Medieval Theories of Haecceity
First proposed by John Duns Scotus (1266–1308), a haecceity is a non-qualitative property responsible for a substance’s individuation and identity. As understood by Scotus, a haecceity is not a bare particular underlying qualities. It is, rather, a non-qualitative property of a substance or thing: it is a “thisness” (a haecceitas, from the Latin haec, meaning “this”) as opposed to a “whatness” (a quidditas, from the Latin quid, meaning “what”) – akin to what are sometimes known in recent philosophy as “suchnesses.” The origins of the proposal have both philosophical and theological components. In 1277, the Bishop of Paris, Stephen Tempier, condemned the view that there could not be more than one angel in a given species. The condemned view was held by Christian Aristotelians in the thirteenth century – pre-eminently, Thomas Aquinas – and originated in the claim that intra-specific individuation is in some sense through different lumps of matter. As immaterial substances, angels cannot be individuated in this way. And in any case, as immaterial and non-spatial, angels seem to be good candidates for possibly lacking any kind of qualitative difference. Hence, as it is possible that two angels be exact replicas of each other, angels are good cases for testing intuitions related to the identity of indiscernibles, and thus the question of individuation.
- 1. Individuation and the identity of indiscernibles
- 2. Common natures
- 3. Haecceity in Duns Scotus
- 4. Later medieval and early modern accounts of haecceities
- 5. Rejecting haecceities
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1. Individuation and the identity of indiscernibles
The possible existence of such non-qualitative properties as explanations of numerical distinction between substances can perhaps be made plausible by considering a modern equivalent to the medieval thought-experiment about angels, namely, the famous counterexample to the identity of indiscernibles suggested by Max Black. A wants to defend the principle, and B attack it, and B does so by proposing the following case:
Isn’t it logically possible that the universe should have contained nothing but two exactly similar spheres? We might suppose that each was made of chemically pure iron, had a diameter of one mile, that they had the same temperature, colour, and so on, and that nothing else existed. Then every quality and relational characteristic of the one would also be a property of the other. Now if what I am describing is logically possible, it is not impossible for two things to have all their properties in common. This seems to me to refute the principle. (Black , 156)
Clearly, if the identity of indiscernibles is understood – as Leibniz intended – to assert that any two individuals must differ in some qualitative or relational way, B’s counterexample seems sufficient to refute it. But it seems that there is an easy answer available to A. For A could assert that the two spheres differ in some property or constituent that is neither qualitative nor relational: they could differ by haecceity. This leaves intact a trivial reading of Leibniz (that if individual x is distinct from individual y, then there must be some property had by x and not by y, or vice versa), and thus an apparently true version of the principle secure. Haecceities may not be the only way to preserve the principle against B’s counterexample. But the solution gives some prima facie plausibility to the possibility of haecceities. After all, if haecceities are required at least in cases of exact replicas, then it seems hard to resist the conclusion that they are responsible for individuation, period.
Here I assume, with Scotus, that a haecceity is a constituent of the item it individuates. I will return later on to theories that make the individuation of particulars primitive. Scotus believes that the haecceity must be a constituent, and the reason is that he grants some kind of reality to universals too (common natures, in the technical medieval parlance) – and that the reality of a common nature requires the reality of the haecceity, and that both be constituents of the particular. So, haecceities are bare particulars, but they are not supposed to underlie properties. Some medieval Aristotelians hold that matter, construed as a substrate for forms and properties, individuates; and it would be possible to hold that the individuation of a substance is explained by some bare particular that underlies properties. Scotus rejects the view that matter could be responsible for individuation, on the grounds that we require too an explanation for the individuation of (chunks of) matter (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, qq. 5–6, n. 187 (Scotus [OO], 7:483; Spade (1994), 106–107)). Neither would Scotus have been able to make any sense of a bare particular in the sense of a bare possessor of qualities, a view that would doubtless have struck him as inconsistent with essentialism (on this, see Park ). Given that the argument for the reality of haecceities (as constituents of particulars) rests on the reality of common natures, we have first to provide an explanation of Scotus’s theory of common natures, followed, in a third section, by a description of the theory of haecceity and the relation of these two theories to each other.
2. Common natures
Building on insights gained through the thirteenth century, Scotus distinguishes two closely related issues in individuation: explaining how a particular is such that it cannot be instantiated (explaining its individuality, its “indivisibility in itself”), and explaining how a particular is such that it is distinct from other particulars (explaining its “division from others”; on this see Park ). The first of these is on the face of it the more complex issue. For various historical reasons, medieval realists tend to suppose that common (shared) natures or essences are somehow divided into their instantiations – as Scotus puts it, divided into “subjective parts.” It is not easy to explain precisely what this divisibility amounts to. Explaining both divisibility and its opposite, Scotus states the problem of individuation as follows:
Because there is among beings something indivisible into subjective parts – that is, such that it is formally incompatible for it to be divided into several parts each of which is it – the question is not what it is by which such a division is formally incompatible with it (because it is formally incompatible by incompatibility), but rather what it is by which, as by a proximate and intrinsic foundation, this incompatibility is in it. Therefore, the sense of the questions on this topic [viz. of individuation] is: What is it in [e.g.] this stone, by which as by a proximate foundation it is absolutely incompatible with the stone for it to be divided into several parts each of which is this stone, the kind of division that is proper to a universal whole as divided into its subjective parts? (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1. q. 2, n. 48 (Scotus [OO], 7:412–413; Spade (1994), 69))
I have italicized the relevant portions here. A common nature is “divided into several parts each of which is it.” As Scotus sees it, individuality and numerical unity or singularity are co-extensive. As something that is divisible in the required way, it follows that the nature is not of itself numerically one thing: it has “less-than-numerical” unity:
In the thing [viz. in extramental reality] the nature according to [its primary] entity has true real being outside the soul. And according to that entity, it has a unity [viz. less than numerical unity] in proportion to it… . That unity is a proper attribute of the nature according to its primary entity. Consequently, the nature is intrinsically this neither from itself nor according to its proper unity, which is necessarily included in the nature according to its primary entity. (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 1, n. 34 (Scotus [OO], 7:404–405; Spade (1994), 64–65))
The basic thought is that a common nature cannot be numerically singular – if it were, it would be a particular, and the distinction between the common and the particular would simply break down. But it must have some kind of unity, since it has some kind of being or reality. The result of the relevant kind of division is that in some sense the whole common nature is in each instantiation of it. But the whole common nature is not to be understood to be identically (numerically) the same in each instantiation, as Scotus makes clear elsewhere, and as in any case we might expect, given the part-whole language that Scotus uses in the passage just quoted. It seems as though there are both intensional and extensional aspects to the nature: intensionally, it is fully in each instantiation, but extensionally the nature somehow becomes many on instantiation. (Not just: comes to exist in many things, unless this be construed to mean that the nature becomes many when it comes to exist in many things.) At least from an extensional point of view, there is more to humanity than just what is found in me. Another way of thinking about the relevant relation might be to think of natures as in some sense ‘content,’ and each individual as the ‘carrier’ of this content. The nature, as far as its content is concerned, is fully in each carrier of the content, but is multiplied in its carriers (such that each carrier bears fully the same content, and so the same content becomes many in its carriers, just as the content of a book is multiplied in its several copies).
Why should we accept this sort of account of common natures? Scotus defends it in the context of a rejection of a theory according to which the singularity of a nature requires no explanation other than the nature itself. The theory is in principle capable of development in one of two different directions, and Scotus seems to regard it as a matter of indifference which of these two directions his opponent has in mind. One direction is nominalist: there could be individual natures (of the same kind), and each such nature be of itself particular. The other is extreme realist: there could be indivisible Platonic universals, and each such universal be of itself numerically singular. As Scotus sees it, the only way to explain both instantiability and commonality of kind is to posit the existence of entities (viz. natures) that are divisible. It is the divisibility of the nature that allows its instantiability, and the unity of the nature that explains commonality of kind. Platonism lacks instantiability, and nominalism lacks an explanation for commonality of kind. Scotus makes the crucial claim about natures as follows:
Anything with a real, proper, and sufficient unity less than numerical is not of itself one by numerical unity – that is, it is not of itself a this. But the proper, real or sufficient unity of the nature existing in this stone is less than numerical unity. Therefore [the nature existing in this stone is not of itself one by numerical unity]. (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 2, p. 1, q. 1, n. 8 (Scotus [OO], 7:395; Spade (1994), 59))
Here the premises speak of Scotus’s “less than numerical unity,” the unity of something that is divisible into numerically many subjective parts. Scotus provides a total of seven arguments in favor of the minor premise – in favor, in other words, of the position that there is something with less-than-numerical unity. Four of these appeal to Aristotelian authority, and of these the third is most interesting:
According to the Philosopher, Metaphysics V, the chapter on relation [c. 15, 1021a9–12], the same, the similar and the equal are all based on the notion of one, so that even though a similarity has for its foundation a thing in the genus of quality, nevertheless such a relation is not real unless it has a real foundation and a real proximate basis for the founding. Therefore, the unity required in the foundation of the relation of similarity is a real one. But it is not numerical unity, since nothing one and the same is similar or equal to itself. (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 1, n. 18 (Scotus [OO], 7:398; Spade (1994), 61))
The point is that relations of similarity between two particulars cannot be self-explanatory; they must have some explanation (some “real foundation”) in the things that are similar. This is amongst other things an argument against resemblance nominalism. But it is also supposed to be an argument against the view that a common nature could be numerically identical in each instantiation. As Paul Vincent Spade helpfully comments in loc. (ftnt. 8), “for mediaeval authors … a thing x is not (qualitatively) similar to itself … but just has a quality.” Similarity between different instances of the same kind requires that they have less-than-numerical unity.
Of the arguments from reason (rather than from the authority of Aristotle), one particularly focuses on a claim with which Ockham will, a few years later, sharply disagree:
If every real unity is numerical unity, then every real diversity is numerical diversity. The consequent is false. For every numerical diversity, in so far as it is numerical, is equal. And so all things would be equally distinct. In that case, it follows that the intellect could not abstract something common from Socrates and Plato any more than it could from Socrates and a line. Every universal would be a pure figment of the intellect. (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 1, n. 23 (Scotus [OO], 7:400–401; Spade (1994), 62))
The obvious claim here is supposed to be that not all real diversity is numerical, and Scotus supports it by arguing that, if the only way in which things differed were numerical, then all things would be equally distinct. But there are degrees of diversity: Socrates and Plato are not distinguished in species, for example. Unity and diversity here are inter-definable contradictories, so it is not the case that every real unity is numerical unity.
The reason that the common nature has some kind of entity is that the nature is supposed to be subject to the accidental modification of existing as this or that particular, and it is not possible for the subject of a real modification not itself to be real:
Although it [viz. the nature] is never without some of these features [viz. being in extramental particulars or being thought of], yet it is not any of them of itself, but is naturally prior to all of them. (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 1, n. 32 (Scotus [OO], 7:403; Spade (1994), 63))
So in order to possess in itself this non-numerical unity, the nature must have, in itself, some sort of being too, proportional to it (such that the real entity of the nature is diminished in proportion to the diminished real unity that it has). Scotus does not mean that the nature is some sort of universal ante rem; if there were no instantiations, there would be no nature, but once there are instantiations there is too some subject for instantiation (the nature), and this subject has some sort of being in itself. Indeed, this subject is in some sense prior (but not temporally prior) to its instantiations: while the identity of its instantiations depends on it, its identity does not depend on those of its instantiations. (It makes no difference to the identity of human nature whether or not I exist, though the reality of human nature certainly requires that at least one human being exist: see Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 1, n. 34 (Scotus [OO], 7:404; Spade (1994), 64).) As instantiated, the nature receives the (accidental) modification of being numerically many in numerically many things.
Much of the account of common natures can be found in nuce in Aquinas’s De ente et essentia. But Scotus’s account is usually thought to diverge from Aquinas’s in at least one crucial way. According to both Scotus and Aquinas – following some suggestions in Avicenna – it is possible to consider a nature in itself, abstracting both from its existence as a universal concept and as the particulars into which it is divided. (Hence Avicenna’s famous slogan “equinity is just equinity”: Avicenna, Liber de scientia divina, V, c. 1 (Avicenna [LPP], 2:228–229).) Aquinas is clear that this bare nature lacks numerical unity (see Aquinas, De ente et essentia, c. 3 (Aquinas [DEE], 24–25)), and it seems that it lacks any kind of entity too. So where Scotus ascribes to the nature a kind of entity, and unity short of numerical unity, Aquinas does neither. It is perhaps worth noting, in passing, that a plausible case can be made for tracing this moderate sort of realism on the question of universals to the Aristotelian tradition (specifically, Alexander of Aphrodisias: see Tweedale ). One might also argue, as his famous commentator Cajetan did, that Aquinas would be willing to attribute some sort of unity and proportionally some sort of being to the absolutely considered nature. For Cajetan’s exposition of the issue, carefully distinguishing Aquinas’s from Scotus’s position, and for useful references to both authors, see Cajetan [CBE], c. 4 (nn. 55–62), pp. 134–155. Scotus, while clearly in this same tradition, evidently considers the sort of account found in Aquinas to be insufficient, and thus is more clearly to be placed in the realist camp than Aquinas on this question. Far from holding that the nature in itself lacks any kind of reality, Scotus holds that the primary reality of the nature belongs to the nature in itself.
3. Haecceity in Duns Scotus
Common natures have non-numerical unity, and are thus in the relevant sense divisible. As Scotus sees it, the fundamental issue to be explained by haecceity is that of indivisibility: what is it about individuals that makes them indivisible into subjective parts, in contrast to the divisibility of the common nature:
I explain what I understand by individuation or numerical unity or singularity: Certainly not the indeterminate unity by which anything in a species is said to be one in number. Rather, I mean designated unity as a this, so that just as it was said above that an individual is incompossible with being divided into subjective parts and the reason for that incompossibility is asked there, so too I say here that an individual is incompossible with not being a designated this by this singularity and the cause is asked not of singularity in general but of this designated singularity in particular – that is, as it is determinately this. (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 4, n. 76 (Scotus [OO], 7:426–427; Spade (1994), 76); see too q. 2, n. 48 [Scotus (1950–), 7:412–413]; qq. 5–6, n. 165 (Scotus [OO], 7:473))
The point is not just that an account of numerical singularity in general is required (the “indeterminate unity by which anything in a species is said to be one in number”). What is required, rather, is an account of the individuality of any given particular, and this account will explain its being indivisible into subjective parts. (Scotus does not use the term ‘haecceity’ [haecceitas] in the work that I am using here – the Ordinatio. He talks rather about the individual difference, or individual entity. But he does elsewhere talk about this entity as a haecceitas [a term of Scotus’s own invention]: for the change in terminology, see Dumont ).
Divisibility into subjective parts, of course, is on the face of it very different from the question of division from all other things, so nicely exemplified in Black’s example of the qualitatively identical spheres. Scotus’s assumption, however, is that both questions can be answered in the same way. Thus Scotus supposes that the explanation for distinction is the explanation for indivisibility, and the rough outline of what he is thinking looks as follows. The explanation for distinction is primary, in the sense that what distinction needs is explanation by items (haecceities) that are irreducibly numerically distinct from each other – as Scotus puts it, “primarily diverse” (primo diversa) – and have nothing real whatever in common: “they agree in nothing the same” (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, qq. 5–6, n. 186 (Scotus [OO], 7:483; Spade (1994), 106)). (This does not entail that the things thus distinguished, as opposed to the haecceities that distinguish these things, have nothing whatever in common. Scotus’s point is that the haecceity is needed as a constituent of a being that shares its nature with something else in the manner described in the previous section.) According to Scotus, merely numerical distinction – as opposed to (say) specific distinction – entails that each of the things distinguished has numerical singularity. And numerical singularity entails indivisibility (into subjective parts), for what allows a common nature to be divided (into subjective parts) is its possession of less-than-numerical unity.
The claim that the explanations for indivisibility and distinction are the same gains some plausibility from an analogy with the distinction between different specific differences in relation to a genus – an analogue that Scotus evidently regards as less controversial, and more familiar to his readers. A specific difference distinguishes two different species of a genus from each other. A specific difference is something indivisible in such a way that is explanatory of a species’s indivisibility into further species (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, qq. 5–6, n. 177 (Scotus [OO], 7:478; Spade (1994), 103–104)). Equally, an ultimate specific difference is “primarily diverse” from any other, in the sense that such a specific difference “has a concept that is absolutely simple” (and thus cannot even overlap with the concept of any other such difference) (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, qq. 5–6, n. 183 (Scotus [OO], 7:481; Spade (1994), 105)). It does not seem overly puzzling that a specific difference could perform these two functions: the absolute conceptual simplicity of any ultimate specific difference seems to entail both distinction from every other specific difference, and its possessing the relevant sort of indivisibility. And Scotus believes that these sorts of consideration can help explicate the function of a haecceity relative to individuation too. That is to say, he believes that something wholly devoid of common (shared) content – a haecceity – can explain not only indivisibility into further particulars, but also distinction from all other particulars (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, qq. 5–6, n. 177 (Scotus [OO], 7:478; Spade (1994), 103–104); n. 183 (Scotus [OO], 7:481; Spade (1994), 105)).
So Scotus holds that the explanations for indivisibility and distinction are the same. To understand why he supposes that this explanation needs to be something real, we need to keep in mind his account of the reality of common natures, outlined in the previous section, for the reality of common natures is a premise in Scotus’s defense of the existence of haecceities. Since such natures are real, Scotus reasons, the haecceities that tie such natures to individuals must be equally real too:
Just as unity in common follows per se on some entity in common, so too does any unity follow per se on some entity or other. Therefore, absolute unity (like the unity of an individual … that is, a unity with which division into several subjective parts is incompatible and with which not being a designated this is incompatible), if it is found in beings (as every theory assumes), follows per se on some per se entity. But it does not follow per se on the entity of the nature, because that has a certain per se real unity of its own, as was proved…. Therefore, it follows on some other entity that determines this one. And that other entity makes up something per se one with the entity of the nature, because the whole to which this unity belongs is perfect of itself. (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, qq. 5–6, n. 169 (Scotus [OO], 7:474–475; Spade (1994), 101))
And later Scotus notes that it “does not seem probable” that the common nature has some kind of entity and yet that the individuating feature does not. (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, qq. 5–6, n. 178 (Scotus [OO], 7:478–479; Spade (1994), 104))
Scotus elsewhere considers the view of Henry of Ghent that the explanation for individuation could be merely a negation. The point about a negation is that it is not in any way real: it is not a thing, or a real form or property of a thing. As Scotus sees it, claiming that individuation could be by a negation is just a way of restating the problem, not of proposing an explanatory solution to it (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 2, n. 49 (Scotus [OO], 7:413; Spade (1994), 69)). In fact, Scotus takes himself to have not merely an explanation for individuation, but also an explanation for identity. The contrast with modern accounts of haecceities is thus quite sharp. In much modern literature, an item’s haecceity is simply the primitive property of being that item, or being identical with that item. For Scotus, the haecceity is supposed to explain that property. (See further discussion of this in section 6 below.)
Supposing that a haecceity is something real, where does it fit into the range of things that there are? Is it, for example, a form, or something else? According to Scotus, it is something like a form, and sometimes, indeed, he calls it such (while elsewhere denying the same claim: on these insignificant terminological shifts, see Dumont ). The reason is that a haecceity is clearly something like a property of a thing – hence like a form – but is at the same time wholly devoid of any correspondence to any conceptual contents. It is not at all a qualitative feature of a thing – not at all a “quidditative” feature, in the technical vocabulary. As irreducibly particular, it shares no real feature in common with any other thing. This does not mean that haecceities cannot fall under the extension of a concept. Being an individuating feature is not a real property of a haecceity (it cannot be, since any haecceity is wholly simple, and shares no real features with any other thing); but any concept of what a haecceity is certainly includes among its components being an individuating feature. A concept of a haecceity includes representations merely of logical, not real, features of any haecceity.
Scotus’s position on the reality of both the nature and the haecceity seems to raise a number of problems. Perhaps the most acute – a problem which Scotus himself raises – is this:
If there is some real unity less than numerical unity, it belongs to something that is either in what is numerically the same or in something else. Not in what is numerically the same, because whatever is numerically the same is numerically one. Neither is it in two, because there is nothing really one in those two. (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, qq. 5–6, n. 171 (Scotus [OO], 7:476; Spade (1994), 102))
This is what has come to be known as Ockham’s problem (see King , 51): how can the nature as instantiated retain its non-numerical unity? Scotus’s apparent solution is that the nature in itself has non-numerical unity, but that as existent in particulars it has, in each particular, numerical unity. Scotus thus – consistent with his basic insight – believes that the nature has two different sorts of extramental entity:
In the same item that is one in number there is some kind of entity from which there follows a unity less than numerical unity is. Such unity [viz. less-than-numerical] is real, and what such unity belongs to is of itself formally one by numerical unity. I grant therefore that this real unity [viz. less-than-numerical] does not belong to anything existing in two individuals, but in one. (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, qq. 5–6, n. 172 (Scotus [OO], 7:476; Spade (1994), 102))
Scotus explains his position by exploiting the analogy between a haecceity or individual difference, and a specific difference:
Color in whiteness is specifically one, but it is not so of itself or per se or primarily but only denominatively. But a specific difference is primarily one, because it is primarily incompatible with it to be divided into what are several in species. Whiteness is specifically one per se but not primarily, because it is specifically one through something intrinsic to it (for example, through the difference). So I grant that whatever is in this stone is numerically one, either primarily or per se or denominatively. Primarily, say, as that through which such a unity belongs to this composite. Per se, the stone itself, of which what is primarily one with this unity is a per se part. Only denominatively, what is potential and is perfected by the actual and is so to speak denominatively related to its actuality. (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, qq. 5–6, nn. 174–175 (Scotus [OO], 7:477–478; Spade (1994), 103))
There are three things here: the nature in the particular, the haecceity, and the particular itself. Each of these is numerically one (and thus numerically distinct from the corrrelative items in any other particular). The haecceity is ‘primarily’ numerically one, because its numerical unity is a basic feature of its. The particular is per se numerically one because it includes the component in virtue of which it is numerically one. The nature in the particular is denominatively numerically one. Denominative predication obtains in the case that the predicate is true of the subject as the result of the subject’s possession of some further, accidental, feature. Thus, qualifying the predication as “denominative” in this way does not make the predication any less real. Being accidentally numerically one is a case of being numerically one, not of being non-numerically one, and what Scotus is really trying to say is that the nature in this particular is indeed really (though accidentally) numerically one. Note that the denominative numerical singularity of the nature in the particular is still compatible with the common nature’s being numerically one in some other particular, and this is because the nature in itself (not as in this or that particular) is less-than-numerically one (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 1, n. 34 (Scotus [OO], 7:404–405; Spade (1994), 64)).
Being non-numerically one, then, is compatible with being accidentally numerically one in any one instantiation. But a problem immediately arises: is being non-numerically one compatible with being accidentally numerically many in many instantiations? On the one hand, thinking this seems a natural way of understanding the theory, given its realist character; on the other, we have just seen Scotus deny that this kind of unity belongs “to anything existing in two individuals.” Perhaps we should say that the nature is really in many individuals, but does not “exist” in many individuals, since existence is precisely a property of concrete particulars. Elsewhere, indeed, Scotus draws an analogy with the Christian doctrine of the Trinity, according to which there is numerically one nature shared by three distinct persons (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 1, n. 39 (Scotus [OO], 7:408; Spade (1994), 44)). And this suggests, contrariwise, that just as something numerically one is in three persons, so something with less-than-numerical unity is in many individuals. Perhaps there are just no principled rules for counting items with less-than-numerical unity. (For an excellent discussion of some of these problems, see Paasch (2014).)
We run into an analogous problem with the question of the common nature’s entity. Scotus persistently refuses to reduce it to the entity of the particulars to which it belongs: as we saw in the previous section, this entity “has true real being outside the soul.” But it nevertheless somehow belongs to the entity of the particulars: as we have just seen, “Such unity [viz. less-than-numerical] is real, and what such unity belongs to is of itself formally one by numerical unity.” Setting aside the particular and the haecceity, we might wonder how many entities there are. Perhaps the entity of the common nature is nothing over and above the entity of the nature in the particular. But perhaps not. So it seems to me that it is hard to come to an assessment of the strength of Scotus’s realism, since it is hard to come to an appraisal of his view on the reality of the common nature.
I have spoken about consituents in this context: the nature in the particular and the haecceity are in effect constituents of the particular. So there must be some kind of distinction between them. This distinction cannot be real, since according to Scotus real distinction requires separability, and the features are not separable from each other any more than they are separable from themselves. Neither are they anything like discrete parts of some whole. They are, as Scotus puts it, “formally distinct”:
This individual entity is not matter or form of the composite, inasmuch as each of these is a nature. Rather, it is the ultimate reality of the being that is matter or that is form or that is the composite. Thus whatever is common and yet determinable can still be distinguished (no matter how much it is one thing) into several formally distinct realities of which this one is not formally that one. This one is formally the entity of singularity and that one is formally the entity of the nature. These two realities cannot be distinguished as thing and thing. … Rather when in the same thing, whether in a part or in the whole, they are always formally distinct realities of the same thing. (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, qq. 5–6, n. 188 (Scotus [OO], 7:483–484; Spade (1994), 107))
The formal distinction in this context is fundamentally a way of distinguishing the necessary properties of a particular substance, in cases where the natures of which the substances are instantiations are not coextensive. Given this, what sort of relation “ties” these two formally distinct components together? Scotus suggests that this relation is real (i.e. numerical) sameness, a kind of unity falling short of absolute identity (Scotus, Ordinatio I, d. 2, p. 2, qq. 1–4, n. 403 (Scotus [OO], 2:356)). This sameness is presumably something rather like the relation of compresence found in Russell and others, though unlike compresence, real sameness is not only symmetrical but also transitive (see Tweedale , 2:463–464). Scotus is able to claim transitivity for the relation of real sameness since, as we have seen, he believes that the common nature instantiated in two distinct particulars does not itself have real (i.e. numerical) identity (see Tweedale , 488). The haeeceity and the nature in the particular can thus be really the same without different concrete particulars of the same kind being really the same as each other.
What should we say about the indiscernibility of identicals in these kinds of case (real identity, formal distinction)? Haecceities explain the identity of the complete concrete objects that they compose. So complete concrete objects have self-identity. So too does each of the formalities that compose such a concrete object. But these formalities are discernible from each other. Real sameness falls short of absolute identity. (I discuss some of these issues, and others related to the varieties of distinction in Scotus, in Cross .)
Given the huge problems that an account of haecceities seems to raise, it is worth seeing just why Scotus believes he needs to accept this view of individuation as opposed to a rival one. Scotus defends haecceities by rejecting all alternative theories of individuation known to him. Rejecting qualitative theories is easy for the scholastics. Suppose that all things of a given kind in some sense share the same nature. The nature as such cannot explain individuation. So the explanation must be somehow non-essential. But non-essential qualitative or accidental features of a thing are posterior to the thing itself, since although the substance must have some accidental features, precisely which ones it has is a matter of historical chance (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 4, n. 87 (Scotus [OO], 7:432–433; Spade (1994), 79)). Things are not identical with their life-stories (on this, see Cross [1999b]). Indeed, Scotus goes so far as to suggest that the accidents of a substance – at least, its quantities, qualities, and relations – are individuated by their own haecceities, something that is not often spotted in the commentaries (on this, see Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 4, n. 89 (Scotus [OO], 7:434; Spade (1994), 79–80)). The great 17th century Scotist, John Poncius, extends this claim to cover even so-called propria, necessary but non-defining properties: paradigmatically, a capacity to smile in human beings (see Poncius, Disputatio Metaphysica VI, q. 9 [Poncius (1659), 138b]).
But this far from exhausts the options, and Scotus considers a number of non-qualitative theories too. In addition to the two theories discussed above, to the effect that things just are individuals (either through the nature itself, or through the negation of division), he considers a view according to which existence individuates, and two views according to which the explanation for individuation is matter, respectively matter as such, and matter + extension. Actual existence, perhaps a prima facie plausible non-qualitative or non-essential feature of a thing, is rejected by Scotus as an individuator on the grounds that existence as such – as opposed to the things that exist – does not seem to be different from case to case: in itself, it seems wholly undifferentiated (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 3, n. 61 (Scotus [OO], 7:418–419; Spade (1994), 72–73)). Nothing about existence seems irreducibly particular in the way required. Indeed, Scotus supposes that there is a sense in which existence is posterior to the haecceity: the whole hierarchy of division into individuals is antecedent to questions of those individuals’ existence (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q, 3, n. 65 (Scotus [OO], 7:420; Spade (1994), 73–74). But that is another story.
Perhaps the most interesting non-qualitative approach is the theory, often associated with Aquinas (but attacked by Scotus in the forms presented by Godfrey of Fontaines and Giles of Rome), that individuation is by extended matter: by, as we might say, chunks of matter. Scotus’s way of understanding the problem of individuation becomes important in his rejection of this theory. For his fundamental strategy against this sort of material individuation is that such a theory, while it may be able to explain numerical distinction, certainly cannot explain indivisibility:
Quantity is not the reason for divisibility into individuals…. For a universal whole, which is divided into individuals and into subjective parts, is predicated of each of those subjective parts in such a way that each subjective part is it. But the quantitative parts into which a continuous whole is divided never admit of the predication of the whole that is divided into them. (Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 4, n. 106 (Scotus [OO], 7:443; Spade (1994), 85))
(The ‘whole’ here is not water as such, taking ‘water’ as a mass term; it is the individual body of water, with which no proper part of the body is identical.) Scotus has other arguments too, most notably variants of the theme that the same chunk of matter (matter + extension) seems to persist through substantial change, and thus not to be sufficient as an account of individuation (see Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 4, nn. 77–81 (Scotus [OO], 7:427–429; Spade (1994), 77)). Individuation on Scotus’s view is not, fundamentally, a case of instantiating forms in matter
4. Later medieval and early modern accounts of haecceities
Acceptance of haecceities is a distinctive feature of the thought of many followers of Scotus, though there are some sixteenth-century scholastics who accept haecceities without accepting many other distinctively Scotist teachings. Having said this, some early followers of Scotus reject haecceities and the theory of the common nature altogether, and of those who accept haecceities, some found the correct understanding of the nature of the distinction between an individual’s nature and its haecceity a troublesome matter. One of the earliest Scotists, Francis of Meyronnes, writing his commentary on the Sentences around 1320, accepts the theory of the non-numerical unity of common natures (In Sent. II, d. 34, q. 3 [Francis of Meyronnes (1520), 157rbG]), and the claim that individuation is by haecceity (In Sent. II, d. 34, q. 4 [Francis of Meyronnes (1520), 157vaK-L]; I, d. 3, q. 4 [Francis of Meyronnes (1520), 18raA]). But he holds that it is inappropriate to talk of a formal distinction in this context. Formal distinction obtains only between things that have some sort of quidditative content (In Sent. I, d. 8, q. 5 [(1520), 48vbQ-49raB]). Haecceities have no such quidditative content (In Sent. I, d. 8, q. 5 [(1520), 48rbG]), and thus cannot be formally distinct from their nature. Rather, a haecceity is modally distinct from its nature (In Sent. II, d. 34, q. 3 [(1520), 157vaL]). A modal distinction, according to Meyronnes, obtains between a thing and an intrinsic mode of that thing, where an intrinsic mode is something which “when added to a thing does not vary its formal definition … since it does not of itself imply any quiddity or formal definition” (In Sent. I, d. 42, q. 3 [(1520), 120vaL; 120vbO]; see too In Sent. I, d. 8, q. 5 [(1520), 49rbE]). A haecceity does not affect a thing’s kind; it is thus an intrinsic mode of the thing.
It may look as though this is just a terminological shift, but it is not so in at least the following way: a modal distinction is a lesser kind of distinction than a formal distinction. Formal distinctions obtain between genus and specific difference; thus, the difference between species/nature and haecceity, for Meyronnes, is less than the difference between genus and difference. Scotus, contrariwise, makes no such distinction between degrees of difference in this context (for this contrast between the two thinkers, see Dumont , 18). Still, without some principled way of spelling out degrees of difference, this contrast between Scotus and Meyronnes amounts to nothing of any philosophical interest. To this extent the difference between the two thinkers might as well be merely terminological, and Meyronnes needs to do more work if he is to make any significant philosophical point here.
Amongst baroque scholastics, the most notable adherent of haecceities is the Jesuit Peter Fonseca (1528–1599), whose monumental commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics (Fonseca ) includes an extensive discussion of haecceities. (Fonseca, with something of a humanist background, worries about the barbarous nature of Scotus’s neologism, and suggests in passing that ‘haeccity’ [haeccitas] would have been a more comfortable formulation [In Met. V, c. 6, q. 5, sect. 1 (Fonseca , vol. 2, col. 381D)] – compare ‘quiddity.’) Like many of the sixteenth and seventeenth-century scholastics, Fonseca – most notable for coming up with a theory of divine “middle knowledge” at much the same time as Molina – is not a follower of any one earlier philosopher, preferring to learn from any of his predecessors on various points as he sees fit. According to Fonseca,
the principle of individuation is a certain positive difference, primarily incommunicable, which, when added to the species, in itself constitutes the individual … which difference others call haecceities. (Fonseca, In Met. V, c. 6, q. 5, sect. 1 [Fonseca (1599), vol. 2, col. 181C-D])
Fonseca engages particularly with the rejection of haecceities in the Thomist Cajetan (most notably in Cajetan’s commentary on Aquinas’s De ente, c. 2, q. 5, nn. 33–36 (Cajetan [CBE], 94–98)). Cajetan worries that haecceities need to be in some sense similar to each other – and specifically that the haecceities of Socrates and Plato must be more similar than the haecceities of Plato and some white patch (Cajetan, In de ente, c. 2, q. 5, n. 36 (Cajetan [CBE], 97); see Fonseca, In Met. V, c. 6, q. 5, sect. 2 [Fonseca (1599), vol. 2, col. 185C-D]). According to Fonseca, haecceities are similar to each other without having anything real in common: they are thus primarily diverse in the required sense, even though the haecceities of Socrates and Plato are more similar than the haecceities of Plato and some white patch (Fonseca, In Met. V, c. 6, q. 5, sect. 2 [Fonseca (1599), vol. 2, col. 185E-F]). More generally, Fonseca (rightly) holds that exact similarity between two haecceities would entail that the two haecceities were numerically identical (Fonseca, In Met. V, c. 6, q. 5, sect. 2 [Fonseca (1599), vol. 2, col. 185B]).
Fonseca is convinced of the reality of haecceities because he accepts the view that common natures have in themselves a certain sort of unity prior to instantiation. Fonseca proposes that, in order to have real existence, something needs to be added to the nature – a haecceity (Fonseca, In Met. V, c. 28, q. 3, sect. 4 [Fonseca (1599), vol. 2, col. 966A]). Again, Fonseca’s discussion is informed by the criticisms of Cajetan, though in this case the position that Cajetan adopts on the question of the unity of the common nature seems closer to the broadly Thomist and Scotist tradition than that proposed by Fonseca. In other words, Fonseca adopts an account of the common nature that seems quite distinct from the closely related views of Aquinas and Scotus. To this extent, Fonseca’s account represents an acceptance of haecceities in the context of a theory of universals that is not really Scotist. According to Cajetan, common natures in themselves have “formal” unity: indivisibility into further more specific kinds, compatible with division into numerically many instances or subjective parts (Cajetan [CBE], nn. 134–155 [nn. 55–62]; see Fonseca, In Met. V, c. 28, q. 3, sect. 4 [Fonseca (1599), vol. 2, col. 967B, D-E]). Fonseca agrees that the nature must have this formal unity – a unity that he identifies as Scotus’s less-than-numerical unity (Fonseca, In Met. V, c. 28, q. 3, sect. 4 [Fonseca (1599), vol. 2, col. 968A]). But, in addition to this unity, he holds that the nature has a proper unity of its own that cannot be communicated to its instantiations. This unity is numerical, and belongs to the nature absolutely (unqualifiedly) (Fonseca, In Met. V, c. 28, q. 3, sect. 4 [Fonseca (1599), vol. 2, col. 968A]). The reason is that, if a nature lacked such additional unity, then it would not be possible to speak of (say) humanity as just one species. After all, the formal unity of the nature is compatible with division into numerically many instances; some other unity must be the basis for the assertion that humanity is not many natures or species (Fonseca, In Met. V, c. 28, q. 3, sect. 1 [Fonseca (1599), vol. 2, col. 959F]). The picture is admittedly not entirely clear, but Fonseca’s distinction of instantiable from non-instantiable unity is presumably supposed to explain how there can be some unity proper to common natures; this unity is distinguished from instantiable unity, and it is the existence of haecceities that explains how the instantiable unity is in fact instantiated.
5. Rejecting haecceities
Setting aside the complexities of a later thinker such as Fonseca, the years immediately after Scotus saw something of a move towards a more nominalist view on the question of universals – the view (on the understanding of ‘nominalism’ relevant here) that universals are just concepts. Amongst opponents of Scotus, the most common strategy was to adopt the view that substances themselves are primarily diverse, such that their distinction is not explained by any real feature or property of them other than merely the substance itself. For example, according to Peter Auriol writing in the decade after Scotus’ death,
objects are singular by themselves, and … this singularity is a basic fact that needs no further explanation…. Maintaining that an object is singular or individual because it results from or is endowed with a proper principle of individuation which is itself singular, amounts to nothing more than duplicating what should be explained. (Nielsen , 498)
Primitive distinction must occur somewhere – so why not make it at the level of the substance itself, rather than of some constituent of the substance? Rejection of Scotus’s view was not confined to such manifest opponents of Scotus’s system. Amongst the earliest students of Scotus, various found his views on the haecceity and its formal distinction from the nature unpalatable. William of Alnwick, the foremost of Scotus’s students working through the second decade of the fourteenth century, holds at least two different positions, neither the same as Scotus’s. In an early disputed question on individuation, William holds that natures are individual of themselves (Stella , 363); later, in his Ordinatio on the Sentences, William accepts something akin to Henry of Ghent’s position that individuation is by a negation, though adding the clarification that this negation represents nevertheless a perfection – it is better not to have the positive feature of divisibility (Stella , 630–631). The reason for the shift in view is an apprehension that the fact that natures can be multiplied (i.e. exemplified many times) entails that a nature cannot be self-individuating (Stella , 628). But William cannot see how the added feature could be anything positive, since he does not see how an individual could be anything, necessarily, other than its nature (Stella , 631). In both works, William objects to Scotus’s view that the common nature is somehow prior to its instantiations, on the grounds that this priority entails that the common nature could exist without any of its instantiations (Stella , 352, 625). This in effect amounts – in Scotist terms – to the claim that the nature is really distinct, not just formally distinct, from any of its instantiations. For Scotus, the mark of a formal distinction is inseparability: no individual is separable from its nature, and there is thus no more than a formal distinction in any individual between nature and haecceity. Ockham puts his finger on this misinterpretation on the part of Alnwick:
On this question there is one theory attributed by some people [viz. William of Alnwick] to the Subtle Doctor [i.e. Scotus] …. This is the theory that the universal is a true being outside the soul, really distinct from a contracting difference but really multiplied and varied by such a contracting difference. (Ockham, Ordinatio I, d. 2, q. 5, n. 6 (William of Ockham [OT], 2:154, ll. 1–2, 3–7; Spade (1994), 149))
As Ockham rightly implies, this is not Scotus’s view. A position not dissimilar to William’s earlier, nominalist, view can be found in another prominent early student of Scotus’s – Henry of Harclay (see Henninger ; for Ockham’s rejection of the way in which Harclay develops his nominalist theory, see Ockham, Ordinatio I, d. 2, q. 7, nn. 11–12, 63–82 (William of Ockham [OT], 2:227, l. 15–p. 228, l. 20, p. 241, l. 21–p. 248, l. 21; Spade (1994), 191–192, 200–204); see too Adams ).
Ockham himself, writing 1321–1323, raises an array of arguments against Scotus’s position. Ockham was a thinker explicitly influenced by Scotus in all sorts of ways, while nevertheless rejecting the fundamental feature of Scotist metaphysics and semantics, namely realism on the question of common natures. Without exception, the arguments target one of the following two Scotist positions: the commonality of the nature, and the formal distinction. As such, Ockham does not attack haecceities, though in so far as Scotus’s account of haecceities requires both his distinctive account of the divisibility of a nature, and the formal distinction between nature and haecceity, Ockham’s attacks will harm Scotus’s haecceities too. Ockham offers no fewer than four arguments against common natures with less than numerical unity (Ockham, Ordinatio I, d. 2, q. 6, nn. 51, 62, 78, 82 (William of Ockham [OT], 2:181, ll. 8–13, p. 184, ll. 11–13, p. 189, ll. 10–14, p. 190, ll. 18–22; Spade (1994), 161, 163, 166, 167)). The key one is the second: humanity in Socrates and humanity in Plato are numerically distinct, and essentially so. So there is nothing in common between these humanities. Ockham’s first and longest argument against Scotus takes issue with the formal distinction. Against the formal distinction of really identical entities, Ockham persistently appeals to the indiscernibility of identicals, arguing that there is no kind of identity mid-way between real identity and real distinction: see Ockham, Ordinatio I, d. 2, q. 6, nn. 25–8, 83 (William of Ockham [OT], 2:173, l. 11–p. 174, l. 12, p. 190, l. 23–p. 191, l. 4; Spade (1994), 118, 127)). As Marilyn Adams has pointed out, this strategy seems to beg the question against Scotus (Adams , 420).
Ockham’s more parsimonious ontology is important in the attempt to understand the nature of the opposition to Scotus just outlined. Ockham is sometimes presented as though his distinctive position on the question of individuation is simply the result of his distinctive nominalist position on the question of universals. Thus Armand Maurer, in a generally very helpful account of Ockham’s position:
The problem of individuation, in the usual sense of the term, does not arise in Ockham’s philosophy. The problem occurs when a philosopher maintains that there are natures or essences in individuals, in some way common the individuals and yet diversified in them…. Given the commonness of [e.g] animality, what makes the individual animal to be the individual it is? (Maurer , 373)
This is not quite right. For while Ockham does not need an account of indivisibility (since a tenet of Ockham’s nominalism on the question of universals is that nothing real is divisible into subjective parts), he certainly needs an account of the distinction of one substance from another, as Black’s reflections on the principle of the identity of indiscernibles forcefully show. In fact, Ockham claims that a substance is singular through itself (“se ipso”: Ockham, Ordinatio I, d. 2, q. 6, n. 105–107 (William of Ockham [OT], 2:196, ll. 2–12; Spade (1994), 171)). And it seems to me that this claim does indeed constitute an attempt at a solution to the problem of distinction. For Ockham is a nominalist about many more properties than Scotus is, as well as being a nominalist on the question of universals. Thus, Ockham believes that the set of those predicates that involve no ontological commitment (that is to say, predicates that do not signify anything extramental other than merely the substance itself) includes the Aristotelian genus, specific difference, and proprium (necessary but non-defining property) (see e.g. Moody , 97–106, 145–51). Substances themselves are primarily diverse according to Ockham – their distinction from each other is not explained by anything other than their own self-identity, and ipso facto not by any qualitative or relational feature of themselves. Self-identity is not, however, a real feature of the substance in any sense distinct from itself or its nature. And this is the result not of Ockham’s nominalism on the question of universals, but of his nominalism on the question of inseparable properties. And much the same seems true of the other opponents of Scotus mentioned above.
Ockham’s position thus turns out to be a variety of haecceitism (in a more modern sense of the word). Maintaining that substances are primarily diverse does not amount to having no theory of individuation. Indeed, it presumably entails that their diversity is not explained by, say, qualitative distinction. Thus, Ockham holds that two things, each per se singular, can be “precisely similar” to each other (Ockham, Ordinatio I, d. 2, q. 6, n. 108 (William of Ockham [OT], 2:196, l. 17; Spade (1994), 171)). And this seems to entail some form of haecceitism. The difference between this view and that of Scotus is that the haecceity defended by Scotus is – in some minimal way – hypostatized. Some modern accounts of haecceities resemble Ockham’s view more than Scotus’s: the uniquely instantiable, non-qualitative property of (say) being identical with Socrates – Socrates’s haecceity (in the modern terminology) – does not carry the kind of ontological weight that Scotus wants to place on haecceities as he understands them:
It may be controversial to speak of a ‘property’ of being identical with me. I want the word ‘property’ to carry as light a metaphysical load here as possible. ‘Thisness’ is intended to be a synonym or translation of the traditional term ‘haecceity’ (in Latin, ‘haecceitas’), which so far as I know was invented by Duns Scotus. Like many medieval philosophers, Scotus regarded properties as components of the things that have them. He introduced haecceities (thisnesses), accordingly, as a special sort of metaphysical component of individuals. I am not proposing to revive this aspect of his conception of a haecceity, because I am not committed to regarding properties as components of individuals. To deny that thisnesses are purely qualitative is not necessarily to postulate “bare particulars,” substrata without qualities of their own, which would be what was left of the individual when all its qualitative properties were subtracted. Conversely, to hold that thisnesses are purely qualitative is not to imply that individuals are nothing but bundles of qualities, for qualities may not be components of individuals at all. We could probably conduct our investigation, in somewhat different terms, without referring to thisnesses as properties. (Adams , 6–7)
Note, of course, that Scotus’s account of the common nature also entails something stronger than Adams is proposing: indeed, it entails precisely the sort of minimal hypostatization that Scotus advocates. And the reason for this, of course, is Scotus’s view that individual substances cannot themselves be primarily diverse – a fact that is explained by his claim that common natures have some sort of unity in their instantiations: the nature in Socrates is (non-numerically) the same as the nature in Plato. Natures, for Scotus, cannot be primarily diverse; substances must include more than natures. But individual natures in Ockham’s view can indeed be primarily diverse, and this surely amounts to a form of haecceitism – nothing other than an individual nature’s own self-identity explains its distinction from all other such natures. Maintaining that individual natures are primarily diverse amounts not to having no theory of individuation, but to accepting a form of haecceitism that, like Adams’s, does not involve ontological commitment to the existence of haecceities as distinct real constituents of things. The result, as in Adams, is that the identity of indiscernibles is false even in Scotus’s rather trivial sense.
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