Notes to Mohist Canons

1. “Canons” (jīng 經) is a generic Chinese term for a set of concise sayings or aphorisms. It was probably a purely formal description of the texts, rather than an acknowledgment of their status as “canonical” within the Mohist school. The “All Under Heaven” book of the Zhuangzi (Book 33), China’s earliest history of thought, states that later sects of Mohists “chanted the Mohist Canon,” as if reciting scripture. This description should probably be taken with a grain of salt, however, since it is a caricature of the Mohists by an opponent. It is unclear whether the reference is specifically to the Canons or to the Mozi doctrinal essays. More likely it is to the latter, since the Canons are not the sort of text one would naturally attempt to chant.

2. This article will use the italicized ‘Canons’ as the title of the two books of the Mozi containing the canons (Books 40–41) and ‘Explanations’ as the title of the books containing the explanations (Books 42–43). The non-italicized ‘canons’ and ‘explanations’ will be used as general terms referring to the various canons and explanations. Individual canons and explanations will be cited according to the numbering system in Graham’s edition (2003/1978). For brevity, textual citations will not distinguish between canons and explanations (for instance, “A1” refers to either Canon A1 or Explanation A1 or both). For convenience, references to the “Greater Selection” and “Lesser Selection” will cite section numbers from Graham’s reconstructed versions, though the interpretations of the text given here often differ from his and the present discussion does not accept his rearrangement of the texts. Thus “EC1” refers to section 1 of Graham’s reconstructed “Expounding the Canons” (2003: 245) and “NO1” refers to section 1 of his reconstructed “Names and Objects” (470).

3. Graham contended that the texts are organized systematically and have a single unifying theme, but later writers have generally resisted this view. Graham’s theory is presented in his (2003/1978) and summarized in his (1989), 137–39. For opposing views, see Harbsmeier (1980), Geaney (1999), and Fraser (2003).

4. Though differing with him on many points, the interpretations presented here are deeply indebted to Graham’s monumental work on the later Mohists (2003/1978). They are also indebted to Chad Hansen’s work (1983, 1992) on points too numerous to identify one by one.

5. Graham suggests that the later Mohists held what is in effect a form of ideal observer theory. He proposes that, through a series of interlocking definitions, the Dialectics presents a rationalist, a priori argument that “the benevolent and right are what will be desired on behalf of mankind by the sage,” a moral paragon with ideal knowledge who weighs benefit and harm on the principle of preferring the total over the unit (1989: 144–46). The grounds for this proposal are tenuous, however (Fraser, 2003). It depends heavily on Graham’s speculative reconstruction of a badly corrupt passage in the ”Greater Selection” (EC2), and even in his reconstructed version, the connection between the sage’s attitudes and the notions of benevolence and right is obscure. (The passage could instead be saying that what the sage desires on people’s behalf are things they can surely obtain, unlike other desires people may have that cannot be satisfied.) Graham’s proposal also requires that we take the ordinary word xiān 先 (before) to refer to a priori knowledge, in a context in which it is fully intelligible as meaning simply “beforehand”; that we interpret the canon that links benefit to happiness (A26) as actually referring to desire, not happiness; and that we posit the existence of an unknown, lost text giving the missing definition of “care” (ài 愛). All of these points are doubtful.

6. This interpretation is tentative, because two passages, one badly corrupt, seem at odds with the doctrine of equal care as summarized here. The first seems to indicate that social superiors and subordinates have an unequal degree of care for each other: superiors care less for their subordinates than vice versa, though they benefit them more (EC7). The second, corrupt fragment implies that for the sake of the world, we may care more for a great sage-king such as Yu, whose benefit to the world was exceptional (EC5).

7. “Weighing” (quán 權) is also treated in several other early Chinese texts, including the Analects, Mencius, Zhuangzi, Xunzi, and Lushi Chunqiu.

8. For a detailed discussion of the concept of shí 實 (stuff, object, reality), see Geaney (2002).

9. “Dog-legged” is Simon Blackburn’s label for this sort of view. See his Spreading the Word (Oxford: Clarendon, 1984).

10. This seems to be Harbsmeier’s interpretation (1998: 186).

11. Two further observations on this potentially confusing issue: First, it is instructive to notice the terminology used in Xunzi’s theory of language (Xunzi, Book 22). Where other texts speak of using language to express 意, Xunzi typically speaks of expressing zhì 志 (intention), implying that in such contexts the two terms are roughly synonymous. Given its pattern of use in the classical literature, zhì is unlikely to be a semantic concept, such as “meaning,” for it typically refers to intentions, plans, or commitment. As a kind of intention, of course zhì or will itself have intentional content, and thus the texts can speak of expressing or grasping one’s zhì or . But the theoretical role of these terms is clearly different from that of semantic meaning. Second, in contexts where we might ask for or explain the meaning of a word or sentence, classical Chinese writers do not mention the word’s yi. Instead, they use the extensional concept wèi 謂 (call, refer). An interesting example comes from Mencius (3A:5), where one speaker uses wèi to refer to his interpretation of a saying: “According to the Confucian teaching, the ancients acted as if protecting an infant. This saying, what does it wèi (mean, refer to)? I take it to be that care has no grades or levels, but practice begins with one’s parents.” If were semantic meaning, we would expect it to be used in contexts such as this, but it is not.

12. The following account differs slightly from that in the 2005 version of this article.

13. In some contexts, “knowledge by explanation” could conceivably amount to a priori knowledge; “a circle is nowhere straight” (A98) might be an example. But the Mohists do not seem to have an explicit notion of the a priori, nor does it play a distinct role in their epistemology. On this point, the present interpretation differs from Graham’s, as he proposes that the Mohists had a conception of a priori knowledge, expressed by the phrase xiān zhī 先知 (know beforehand) (2003/1978: 188–89). Arguably, however, Graham’s interpretation does not explain the Mohists’ use of xiān zhī better than simply taking the phrase to mean “know in advance,” its meaning in other pre-Hàn texts. His suggested examples of a priori knowledge—knowing things about an object before one has a chance to observe it—seem more likely to be instances of knowledge by inductive reasoning.

14. Graham (2003/1978) contended that the later Mohists developed a distinctive area of inquiry, which he labeled “disputation,” that yields necessary, a priori knowledge of relations between names, and that this contrasts with “description,” or the study of how names relate to objects. However, there are strong grounds for rejecting Graham’s proposed division of the canons into these and two other discrete areas of knowledge, and it is unlikely that the Mohists identify any particular form of knowledge as “necessary,” especially since their notion of 必 (necessary, must) does not appear to distinguish between logical necessity, causal necessity or constant conjunction, epistemic certainty, and various forms of obligation. For further discussion, see Fraser (2003).

15. As first proposed by Hansen (1983), the Mohists seem to have held a mereological, or part-whole, ontology, on which the notions of a whole (jiān 兼) and its parts ( 體) are used in place of those of a set and its members. Mohist mereology is explored in more detail in Fraser (2007a) and (2007b).

16. The ambiguity arising from the several senses of “same” is the likely basis for Gongsun Long’s white horse paradox: “White horses are not horses.” Since the English to be has roughly the same range of senses, the ambiguity holds equally well in English: If the ‘is’ in question is the ‘is’ of predication, then of course a white horse is a horse. But if the ‘is’ is that of identity, then it is correct that the kind white horse is not identical to the kind horse, since not all horses are white.

17. Canon B66 is important evidence that the Mohists employ no concept with a role similar to that of the Western concept of essence, for if they did it would be natural to explain the distinction between oxen and horses by appeal to their different essences. Instead, they simply appeal to whatever features they believe allow us to reliably differentiate the two kinds.

18. See, e.g., A. C. Graham, tr., Chuang-tzu: The Inner Chapters (London, George Allen & Unwin, 1981), 53. For further discussion, see “The School of Names.”

19. In this context, realism is the view that the meanings of general terms are abstract, mind-independent entities called universals, and that concrete things belong to kinds by virtue of instantiating universals. Conceptualism holds that the meanings of general terms are concepts and that concrete things belong to certain kinds because they fall under or satisfy the corresponding concepts. Nominalism holds that the objects of thought are just words or imagined images, not abstract entities or concepts; only concrete individuals exist, and the referents of general terms are just their extensions. Things belong to kinds, denoted by the same general term, simply because language users use the same term to refer to them.

20. This suggestion is due to Chad Hansen (1992).

21. This section has been revised significantly in response to the discussions in Stephens (2017) and Fraser (forthcoming). The revisions involve three main changes. (i) As Stephens points out, several passages previously cited here as weakly supporting a realist interpretation could just as plausibly be read as neutral on the issue. Accordingly, the present discussion no longer draws on them. (ii) The discussion aims to eliminate any ambiguity about what is intended in characterising the later Mohist stance as “realist” and to pin down more precisely the textual basis for this characterization. “Realism” here is not the view that nature fixes a uniquely correct lexicon of kind names that all speech communities should use, but that it fixes the “sameness” relations on the basis of which kinds can justifiably be distinguished. (iii) The discussion develops the distinction between “sameness in being united” and “sameness in being the same kind,” as clarified in Robins (2012).

22. “Admissibility” ( 可) refers to assertions that are “semantically permissible,” in that they conceivably could be uttered in some situation without violating semantic or pragmatic norms. Logical consistency in what one says is a necessary but not sufficient condition for admissibility. “Perversity” (bèi 誖,悖) refers to assertions that are not “semantically permissible.” In uttering them one would be guilty of semantic or pragmatic contradiction, inconsistency, or other error. A logical contradiction in what one has said would be a sufficient but not necessary condition for “perversity.”

23. For further discussion of various aspects of disputation, see “The School of Names.”

24. Graham (2003/1978) claims, strangely, that the notion of biàn 辯 in the Canons is part of a different field of knowledge from the notion of biàn in the “Lesser Selection.” As he sees it, in the Canons biàn is part of the study of “disputation,” which investigates a priori, necessary relations between names, but not relations between names and objects. In the “Lesser Selection,” it is part of the study of “description,” which provides procedures for consistently describing, or fitting names to, objects. Against this, we can point out that the canons on biàn clearly refer to name-object relations, the terminology of the two texts is highly coherent, and both refer to their subject by the same name, biàn (distinguishing, distinction drawing). In the absence of any explicit statement to the contrary in the texts, it is overwhelmingly likely that the separate discussions of biàn are part of a single field of inquiry.

25. Canon and Explanation A73 read, “‘That’ ( 彼) is, it is impermissible for both to be impermissible. In all cases of distinguishing oxen from non-oxen, [there are] two. [The one that] lacks the criterion is not-this (fēi 非).” That is, the logical relationship between “this” (shì 是) and “that” () is such that it must be “permissible” to predicate at least one of the pair of something. If we distinguish oxen from non-oxen, then we have a case in which any one thing must either be “this” (an ox) or “that” (a non-ox). Anything that lacks the distinguishing criteria for oxen is thereby “that” (a non-ox). The law of excluded middle states that any proposition must be either true or false. The Mohist analogue of this principle is that for any object and any pair of complementary terms, such as ‘ox’ and ‘non-ox’, one of the terms must fit the object. Thus, by extension, any term either fits an object or it does not. Notice that the Mohist version of the principle concerns predicating terms of objects, not the truth of propositions.

Canon and Explanation A74 read, “Disputation (biàn 辯) is contending over ‘that’ [i.e., exclusive alternatives]. For a disputation to win is to fit the object. One calls it ‘ox,’ the other calls it ‘non-ox’; this is ‘contending over “that.”’ These do not jointly fit the object. If they do not jointly fit, it must be that one does not fit.” For a piece of discourse to qualify as “disputation,” one side must contend that the thing at hand is “this” (shì), the other that it is not-this (fēi). For instance, one side could claim that a thing is an ox, the other that it is a non-ox. The law of non-contradiction states that a proposition and its negation cannot be both true. The Mohist analogue is that a term and its negation cannot both fit an object. Again, the Mohist version concerns predicating terms of objects, not whether a proposition is true or not.

26. For convenience, Graham’s numbering system is used to cite passages from the “Lesser Selection” and “Greater Selection.” However, unlike Graham, the present article treats the “Lesser Selection” as an independent, self-standing essay. Graham breaks this text into parts, which he embeds in a longer, reconstructed essay he calls “Names and Objects.” There are strong grounds for rejecting this reconstruction, however. Although the “Greater Selection” is unquestionably a collection of disjoint fragments, the “Lesser Selection” is a reasonably coherent text. It begins with what is plausibly interpreted as an introductory paragraph, introduces a number of technical terms, makes several claims about disputation, and wraps these up with what is plausibly interpreted as a conclusion. It then goes on to give a series of examples to support some of its claims. A satisfactory interpretation of the text can be given without resorting to Graham’s radical reconstruction.

27. The account of these techniques given here is modified from the treatment in the 2005 version of this article. Much thanks go to Dan Robins for critical discussions regarding the earlier account.

28. This way of characterizing the four is due to Dan Robins (personal correspondence).

29. For a similar example, see the anecdote about Cao Gongzi in Mozi Book 49.

30. See, for example, Graham (1978/2003), Hansen (1983), Chong (1999), Johnston (2000), Robins (2010), Fung (2012), and (Sturgeon 2013). Many other interpretations have been presented in Chinese-language publications.

31. The interpretation below develops and significantly revises points presented in the 2005 version of this article and in a later, intermediate interpretation presented in the 2009 version. I thank Dan Robins for critical discussions about the original version in 2008 and Donald Sturgeon for convincing me in 2013 that the intermediate version was unsatisfactory. The present version is indebted to Sturgeon's own (Sturgeon 2013).

32. This point is a major difference between the interpretation proposed here and those of Graham (2003/1978: 484–486) and Hansen (1983: 129–30).

33. The text refers to examples of this type as “not this but so.” For an alternative translation and examples of other patterns, see Graham (2003/1978: 487–93).

34. Section 1.5 of The Annals of Lu Buwei quotes a Mohist leader saying that by Mohist law ( 法), a person who kills another must die.

35. The grounds for the “this and so” category are obvious and unobjectionable. Many of the examples in the “this but not so,” “not this but so,” and “one this and one not this” categories seem unconvincing or contrived, though a detailed discussion is beyond the scope of this article. The fourth category, “one universal and one not universal,” is implicitly based on quantifier logic and is probably on firmer ground.

36. See John Knoblock, Xunzi: A Translation and Study of the Complete Works, Vol. 3 (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1994), sections 18.9 and 22.2f. The reference to Xunzi in the next paragraph is also to section 22.2f.

37. The precise chronology of the Mohist Dialectics and the Xunzian theory of language is impossible to determine, as is whether Xunzi himself was directly responsible for formulating the theory of language that appears in the anthology bearing his name. However, since the claim “killing robbers isn’t killing people” is cited for criticism in the discourse on language in the Xunzi (Book 22), the Xunzian theory is probably later than the Mohist “Lesser Selection.”

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Chris Fraser <>

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