Notes to Neutral Monism

1. Galen Strawson has explored the idea underlying the Both View at considerable depth, though he has presented it as a version of (real) physicalism and panpsychism rather than as a form of neutral monism (see Strawson 1994: 46–7, 55–9, 72–5; Strawson 2006: 187–8, 238ff; Strawson 2016.).

2. In his 1948, Russell further analyzes events into bundles of (concrete) universals. For more on Russell’s view, see Maclean 2014.

3. Note that views according to which all neutral entities are events, substances, properties, and/or some other category, are compatible with the existence of multiple kinds within such categories (so long as they are neutral in character).

4. More rarely, the German philosopher and psychophysicist Gustav Fechner (1801–87) has been described as an early pioneer of neutral monism (Clarke 2004, Textor 2021b). However, Fechner is generally deemed a panpsychist or dual-aspect theorist.

5. See Pincock 2018 and Wishon 2021. Note that Ward seemingly used the term “neutral monism” to refer to Spinozistic dual-aspect theories.

6. Russell’s treatment of images in his early neutral monist works (1919, 1921) has led a number of commentators to classify Russell as a dualist of sorts. Russell himself acknowledges that “we seem to find a certain dualism, perhaps not ultimate…as to the causal laws” (Russell 1921: 137) that govern sensations and images respectively. The great difficulty of finding a coherent interpretation of these texts is due, in part, to Russell’s reliance on two different criteria of neutrality: the Neither View and the Law View. It is doubtful that one can have it both ways. But note that Russell never suggests that images are mental, in the sense of being directed at an object.

7. Note the epistemic risk incurred by admitting inferred entities into the realm of the known. As this risk increases, the epistemic yield of following the method of logical construction diminishes. It is worth noting that Russell never intended his logical constructions to secure knowledge against traditional skepticism.

8. The reasons for the first inferential step are stated in (Russell 1927a: 278–282). For an extended presentation of the inferences involved in the last two steps, see (Russell 1927a: ch. 20). For Russell’s final thoughts about what we must assume about the world in order to infer the existence of events other than our own sensations, images, and percepts, see (Russell 1948: Part VI).

9. Russell’s views on the epistemic accessibility of our sensations are difficult to pin down exactly. Sensations are the “theoretical core” (Russell 1921: 132) or our percepts. As such they remain “more or less hypothetical” (Russell 1927b: 212). Some of his examples suggests that we can attend to them; others suggest that we cannot isolate them from other components of our percepts.

10. While Russell insists that our knowledge of the qualities of our mental episodes is “the most immediate knowledge of which we have experience”, he does not accept the so-called Revelation Thesis which is routinely attributed to him (Johnston 1992). According to this thesis, we can fully grasp the intrinsic nature of our mental episodes and/or their aspects on the basis of careful introspective attention. In point of fact, Russell repeatedly emphasizes that introspection is limited, “exceedingly fallible and quite peculiarly liable to falsification in accordance with preconceived theory” (Russell 1921: 223-4). Even so, he sees “self-observation as the most reliable way of obtaining knowledge” (Russell 1927b: 129).

11. Russell’s recurring remarks that physics is purely abstract prompted Max Newman’s well-known objection that such knowledge would render physics either false or trivial—as it would at most only capture the cardinality of the physical world. To this, Russell replied in his autobiography: “I had always assumed spatio-temporal continuity with the world of percepts, that is to say, I had assumed that there might be co-punctuality between percepts and non-percepts, and even that one could pass by a finite number of steps (from one event to another compresent with it) from one end of the universe to the other. And co-punctuality I regarded as a relation which might exist among percepts and is itself perceptible” (1968: 259). For more on this debate, see Landini 2017.

12. Russell’s two theses that all fundamental entities are events and that all fundamental entities are neutral entities are distinct, but they combine naturally in Russell’s neutral monism.

13. Russell counts Dewey among the American neutral monists in his An Outline of Philosophy (1927b: 303). More recently, Richard Gale has also argued forcefully that “Dewey developed a version of James’s neutral monism” (2010: 56). Peter Godfrey-Smith—himself somewhat sympathetic to neutral monism (see his “3:AM Interview”)—has similarly suggested that Dewey might best be thought of as a neutral monist (2014: 5-6). However, Gale’s discussions of this thesis also makes it quite clear that this interpretation is quite controversial (1997, 2002, 2010).

14. David Chalmers’s paper “Panpsychism and Panprotopsychism” (Chalmers 2015) provides an illuminating account of the dialectic that drives some contemporary philosophers to explore the little known neutral monistic territory.

15. In this way, neutral monism can solve the traditional dualist problem of perception by maintaining that “we cannot say that ‘matter is the cause of our sensations” (1927b: 290). Mach agrees: “Bodies do not produce sensations” (Mach 1886: 29). To suggest otherwise is to rely on “the monstrous idea of employing atoms to explain psychical processes” (Mach 1886: 311). Matter/bodies are, after all, nothing but systems of neutral entities, i.e., of Russellian events or Machian elements. And, for all we know, the events/elements causing a sensation may be quite similar to the sensation it causes. This closes the apparent chasm between the “material process” and the ensuing experience, and the mystery of perception vanishes.

16. None of the other neutral monists took the suggestion that sensations/percepts might occur in the brain seriously. James mentions the possibility in a footnote, only to dismiss it as “not seriously defensible” (James 1904a: 79). Mach warns against the “absurdity that can be committed by thinking sensations spatially into the brain” (Mach 1886: 27). Petzoldt rails against the “barbaric quid pro quo that lets the psychological sensation get into the brain together with the physiological stimulation” (Petzoldt 1906: 170). And a good deal of Avenarius’s thought is directed against the fallacy of “introjection”—the fallacy of locating thought (broadly conceived) in the brain.

17. As noted in 2.3.1 above, Russell does not strictly eliminate or reduce logically constructed entities. Rather, it simply frees our relevant bodies of knowledge from any commitment to the existence of such inferred entities.

18. Note that such physicalist interpretations are not a problem for those who accept the Both View of neutrality. This is why Strawson, for instance, is able to say that the neutral monisms of James and Russell are forms of (real) materialism and panpsychism at the same time—as long as we are careful to distinguish their narrow notions of being ‘mental’ from broader ones (Strawson 2020: 324; though see Wishon 2020 for a different reading of Russell).

19. One of Russell’s early criticisms of neutral monism was based on a similar idea:

I cannot think that the difference between my seeing the patch of red, and the patch of red being there unseen, consists in the presence or absence of relations between the patch of red and other objects of the same kind…. (1914b: 148)

But as his doubts about the existence of the self and of the acquaintance relation grew, what had seemed unthinkable gradually came to seem plausible.

20. This raises the question of whether Landini should deem Russell an emergentist property-dualist rather than a physicalist.

21. One might reasonably take information in Sayre’s sense to be a feature of ordinary concrete reality. But it is unclear whether or not such information is itself concrete, which at least raises questions about the relation between information and concrete reality. Our thanks to an anonymous referee for raising this challenge.

22. For the record, Heil does not defend this identity claim as stated in the example. He defends the weaker claim that every token occurrence of pain can be described in a physical vocabulary.

23. Given the fact that Nagel allows that the neutral properties might give rise to mental or protomental properties, the view ends up being even more complex than presented here.

24. This is a version of the thesis of structuralism about physics. Russell is a prominent defender of this view, hence the name “Russellian monism.” His remark that “the aim of physics, consciously or unconsciously, has always been to discover what we may call the causal skeleton of the world” (1927a: 391; cf. Russell 1931: 132–3) vividly captures the structuralist idea. The best source for recent work on Russellian monism is Alter and Nagasawa 2015.

25. Here we see C.B. Martin’s “surprising identity” between dispositionality and qualitativity (Martin 2008: 64) being used to further the case of neutral monism. Although John Heil (see 5.2) is a leading advocate of this idea, his case for neutral monism does not turn on it.

26. Other contemporaries exploring new directions for neutral monism include Michael Silberstein (Silberstein 2020; Silberstein and Chemero 2015), Jonathan Westphal (2016), Iva Apostolova (Apostolova 2004, 2022; Apostolova and Frederick-Wagner 2020), and Andrea Pace Giannotta (2018, 2021), among others.

Copyright © 2023 by
Leopold Stubenberg
Donovan Wishon <>

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