Notes to Varieties of Modality

1. Philosophers who believe that it is impossible for an agent to have no empirical evidence whatsoever need to tweak the foregoing definitions. Instead of beginning with an agent-relative notion of epistemic necessity, they can start by defining a concept of epistemic necessity that is relative to a set of empirical evidence, and can then define a prioricity by considering the limiting case where that set is empty.

2. According to this definition, every proposition that is not a priori is a posteriori. The definition does not entail that every a posteriori proposition is decidable on the basis of empirical evidence. For some a posteriori propositions, it may simply be unknowable whether they are true.

3. This sketch is oversimplified. There are well-known reasons for doubting that all possible states of information can be identified with sets of possible worlds. Consider an agent whose evidence is sufficient to rule out all possible worlds except one (call it ‘\(w\)’). This agent may nevertheless be ignorant of certain things. For example, \(w\) may contain several different people, and the agent may not know which of them she is. Similarly, she may not know what time it is. Her state of information differs from that of another agent who also knows that \(w\) is actualized, but who knows, in addition, who she is and what time it is. One and the same set of worlds can therefore correspond to two different possible states of information, which shows that we need a more fine-grained way of thinking about states of information than is provided by sets of possible worlds. The standard solution is to appeal to what is known as ‘centered possible worlds,’ i.e., possible worlds one of whose agents and one of whose times are designated (see, e.g., Lewis 1979b). More formally, we can think of them as triples of a world, an agent in that world and a time in the history of that world. An agent can rule out a centered world \(\langle w; a; t\rangle\) just in case she can either rule out that \(w\) is actualized, or that she is \(a\), or that \(t\) is the present time. A person’s total information can be identified with the set of centered worlds that she cannot rule out. In the foregoing example, the information of the better-informed agent is a set containing a single centered world, while that of the other agent is a set containing several different centered worlds (all of which have \(w\) as their first member).

4. The dualist need not hold that that is the right explanation of all of Kripke’s examples. For example, Scott Soames (2002, 2003, 2005, 2011), a modal dualist, denies that (1) expresses a necessary a posteriori proposition, or that (4) expresses a contingent a priori proposition.

5. On Chalmers’s official account, \(P\) is true at \(w\) considered as actual just in case the material conditional “\(w\) is actual \(\supset P\)” is a priori. (For more discussion on how to define a suitable notion, see Yablo 2002.)

6. Some remarks to flesh out this picture. Firstly, while the two-dimensional intension encodes certain principles about how the reference of a term depends on the features of the actual world, there is no reason for thinking that these principles can always be condensed into a simple, or even finite, reference-fixing description (as in the foregoing example of ‘Phosphorus’). Secondly, the reference of a term may not only depend on certain aspects of the actual world, but also on the features of the location within the actual world where it is used. That is obvious in the case of ‘I’, ‘now’, and ‘here’, but it may also be true for many proper names or natural-kind terms. For example, the reference of a token of ‘water’ may be fixed to whatever liquid in the speaker’s environment has certain features. In that case, the expression can single out different kinds when used by different speakers in the same world. To capture this phenomenon, the two-dimensional function that serves as the intension of a sentence must be defined over pairs of one centered and one uncentered world rather than over pairs of two uncentered worlds (see footnote 3 ‘ for an explanation of the notion of a centered world).

7. This is a very simplified statement of Stalnaker’s views. His full account appeals to several different rules of assertion. See Stalnaker 1978.

8. Of course, some philosophical accounts of natural laws make this view more natural than others. It chimes well with a view that accounts for natural laws by appealing to relations between universals (Armstrong 1983, 1991, 1993; Dretske 1977; Tooley 1977). By contrast, Humeans, who (roughly speaking) regard the laws as summaries of pervasive general patterns in the history of the world (e.g., Lewis 1973b, 1994), may find it less natural to think of laws as being necessary in an interesting and substantive sense.

9. Suppose that \(N\) is defined by relativizing \(N^*\) to a class of propositions \(S\). Then \(N\) can be equivalently defined by restricting the quantifier over \(P^*\)-possible worlds to those worlds where the members of \(S\) are jointly true. Conversely, suppose that \(N\) was defined by restricting the quantifier to \(P^*\)-possible worlds in class \(C\). If there is some class \(S\) of propositions that are jointly true in the \(P^*\)-possible worlds in \(C\) and in no other \(P^*\)-possible worlds, then \(N\) can equivalently be defined by relativizing \(N^*\) to \(S\).

10. A very different strategy for pursuing a unified account of different forms of modality is outlined by Amie Thomasson (2020, 15–16). On her view, modal discourse is not descriptive. Rather, the unifying feature of our different modal notions is that they are tools for communicating norms. In the tradition of conventionalist and other deflationary views of modality (Ayer 1936, Wittgenstein 1953, Sidelle 1989), Thomasson argues that metaphysical modal claims convey norms for the correct use of expressions or concepts. Similarly, we employ the notion of logical necessity to express norms of reasoning, the concept of moral necessity to communicate norms of behavior, and so forth.

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Boris Kment <>

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