Supplement to Mohist Canons

Textual History and Philological Issues

It is only by a fortunate accident that we have the later Mohist texts at all. The popularity of a 7th-century abridged edition inadvertently caused the bulk of the Mozi, including the dialectical writings, to vanish from Chinese literature for nearly a thousand years. Leading Tang (618–907) and Song dynasty (960–1279) intellectuals such as Han Yu (768–824), Shen Gua (1031–1095), and Cheng Yi (1033–1107) seem to have been unaware of the content of most of the Mozi, including the Canons and Explanations. Fortunately, the complete text was preserved among the 1476 titles in the Dao Zang (Daoist Patrology scriptures), from which it was eventually recovered during the Ming dynasty and published again whole in 1552. Qing dynasty philologists set out to reconstruct the later Mohist texts, beginning with the seminal work of Bi Yuan (1730–97) and Sun Xingyang (1753–1818) and culminating in Sun Yirang’s comprehensive commentary published in 1894. (For more information on the history of the texts, see Graham (2003: 64–70).)

The early decades of the twentieth century saw a surge of interest in the later Mohists, fueled partly by contact with Western philosophy and science. Impressed with Western logic and scientific method, Chinese intellectuals were eager to explore what Hu Shih called “the development of the logical method” in their own tradition. The long-neglected Mohist dialectical texts appeared to be records of a pivotal episode in that development. Scholars such as Liang Qichao, Luan Tiaofu, and Tan Jiefu achieved many breakthroughs in correcting and interpreting the texts. A major step forward came with the publication of A. C. Graham’s study in 1978. Graham provided the most systematic, detailed analysis of the structure, grammar, and terminology of the texts to date and applied a more rigorous philological methodology than previous editors. Though some of his emendations and aspects of his interpretation are questionable, his edition remains the best available. Philological work on the texts continues today. Scholars in mainland China have produced several new editions since the 1980s, and researchers at the Chinese University of Hong Kong are preparing a detailed comparative edition.

Unhappily, given their importance to our understanding of early Chinese thought, the later Mohist writings are among the most obscure and unreliable in all the ancient literature. Their complex content, technical terminology, extreme terseness, and difficult grammar render many passages vague, ambiguous, even impenetrable. This obscurity is due partly to the nature of the texts, which were probably a set of notes for school members familiar with their content, not a treatise for wide distribution. The interpretive difficulties are compounded by damage and corruption. Parts of the texts have been dislocated or lost, probably because of the fragility of the bamboo strips on which they were written. Headings that originally marked the explanations to individual canons have been copied into the body of the text, often in the wrong position, making it difficult to tell in places where one passage ends and the next begins. Other scribal errors, obvious and not, are scattered throughout. Technical terms and specialized graphs have been miscopied over the centuries, and marginal notes have crept into the text here and there. Most remarkably, after being arranged early on into two horizontal rows of short columns, the canons were later miscopied into a single row of long columns. (Ancient Chinese texts were written vertically and read from top to bottom.) This blunder shuffled canons from the top and bottom rows together like playing cards, making the already obscure text even more opaque. Given all of these factors, many parts of the Canons and Explanations are difficult or impossible to interpret with any reasonable confidence.

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Copyright © 2020 by
Chris Fraser <>

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