Notes to George Herbert Mead

1. There are those who find the notion of emergence useless as a category or marker, for it appears to be in the eye of the beholder. However, Mead's qualitative or experiential pluralism, which he shares with Dewey and James, would view this criticism as failing to address genuine novelty and the “objective reality of perspectives.” See below for a discussion the latter.

2. In “Philanthropy from the Point of View of Ethics,” Mead wrote:

The sympathetic identification with the individual in distress, however, calls out in us the incipient reactions of warding off, of defense, which the distress arouses in the sufferer, and these reactions become dominant in response of the one who assists. He places himself in the service of the other. We speak of this attitude as that of unselfishness or self-effacement of the charitable individual. But even this attitude of devotion to the interest of the other is not that of obligation, though it is likely to be so considered in an ethical doctrine which makes morality synonymous with self-sacrifice. The earliest appearance of the feel of obligation is found in the appraisal of the relief to the distressed person in terms of the donor's effort and expenditure. (SW, 400) [emphasis added]

See Intelligent Philanthropy, edited by Ellsworth Faris, Ferris Laune, and Arthur J. Todd, Chicago, University of Chicago Press, 1930, 133-148. Page reference is to the reprinted edition in Selected Writings [SW]. See also Aboulafia 2010, Chapter 4.

3. For criticisms on the limitations of Mead's position with regard to the “I” and reflection, see Aboulafia 1986.

4. For the few published collections of conference papers see Corti 1972, Burke and Skowroñski 2013, and Joas and Huebner 2016.

5. For an exhaustive list of current research on Mead and cognitive science, see Baggio 2021.

6. What is also seldom noted is that had it not been for his untimely death in April of 1931, Mead was to again follow Dewey, securing a teaching position at Columbia University for the 1931-1932 academic year (Cook 1993, 191-193).

7. It is important to note this is also one of the first book-length studies on Mead’s philosophy in general. See also Renger 1980 for a discussion of the importance of Mead’s contributions to philosophy of education.

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