Nominalism in the Philosophy of Mathematics

First published Mon Sep 16, 2013

Nominalism about mathematics (or mathematical nominalism) is the view according to which either mathematical objects, relations, and structures do not exist at all, or they do not exist as abstract objects (they are neither located in space-time nor do they have causal powers). In the latter case, some suitable concrete replacement for mathematical objects is provided. Broadly speaking, there are two forms of mathematical nominalism: those views that require the reformulation of mathematical (or scientific) theories in order to avoid the commitment to mathematical objects (e.g., Field 1980; Hellman 1989), and those views that do not reformulate mathematical or scientific theories and offer instead an account of how no commitment to mathematical objects is involved when these theories are used (e.g., Azzouni 2004). Both forms of nominalism are examined, and they are assessed in light of how they address five central problems in the philosophy of mathematics (namely, problems dealing with the epistemology, the ontology, and the application of mathematics as well as the use of a uniform semantics and the proviso that mathematical and scientific theories be taken literally).

1. Two views about mathematics: nominalism and platonism

In ontological discussions about mathematics, two views are prominent. According to platonism, mathematical objects (as well as mathematical relations and structures) exist and are abstract; that is, they are not located in space and time and have no causal connection with us. Although this characterization of abstract objects is purely negative—indicating what such objects are not—in the context of mathematics it captures the crucial features the objects in questions are supposed to have. According to nominalism, mathematical objects (including, henceforth, mathematical relations and structures) do not exist, or at least they need not be taken to exist for us to make sense of mathematics. So, it is the nominalist's burden to show how to interpret mathematics without the commitment to the existence of mathematical objects. This is, in fact, a key feature of nominalism: those who defend the view need to show that it is possible to yield at least as much explanatory work as the platonist obtains, but invoking a meager ontology. To achieve that, nominalists in the philosophy of mathematics forge interconnections with metaphysics (whether mathematical objects do exist), epistemology (what kind of knowledge of these entities we have), and philosophy of science (how to make sense of the successful application of mathematics in science without being committed to the existence of mathematical entities). These interconnections are one of the sources of the variety of nominalist views.

Despite the substantial differences between nominalism and platonism, they have at least one feature in common: both come in many forms. There are various versions of platonism in the philosophy of mathematics: standard (or object-based) platonism (Gödel 1944, 1947; Quine 1960), structuralism (Resnik 1997; Shapiro 1997), and full-blooded platonism (Balaguer 1998), among other views. Similarly, there are also several versions of nominalism: fictionalism (Field 1980, 1989), modal structuralism (Hellman 1989, 1996), constructibilism (Chihara 1990), the weaseling-away view (Melia 1995, 2000), figuralism (Yablo 2001), deflationary nominalism (Azzouni 2004), agnostic nominalism (Bueno 2008, 2009), and pretense views (Leng 2010), among others. Similarly to their platonist counterparts, the various nominalist proposals have different motivations, and face their own difficulties. These will be explored in turn. (A critical survey of various nominalization strategies in mathematics can be found in Burgess and Rosen (1997). The authors address in detail both the technical and philosophical issues raised by nominalism in the philosophy of mathematics.)

Discussions about nominalism in the philosophy of mathematics in the 20th century started roughly with the work that W. V. Quine and Nelson Goodman developed toward constructive nominalism (Goodman and Quine 1947). But, as Quine later pointed out, in the end it was indispensable to quantify over classes (Quine 1960). As will become clear below, responses to this indispensability argument have generated a significant amount of work for nominalists. And it is the focus on the indispensability argument that largely distinguishes more recent nominalist views in the philosophy of mathematics, which I will focus on, from the nominalism developed in the early part of the 20th century by the Polish school of logic (Simons 2010).

Mathematical nominalism is a form of anti-realism about abstract objects. This is an independent issue from the traditional problem of nominalism about universals. A universal, according to a widespread use, is something that can be instantiated by different entities. Since abstract objects are neither spatial nor temporal, they cannot be instantiated. Thus, mathematical nominalism and nominalism about universals are independent from one another (see the entry on nominalism in metaphysics). It could be argued that certain sets encapsulate the instantiation model, since a set of concrete objects can be instantiated by such objects. But since the same set cannot be so instantiated, given that sets are individuated by their members and as long as their members are different the resulting sets are not the same, it is not clear that even these sets are instantiated. I will focus here on mathematical nominalism.

2. Five Problems

In contemporary philosophy of mathematics, nominalism has been formulated in response to difficulties faced by platonism. But in developing their responses to platonism, nominalists also encounter difficulties of their own. Five problems need to be addressed in this context:

  1. The epistemological problem of mathematics,
  2. The problem of the application of mathematics,
  3. The problem of uniform semantics,
  4. The problem of taking mathematical discourse literally, and
  5. The ontological problem.

Usually, problems (1) and (5) are considered as raising difficulties for platonism, whereas problems (2), (3), and (4) are often taken as yielding difficulties for nominalism. (I will discuss below to what extent such an assessment is accurate.) Each of these problems will be examined in turn.

2.1 The epistemological problem of mathematics

Given that platonism postulates the existence of mathematical objects, the question arises as to how we obtain knowledge about them. The epistemological problem of mathematics is the problem of explaining the possibility of mathematical knowledge, given that mathematical objects themselves do not seem to play any role in generating our mathematical beliefs (Field 1989).

This is taken to be a particular problem for platonism, since this view postulates the existence of mathematical objects, and one would expect such objects to play a role in the acquisition of mathematical knowledge. After all, on the platonist view, such knowledge is about the corresponding mathematical objects. However, despite various sophisticated attempts by platonists, there is still considerable controversy as to how exactly this process should be articulated. Should it be understood via mathematical intuition, by the introduction of suitable mathematical principles and definitions, or does it require some form of abstraction?

In turn, the epistemological issue is far less problematic for nominalists, who are not committed to the existence of mathematical objects in the first place. They will have to explain other things, such as, how can the nominalist account for the difference between a mathematician, who knows a significant amount of mathematics, and a non-mathematician, who does not? This difference, according to some nominalists, is based on empirical and logical knowledge—not on mathematical knowledge (Field 1989).

2.2 The problem of the application of mathematics

Mathematics is often successfully used in scientific theories. How can such a success be explained? Platonists allegedly have an answer to this problem. Given that mathematical objects exist and are successfully referred to by our scientific theories, it is not surprising that such theories are successful. Reference to mathematical objects is just part of the reference to those entities that are indispensable to our best theories of the world. This frames the problem of the application of mathematics in terms of the indispensability argument.

In fact, one of the main reasons for belief in the existence of mathematical objects—some claim this is the only non-question begging reason (Field 1980)—is given by the indispensable use of mathematics in science. The crucial idea, originally put forward by W. V. Quine, and later articulated, in a different way, by Hilary Putnam, is that ontological commitment should be restricted to just those entities that are indispensable to our best theories of the world (Quine 1960; Putnam 1971; Colyvan 2001a). Mark Colyvan has formulated the argument in the following terms:

(P1) We ought to be ontologically committed to all and only those entities that are indispensable to our best theories of the world.

(P2) Mathematical entities are indispensable to our best theories of the world.

Therefore, (C) we ought to be ontologically committed to mathematical entities.

The first premise relies crucially on Quine's criterion of ontological commitment. After regimenting our best theories of the world in a first-order language, the ontological commitments of these theories can be read off as being the value of the existentially quantified variables. But how do we move from the ontological commitments of a theory to what we ought to be ontologically committed to? This is the point where the first premise of the indispensability argument emerges. If we are dealing with our best theories of the world, precisely those items that are indispensable to these theories amount to what we ought to be committed to. (Of course, a theory may quantify over more objects than those that are indispensable.) And by identifying the indispensable components invoked in the explanation of various phenomena, and noting that mathematical entities are among them, the platonist is then in a position to make sense of the success of applied mathematics.

However, it turns out that whether the platonist can indeed explain the success of the application of mathematics is, in fact, controversial. Given that mathematical objects are abstract, it is unclear why the postulation of such entities is helpful to understand the success of applied mathematics. For the physical world—being composed of objects located in space-time—is not constituted by the entities postulated by the platonist. Hence, it is not clear why the correct description of relations among abstract (mathematical) entities is even relevant to understand the behavior of concrete objects in the physical world involved in the application of mathematics. Just mentioning that the physical world instantiates structures (or substructures) described in general terms by various mathematical theories is not enough (see, e.g., Shapiro 1997). For there are infinitely many mathematical structures, and there is no way of uniquely determining which of them is actually instantiated—or even instantiated only in part—in a finite region of the physical world. There is a genuine underdetermination here, given that the same physical structure in the world can be accommodated by very different mathematical structures. For instance, quantum mechanical phenomena can be characterized by group-theoretic structures (Weyl 1928) or by structures emerging from the theory of Hilbert spaces (von Neumann 1932). Mathematically, such structures are very different, but there is no way of deciding between them empirically.

Despite the controversial nature of the platonist claim to be able to explain the success of applied mathematics, to accommodate that success is often taken as a significant benefit of platonism. Less controversially, the platonist is certainly able to describe the way in which mathematical theories are actually used in scientific practice without having to rewrite them. This is, as will become clear below, a significant benefit of the view.

Nominalism, in turn, faces the difficulty of having to explain the successful use of mathematics in scientific theorizing. Since, according to the nominalist, mathematical objects do not exist—or, at least, are not taken to exist—it becomes unclear how referring to such entities can contribute to the empirical success of scientific theories. In particular, if it turns out that reference to mathematical entities is indeed indispensable to our best theories of the world, how can the nominalist deny the existence of such entities? As we will see below, several nominalist views in the philosophy of mathematics have emerged in response to the challenge raised by considerations based on the indispensability of mathematics.

2.3 The problem of uniform semantics

One of the most significant features of platonism is the fact that it allows us to adopt the same semantics for both mathematical and scientific discourse. Given the existence of mathematical objects, mathematical statements are true in the same way as scientific statements are true. The only difference emerges from their respective truth makers: mathematical statements are true in virtue of abstract (mathematical) objects and relations among them, whereas scientific statements are ultimately true in virtue of concrete objects and the corresponding relations among such objects. This point is idealized in that it assumes that, somehow, we can manage to distill the empirical content of scientific statements independently of the contribution made by the mathematics that is often used to express such statements. Platonists who defend the indispensability argument insist that this is not possible to do (Quine 1960; Colyvan 2001a); even some nominalists concur (Azzouni 2011).

Moreover, as is typical in the application of mathematics, there are also mixed statements, which involve both terms referring to concrete objects and terms referring to abstract ones. The platonist has no trouble providing a unified semantics for such statements either—particularly if mathematical platonism is associated with realism about science. In this case, the platonist can provide a referential semantics throughout. Of course, the platonist about mathematics need not be a realist about science—although it's common to combine platonism and realism in this way. In principle, the platonist could adopt some form of anti-realism about science, such as constructive empiricism (van Fraassen 1980; Bueno 2009). As long as the form of anti-realism regarding science allows for a referential semantics (and many do), the platonist would have no trouble providing a unified semantics for both mathematics and science (Benacerraf 1973).

It is not clear that the nominalist can deliver these benefits. As will become clear shortly, most versions of nominalism require a substantial rewriting of mathematical language. As a result, a distinct semantics needs to be offered for that language in comparison with the semantics that is provided for scientific discourse.

2.4 The problem of taking mathematical discourse literally

A related benefit of platonism is that it allows one to take mathematical discourse literally, given that mathematical terms refer. In particular, there is no change in the syntax of mathematical statements. So, when mathematicians claim that ‘There are infinitely many prime numbers’, the platonist can take that statement literally as describing the existence of an infinitude of primes. On the platonist view, there are obvious truth-makers for mathematical statements: mathematical objects and their corresponding properties and relations (Benacerraf 1973).

We have here a major benefit of platonism. If one of the goals of the philosophy of mathematics is to provide understanding of mathematics and mathematical practice, it is a significant advantage that platonists are able to take the products of that practice—such as mathematical theories—literally and do not need to rewrite or reformulate them. After all, the platonist is then in a position to examine mathematical theories as they are actually formulated in mathematical practice, rather than discuss a parallel discourse offered by various reconstructions of mathematics given by those who avoid the commitment to mathematical objects (such as the nominalists).

The inability to take mathematical discourse literally is indeed a problem for nominalists, who typically need to rewrite the relevant mathematical theories. As will become clear below, it is common that nominalization strategies for mathematics change either the syntax or the semantics of mathematical statements. For instance, in the case of modal structuralism, modal operators are introduced to preserve verbal agreement with the platonist (Hellman 1989). The proposal is that each mathematical statement S is translated into two modal statements: (i) if there were structures of the suitable kind, S would be true in these structures, and (ii) it's possible that there are such structures. As a result, both the syntax and the semantics of mathematics are changed. In the case of mathematical fictionalism, in order to preserve verbal agreement with the platonist despite the denial of the existence of mathematical objects, fiction operators (such as, ‘According to arithmetic…’) are introduced (Field 1989). Once again, the resulting proposal changes the syntax (and, hence, the semantics) of mathematical discourse. This is a significant cost for these views.

2.5 The ontological problem

The ontological problem consists in specifying the nature of the objects a philosophical conception of mathematics is ontologically committed to. Can the nature of these objects be properly determined? Are the objects in question such that we simply lack good grounds to believe in their existence? Traditional forms of platonism have been criticized for failing to offer an adequate solution to this problem. In response, some platonists have argued that the commitment to mathematical objects is neither problematic nor mysterious (see, e.g., Hale and Wright 2001). Similarly, even though some nominalists need not be committed to mathematical objects, they may be committed to other entities that may also raise ontological concerns (such as possibilia). The ontological problem is then the problem of assessing the status of the ultimate commitments of the view.

Three nominalization strategies will be discussed below: mathematical fictionalism (Field 1980, 1989), modal structuralism (Hellman 1989, 1996), and deflationary nominalism (Azzouni 2004). The first two reject the second premise of the indispensability argument. They provide ‘hard roads’ to nominalism (Colyvan 2010), in the sense that the nominalist needs to develop the complex, demanding work of showing how quantification over mathematical objects can be avoided in order to develop a suitable interpretation of mathematics. The third strategy rejects the first premise of the argument, thus bypassing the need to argue for the dispensability of mathematics (in fact, for the deflationary nominalist, mathematics is ultimately indispensable). By reassessing Quine's criterion of ontological commitment, and indicating that quantification over certain objects does not require their existence, this strategy yields an ‘easy road’ to nominalism.

Although this survey is clearly not exhaustive, since not every nominalist view available will be considered here, the three views discussed are representative: they occupy distinct points in the logical space, and they have been explicitly developed to address the various problems just listed.

3. Mathematical Fictionalism

3.1 Central features of mathematical fictionalism

In a series of works, Hartry Field provided an ingenious strategy for the nominalization of science (Field 1980, 1989). As opposed to platonist views, in order to explain the usefulness of mathematics in science, Field does not postulate the truth of mathematical theories. In his view, it is possible to explain successful applications of mathematics with no commitment to mathematical objects. Therefore, what he takes to be the main argument for platonism, which relies on the (apparent) indispensability of mathematics to science, is resisted. The nominalist nature of Field's account emerges from the fact that mathematical objects are not assumed to exist. Hence, mathematical theories are false. (Strictly speaking, Field notes, any existential mathematical statement is false, and any universal mathematical statement is vacuously true.) By devising a strategy that shows how to dispense with mathematical objects in the formulation of scientific theories, Field rejects the indispensability argument, and provides strong grounds for the articulation of a nominalist stance.

Prima facie, it may sound counterintuitive to state that ‘there are infinitely many prime numbers’ is false. But if numbers do not exist, that's the proper truth-value for that statement (assuming a standard semantics). In response to this concern, Field 1989 introduces a fictional operator, in terms of which verbal agreement can be reached with the platonist. In the case at hand, one would state: ‘According to arithmetic, there are infinitely many prime numbers’, which is clearly true. Given the use of a fictional operator, the resulting view is often called mathematical fictionalism.

The nominalization strategy devised by the mathematical fictionalist depends on two interrelated moves. The first is to change the aim of mathematics, which is not taken to be truth, but something different. On this view, the proper norm of mathematics, which will guide the nominalization program, is conservativeness. A mathematical theory is conservative if it is consistent with every internally consistent theory about the physical world, where such theories do not involve any reference to, nor quantification over, mathematical objects, such as sets, functions, numbers etc. (Field 1989, p. 58). Conservativeness is stronger than consistency (since if a theory is conservative, it is consistent, but not vice versa). However, conservativeness is not weaker than truth (Field 1980, pp. 16–19; Field 1989, p. 59). So, Field is not countenancing a weaker aim of mathematics, but only a different one.

It is precisely because mathematics is conservative that, despite being false, it can be useful. Of course, this usefulness is explained with no commitment to mathematical entities: mathematics is useful because it shortens our derivations. After all, if a mathematical theory M is conservative, then a nominalistic assertion A about the physical world (i.e. an assertion which does not refer to mathematical objects) follows from a body N of such assertions and M only if it follows from N alone. That is, provided we have a sufficiently rich body of nominalistic assertions, the use of mathematics does not yield any new nominalistic consequences. Mathematics is only a useful instrument to help us in the derivations.

As a result, conservativeness can only be employed to do the required job if we have nominalistic premises to start with (Field 1989, p. 129). As Field points out, it is a confusion to argue against his view by claiming that if we add some bits of mathematics to a body of mathematical claims (not nominalistic ones), we may obtain new consequences that could not be achieved otherwise (Field 1989, p. 128). The restriction to nominalistic assertions is crucial.

The second move of the mathematical fictionalist strategy is to provide such nominalistic premises. Field has done that in one important case: Newtonian gravitational theory. He elaborates on a work that has a respectable tradition: Hilbert's axiomatization of geometry (Hilbert 1971). What Hilbert provided was a synthetic formulation of geometry, which dispenses with metric concepts, and therefore does not include any quantification over real numbers. His axiomatization was based on concepts such as point, betweenness, and congruence. Intuitively speaking, we say that a point y is between the points x and z if y is a point in the line-segment whose endpoints are x and z. Also intuitively, we say that the line-segment xy is congruent to the line-segment zw if the distance from the point x to the point y is the same as that from the point z to w. After studying the formal properties of the resulting system, Hilbert proved a representation theorem. He showed, in a stronger mathematical theory, that given a model of the axiom system for space he had put forward, there is a function d from pairs of points onto non-negative real numbers such that the following ‘homomorphism conditions’ are met:

  1. xy is congruent to zw iff d(x, y) = d(z,w), for all points x, y, z, and w;
  2. y is between x and z iff d(x, y) + d(y, z) = d(x, z), for all points x, y, and z.

As a result, if the function d is taken to represent distance, we obtain the expected results about congruence and betweenness. Thus, although we cannot talk about numbers in Hilbert's geometry (there are no such entities to quantify over), there is a metatheoretic result that associates assertions about distances with what can be said in the theory. Field calls such numerical claims abstract counterparts of purely geometric assertions, and they can be used to draw conclusions about purely geometrical claims in a smoother way. Indeed, because of the representation theorem, conclusions about space, statable without real numbers, can be drawn far more easily than we could achieve by a deflationary proof from Hilbert's axioms. This illustrates Field's point that the usefulness of mathematics derives from shortening derivations (Field 1980, pp. 24–29).

Roughly speaking, what Field established was how to extend Hilbert's results about space to space-time. Similarly to Hilbert's approach, instead of formulating Newtonian laws in terms of numerical functors, Field showed that they can be recast in terms of comparative predicates. For example, instead of adopting a functor such as ‘the gravitational potential of x’, which is taken to have a numerical value, Field employed a comparative predicate such as ‘the difference in gravitational potential between x and y is less than that between z and w’. Relying on a body of representation theorems (which plays the same role as Hilbert's representation theorem in geometry), Field established how several numerical functors can be ‘obtained’ from comparative predicates. But in order to use those theorems, he first showed how to formulate Newtonian numerical laws (such as, Poisson's equation for the gravitational field) only in terms of comparative predicates. The result (Field 1989, pp. 130–131) is the following extended representation theorem. Let N be a theory formulated only in terms of comparative predicates (with no recourse to numerical functors). For any model S of N whose domain is constituted by space-time regions, there exists:

  1. A 1–1 spatio-temporal co-ordinate function f (unique up to a generalized Galilean transformation) mapping the space-time of S onto quadruples of real numbers;
  2. A mass density function g (unique up to a positive multiplicative transformation) mapping the space-time of S onto an interval of non-negative real numbers; and
  3. A gravitational potential function h (unique up to a positive linear transformation) mapping the space-time onto an interval of real numbers.

Moreover, all these functions ‘preserve structure’, in the sense that the comparative relations defined in terms of them coincide with the comparative relations used in N. Furthermore, if f, g and h are taken as the denotation of the appropriate functors, the laws of Newtonian gravitational theory in their functorial form hold.

Notice that, in quantifying over space-time regions, Field assumes a substantivalist view of space-time, according to which there are space-time regions that are not fully occupied (Field 1980, pp. 34–36; Field 1989, pp. 171–180). Given this result, the mathematical fictionalist is allowed to draw nominalistic conclusions from premises involving N plus a mathematical theory T. After all, due to the conservativeness of mathematics, such conclusions can be obtained independently of T. The role of the extended representation theorem is then to establish that, despite the lack of quantification over mathematical objects, precisely the same class of models is determined by formulating Newtonian gravitational theory in terms of functors (as the theory is usually expressed) or in terms of comparative predicates (as the mathematical fictionalist favors). Thus, the extended representation theorem ensures that the use of conservativeness of mathematics together with suitable nominalistic claims (formulated via comparative predicates) does not change the class of models of the original theory: the same comparative relations are preserved. Hence, what Field provided is a nominalization strategy, and since it reduces ontology, it seems a promising candidate for a nominalist stance vis-à-vis mathematics.

How should the mathematical fictionalist approach physical theories, such as perhaps string theory, that do not seem to be about concrete observable objects? One possible response, assuming the lack of empirical import of such theories, is simply to reject that they are physical theories, and as such they are not the sorts of theories for which the mathematical fictionalist needs to provide a nominalistic counterpart. In other words, until the moment in which such theories acquire the relevant empirical import, they need not worry the mathematical fictionalist. Theories of that sort would be classified as part of the mathematics rather than the physics.

3.2 Metalogic and the formulation of conservativeness

But is mathematics conservative? In order to establish the conservativeness of mathematics, the mathematical fictionalist has used metalogical results, such as the completeness and the compactness of first-order logic (Field 1992, 1980, 1989). The issue then arises as to whether the mathematical fictionalist can use these results to develop the program.

At two crucial junctures, Field has made use of metalogical results: (a) in his reformulation of the notion of conservativeness in nominalistically acceptable terms (Field 1989, pp. 119–120; Field 1991), and (b) in his nominalist proof of the conservativeness of set theory (Field 1992). These two outcomes are crucial for Field, since they establish the adequacy of conservativeness for the mathematical fictionalist. For (a) settles that the latter can formulate that notion without violating nominalism, and (b) concludes that conservativeness is a feature that mathematics actually has. But if these two outcomes are not legitimate, Field's approach cannot get off the ground. I will now consider whether these two uses of metalogical results are acceptable on nominalist grounds.

3.2.1 Conservativeness and the compactness theorem

Let me start with (a). The mathematical fictionalist has relied on the compactness theorem to formulate the notion of conservativeness in an acceptable way, that is, without reference to mathematical entities. As noted above, conservativeness is defined in terms of consistency. But this notion is usually formulated either in semantic terms (as the existence of an appropriate model), or in proof-theoretic terms (in terms of suitable proofs). However, as Field acknowledges, these two formulations of consistency are platonist, since they depend on abstract objects (models and proofs), and therefore are not nominalistically acceptable.

The mathematical fictionalist way out is to avoid moving to the metalanguage in order to express the conservativeness of mathematics. The idea is to state, in the object-language, the claim that a given mathematical theory is conservative by introducing a primitive notion of logical consistency: ◊A. Thus, if B is any sentence, B* is the result of restricting B to non-mathematical entities, and M1, …, Mn are the axioms of a mathematical theory M, the conservativeness of M can be expressed by the following schema (Field 1989, p. 120):

(C) If ◊B, then ◊(B* ∧ M1 ∧ … ∧ Mn).

In other words, a mathematical theory M is conservative if it is consistent with every consistent theory about the physical world B*.

This assumes, of course, that M is finitely axiomatized. But how can we apply (C) in the case of mathematical theories that are not finitely axiomatizable (such as Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory)? In this case, we cannot make the conjunction of all the axioms of the theory, since there are infinitely many of them. Field has addressed this issue, and he initially suggested that the mathematical fictionalist could use substitutional quantification to express these infinite conjunctions (Field 1984). In a postscript to the revised version of this essay (Field 1989, pp. 119–120), he notes that substitutional quantification can be avoided, provided that the mathematical and physical theories in question are expressed in a logic for which compactness holds. For in this case, the consistency of the whole theory is reduced to the consistency of each of its finite conjunctions.

There are, however, three problems with this move.

  1. One concern about the use of substitutional quantification in this context involves the nature of substitutional instances. If the latter turn out to be abstract, which would be the case if such substitutional instances were not mere inscriptions, they are not available to the nominalist. If the substitutional instances are concrete, the nominalist needs to show that there are enough of them.
  2. The very statement of the compactness theorem involves set-theoretic talk: let G be a set of formulas; if every finite subset of G is consistent, then G is consistent. How can nominalists rely on a theorem whose very statement involves abstract entities? In order to use this theorem, an appropriate reformulation is required.
  3. Let us grant that it is possible to reformulate this statement without referring to sets. Can then the nominalist use the compactness theorem? As is well known, the proof of this theorem assumes set theory. The compactness theorem is usually presented as a corollary to the completeness theorem for first-order logic, whose proof assumes set theory (see, for example, Boolos and Jeffrey 1989, pp. 140–141). Alternatively, if the compactness result is to be proved directly, then one has to construct the appropriate model of G—which again requires set theory. So, unless mathematical fictionalists are able to provide an appropriate nominalization strategy for set theory itself, they are not entitled to use this result. In other words, far more work is required before a Field-type nominalist is able to rely on metalogical results.

But maybe this criticism misses the whole point of Field's program. As we saw, Field does not require that a mathematical theory M be true for it to be used. Only its conservativeness is demanded. So, if M is added to a body B* of nominalistic claims, no new nominalistic conclusion is obtained which was not obtained by B* alone. In other words, what Field's strategy asks for is the formulation of appropriate nominalistic bodies of claims to which mathematics can be applied. The same point holds for metalogical results: provided that they are applied to nominalistic claims, Field is fine.

The problem with this reply is that it involves the mathematical fictionalist program in a circle. The fictionalist cannot rely on the conservativeness of mathematics to justify the use of a mathematical result (the compactness theorem) that is required for the formulation of the notion of conservativeness itself. For in doing that, the fictionalist assumes that the notion of conservativeness is nominalistically acceptable, and this is exactly the point in question. Recall that the motivation for Field to use the compactness theorem was to reformulate conservativeness without having to assume abstract entities (namely, those required by the semantic and the proof-theoretic accounts of consistency). Thus, at this point, the mathematical fictionalist cannot yet use the notion of conservativeness; otherwise, the whole program would not get off the ground. I conclude that, similarly to any other part of mathematics, metalogical results also need to be obtained nominalistically. Trouble arises for nominalism otherwise.

3.2.2 Conservativeness and primitive modality

But perhaps the mathematical fictionalist has a way out. As we saw, Field spells out the notion of conservativeness in terms of a primitive notion of logical consistency: ◊A. And he also indicates that this notion is related to the model-theoretic concept of consistency—in particular, to the formulation of this concept in von Neumann-Bernays-Gödel finitely axiomatizable set theory (NBG). This is done via two principles (Field 1989, p. 108):

(MTP#) If ☐(NBG → there is a model for ‘A’), then ◊A

(ME#) If ☐(NBG → there is no model for ‘A’), then ¬◊A.

I am following Field's terminology: ‘MTP#’ stands for model-theoretic possibility, and ‘ME#’ for model existence. The symbol ‘#’ indicates that, according to Field, these principles are nominalistically acceptable. After all, they are modal surrogates for the platonistic principles (Field 1989, pp. 103–109):

(MTP) If there is a model for ‘A’, then ◊A

(ME) If there is no model for ‘A’, then ¬◊A.

It may be argued that, by using these principles, the mathematical fictionalist will be entitled to use the compactness theorem. First, one should try to state this theorem in a nominalistically acceptable way. Without worrying too much about details, let us grant, for the sake of argument, that the following characterization will do:

(Compact#) If ¬◊T, then ∃f A1, …, An[¬◊(A1 ∧ … ∧ An)],

where T is a theory and each Ai, 1 ≤ in, is a formula (an axiom of T). The expression ‘∃f A1An’ is to be read as ‘there are finitely many formulas A1An’. (This quantifier is not first-order. However, I am not going to press the point that the nominalist seems to need a non-first-order quantifier to express a property typical of first-order logic. This is only one of the worries we are leaving aside in this formulation.) This version is parasitic on the following platonistic formulation of the compactness theorem:

(Compact) If there is no model for T, then ∃f A1, …, An such that there is no model for (A1 ∧ … ∧ An).

In order for mathematical fictionalists to be entitled to use the compactness theorem, they will have to show that the nominalistic formulation (Compact#) follows from the platonistic one (Compact). In this sense, if the latter is adequate, so is the former. More accurately, what has to be shown is that (Compact#) follows from a modal surrogate of (Compact). After all, since what is at issue is the legitimacy of the compactness theorem on nominalist grounds, it would be question-begging to assume the full platonistic version from the outset. As we will see, there are two ways to try to establish this result. Unfortunately, none of them works: both are formally inadequate.

The two options start in the same way. Suppose that

(1) ¬◊T.

We have to establish that

(2) ∃f A1An ¬◊(A1∧…∧An).

It follows from (1) and (MTP#) that

(3) ¬☐(NBG → there is a model for ‘T’),

and thus

(4) ◊(NBG ∧ there is no model for ‘T’).

Let us assume the modal surrogate for the compactness theorem:

(CompactM) ☐(NBG → if there is no model for ‘T’, then ∃f A1An such that there is no model for (A1∧…∧An)).

Note that, since the modal surrogate is formulated in terms of models (rather than in terms of the primitive modal operator), it is still not what mathematical fictionalists need. What they need is (Compact#), but one needs to show that they can get it. At this point, the options begin to diverge.

The first option consists in drawing from (4) and (CompactM) that

(5) ◊(∃f A1An such that there is no model for (A1 ∧…∧ An)).

There are, however, difficulties with this move. First, note that (5) is not equivalent to (2), which is the result to be achieved. Moreover, as opposed to (2), (5) is formulated in model-theoretic terms, since it incorporates a claim about the nonexistence of a certain model. And what is required is a similar statement in terms of the primitive notion of consistency. In other words, we need the nominalistic counterpart of (5), rather than (5).

But (5) has a nice feature. It is a modalized formulation of the consequent of (Compact). And since (5) only states the possibility that there is no model of a particular kind, it may be argued that it is nominalistically acceptable. (As will be examined below, modal structuralists advance a nominalization strategy exploring modality along these lines; see Hellman (1989).) Field, however, is skeptical about this move. On his view, modality is not a general surrogate for ontology (Field 1989, pp. 252–268). And one of his worries is that by allowing the introduction of modal operators, as a general nominalization strategy, we modalize away the physical content of the theory under consideration. However, since metalogical claims are not expected to have physical consequences, the worry need not arise here. At any rate, given that (5) does not establish what needs to be established, it does not solve the problem.

The second option consists in moving to (5′) instead of (5):

(5′) ☐(NBG → ∃f A1An such that there is no model for (A1 ∧…∧ An)).

Note that if (5′) were established, we would have settled the matter. After all, with a straightforward reworking of (ME#) (namely, If ☐(NBG → ∃f A1An such that there is no model for (A1∧…∧An)), then ¬◊(A1 ∧…∧ An)), it follows from (5′) and (ME#) that

(2) ∃f A1An ¬◊(A1 ∧…∧ An),

which is the conclusion we need. The problem here is that (5′) does not follow from (4) and (CompactM). Therefore, we cannot derive it.

Clearly, there may well be another option that establishes the intended conclusion. But, to say the least, the mathematical fictionalist has to present it before being entitled to use metalogic results. Until then, it is not clear that these results are nominalistically acceptable.

3.2.3 Metalogic and the proof of the conservativeness of set theory

I should now consider issue (b): Field's nominalistic proof of the conservativeness of set theory. Let us grant that the concept of conservativeness has been formulated in some nominalistically acceptable way. If Field's proof were correct, he would have proved that mathematics itself is conservative—as long as one assumes the usual reductions of mathematics to set theory. How does Field prove the conservativeness of set theory? It is by an ingenious argument, which adapts one of the Field's platonistic conservativeness proofs (Field 1980). For our present purposes, we need not examine the details of this argument, but simply note that at a crucial point the completeness of first-order logic is used to establish its conclusion (Field 1992, p. 118).

The problem with this move is that, even if mathematical fictionalists formulate the statement of the completeness theorem without referring to mathematical entities, the proof of this theorem assumes set theory (see, for instance, Boolos and Jeffrey 1989, pp. 131–140). Therefore, fictionalists cannot use the theorem without undermining their nominalism. After all, the point of providing a nominalistic proof of the conservativeness of set theory is to show that, without recourse to platonist mathematics, the mathematical fictionalist is able to establish that mathematics is conservative. Field has offered a platonist argument for the conservativeness result (Field 1980)—an argument that explicitly invoked properties of set theory. The idea was to provide a reductio of platonism: by using platonist mathematics, Field attempted to establish that mathematics was conservative and, thus, ultimately dispensable. In contrast with the earlier strategy, the goal was to provide a proof of the conservativeness of set theory that a nominalist could accept. But since the nominalistic proof relies on the completeness theorem, it is not at all clear that it is in fact nominalist. Mathematical fictionalists should first be able to prove the completeness result without assuming set theory. Alternatively, they should provide a nominalization strategy for set theory itself, which will then entitle them to use metalogical results.

But it may be argued that the mathematical fictionalist only requires the conservativeness of the set theory in which the completeness theorem is proved. It should now be clear that this reply is entirely question begging, since the point at issue is exactly to prove the conservativeness of set theory. Thus, the fictionalist cannot assume that this result is already established at the metatheory.

In other words, without a broader nominalization strategy, which allows set theory itself to be nominalized, it seems difficult to see how mathematical fictionalists can use metalogical results as part of their program. The problem, however, is that it is not at all obvious that, at least in the form articulated by Field, the mathematical fictionalist program can be extended to set theory. For it only provides a nominalization strategy for scientific theories, that is, for the use of mathematics in science (e.g., in Newtonian gravitational theory). The approach doesn't address the nominalization of mathematics itself.

In principle, one may object, this shouldn't be a problem. After all, the mathematical fictionalists’ motivation to develop their approach has focused on one issue: to overcome the indispensability argument—thus addressing the use of mathematics in science. And the overall strategy, as noted, has been to provide nominalist counterparts to relevant scientific theories.

The problem with this objection, however, is that given the nature of Field's strategy, the task of nominalizing science cannot be achieved without also nominalizing set theory. Thus, what is needed is a more open-ended, broader nominalism: one that goes hand in hand not only with science, but also with metalogic. As it stands, the mathematical fictionalist approach still leaves a considerable gap.

3.3 Assessment: benefits and problems of mathematical fictionalism

3.3.1 The epistemological problem

Given that mathematical objects do not exist, on the mathematical fictionalist perspective, the problem of how we can obtain knowledge of them simply vanishes. But another problem emerges instead: what is it that distinguishes a mathematician (who knows a lot about mathematics) and a non-mathematician (who does not have such knowledge)? The difference here (according to Field 1984) is not about having or lacking mathematical knowledge, but rather it is about logical knowledge: of knowing which mathematical theorems follow from certain mathematical principles, and which do not. The epistemological problem is then solved—as long as the mathematical fictionalist provides an epistemology for logic.

In fact, what needs to be offered is ultimately an epistemology for modality. After all, on Field's account, in order to avoid the platonist commitment to models or proofs, the concept of logical consequence is understood in terms of the primitive modal concept of logical possibility: A follows logically from B as long as the conjunction of B and the negation of A is impossible, that is, ¬◊(B ∧ ¬A).

However, how are such judgments of impossibility established? Under what conditions do we know that they hold? In simple cases, involving straightforward statements, to establish such judgments may be unproblematic. The problem emerges when more substantive statements are invoked. In these cases, we seem to need a significant amount of mathematical information in order to be able to determine whether the impossibilities in question really hold or not. Consider, for instance, the difficulty of establishing the independence of the axiom of choice and the continuum hypotheses from the axioms of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory. Significantly complex mathematical models need to be constructed in this case, which rely on the development of special mathematical techniques to build them. What is required from the mathematical fictionalist at this stage is the nominalization of set theory itself—something that, as we saw, Field still owes us.

3.3.2 The problem of the application of mathematics

Similarly to the epistemological problem, the problem of the application of mathematics is partially solved by the mathematical fictionalist. Field provides an account of the application of mathematics that does not require the truth of mathematical theories. As we saw, this demands that mathematics be conservative in the relevant sense. However, it is unclear whether Field has established the conservativeness of mathematics, given his restrictive way of introducing non-set-theoretic vocabulary into the axioms of set theory as part of his attempted proof of the conservativeness of set theory (Azzouni 2009b, p. 169, note 47; additional difficulties for the mathematical fictionalist program can be found in Melia 1998, 2000). Field was working with restricted ZFU, Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory with the axiom of choice modified to allow for Urelemente, objects that are not sets, but not allowing for any non-set-theoretic vocabulary to appear in the comprehension axioms, that is, replacement or separation (Field 1980, p. 17). This is, however, a huge restriction, given that when mathematics is actually applied, non-set-theoretic vocabulary, when translated into set-theoretic language, will have to appear in the comprehension axioms. As formulated by Field, the proof failed to address the crucial case of actual applications of mathematics.

Moreover, it is also unclear whether the nominalization program advanced by the mathematical fictionalist can be extended to other scientific theories, such as quantum mechanics (Malament 1992). Mark Balaguer responded to this challenge by trying to nominalize quantum mechanics along mathematical fictionalist lines (Balaguer 1998). However, as argued by Bueno (Bueno 2003), Balaguer's strategy is incompatible with a number of interpretations of quantum mechanics, in particular with Bas van Fraassen's version of the modal interpretation (van Fraassen 1991). And given that Balaguer's strategy invokes physically real propensities, it is unclear whether it is even compatible with nominalism. As a result, the nominalization of quantum mechanics still remains a major problem for the mathematical fictionalist.

But even if these difficulties can all be addressed, it is unclear that the mathematical fictionalist has offered an account of the application of mathematics that allows us to make sense of how mathematical theories are actually applied. After all, the fictionalist account requires us to rewrite the relevant theories, by finding suitable nominalistic versions for them. This leaves the issue of making sense of the actual process of the application of mathematics entirely untouched, given that no such reformulations are ever employed in actual scientific practice. Rather than engaging with actual features of the application process, the fictionalist creates a parallel discourse in an effort to provide a nominalist reconstruction of the use of mathematics in science. The reconstruction shows, at best, that mathematical fictionalists need not worry about the application of mathematics vis-à-vis increasing their ontology. But the problem still remains of whether they are in a position to make sense of the actual use of mathematics in science. This problem, which is crucial for a proper understanding of mathematical practice, still remains.

A similar difficulty also emerges for Balaguer's version of fictionalism (see the second half of Balaguer 1998). Balaguer relies on the possibility of distinguishing between the mathematical and the physical contents of an applied mathematical theory: in particular, the truth of such a theory holds only in virtue of physical facts, with no contribution from mathematics. It is, however, controversial whether the distinction between mathematical and physical content can be characterized without implementing a Field-like nominalization program. In this case, the same difficulties that the latter face also carry over to Balaguer's account (Colyvan 2010; Azzouni 2011).

Moreover, according to Azzouni (Azzouni 2009b), in order for scientists to use a scientific theory, they need to assert it. On his view, it is not enough for scientists simply to recognize that a scientific theory is true (or exhibits some other theoretical virtue). It is required that they assert the theory. In particular, scientists would then need to assert a nominalistic theory. They cannot simply contemplate such a theory; they need to be able to assert it as well (Azzouni 2009b, footnotes 31, 43, 53, and 55, and p. 171). Thus, nominalists who grant this point to Azzouni need to show that scientists are in a position to assert the relevant nominalistic theories in order to address the issue of the application of mathematics.

3.3.3 Uniform semantics

In one respect, mathematical fictionalists offer a uniform semantics for mathematical and scientific discourse, in another respect, they don't. Initially, both types of discourse are assessed in the same way. Electrons and relations among them make certain quantum-mechanical statements true; in turn, mathematical objects and relations among them make the corresponding mathematical statements true. It just happens that, as opposed to electrons on a realist interpretation of quantum mechanics, mathematical objects do not exist. Hence, as noted, existential mathematical statements, such as ‘there are infinitely many prime numbers’, are false. Although the resulting truth-value assignments for existential statements conflict with those found in mathematical practice, at least the same semantics is offered for mathematical and scientific languages.

In an attempt to agree with the truth-value assignments that are usually displayed in mathematical discourse, the mathematical fictionalist introduces a fictional operator: ‘According to mathematical theory M…’. Such an operator, however, changes the semantics of mathematical discourse. Applied to a true mathematical statement, at least one that the platonist recognizes as true, the result will be a true statement—even according to the mathematical fictionalist. For instance, from both platonist and fictionalist perspectives, the statement ‘according to arithmetic, there are infinitely many prime numbers’ comes out true. But, in this case, the mathematical fictionalist can no longer offer a unified semantics for mathematical and scientific languages, given that the latter does not involve the introduction of fictional operators. Thus, whether mathematical fictionalists are able to provide a uniform semantics ultimately depends on whether fictional operators are introduced or not.

3.3.4. Taking mathematics literally

An immediate consequence of the introduction of fiction operators is that mathematical discourse is no longer taken literally. As just noted, without such operators, mathematical fictionalism produces non-standard attributions of truth-values to mathematical statements. But with fiction operators in place, the syntax of mathematical discourse is changed, and thus the latter cannot be taken literally.

3.3.5 The ontological problem

The ontological problem—the problem of the acceptability of the ontological commitments made by the mathematical fictionalist—is basically solved. No commitment to mathematical objects is, in principle, made. Although a primitive modal notion is introduced, it has only a limited role in the nominalization of mathematics: to allow for a nominalist formulation of the crucial concept of conservativeness. As we saw, however, without a proper nominalization of set theory itself, it is unclear whether the mathematical fictionalist program ultimately succeeds.

4. Modal Structuralism

4.1 Central features of modal structuralism

Modal structuralism offers a program of interpretation of mathematics which incorporates two features: (a) an emphasis on structures as the main subject-matter of mathematics, and (b) a complete elimination of reference to mathematical objects by interpreting mathematics in terms of modal logic (as first suggested by Putnam (1967), and developed in Hellman (1989, 1996)). Given these features, the resulting approach is called a modal-structural interpretation (Hellman 1989, pp. vii–viii and 6–9).

The proposal is also supposed to meet two important requirements (Hellman 1989, pp. 2–6). The first is that mathematical statements should have truth-values, and thus ‘instrumentalist’ readings are rejected from the outset. The second is that: ‘a reasonable account should be forthcoming of how mathematics does in fact apply to the material world’ (Hellman 1989, p. 6). Thus, the applicability problem must be examined.

In order to address these issues, the modal structuralist puts forward a general framework. The main idea is that although mathematics is concerned with the study of structures, this study can be accomplished by focusing only on possible structures, and not actual ones. Thus, the modal interpretation is not committed to actual mathematical structures; there is no commitment to their existence as objects or to any objects that happen to ‘constitute’ these structures. In this way, the ontological commitment to them is avoided: the only claim is that the structures in question are possible. In order to articulate this point, the modal-structural interpretation is formulated in a second-order modal language based on S5. However, to prevent commitment to a set-theoretical characterization of the modal operators, Hellman takes these operators as primitive (1989, pp. 17, and 20–23).

Two steps are taken. The first is to present an appropriate translation scheme in terms of which each ordinary mathematical statement S is taken as elliptical for a hypothetical statement, namely: that S would hold in a structure of the appropriate kind.

For example, if we are considering number-theoretic statements, such as those articulated in Peano arithmetic (PA, for short), the structures we are concerned with are ‘progressions’ or ‘ω-sequences’ satisfying PA's axioms. In this case, each particular statement S is to be (roughly) translated as

☐∀X(X is an ω-sequence satisfying PA's axioms → S holds in X).

According to this statement, if there were ω-sequences satisfying PA's axioms, S would hold in them. This is the hypothetical component of the modal-structural interpretation (for a detailed analysis and a precise formulation, see (Hellman 1989, pp. 16–24)). The categorical component constitutes the second step (Helman 1989, pp. 24–33). The idea is to assume that the structures of the appropriate kind are logically possible. In that case, we have that

◊∃X(X is an ω-sequence satisfying PA's axioms).

That is, it is logically possible that there are ω-sequences satisfying PA's axioms. Following this approach, truth preserving translations of mathematical statements can be presented without ontological costs, given that only the possibility of the structures in question is assumed.

The modal structuralist then indicates that the practice of theorem proving can be regained in this framework (roughly speaking, by applying the translation scheme to each line of the original proof of the theorem under consideration). Moreover, by using the translation scheme and appropriate coding devices, one can argue that arithmetic, real analysis and, to a certain extent, even set theory are recovered in a nominalist setting (Hellman 1989, pp. 16–33, 44–47, and 53–93). In particular, ‘by making use of coding devices, virtually all the mathematics commonly encountered in current physical theories can be carried out within [real analysis]’ (Hellman 1989, pp. 45–46). However, the issue of whether set theory has been nominalized in this way is, in fact, problematic—as the modal structuralist grants. After all, it is no obvious matter to establish even the possibility of the existence of structures with inaccessibly many objects.

With the framework in place, the modal structuralist can then consider the applicability problem. The main idea is to adopt the hypothetical component as the basis for accommodating the application of mathematics. The relevant structures are those commonly used in particular branches of science. Two considerations need to be made at this point.

The first is the general form of applied mathematical statements (Hellman 1989, pp. 118–124). These statements involve three crucial components: the structures that are used in applied mathematics, the non-mathematical objects to which the mathematical structures are applied, and a statement of application that specifies the particular relations between the mathematical structures and the non-mathematical objects. The relevant mathematical structures can be formulated in set theory. Let us call the set theory used in applied contexts Z. (This is second-order Zermelo set theory, which is finitely axiomatizable; I'll denote the conjunction of the axioms of Z by ∧Z.) The non-mathematical objects of interest in the context of application can be expressed in Z as Urelemente, that is, as objects that are not sets. We will take ‘U’ to be the statement that certain non-mathematical objects of interest are included as Urelemente in the structures of Z. Finally, ‘A’ is the statement of application, describing the particular relations between the relevant mathematical structures of Z and the non-mathematical objects described in U. The particular relations involved depend on the case in question. We can now present the general form of an applied mathematical statement (Hellman 1989, p. 119):

☐∀Xf ((∧Z & U)X (∈f) → A).

In the antecedent ‘(∧Z & U)X (∈f)’ is an abbreviation for the results from writing out the axioms of Zermelo set theory with all quantifiers relativized to the second order variable X, replacing each occurrence of the membership symbol ‘∈’ with the two place relation variable ‘f’. According to the applied mathematical statement, if there were structures satisfying the conjunction of the axioms of Zermelo set theory Z including some non-mathematical objects referred to in U, A would hold in such structures. The application statement A expresses the relations in questions, such as an isomorphism or a homomorphism between a physical system and certain set theoretic structures. This is the hypothetical component interpreted to express which relations would hold between certain mathematical structures (formulated as structures of ∧Z) and the entities studied in the world (the Urelemente).

The second consideration examines in more detail the relationships between the physical (or the material) objects studied and the mathematical framework. These are the “synthetic determination” relations (Hellman 1989, pp. 124–135). More specifically, we have to determine which relations among non-mathematical objects can be taken, in the antecedent of an applied mathematical statement, as the basis for specifying “the actual material situation” (Hellman 1989, p. 129). The modal structuralist proposal is to consider the models of a comprehensive theory T′. This theory embraces and links the vocabulary of the applied mathematical theory (T) and the synthetic vocabulary (S) in question, which intuitively fixes the actual material situation. It is assumed that T determines, up to isomorphism, a particular kind of mathematical structure (containing, for example, Z), and that T′ is an extension of T. In that case, a proposed “synthetic basis” will be adequate if the following condition holds:

Let a be the class of (mathematically) standard models of T′, and let V denote the full vocabulary of T′: then S determines V in a iff for any two models m and m′ in a, and any bijection f between their domains, if f is an S isomorphism, it is also a V isomorphism. (Hellman 1989, p. 132.)

The introduction of isomorphism in this context comes, of course, from the need to accommodate the preservation of structure between the (applied) mathematical part of the domain under study and the non-mathematical part. This holds in the crucial case in which the preservation of the synthetic properties and relations (S-isomorphism) by f leads to the preservation of the analytic applied mathematical relations (V-isomorphism) of the overall theory T′. It should be noted that the ‘synthetic’ structure is not meant to ‘capture’ the full structure of the mathematical theory in question, but only its applied part. (Recall that Hellman started with an applied mathematical theory T.)

This can be illustrated with a simple example. Suppose that finitely many physical objects display a linear order. We can describe this by defining a function from those objects to an initial segment of the natural numbers. What is required by the modal structuralist's synthetic determination condition is that the physical ordering among the objects alone captures this function and the description it offers of the objects. It is not claimed that the full natural number structure is thus captured. This example also provides an illustration of the applied mathematical statement mentioned above. The Urelemente (objects that are not sets) are the physical objects in question, the relevant mathematical relation is isomorphism, and the mathematical structure is a segment of natural numbers with their usual linear order.

On the modal structural conception, mathematics is applied by establishing an appropriate isomorphism between (parts of) mathematical structures and those structures that represent the material situation. This procedure is justified, since such isomorphism establishes the structural equivalence between the (relevant parts of the) mathematical and the non-mathematical levels.

However, this proposal faces two difficulties. The first concerns the ontological status of the structural equivalence between the (applied) mathematical and the non-mathematical domains. On what grounds can we claim that the structures under consideration are mathematically the same if some of them concern ‘material’ objects? Of course, given that the structural equivalence is established by an isomorphism the material objects are already formulated in structural terms—this means that some mathematics has already been applied to the domain in question. In other words, in order to be able to represent the applicability of mathematics, Hellman assumes that some mathematics has already been applied. This means that a purely mathematical characterization of the applicability of mathematics (via structure preservation) is inherently incomplete. The first step in the application, namely the mathematical modeling of the material domain, is not, and cannot, be accommodated, since no isomorphism is involved there. Indeed, given that by hypothesis the domain is not articulated in mathematical terms, no isomorphism is defined there.

It may be argued that the modal structural account does not require an isomorphism between (applied) mathematical structures and those describing the material situation. The account only requires an isomorphism between two standard models of the overall theory T′, which links the mathematical theory T and the description S of the material domain. In reply, note that this only moves the difficulty one level up. In order for T′ to extend the applied mathematical theory T and to provide a link between T and the material situation, a model of T′ will have to be, in particular, a model of both T and S. Thus, if the modal structuralist's synthetic determination claim is satisfied, an isomorphism between two models of T′ will determine an isomorphism between the models of S and those of T. In this way, an isomorphism between structures describing the material situation and those arising from applied mathematics is still required.

The second difficulty addresses the epistemological status of the claim that there is a structural equivalence between the mathematical and the non-mathematical domains. On what grounds do we know that such equivalence holds? Someone may say that the equivalence is normatively imposed in order for the application process to get off the ground. But this suggestion leads to a dilemma. Either it is just assumed that we know that the equivalence holds, and the epistemological question is begged (given that the grounds for this are in question), or it is assumed that we do not know that the equivalence holds—and that is why we have to impose the condition—in which case the latter is clearly groundless. However, it may be argued that there is no problem here, since we establish the isomorphism by examining the physical theories of the material objects under consideration. But the problem is that in order to formulate these physical theories we typically use mathematics. And the issue is precisely to explain this use, that is, to provide some understanding of the grounds in terms of which we come to know that the relevant mathematical structures are isomorphic to the physical ones.

The main point underlying these considerations has been stressed often enough (although in a different context): isomorphism does not seem to be an appropriate condition for capturing the relation between mathematical structures and the world (see, e.g., da Costa and French 2003). There is, of course, a correct intuition underlying the use of isomorphism at this level, and this relates to the idea of justifying the application of mathematics: the isomorphism does guarantee that applied mathematical structures S and the structures M which represent the material situation are mathematically the same. The problem is that isomorphism-based characterizations tend to be unrealistically strong. They require that some mathematics has already been applied to the material situation, and that we have knowledge of the structural equivalence between S and M. What is needed is a framework in which the relation between the relevant structures is weaker than isomorphism, but which still supports the applicability, albeit in a less demanding way (e.g., Bueno, French and Ladyman 2002).

4.2 Assessment: benefits and problems of modal structuralism

4.2.1 The epistemological problem

The modal structuralist solves partially the epistemological problem for mathematics. Assuming that the modal-structural translation scheme works for set theory, modal structuralists need not explain how we can have knowledge of the existence of mathematical objects, relations or structures—given the lack of commitment to these entities. However, they still need to explain our knowledge of the possibility of the relevant structures, since the translation scheme commits them to such possibility.

One worry that emerges here is that, in the case of substantive mathematical structures (such as those invoked in set theory), knowledge of the possibility of such structures may require knowledge of substantial parts of mathematics. For instance, in order to know that the structures formulated in Zermelo set theory are possible, presumably we need to know that the theory itself is consistent. But the consistency of the theory can only be established in another theory, whose consistency, in turn, also needs to be established—and we face a regress. It would be arbitrary simply to assume the consistency of the theories in question, given that if such theories turn out to be in fact inconsistent, given classical logic, everything could be proved in them.

Of course, these considerations do not establish that the modal structuralist cannot develop an epistemology for mathematics. They just suggest that further developments on the epistemological front seem to be called for in order to address more fully the epistemological problem for mathematics.

4.2.2 The problem of the application of mathematics

Similarly, the problem of the application of mathematics is partially solved by the modal structuralist. After all, a framework to interpret the use of mathematics in science is provided, and in terms of this framework the application of mathematics can be accommodated without the commitment to the existence of the corresponding objects.

One concern that emerges (besides those already mentioned at the end of section 4.1 above) is that, similarly to what happens to mathematical fictionalism, the proposed framework does not allow us to make sense of actual uses of the application of mathematics. Rather than explaining how mathematics is in fact applied in scientific practice, the modal-structural framework is advanced in order to regiment that practice and dispense with the commitment to mathematical entities. But even if the framework succeeds at the latter task, thus allowing the modal structuralist to avoid the relevant commitment, the issue of how to make sense of the way mathematics is actually used in scientific contexts still remains. Providing a translation scheme into a nominalistic language does not address this issue. A significant aspect of mathematical practice is then left unaccounted for.

The status of the indispensability argument within the modal-structural interpretation is quite unique. On the one hand, the conclusion of the argument is undermined (if the proposed translation scheme goes through), since commitment to the existence of mathematical objects can be avoided. On the other hand, a revised version of the indispensability argument can be used to motivate the translation into the modal language, thus emphasizing the indispensable role played by the primitive modal notions introduced by the modal structuralist. The idea is to change the argument's second premise, insisting that modal-structural translations of mathematical theories are indispensable to our best theories of the world, and concluding that we ought to be ontologically committed to the possibility of the corresponding structures. In this sense, modal structuralists can invoke the indispensability argument in support of the translation scheme they favor and, hence, the possibility of the relevant structures, which are referred to in the conclusion of the revised argument. But rather than supporting the existence of mathematical objects, the argument would only support commitment to modal-structural translations of mathematical theories and the possibility of mathematical structures.

4.2.3 Uniform semantics

With the introduction of modal operators and the proposed translation scheme, the modal structuralist is unable to provide a uniform semantics for scientific and mathematical theories. Only the latter, as opposed to the former, requires such operators. In fact, Field has argued that if modal operators were invoked in the formulation of scientific theories, not only their mathematical content, but also their physical content would be nominalized (Field 1989). After all, in that case, instead of asserting that some physical situation is actually the case, the theory would only state the possibility that this is so.

One strategy to avoid this difficulty (of losing the physical content of a scientific theory due to the use of modal operators) is to employ an actuality operator. By properly placing this operator within the scope of the modal operators, it is possible to undo the nominalization of the physical content in question (Friedman 2005). Without the introduction of the actuality operator, or some related maneuver, it is unclear that the modal structuralist would be in a position to preserve the physical content of the scientific theory in question.

But the introduction of an actuality operator in this context requires the distinction between nominalist and mathematical content. (That such a distinction cannot be drawn at all is argued in Azzouni 2011.) Otherwise, there is no guarantee that the application of the actuality operator will not yield more than what is physically real.

However, even with the introduction of such an operator, there would still be a significant difference, on the modal-structural translation scheme, between the semantics for mathematical and scientific discourse. For the former, as opposed to the latter, does not invoke such an operator. The result is that modal structuralism does not seem to be able to provide a uniform semantics for mathematical and scientific language.

4.2.4 Taking mathematics literally

Given the need for introducing modal operators, the modal structuralist does not take mathematical discourse literally. In fact, it may be argued, this is the whole point of the view! Taken literally, mathematical discourse seems to be committed to abstract objects and structures—a commitment that the modal structuralist clearly aims to avoid.

However, the point still stands that, in order to block such commitment, a parallel discourse to actual mathematical practice is offered. The discourse is ‘parallel’ given that mathematical practice typically does not invoke the modal operators introduced by the modal structuralist. For those who aim to understand mathematical discourse as it is used in the practice of mathematics, and who try to identify suitable features of that practice that prevent commitment to mathematical entities, the proposed translation will make the realization of that goal particularly difficult.

4.2.5 The ontological problem

The modal structuralist has solved, in part, the ontological problem. No commitment to mathematical objects or structures seems to be needed to implement the proposed translation scheme. The main concern emerges from the introduction of modal operators. But as the modal structuralist emphasizes, these operators do not presuppose a possible-worlds semantics: they are introduced as primitive terms.

However, since the modal translation of mathematical axioms is taken to be true, the question arises as to what makes such statements true. For instance, when it is asserted that ‘it is possible that there are structures satisfying the axioms of Peano Arithmetic’, what is responsible for the truth of such statement? Clearly, the modal structuralist will not ground the possibility in question on the actual truth of the Peano axioms, for this move, on a reasonable interpretation, would require platonism. Nor will the modal structuralist support the relevant possibility on the basis of the existence of a consistency proof for the Peano axioms. After all, any such proof is an abstract object, and to invoke it at the foundation of modal structuralism clearly threatens the coherence of the overall view. Furthermore, to invoke a modalized version of such a consistency proof would beg the question, since it assumes that the use of modal operators is already justified. Ultimately, what is needed to solve properly the ontological problem is a suitable account of modal discourse.

5. Deflationary Nominalism

5.1 Central features of deflationary nominalism

According to the deflationary nominalist, it is perfectly consistent to insist that mathematical theories are indispensable to science, to assert that mathematical and scientific theories are true, and to deny that mathematical objects exist. I am calling the view ‘deflationary nominalism’ given that it demands very minimal commitments to make sense of mathematics (Azzouni 2004), it advances a deflationary view of truth (Azzouni 2004, 2006), and advocates a direct formulation of mathematical theories, without requiring that they be reconstructed or rewritten (Azzouni 1994, 2004).

Deflationary nominalism offers an ‘easy road’ to nominalism, which does not require any form of reformulation of mathematical discourse, while granting the indispensability of mathematics. Despite the fact that quantification over mathematical objects and relations is indispensable to our best theories of the world, this fact offers no reason to believe in the existence of the corresponding entities. This is because, as Jody Azzouni points out, two kinds of commitment should be distinguished: quantifier commitment and ontological commitment (Azzouni 1997; 2004, p. 127 and pp. 49–122). We incur a quantifier commitment whenever our theories imply existentially quantified statements. But existential quantification, Azzouni insists, is not sufficient for ontological commitment. After all, we often quantify over objects we have no reason to believe exist, such as fictional entities.

To incur an ontological commitment—that is, to be committed to the existence of a given object—a criterion for what exists needs to be satisfied. There are, of course, various possible criteria for what exists (such as causal efficacy, observability, possibility of detection, and so on). But the criterion Azzouni favors, and he takes it to be the one that has been collectively adopted, is ontological independence (2004, p. 99). What exist are the things that are ontologically independent of our linguistic practices and psychological processes. The point is that if we have just made something up through our linguistic practices or psychological processes, there's no need for us to be committed to the existence of the corresponding object. And typically, we would resist any such commitment.

Do psychological processes themselves exist, according to the ontologically independence criterion? It may be argued that most psychological processes do exist, at least those we undergo rather than those we make up. After all, the motivation underlying the independence criterion is that those things we just made up verbally or psychologically do not exist. Having a headache or believing that there is a laptop computer in front of me now are psychological processes that I did not make up. Therefore, it seems that at least these kinds of psychological processes do exist. In contrast, imaginings, desires, and hopes are processes we make up, and thus they do not exist. However, the underlying motivation for the criterion seems to diverge, in these cases, from what is entailed by the criterion's actual formulation. For the criterion insists on the ontological independence of “our linguistic practices and psychological processes”. Since headaches and beliefs are psychological processes themselves, presumably they are not ontologically independent of psychological processes. Hence, they do not exist. This means that if the criterion is applied as stated, no psychological process exists. For similar reasons, novels, mental contents, and institutions do not exist either, since they are all abstract objects dependent on our linguistic practices and psychological processes, according to the deflationary nominalist (Azzouni 2010a, 2012).

Quine, of course, identifies quantifier and ontological commitments, at least in the crucial case of the objects that are indispensable to our best theories of the world. Such objects are those that cannot be eliminated through paraphrase and over which we have to quantify when we regiment the relevant theories (using first-order logic). According to Quine's criterion, these are precisely the objects we are ontologically committed to. Azzouni insists that we should resist this identification. Even if the objects in our best theories are indispensable, even if we quantify over them, this is not sufficient for us to be ontologically committed to them. After all, the objects we quantify over might be ontologically dependent on us—on our linguistic practices or psychological processes—and thus we might have just made them up. But, in this case, clearly there is no reason to be committed to their existence. However, for those objects that are ontologically independent of us, we are committed to their existence.

As it turns out, on Azzouni's view, mathematical objects are ontologically dependent on our linguistic practices and psychological processes. And so, even though they may be indispensable to our best theories of the world, we are not ontologically committed to them. Hence, deflationary nominalism is indeed a form of nominalism.

But in what sense do mathematical objects depend on our linguistic practices and psychological processes? In the sense that the sheer postulation of certain principles is enough for mathematical practice: ‘A mathematical subject with its accompanying posits can be created ex nihilo by simply writing down a set of axioms’ (Azzouni 2004, p. 127). The only additional constraint that sheer postulation has to meet, in practice, is that mathematicians should find the resulting mathematics interesting. That is, the consequences that follow from the relevant mathematical principles shouldn't be obvious, and they should be computationally tractable. Thus, given that sheer postulation is (basically) enough in mathematics, mathematical objects have no epistemic burdens. Such objects, or ‘posits’, are called ultrathin (Azzouni 2004, p. 127).

The same move that the deflationary nominalist makes to distinguish ontological commitment from quantifier commitment is also used to distinguish ontological commitment to Fs from asserting the truth of ‘There are Fs’. Although mathematical theories used in science are (taken to be) true, this is not sufficient to commit us to the existence of the objects these theories are supposedly about. After all, according to the deflationary nominalist, it may be true that there are Fs, but to be ontologically committed to Fs, a criterion for what exists needs to be satisfied. As Azzouni points out:

I take true mathematical statements as literally true; I forgo attempts to show that such literally true mathematical statements are not indispensable to empirical science, and yet, nonetheless, I can describe mathematical terms as referring to nothing at all. Without Quine's criterion to corrupt them, existential statements are innocent of ontology. (Azzouni 2004, pp. 4–5.)

On the deflationary nominalist picture, ontological commitment is not signaled in any special way in natural (or even formal) language. We just don't read off the ontological commitment of scientific doctrines (even if they were suitably regimented). After all, without Quine's criterion of ontological commitment, neither quantification over a given object (in a first-order language) nor formulation of true claims about such an object entails the existence of the latter.

In his 1994 book, Azzouni did not commit himself to nominalism, on the grounds that nominalists typically require a reconstruction of mathematical language—something that, as discussed above, is indeed the case with both mathematical fictionalism (Field 1989) and modal structuralism (Hellman 1989). However, no such reconstruction was implemented, or needed, in the proposal advanced by Azzouni (Azzouni 1994). The fact that mathematical objects play no role in how mathematical truths are known clearly expresses a nominalist attitude—an attitude that Azzouni explicitly endorsed in (Azzouni 2004).

The deflationary nominalist proposal nicely expresses a view that should be taken seriously. And as opposed to other versions of nominalism, it has the significant benefit of aiming to take mathematical discourse literally.

5.2 Assessment: benefits of deflationary nominalism and a problem

Of the nominalist views discussed in this essay, deflationary nominalism is the view that comes closest to solving (or, in some cases, dissolving) the five problems that have been used to assess nominalist proposals. With the possible exceptions of the issue of taking mathematical language literally and the ontological problem, all of the remaining problems are explicitly and successfully addressed. I will discuss each of them in turn.

5.2.1 The epistemological problem dissolved

How can the deflationary nominalist explain the possibility of mathematical knowledge, given the abstract nature of mathematical objects? On this version of nominalism, this problem vanishes. Mathematical knowledge is ultimately obtained from what follows from mathematical principles. Given that mathematical objects do not exist, they play no role in how mathematical results are known (Azzouni 1994). What is required is that the relevant mathematical result be established via a proof. Proofs are the source of mathematical knowledge.

It might be argued that certain mathematical statements are known without the corresponding proof. Consider the Gödel sentence invoked in the proof of Gödel's incompleteness theorem: the sentence is true, but it cannot be proved in the system under consideration (if the latter is consistent). Do we have knowledge of the Gödel sentence? Clearly we do, despite the fact that the sentence is not derivable in the system in question. As a result, the knowledge involved here is of a different sort than the one articulated in terms of what can be proved in a given system.

In my view, the deflationary nominalist has no problem making sense of our knowledge of the Gödel sentence. It is an intuitive sort of knowledge, which emerges from what the sentence in question states. All that is required in order to know that the sentence is true is to properly understand it. But that's not how mathematical results are typically established: they need to be proved.

According to Azzouni, we know the Gödel sentence as long as we are able to embed the syntactically incomplete system (such as Peano arithmetic) in a stronger system in which the truth predicate for the original system occurs and in which the Gödel sentence is proved (Azzouni 1994, pp. 134–135; Azzouni 2006, p. 89, note 38, last paragraph, and pp. 161–162).

Clearly, the account does not turn mathematical knowledge into something easy to obtain, given that, normally, it is no straightforward matter to determine whether some result follows from a given group of axioms. Part of the difficulty emerges from the fact that the logical consequences of a non-trivial group of axioms are often not transparent: significant work is required to establish such consequences. This is as it should be, given the non-trivial nature of mathematical knowledge.

5.2.2 Dissolving the problem of the application of mathematics

The deflationary nominalist offers various considerations to the effect that there is no genuine philosophical problem in the success of applied mathematics (Azzouni 2000). Once particular attention is given to implicational opacity—our inability to see, before a proof is offered, the consequences of various mathematical statements—much of the alleged surprise in the successful application of mathematics should vanish. Ultimately, the so-called problem of the application of mathematics—of understanding how it is possible that mathematics can be successfully applied to the physical world should—is an artificially designed issue rather than a genuine problem.

Colyvan defends the opposing view (Colyvan 2001b), insisting that the application of mathematics to science does present a genuine problem. In particular, he argues that two major philosophical accounts of mathematics, Field's mathematical fictionalism and Quine's platonist realism, are unable to explain the problem. Thus, he concludes that the problem cuts across the realism/anti-realism debate in the philosophy of mathematics. The deflationary nominalist would insist that what is ultimately at issue—implicational opacity—is not a special problem, even though to the extent that it is a problem, it is one that is equally faced by realists and anti-realists about mathematics.

This does not mean that the application of mathematics is a straightforward matter. Clearly, it is not. But the difficulties involved in the successful application of mathematics do not raise a special philosophical problem, particularly as soon as the issue of implicational opacity is acknowledged—an issue that is common to both pure and applied mathematics.

The issue of understanding the way in which mathematics in fact gets applied is something that the deflationary nominalist explicitly addresses, carefully examining the central features and the limitations of different models of the application of mathematics (see, in particular, the second part of (Azzouni 2004)).

5.2.3 Uniform semantics

The deflationary nominalist, as noted above, is not committed to offering a reconstruction, or any kind of reformulation, of mathematical theories. (The exception here is the case of inconsistent mathematical or scientific theories, which according to the deflationary nominalist, ideally are regimented as consistent first-order theories.) No special semantics is required to make sense of mathematics: the same semantics that is used in the case of scientific theories is invoked for mathematical theories. It may seem that the uniform semantics requirement is thus satisfied. But the situation is more complicated.

It may be argued that the deflationary nominalist needs to provide the semantics for the existential and universal claims in mathematics, science and ordinary language. After all, it does sound puzzling to state: “It is true that there are numbers, but numbers do not exist”. What is such semantics? The deflationary nominalist will respond by noting that this semantics is precisely the standard semantics of classical logic, with the familiar conditions for the existential and universal quantifiers, but without the assumption that such quantifiers are ontologically committing. The fact that no ontological import is assigned to the quantifiers does not change their semantics. After all, the metalanguage in which the semantics is developed already has universal and existential quantifiers, and these quantifiers need not be interpreted as providing ontological commitment any more than the object language quantifiers do. As a result, the same semantics is used throughout.

It may be argued that the deflationary nominalist needs to introduce the distinction between ontologically serious (or ontologically committing) uses of the quantifiers and ontologically innocent (or ontologically non-committing) uses. If so, this would presumably require a different semantics for these quantifiers. In response, the deflationary nominalist will deny the need for such distinction. In order to mark ontological commitment, an existence predicate, which expresses ontological independence, is used. Those things that are ontologically independent of us (that is, of our linguistic practices and psychological processes) are those to which we are ontologically committed. The mark of ontological commitment is not made at the level of the quantifiers, but via the existence predicate.

This means, however, that even though the semantics is uniform throughout the sciences, mathematics and ordinary language, deflationary nominalism requires the introduction of the existence predicate. But, at least on the surface, this predicate does not seem to have a counterpart in the way language is used in these domains. It is the same semantics throughout, but the formalization of the discourse requires an extended language to accommodate the existence predicate. As a result, the uniformity of the semantics comes with the cost of the introduction of a special predicate into the language to mark ontological commitment for formalization.

Perhaps the deflationary nominalist will respond by arguing that the existence predicate is already part of the language, maybe implicitly via contextual and rhetorical factors (Azzouni 2007, Section III; Azzouni 2004, Chapter 5). What would be needed then is evidence for such a claim, and an indication of how exactly the predicate is in fact found in scientific, mathematical and ordinary contexts. Consider, for instance, the sentences:

(S) There is no set of all sets.

(P) Perfectly frictionless planes do not exist.

(M) Mice exist; talking mice don't.

Presumably, in all of these cases the existence predicate is used. As a result, the sentences could be formalized as follows:

(S) ∀x(Sx → ¬Ex), where ‘S’ is (for simplicity) the predicate ‘set of all sets’, and ‘E’ is the existence predicate.

(P) ∀x(Px → ¬Ex), where ‘P’ is (for simplicity) the predicate ‘perfectly frictionless plane’, and ‘E’ is the existence predicate.

(M) ∃x(MxEx) ∧ ∀x((MxTx) → ¬Ex), where ‘M’ is the predicate ‘mice’, ‘T’ is the predicate ‘to talk’, and ‘E’ is the existence predicate.

In all of these cases, the formalization requires some change in the logical form of the natural language sentences in order to introduce the existence predicate. And that is arguably a cost for the view. After all, in these cases, mathematical, scientific and ordinary languages do not seem to be taken literally—a topic to which I turn now.

5.2.4 Taking mathematical language literally

We saw that with the introduction of the existence predicate it is not clear that the deflationary nominalist is in fact able to take mathematical language literally. After all, some reconstruction of that language seems to be needed. It should be granted that the level of reconstruction involved is significantly less than what is found in the other versions of nominalism discussed above. As opposed to them, the deflationary nominalist is able to accommodate significant aspects of mathematical practice without the need for creating a full parallel discourse (in particular, no operators, modal or fictional, need to be introduced). However, some level of reconstruction is still needed to accommodate the existence predicate, which then compromises the deflationary nominalist's capacity to take mathematical language literally.

A related concern is that the deflationary nominalist introduces a non-standard notion of reference that does not presuppose the existence of the objects that are referred to (Bueno and Zalta 2005). This move goes hand in hand with the understanding of the quantifiers as not being ontologically committing, and it does seem to limit the deflationary nominalist's capacity to take mathematical language literally. After all, a special use of ‘refers’ is needed to accommodate the claim that “‘a’ refers to b, but b does not exist”. The deflationary nominalist, however, resists this charge (Azzouni 2009a, 2010a, 2010b).

5.2.5 The ontological problem

The ontological problem is also dissolved by the deflationary nominalism. Clearly, deflationary nominalism has no commitment either to mathematical objects or to a modal ontology of any kind (including possible worlds, abstract entities as proxy for possible worlds, or other forms of replacement for the expression of modal claims). The deflationary nominalists not only avoid the commitment to mathematical objects, they also claim that such objects have no properties whatsoever. This means that the deflationary nominalist's ontology is extremely minimal: only concrete objects are ultimately assumed—objects that are ontologically independent of our psychological processes and linguistic practices. In particular, no domain of nonexistent objects is posited nor a realm of genuine properties of such objects. By ‘genuine properties’ I mean those properties that hold only in virtue of what the objects in question are, and not as the result of some external relations to other objects. For example, although Sherlock Holmes does not exist, he has the property of being thought of by me as I write this sentence. This is not, however, a genuine property of Sherlock Holmes in the intended sense.

Deflationary nominalism is not a form of Meinongianism (Azzouni 2010a). Although the ontology of deflationary nominalism is not significantly different from that of the Meinongian, the ideology of the two views—at least assuming a particular, traditional interpretation of Meinongianism—is importantly different. The deflationary nominalist is not committed to any subsisting objects, in contrast to what is often claimed to be a distinctive feature of Meinongianism.

It is not clear to me, however, that this traditional reading of Meinongianism is correct. If we consider the subsisting objects as those that are abstract, and if we take only concrete objects as existing, the resulting picture ideologically is not significantly different from the one favored by the deflationary nominalist. Still, the deflationary nominalists distance themselves from Meinongianism (Azzouni 2010a).

With the meager ontological commitments, the deflationary nominalist fares very well on the ontological front. One source of concern is how meager the deflationary nominalist's ontology ultimately is. For instance, platonists would insist that mathematical objects are ontologically independent of our psychological processes and linguistic practices, and—using the criterion of ontological commitment offered by the deflationary nominalist—they would insist that these objects do exist. Similarly, modal realists (such as Lewis 1986) would also argue that possible worlds are ontologically independent of us in the relevant sense, thus concluding that these objects also exist. Deflationary nominalists will try to resist these conclusions. But unless their arguments are successful at this point, the concern remains that the deflationary nominalist may have a significantly more robust ontology—given the proposed criterion of ontological commitment—than advertised.

It may be argued that deflationary nominalists are changing the rules of the debate. They state that mathematicians derive statements of the form “There are Fs”, but insist that the objects in question do not exist, given that quantifier commitment and ontological commitment should be distinguished. This strategy is fundamentally different from those found in the nominalist proposals discussed before. It amounts to the denial of the first premise of the indispensability argument (“We ought to be ontologically committed to all and only those entities that are indispensable to our best theories of the world”). Even though quantification over mathematical entities is indispensable to our best theories of the world (thus, the deflationary nominalist accepts the second premise of the argument), this fact does not entail that these entities exist. After all, we can quantify over objects that do not exist, given the rejection of the indispensability argument's first premise.

But are deflationary nominalists really changing the rules of the debate? If Quine's criterion of ontological commitment provides such rules, then they are. But why should we grant that Quine's criterion play such a role? Deflationary nominalists challenge this deeply held assumption in ontological debates. And by doing so, they pave the way for the development of a distinctive form of nominalism in the philosophy of mathematics.


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My thanks go to two anonymous referees for their helpful comments on earlier versions of this entry. Their suggestions led to significant improvements. My thanks are also due to Jody Azzouni, Uri Nodelman, and Ed Zalta for all of their comments and help.

Copyright © 2013 by
Otávio Bueno <>

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