arguments is that the conclusion of the argument concerns the interpretation of pure mathematics while the premises of the argument consider how mathematics is used in science. Perhaps, then, a platonist would be better served by focusing on explanatory considerations that arise within the practice of pure mathematics. This is the focus of section 2.

2. Mathematical explanation in mathematics

Much mathematical activity is driven by factors other than establishing that a certain theorem is true. In many cases mathematicians are unsatisfied by merely knowing that a mathematical fact holds and reprove it, while also claiming explanatory benefits for the new proof. This type of explanatory activity appears within mathematics itself (see the Preamble) and thus one often speaks of “internal” or “intra-mathematical explanations” (Baron, Colyvan & Ripley 2020, Betti 2010, Mancosu 2008). The expression “internal mathematical explanation” covers a wide range of different phenomena: an internal mathematical explanation could amount to the recasting of an entire area of mathematics or it might aim at providing explanatory proofs for specific theorems. The variety of these mathematical explanatory activities has been investigated in D’Alessandro (2020), Hafner and Mancosu (2005), Lange (2018b), and Sandborg (1997, Ch. 1).

Amongst these different explanatory activities, most of the attention has been focused on proofs which not only prove that a theorem is true, but also show why it is true. While there might not be agreement on specific instances, many mathematicians often claim that certain proofs have an explanatory power and that others do not. These claims are found throughout the history of mathematics and the philosophy of mathematics (see Lange 2015c, 2016, 2017 (Ch. 7–9) and Mancosu 2001). In the words of Bouligand:

Many theorems can be given different demonstrations. The most instructive are of course those that let one understand the deep reasons of the results that one is establishing. (Bouligand, 1932, 6, Mancosu’s translation)

And the real algebraic geometer Gregory Brumfiel draws a stark contrast between two different types of proofs to be found in real algebraic geometry, i.e., what he calls transcendental proofs (i.e., proofs based on transfer theorems that infer the truth of a statement for all real closed fields from its truth on a specific real closed field, say the real numbers) vs. a type of proof that holds uniformly for all real closed fields. The first type of proof is rejected by Brumfiel as non-explanatory and, by contrast, the latter provide explanatory benefits. In his words:

In this book we absolutely and unequivocally refuse to give proofs of this […] type [transcendental proofs]. Every result is proved uniformly for all real closed ground fields. Our philosophical objection to transcendental proofs is that they might logically prove a result, but they do not explain it, except for the special case of real numbers. (Brumfiel 1979, 166)

As the previous examples show, explanatory proofs could be of several types and explain in different manners. A recent debate has focused on the issue of whether proofs by induction are explanatory. On the one hand, Lange (2010) argues that proofs by induction are not explanatory. His argument relies on the use of a form of upward and downward induction from a fixed number k, with k≠1. According to Lange, if proofs by ordinary mathematical induction are explanatory, so are proofs by upward and downward induction from a fixed number k, with k≠1. But if so, then the typical asymmetry of explanations, which also holds of mathematical explanations, is not respected: for a certain property P, P(1) is part of the explanation of P(k) and P(k) is part of the explanation of P(1). Baker (2009b) rejects Lange’s argument by arguing against the explanatory equivalence between proofs by ordinary mathematical induction and proofs by upward and downward induction. Hoeltje et al. (2013) reject what they see as an unacknowledged assumption in Lange’s argument, namely that a universal sentence explains its instances. Dougherty (2017)’s line of attack is based on Lange’s need to presuppose a problematic notion of identity of proofs, which he questions using an alternative criterion of identity spelled out using two equivalent characterizations (the first appealing to the language of homotopy type theory and the second using algebraic representatives to proofs). Both Baldwin (2016) and Lehet (2019) defend the explanatory value of induction in mathematics: while Baldwin offers positive considerations as to why inductive arguments are explanatory, Lehet dwells on inductive definitions which – she argues – might be cases of explanations in mathematics.

The distinction between explanatory and non-explanatory proofs has also been applied to other types of proofs, for instance proofs that explain by using diagrams (see D’Alessandro 2020, Brown 1997), or proofs that explain by drawing on analogies (see Lange 2017). Significant philosophical activity has focused on those proofs that explain by revealing the reasons, or the grounds, why a theorem is true. As stressed by Lange (2021c), in this context the word “ground” should not be understood as connected to the recent literature on metaphysical grounding (e.g., see Correia and Schnieder (2002)). We should rather think of the notion of “conceptual grounding”, as developed by, e.g. Smithson (2020). This notion of ground has an illustrious pedigree in philosophers and mathematicians such as Bolzano (see Kitcher 1975, Mancosu 1999 and Sebestik 1992) or Cournot (see Mancosu 1999), and recent contributions have stressed its value in the mathematical realm (see Betti 2010, Detlefsen 1988, Jansson 2017, Pincock 2015b, Poggiolesi and Genco 2023). Indeed, just as in the scientific literature it is widely accepted that causal explanations track a causal relation in the world and explain by revealing the causes of why a certain fact holds, it seems reasonable to accept that (at least certain) mathematical explanatory proofs track a grounding relation in the mathematical realm and thus explain by mentioning the grounds or reasons why a theorem is true.

2.1 Some historical remarks

Since contributions in analytic philosophy to the study of mathematical explanations date back only to Steiner 1978a, one might suspect that the topic was a byproduct of the Quinean conception of scientific theories (see Resnik & Kushner, 1987, 154). Once mathematics and natural science were placed on the same footing, it became possible to apply a unified methodology to both areas. Thus, it made sense to look for explanations in mathematics just as in natural science. However, this historical reconstruction would be mistaken. Mathematical explanations of mathematical facts have been part of philosophical reflection since Aristotle. We have already seen in section 1.1 the distinction Aristotle drew between demonstrations “of the fact” and demonstrations “of the reasoned fact”. Both are logically rigorous but only the latter provide explanations for their results. Aristotle had also claimed that demonstrations “of the reasoned fact” occur in mathematics. Only these demonstrations can be called “explanatory” demonstrations, and some of these demonstrations will be mathematical proofs.

Aristotle’s position on explanatory proofs in mathematics was already challenged in ancient times. Proclus, in his “Commentary on the first book of Euclid’s Elements”, informs us on this point. He reports: “Many persons have thought that geometry does not investigate the cause, that is, does not ask the question ‘Why?’” (Proclus 1970, 158–159; for more on Proclus on mathematical explanation see Harari 2008). Proclus himself singles out certain propositions in Euclid’s “Elements”, such as I.32, as not being demonstrations “of the reasoned fact”. Euclid I.32 states that the sum of the internal angles of a triangle is equal to two right angles. If the demonstration were given by a scientific syllogism in the Aristotelean sense, the middle of the syllogism would have to provide the ‘cause’ of the fact. But Proclus argues that Euclid’s proof does not satisfy these Aristotelian constraints, for the appeal to the auxiliary lines and exterior angles is not ‘causal’:

What is called “proof” we shall find sometimes has the properties of a demonstration in being able to establish what is sought by means of definitions as middle terms, and this is the perfect form of demonstration; but sometimes it attempts to prove by means of signs. This point should not be overlooked. Although geometrical propositions always derive their necessity from the matter under investigation, they do not always reach their results through demonstrative methods. For example, when [from] the fact that the exterior angle of a triangle is equal to the two opposite interior angles it is shown that the sum of the interior angles of a triangle is equal to two right angles, how can this be called a demonstration based on the cause? Is not the middle term used here only as a sign? For even though there be no exterior angle, the interior angles are equal to two right angles; for it is a triangle even if its side is not extended. (Proclus 1970, 161–2)

In addition, Proclus also held that proofs by contradiction were not demonstrations “of the reasoned fact”. The rediscovery of Proclus in the Renaissance was to spark a far-reaching debate on the causality of mathematical demonstrations referred to above as the Quaestio de Certitudine Mathematicarum (see section 1.1 for more on this debate). The first shot was fired by Alessandro Piccolomini in 1547. Piccolomini’s aim was to disarm a traditional claim to the effect that mathematics derives its certainty on account of its use of “scientific demonstrations” in the Aristotelean sense (such proofs were known as “potissimae” in the Renaissance). Since “potissimae” demonstrations had to be causal, Piccolomini attacked the argument by arguing that mathematical demonstrations are not causal. This led to one of the most interesting epistemological debates of the Renaissance and the seventeenth century. Those denying the “causality” of mathematical demonstrations (Piccolomini, Pereyra, Gassendi etc.) argued by providing specific examples of demonstrations from mathematical practice (usually from Euclid’s Elements) which, they claimed, could not be reconstructed as causal reasonings in the Aristotelian sense. By contrast, those hoping to restore “causality” to mathematics aimed at showing that the alleged counterexamples could easily be accommodated within the realm of “causal” demonstrations (Clavius, Barrow, etc.). Interestingly, both positions in the debate assumed that mathematical proofs could be syllogized (Mancosu & Mugnai 2023). The historical developments have been presented in detail in Mancosu 1996 and Mancosu 2000.

What is more important here is to appreciate that the basic intuition – the contraposition between explanatory and non-explanatory demonstrations – had a long and successful history that has influenced both mathematical and philosophical developments well beyond the seventeenth century. For instance, Mancosu 1999 shows that Bolzano and Cournot, two major philosophers of mathematics in the nineteenth century, construe the central problem of philosophy of mathematics as that of accounting for the distinction between explanatory and non-explanatory demonstrations. In the case of Bolzano this takes the form of a theory of Grund (ground) and Folge (consequence). Kitcher 1975 was the first to read Bolzano as propounding a theory of mathematical explanations (see Betti 2010 and Roski 2017 for recent contributions). In the case of Cournot this is spelled out in terms of the opposition between “ordre logique” and “ordre rationelle” (see Cournot 1851). In Bolzano’s case, the aim of providing a reconstruction of parts of analysis and geometry, so that the exposition would use only “explanatory” proofs, also led to major mathematical results, such as his purely analytic proof of the intermediate value theorem.

In conclusion to this section, we should also point out that there is another tradition of thinking of explanation in mathematics that includes Mill, Lakatos, Russell and Gödel. These authors are motivated by a conception of mathematics (and/or its foundations) as hypothetico-deductive in nature and this leads them to construe mathematical activity in analogy with how explanatory hypotheses occur in science (see Mancosu 2001 for more details). Related to inductivism are Cellucci 2008, 2017, which emphasize the connection between mathematical explanation and discovery.

2.2 Models of mathematical explanation

From the above, it should be obvious that both philosophers and mathematicians have appealed to the notion of explanation within mathematics and that amongst the different contexts in which such explanatory activity appears, proofs play a special role. But what distinguishes a proof that explains from one that doesn’t? How should one proceed in providing an account of explanatory proofs? It is here that two possibilities emerge. On the one hand, one can follow a top-down approach where one starts with a general model of explanatory proof and then tries to see how well it accounts for the practice. On the other hand, one can embrace a bottom-up approach where one begins by avoiding, as much as possible, any commitment to a particular theoretical framework. Only afterwards, one attempts to provide a taxonomy of recurrent types of mathematical explanatory proofs and tries to see whether these patterns are heterogeneous or can be subsumed under a general account.

Supporters of the bottom-up approach include Hafner and Mancosu (2005), Mancosu (2008) and Lange (2015b, 2015c, 2017, 2018b). Probably the main characteristic of their investigations is the extremely rich and varied set of examples considered; precisely in virtue of this variety, Lange argues that there is no general pattern characterizing explanatory proofs; at most one can claim that there are different classes of explanatory proofs. Lange proposes several salient features of mathematical theorems, which (in different contexts) are responsible (in those contexts) for the distinction between explanatory and non-explanatory proofs. Among them, he discusses extensively symmetry and simplicity. As for simplicity, it amounts to the requirement for a proof of a simple result “exploits some similar, simple feature of the setup” (see Lange 2017, 257). As for symmetry, it is a property that arises when dealing with mathematical results that display some striking symmetry: for the proof to count as explanatory, it needs to show how such symmetry follows from a similar symmetry in the set-up of the problem. Lange defends these properties by using cases studies drawn from probability, real analysis, number theory, complex numbers and geometry, among other areas of mathematics. One of the most representative (see Lange 2017, 239–242) is the proof of d’Alembert’s theorem to the effect that in a polynomial equation of n-th degree in the variable x and having only real coefficients, the nonreal roots always come in pairs (any non-real root and its complex conjugate will both satisfy the equation). What explains this symmetry? A non-explanatory proof can be given by algebraic manipulations but this does not reveal the reason for the result which, according to Lange, is the fact that the axioms of complex arithmetic are invariant under substitution of i for -i. Bueno and Vivanco (2019) points out that it is unclear why what Lange isolates as the symmetric feature of the proof (which makes it explanatory) is a symmetry at all. They suggest that this proof turns on an appropriate feature of the relevant structure.

Other instances of the bottom-up approach may be found in Paseau (2010), Arana & Mancosu (2012), Colyvan, Cusberg & McQueen (2018), D’Alessandro (2021) and Ryan (2021). Each article considers an aspect of mathematical practice and tries to address it on its own terms.

Top-down approaches take their start from a general theory of mathematical explanation and then explore how well the practice fits the model. A typical example of a top-down approach in mathematical explanation is Kitcher’s unificationist theory, to be discussed below. But one can also apply this description to overarching views on the nature of explanation. While there are several examples one could mention, here we present an influential proposal that finds its origin in Kim (1994). In order to classify the different accounts of scientific explanation Kim uses the contraposition between ‘explanatory internalism’ and ‘explanatory externalism.’ Whereas for ‘explanatory internalism’ explanations are activities internal to an epistemic corpus (a theory or set of beliefs), an ‘explanatory externalist’ will look for some systematic pattern of objective dependence relations which explanations track or can be identified with. We divide the present section in two subsections that follow this division: one will be dedicated to the presentation of the externalist, or ontic, accounts of explanatory mathematical proofs, while the other to the internalist, or epistemic, ones. Among the externalist accounts, we will discuss Steiner’s theory, several counterfactual theories of mathematical explanation, and some other proposals. Among internalist accounts we will discuss Kitcher’s theory, together with two novel ones proposed by Frans (2021) and Inglis & Mejía-Ramos (2019).

2.2.1 Externalist models of mathematical explanation

Amongst the several existing contemporary externalist models of explanatory proofs, the oldest and probably most well-known is Steiner’s account. Steiner aims at finding criteria that could characterize explanatory proofs. After having discussed several possible criteria, such as abstractness, generality, and visualizability, Steiner rejects them all in favor of the idea that “to explain the behavior of an entity, one deduces the behavior from the essence or nature of the entity” (Steiner 1978a, 143). Although such an idea could seem prima facie intuitive and interesting, it turns out to be quite problematic. First, it leads to the notorious difficulties linked to the concepts of essence or essential property; moreover, such concepts risk having little traction in a mathematical context since all mathematical truths are regarded as necessary. Hence, instead of talking of “essence,” Steiner speaks of “characterizing properties” by which he means “a property unique to a given entity or structure within a family or domain of such entities or structures,” where he takes the notion of a family as undefined. In other words, for Steiner the difference between explanatory and non-explanatory proofs lies in the characterizing properties, which are found only in the former but not by the latter. However, this is not all: an explanatory proof needs to be generalizable as well. Varying the relevant feature (and hence a certain characterizing property) in such a proof needs to give rise to an array of corresponding theorems, which are proved – and explained – by an array of “deformations” of the original proof.

There have been two extensive critical discussions of Steiner’s account. The first was provided by Resnik and Kushner (1987) who argued that the distinction between explanatory and non-explanatory proofs is context-dependent. The second, which also offers a counterexample to the theory based on a case of explanation from real analysis recognized as such in mathematical practice, has been developed by Hafner and Mancosu (2005). There have also been attempts to improve Steiner’s model. The work developed by Weber and Verhoeven (2002) can for example be seen as an attempt to improve Steiner’s notion of deformation. Indeed, while Steiner suggests that explanation concerns an array of related proofs and theorems, although maintaining that each proof is an explanation of the individual theorem, Weber and Verhoeven (2002) start with what makes pairs of proofs – P1 and P2 – count as explanatory. In particular, they focus on explaining why, while a certain class of object \(x\) has a property \(Q\) (proof P1), another class of objects \(y\) enjoys property Q’ (proof P2). Here P1 and P2 use the same axioms and the same logical rules, but while P1 uses a characterizing property of \(x\), but not of \(y\), P2 uses a characterizing property of \(y\), but not of \(x\). A final attempt to enrich Steiner’s account is proposed by Salverda (2017) who tries to adapt this approach to an internalist perspective on explanations of the sort discussed in section 2.2.2.

In the field of causal explanations, a dominant perspective has been formulated in counterfactual terms. Although there has long been a resistance in the use of counterfactuals to account for explanations in mathematics (see Lange 2017, 88, 2022), many authors adopt this approach, perhaps due to the attractiveness of a unified theory of explanation that promises to hold in both causal and non-causal contexts.

According to a counterfactual account, the evaluation of whether a mathematical fact \(F\) explains another mathematical fact \(G\) boils down to the evaluation of the following two counterfactuals:

if \(F\) had not been the case, \(G\) would not have been the case,
if \(G\) had not been the case, \(F\) would not have been the case.

The first counterfactual, CF1, needs to be true: it directly accounts for the explanatory power of the relation between \(F\) and \(G\). By contrast, the second counterfactual, CF2, needs to be false since it serves to ensure that the relation between \(F\) and \(G\) is asymmetric, i.e., it shows that it is not the case that \(G\) explains \(F\).

Once the counterfactuals are specified, a theory for counterfactuals needs to make clear what truth-conditional account of counterfactuals is adopted. Here (at least) two options naturally emerge. On the one hand, one can evaluate a counterfactual using possible worlds semantics; for example, Lewis’s closeness-based semantics, which trivializes for mathematical counterfactuals (see Lewis 1973, and Stalnaker 1968), has recently been extended to avoid these trivialities (see for example Nolan 2001 and Priest 2002). This extension, which considers both possible and impossible words, can be used to evaluate the truth value of counterfactuals CF1 and CF2. On the other hand, one can also try to adapt the standard tools of structural equation modelling (see Pearl 2000) to evaluate the truth value of CF1 and CF2. In this case, one interprets mathematical facts as variables which can either take the value 1 or the value 0, according to whether the propositions they represent are either true or false. While the variable that denotes \(F\) is an exogenous variable – its values are determined by factors outside the model – the variable that denotes \(G\) is endogenous – its values are determined by the value of other variable(s), in our case \(F\). In order to test whether the counterfactual CF1 is true, one needs to intervene on the value of the variable assigned to \(F\) and check whether this change affects the value of the variable assigned to \(G\). As for the truth value of CF2, its falsity, and thus the asymmetry required by the explanatory relation, is built into the nature of endogenous variable.

Both Reutlinger et al. (2022) and Baron et al. (2020) support a counterfactual theory of explanation that is mainly discussed in the possible worlds’ semantics framework. More precisely, while Reutlinger et al. defends the value of a monist theory of explanation, Baron et al. (2020) exemplify the counterfactual approach to mathematical explanations with a real case of explanatory proof.

Gijsbers (2017) develops a counterfactual account of explanatory proofs which relies on the structural equation framework, but where the notion of “intervention” à la Woodward (2003), cannot be employed in the mathematical context. As Woodward emphasizes, an intervention is a causal change to the value of a variable. Instead Gijsbers introduces the idea of a “quasi-interventionist” theory of mathematical explanation: in this theory, quasi-interventions reveal asymmetries which are inherent not in the mathematical proofs, but in the mathematical practice (see Gijsbers, 2017, 59). In other words, asymmetries are no longer accounted for in an objective, but rather in a more subjective way that is tied to the features of the practice in question.

In a sense Gijsbers’ model is complementary to the one proposed by Frans and Weber (2014). Indeed, while Gijsbers accounts for the explanatory power of proofs in counterfactual terms, without using the notion of intervention, Frans and Weber account for the explanatory power of proofs with a mechanistic model of explanation that directly generalizes on Woodward’s notion of an intervention.

The use of counterfactuals to model mathematical explanations has been criticized by Kasirzadeh (2021) and Lange (2022). While Kasirzadeh questions whether the explanans of an explanatory proof can be meaningfully varied in a mathematical context, as the counterfactual accounts would require, Lange argues instead that the counterfactual account is rather threatened by the existence of too many non-trivially true countermathematicals. Both Kasirzadeh and Lange emphasize that the capacity to answer what-if-things-had-been-different questions does not correlate with explanatory power in mathematics. Finally, note that also in Jansson (2018) one might find criticisms on the use of the structural equations’ framework to model dependence relations other than causation, and thus arguably also dependence relations in a mathematical context.

Not all externalist models for mathematical explanations are modifications of Steiner’s theory or conveyed in counterfactual terms. Pincock (2015b) for example proposes to classify a proof as explanatory when it invokes more abstract kind of entities than the topic of the theorem it proves. Wilhelm (2021) and Poggiolesi (forthcoming) contain different proposals for the analysis of explanatory proofs that are similar in perspective to Pincock’s approach. In their cases the determination of the explanatory power of different proofs requires a formalization of the proofs in logical systems. While for Wilhelm the explanatory power of a proof comes from the balance between the simplicity and the depth of the formalized proof, Poggiolesi distinguishes an explanatory proof from a non-explanatory one in that only in the (formalized version of the) former one can witness an increase of conceptual complexity from the assumptions to the theorem the proof aims to establish.

2.2.2 Internalist models of mathematical explanation

In a paper of 1974, Friedman posed a challenge for any coherent account of scientific, and thus presumably also mathematical, explanation: he argued that any such account needed to show how explanation generates understanding. “I don’t see how the philosopher of science can afford to ignore such concepts as ‘understanding’ and ‘intelligibility’ when giving a theory of the explanation relation” (Friedman 1974, 8). While externalist, or ontic, accounts do not directly concern themselves with Friedman’s challenge, they do not deny the link between explanation and understanding. However, they simply do not pose understanding as a defining characteristic of explanation. By contrast, internalist, or epistemic, accounts are those which directly address this challenge.

In the philosophy of science, one of the main conceptions of scientific understanding is the unificationist model which argues that explanations provide understanding by unifying different phenomena. Although the idea is undoubtedly intuitively appealing, the key question is whether the notion of unification can be made more precise so that we can distinguish between what an explanation is and what is not. Friedman (1974) is an early attempt to do this, although his formulation was quickly shown to suffer from several technical problems (see Kitcher 1976). Kitcher is, on the other hand, the main supporter of the unificationist approach. His proposal consists in looking at unification as the reduction of the number of argument patterns used in providing explanations while being as comprehensive as possible in the number of phenomena explained:

Understanding the phenomena is not simply a matter of reducing the “fundamental incomprehensibilities” but of seeing connections, common patterns, in what initially appeared to be different situations. Here the switch in conception from premise conclusion pairs to derivations proves vital. Science advances our understanding of nature by showing us how to derive descriptions of many phenomena, using the same patterns of derivation again and again, and, in demonstrating this, it teaches us how to reduce the number of types of facts that we have to accept as ultimate (or brute). So the criterion of unification I shall try to articulate will be based on the idea that E(K) is a set of derivations that makes the best tradeoff between minimizing the number of patterns of derivation employed and maximizing the number of conclusions generated. (Kitcher 1989, 432)

Let us make this a little bit more formal. Let us start with a set K of beliefs assumed to be consistent and deductively closed (informally one can think of this as a set of statements endorsed by an ideal scientific community at a specific moment in time; Kitcher 1981, 75). A systematization of K is any set of arguments that derive some sentences in K from other sentences of K. The explanatory store over K, E(K), is the best systematization of K (Kitcher here makes an idealization by claiming that E(K) is unique). Corresponding to different systematizations we have different degrees of unification. The highest degree of unification is that given by E(K). But according to what criteria can a systematization be judged to be the best? There are three factors: the number of patterns, the stringency of the patterns, and the set of consequences derivable from the unification.

Two remarks are in order when it comes to Kitcher’s proposal. First, his account of theoretical unification is mainly thought of for the general question of scientific explanation, although he sees as one of the virtues of his viewpoint to be extendable to mathematics as well. Secondly, Kitcher’s model is not meant to address the local question of what distinguishes an explanatory proof from one that does not explain (as all other accounts do); it rather provides a novel perspective on the global question of how to systemize a whole body of knowledge that has explanatory value. The application of Kitcher’s model to explanatory proofs has been explored in two opposite directions. On the one hand, Hafner and Mancosu (2008) tested Kitcher’s model with three different methods to prove theorems about real closed fields (see Brumfiel 1979); the authors showed that the model makes predictions about the explanatory power of these methods which contradicts judgments coming from the mathematical practice (See also Pincock 2015b). On the other hand, Frans (2021) not only reassesses the value of unificatory understanding, which it is a type of explanatory understanding, for mathematics; additionally, he shows through a plethora of different examples, ranging from Pythagoras’ theorem to the theorem that states that sum of the first n integers equals n(n+1)/2, that proofs can contribute to unificatory understanding.

A novel internalist account has recently been proposed by Inglis and Mejía-Ramos (2019), who apply Wilkenfeld’s functional model of understanding (see Wilkenfeld (2014)) to the mathematical case. Wilkenfield’s approach consists in reversing Friedman’s perspective: while Friedman demanded that philosophers clarify how explanations, suitably defined, generate understanding, Wilkenfield defines explanations as those things that generate understanding. By doing so, Wilkenfield moves the burden of clarification from the notion of explanation to that of understanding and how it is generated: this move he argues – has recently become tenable as philosophical accounts of understanding have become more and more sophisticated.

In Inglis & Mejía-Ramos (2019) the conception of understanding adopted is that of Kelp (2016), along with a modal model of the generation of understanding (see Atkinson and Shiffrin 1968). With these two elements at hand, Inglis & Mejía-Ramos identify three properties that any mathematical explanatory proof is likely to have: (i) an explanatory proof would direct the reader’s attention to its conceptually important section; (ii) it would reorganize the new and existing information into coherent new schema; (iii) it would reduce the chances of working memory capacity to be exceeded.

Other internalist accounts of explanatory proof have been developed by Delarivière, Frans & Kerkhove (2017), Dutilh Novaes (2018), and Lehet (2021).

3. Some connections to other debates

A number of fruitful studies have recently appeared connecting mathematical explanation to mathematical beauty, purity of methods, understanding in mathematics, mathematical style, and mathematical depth. We simply refer to one or two such background studies and encourage the reader to explore the bibliography of the studies referred to. The most extensive studies connecting mathematical beauty and explanation are Giaquinto (2016) and Lange (2016). The notion of purity of method has long been of interest to mathematicians and philosophers (see Detlefsen and Arana (2011) and Arana and Mancosu (2012)). Among the most recent contributions on purity and mathematical explanation are Skow (2015), Lange (2015b), Ryan (2021) and Arana (2023). The connection between mathematical explanation and understanding has been discussed in Molinini (2011), Cellucci (2014), and Delariviére et al. (2017). For connections between mathematical depth and mathematical explanation see Lange (2015c). Moreover, theorists of style in mathematics and science have emphasized the importance of explanatory arguments for characterizing style (see Mancosu (2021) for an overview).

The issues that have shaped the debates about mathematical explanation reviewed in sections 1 and 2 also arise in ongoing debates in the philosophy of mind and moral theory. For the philosophy of mind, one puzzle is how appealing to mental properties can explain human actions even though a human is a physical entity. If non-mental, physical properties are apt to explain any physical event or pattern of physical events, then it seems that mental properties are dispensable or “epiphenomenal”. For moral theory, a series of questions arise about how moral properties relate to the presumably non-moral features of the physical world. In terms of explanation, it seems like there is no explanatory work for moral properties to do, at least with respect to physical events. However, our ordinary practices frequently appeal to these properties in putative explanations. So, as with the philosophy of mind, it seems that we must either revise our explanatory practices or else find a place for these properties in a more comprehensive conception of reality.

Kim’s exclusion argument is a prominent driver of these debates in the philosophy of mind (Kim 2005). Kim argues that the existence of mental properties requires that these properties provide some genuine contribution to the explanation of physical events. However, Kim maintains that mental properties are excluded from this contribution by the causal closure of the physical, i.e. every physical event has a purely physical explanation. One response to Kim is that the right conception of causal explanation makes space for mental properties to explain (Shapiro & Sober 2007, Woodward 2021b). The “explanatory autonomy” of the mental can thus be obtained in a way that parallels similar generalizations of causal explanation to allow for genuine mathematical explanations of physical phenomena (section 1.2). Pluralists about mathematical explanation can develop a different response to exclusion arguments: if explanations come in different kinds, then an explanation of one kind does not stand in the way of an explanation of another kind (Batterman 2021). Baker (2022) has pursued a different kind of response that compares Dennett’s intentional stance with a “mathematical stance” that enables mathematical explanations of physical phenomena.

Harman and Street have advanced explanatory challenges to moral properties that can be fruitfully compared to criticisms of the explanatory indispensability argument for mathematical platonism (Harman 1977, Street 2006). While Harman focuses on the explanation of moral observations (e.g. that some action is wrong), Street emphasizes a broader concern with explaining other phenomena such as the prevalence of some moral judgments (e.g. that murder is wrong). For both, the challenge is that the best explanation does not involve moral properties. That is, moral properties are explanatorily dispensable for the targets in question. As Sinclair and Leibowitz emphasize, this argument, and the responses to it, parallel debates about the explanatory dispensability of mathematical objects (Sinclair & Leibowitz 2016). One innovation in the debate about moral properties is Enoch’s argument that it is sufficient for moral properties to be indispensable to practical deliberation. If this non-Quinean condition for ontological commitment is granted, then it may be feasible to identify new forms of explanatory indispensability for mathematical objects. For some investigations into how such arguments may or may not extend to mathematics, see Leng (2016), Baker (2016), Enoch (2016) and Clark-Doane (2020).


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