Normativity in Metaethics
You think to yourself, “I shouldn’t drink another Dr. Pepper. I’ve had two already”. But the claim that you shouldn’t drink another seems like a very different kind of claim than the claim that you’ve had two Dr. Peppers already. Broadly (and vaguely) speaking, the first claim tells us something action-guiding, whereas the second does not. The first tells us something about your reasons for acting or thinking a certain way; the second, by itself, does not. In sum, the first is a normative claim, whereas the second is not.
Action-guiding claims include claims about what someone ought to do, or should do, or is obligated to do, or has reason to do. Some philosophers take it that all normative claims are action-guiding in this way. We will take a broader view, however, and include evaluative claims among those that we classify as “normative”. Examples are claims about what it would be good to do, or what would be praiseworthy or virtuous, or about beauty. Our reason for taking this broader view of the normative is that evaluative claims give rise to similar philosophical questions as do the claims we described as action-guiding. One might suggest that evaluative claims are attitude-guiding rather than action-guiding. Perhaps, then, the central issue we need to understand, in thinking about normativity, is the nature of such “guidance”.
What precisely is the nature of the normative? How is it different from the non-normative? And how are the two related? Are any normative claims actually true, or is there properly speaking nothing I should or shouldn’t do? Are there normative properties, like goodness, obligation, reasons, etc. – and if so, how are they related to each other? And is the normative fundamentally a matter of our attitudes, or do certain normative truths obtain independently of what anyone thinks or feels?
In this article, we will explore these questions, attempting to outline some of the major debates about normativity in meta-ethics.
- 1. The Target Explanandum
- 2. Are There Any Normative Facts At All? – Error Theory
- 3. Can Normativity Be Given a Naturalistic Explanation?
- 4. Attempts to Explain the Nature of Normativity
- 4.1 Explaining Normativity via Motivation
- 4.2 Explaining Normativity via Desire-based reasons
- 4.3 Explaining Normativity via Practical identity
- 4.4 Explaining Normativity via Essential features of agency or action
- 4.5 Explaining Normativity via “Self-legislation”
- 4.6 Explaining Normativity via Categorical requirements
- 4.7 Explaining Normativity via Natural function
- 4.8 Explaining Normativity via Practices well-suited to address problems of normative governance
- 4.9 Conclusion
- 5. Is Normativity Mind-Dependent?
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. The Target Explanandum
Our first task is a deceptively hard one: getting a basic understanding of our explanandum – i.e., normativity. What is normativity?
1.1 Concept vs. World
If we wanted to gain an understanding of physicality, we’d need to first settle whether it was most important to understand physical concepts, physical properties, physical facts, or something else entirely. Similarly, one initial issue worth settling here is whether we should be investigating normative concepts, normative properties, normative facts, or all of these, or, perhaps, something else entirely.
This debate could happen at a general level – whether it is more important to understand things in general at a conceptual or a “worldly” level. (Here, and in what follows, we use “worldly” to refer to metaphysical matters – matters that are in the realm of what our thoughts and concepts are about.) But it might be that there are special considerations regarding the normative domain that point us in one direction or the other. Consider an illustrative case: the debate around G.E. Moore’s famous “Open Question Argument” early in the twentieth century, at least on one interpretation of the argument (see entry on moral non-naturalism, section on the open question argument). Moore argued, in Principia Ethica, that for any proposed analysis of moral concept <M> in terms of natural concept <N>, someone who fully grasped and understood the relevant concepts could still grant that something is N but wonder whether it is M. (For example, a speaker competent with the concepts involved could sincerely wonder: “It’s painful, but is it bad?”) But such questions would not be “open” to competent speakers if M could be analyzed in terms of N. So, there can be no analysis of any moral concept in purely natural terms (Moore 1903 [1993: ch. 1]).
If successful, this argument tells us something useful about moral – and also, by similar reasoning, normative – concepts: that they cannot be reduced to natural ones. But it does not automatically tell us anything about moral metaphysics. It is entirely possible that while the concept <bad> cannot be reduced to the concept <painful>, the property of badness (if there is such a property) can be reduced to the property of painfulness. Roughly speaking, there can be conceptual gaps even where there are no metaphysical gaps: water might be distinct from H2O at the conceptual level even if water is metaphysically identical to H2O. Some metaethical naturalists have argued for an analogous claim in the ethical domain (see Boyd 1988).
What this case shows is that insights about normative concepts often don’t carry over to normative metaphysics, and vice versa. This will be true about some of the questions we consider here. For example, take the question of the relationship between the normative and the non-normative. The case of the Open Question Argument directly illustrates that what we say about the relationship between normative and non-normative facts may be different from what we say about the relationship between normative and non-normative concepts. Similarly, when we come to discuss whether the normative obtains independently of what anyone thinks or feels – the question of mind-independence – the conceptual/metaphysical distinction makes a big difference. Most contemporary mind-dependence theorists don’t want to say that normative concepts are explained by mental concepts, in the same way that (on their views) normative facts are explained by mental facts.
It would be difficult to deny that there are normative concepts. We have normative thoughts, such as that so-and-so was an evil person or that such-and-such was the wrong thing to do. There are common thoughts such as that it would be a bad idea to have yet another Dr Pepper. And our having such thoughts reveals that we have the normative concepts involved in them, such as the concepts <evil>, <wrong> and <bad>. But some philosophers deny that there are normative properties that are referred to or represented by our normative concepts, and that there are normative facts that are referred to or represented by our normative thoughts. Accounts of these kinds are anti-realist in that they hold that normativity lies in the realm of thought rather than in the worldly realm of metaphysics. A further complication is that anti-realist accounts of these kinds can be nihilistic – taking it that, to a first approximation, there are no normative truths – or cognitivist and concessive – taking it that, again approximately, there are normative truths but they have no metaphysical commitments – or non-cognitivist – taking it that, roughly, our normative “thoughts” are not strictly speaking representational in the way that (other) beliefs are and that there are normative truths, but only in a deflationary sense.
We don’t want to take a hard stand here on whether conceptual or worldly questions are more important: the truth is probably that both kinds of question are important at various junctures. However, if we are right that virtually every party to debates about normativity would agree that there are normative concepts, the main area of debate is going to be in metaphysics, about whether or not there are worldly normative properties and facts. We think that philosophers’ different views about the metaphysical issues will go a long way toward explaining their different views about other matters, such as the nature of normative thoughts, the nature of moral motivation, and so on. We will therefore begin with issues about normative facts and properties.
In thinking about these issues, we will adopt a familiar “robust” or “realist” view about the nature of properties, concepts, truths, propositions, and facts. We take it that properties are worldly characteristics of things that explain objective worldly similarities among things. So, for example, the property redness is the characteristic shared by things that are similar in being red. We also assume that we have concepts of properties, which are our way of representing properties in thought, and we assume there are propositions, which are the objects of belief, and which are structured entities at least partly constituted by concepts. We take beliefs to be cognitive states, the objects of which are propositions, which can be evaluated as true or false. Further, we take it that, at least in the case of synthetic truths, if a sentence or proposition is true, it is true in virtue of the obtaining of a relevant fact or worldly state of affairs. We take it that facts are worldly states of affairs. A simple example is the instantiation of redness by a fire truck. Our concern, then, is whether there are normative facts and properties.
It will be useful to consider briefly why one might suppose there are any normative facts – where a normative fact would be, again, on our usage of the term “fact”, a worldly state of affairs involving the instantiation of a normative property, such as the fact that torture is wrong. One reason to think that such entities exist can be derived from reflection on our normative thought and talk. We think, for instance, that torture is wrong just as we think that torture is (unfortunately) widespread. We think these things are true, and, intuitively, for a sentence or proposition to be true is for it to be accurate to the facts. This gives us reason to think that our thoughts about torture commit us to the existence of the normative fact that torture is wrong just as they commit us to the existence of the fact that torture is widespread. Moreover, our thought that torture is wrong seems on its face to ascribe wrongness to torture, just as our thought that torture is widespread ascribes being widespread to torture, so these thoughts seem to commit us to the existence of the property wrongness, just as they commit us to the existence of the property being widespread. In short, it seems that our normative thoughts commit us to the existence of normative facts and properties. As we will see, however, the idea that there is this commitment would be denied by philosophers who accept one or another form of normative anti-realism – non-cognitivists or expressivists, “quietists”, cognitive anti-realists, and at least some constructivists. And anti-realists of another kind, error theorists, agree that our moral thought and talk commit us to the existence of normative facts and properties, but they think this commitment is false. They think there are no such things. We will discuss these anti-realist positions in what follows.
1.2 The Fundamental Normative Property
Our decision to focus initially on metaphysical issues doesn’t get us any closer to what normativity is; it only tells us where to locate the initial important questions about normativity. But what would make a fact be a normative one? We started with some hand-wavy platitudes about normative claims being “action-guiding”, and “attitude-guiding”, and about their giving us reasons for action, or reasons for attitudes. We could also give lots of examples of normative claims, adding that, if they are true, they are true in virtue of the normative facts:
- Moral claims: It’s wrong to commit adultery; Bill Gates is a generous man; it’s good to love your country.
- Epistemic claims: You should believe that there is an external world; George has reason to distrust Benedict; no one should believe what the sum of the evidence points decisively against.
- Aesthetic claims: No Country for Old Men is the best movie ever made; contrast contributes beauty to a painting; modern art is not good.
But while platitudes and examples can give one a general sense of the extension of the normative, they don’t tell us what normativity is.
One way to answer this latter question, assuming there are normative properties, is to figure out which normative property, if any, is normatively fundamental. This is not the question about what is metaphysically fundamental, or fundamental simpliciter. It is the question of what the bottom layer of normative facts, so to speak, looks like, and in particular what normative properties show up there, if there is such a bottom layer. Those normative facts might be grounded in non-normative facts of one kind or another, or maybe they’re ungrounded – we’ll come to that question in time. The question here is, what are the normative properties, if any, that all other normative properties depend on, or are explained by? (We are being deliberately opaque about the sense of dependence or explanation involved, since that is a matter of some controversy – while many nowadays want to construe it as grounding [see, for instance, Berker 2018], others are skeptical [Wielenberg 2014: 1.5].) If we can get an answer to that question, it could tell us about the nature of the normative.
The most popular answer to this question, in recent years, has been that facts about reasons are normatively fundamental (Parfit 2011; Scanlon 2014; Dancy 2004). Facts about goodness, obligation, virtue, etc. – all other normative facts – depend on facts about reasons. Others think that value is normatively fundamental, explaining reasons and all other normative phenomena (Maguire 2016), while still others think that facts about fittingness are normatively fundamental (Howard 2019). Some have even suggested that “thin” normative facts – which, roughly speaking, merely tell us normative information – are the wrong focus, and that “thick” normative facts – roughly, facts that tell us something normative and non-normative – could be at the bottom of it all, normatively speaking (Roberts 2017, Morton 2019). On that view, the fact that an act is courageous is normatively more fundamental, and perhaps also metaphysically more fundamental, than the fact that it is good, rather than the other way around.
Each answer aims to give us insight into the nature of the normative. It could be that normative facts are facts that either are, or depend on, facts about reasons. Or maybe normative facts are those that are, or depend on, facts about value. And so on. Another possibility is that no kind of normative fact is normatively fundamental (Wodak 2020).
This methodology for determining the nature of the normative might seem flawed. After all, our goal was to understand what makes a fact be normative, and it might seem that we won’t achieve this goal unless we can explain what makes the base-facts (reasons, values, etc.) be normative. “What makes this (not normatively fundamental) fact normative?” we can imagine someone asking. “Well”, we answer, “it ultimately depends on a fact about reasons”. But then our interlocutor might reasonably ask, “Ok, but what makes facts about reasons normative?” And here we don’t have an answer: “They just are!” we would have to say.
This worry becomes deeper when we consider the possibility of reasons that are not “robustly” normative in the philosophically most interesting and important sense. In chess, there is a reason to castle early. In etiquette, there is a reason, when in Rome, to do what the Romans do. But it might seem that these reasons have no genuine claim on our attention in the way that the moral reason to be loyal to friends does. So it would seem that the normatively fundamental facts about reasons, if reasons fundamentalism is indeed on the right track, would be facts about robustly normative reasons. Perhaps, then, only some reasons are normatively fundamental – the robustly normative ones. If so, presumably the reasons fundamentalist would want to amend their view: what makes a fact normative is that it is, or depends on, a fact or facts about robustly normative reasons. But then it seems important for them to be able to say what makes a reason robustly normative – and it would be unsatisfying for them to answer that a robustly normative reason is one that makes its dependents robustly normative!
There would presumably be similar worries about the other kinds of normative fundamentalism: not only will we lack an explanation of what makes the base-facts (reasons, values, fittingness, etc.) normative, but in many cases, there will be (putative) base-facts that do not seem robustly normative. That will trigger a need for a non-question-begging explanation of the difference between robust and non-robust (putative) base-facts, which might or might not be a deliverable good.
We do not think such accounts of normativity are necessarily doomed, however. The mere fact that there is no explanation for why the base-facts are (robustly) normative is not decisive on its own. Suppose we were to claim that a certain class of facts are essentially normative, where an essentially normative fact is (roughly) a normative fact whose normativity is essential to it. And suppose we were to claim, further, that there is no explanation of why an essentially normative fact is normative. (Note that this does not entail that essentially normative facts have no explanation: some naturalists might want to claim that certain kinds of facts are essentially normative but are fully explainable in natural terms.) Taking this route, we would then claim that all other normative facts derive their normativity from those essentially normative facts. But that does not seem like an objection to the methodology; in fact, it seems to substantially advance our understanding of normativity. By way of analogy, imagine we were concerned to find out what makes an object physical. Our answer: there are fundamental physical objects called atoms, and an object is physical just when it is composed of atoms. What makes an atom physical though, one might ask? It seems that we could justifiably answer that atoms are essentially physical, while all other physical objects derive their physicality from atoms. In this case, it does not seem like we should throw out the theory just because there is a sub-class of physical objects whose physicalness does not get explained, since those objects are essentially physical. On the contrary, we seem to have learned something substantive about the nature of the physical. Similarly, we should not throw out an account of normativity just because, on that account, there is a sub-class of normative facts whose normativity is not explained.
On the other hand, we think that reasons fundamentalists and their kin do need a non-question-begging answer to the question of what makes a reason (value, etc.) the robust kind of reason to engender robust normativity. And while that order seems like a tall one, it does not seem to us to be unfillable in principle.
As an aside, note also that we have construed this method for understanding normativity in worldly, not conceptual terms. This is certainly one way of doing it, but it is also possible to replicate the strategy at the conceptual level. For example, one might propose a version of reasons fundamentalism according to which the concept <reason> is the normatively fundamental concept. Such a view would claim that the concept <good> can be analyzed in terms of the concept <reason>. A conceptual version of value fundamentalism would do the opposite.
And, just as we learned with Moore, the conceptual and worldly strategies come apart. It might be that while goodness facts depend fully on reason facts, the concept <good> cannot be analyzed in terms of <reason>. Or, instead, it might be that while <good> is analyzable in terms of <reason>, goodness facts do not depend on reason facts. This could obtain, for instance, if the error theory is true – for in that case, while we have normative concepts to analyze in terms of each other, there are no goodness or reason facts (or normative facts of any kind) at all.
2. Are There Any Normative Facts At All? – Error Theory
Of course, one of the biggest questions about normativity is whether there are any normative facts at all. Most philosophers – all that we know of – grant that we have normative concepts. So, as we said before, we will confine ourselves to the worldly question here. Yet many doubt that there are any facts of the form [Xing is wrong] or [Y is a virtue]. By far the most prominent concern with the existence of such facts, going back at least to J.L. Mackie, is the concern that they would be intolerably queer (Mackie 1977: 33). Some, admitting such queerness, have tried to undermine the argument from queerness to the conclusion that there are no normative facts, while others have (in various ways) denied that normative facts are queer in the first place. We’ll explore all this below.
Again, error theorists agree that our normative thought and talk commit us to the existence of normative facts and properties. They are anti-realists because they think there are not actually any normative properties or facts. They think our commitment to the existence of such things is a mistake.
Mackie famously argued for a form of nihilism about morality – or, in contemporary terms, “moral error theory” – in his 1977 book Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong. Mackie thought that there are no moral facts – or, as it will be convenient to talk about things here, that all moral claims are false. Mackie was not the first to think this, or something similar – see Olson (2014: chs. 2–4) for some of the pre-Mackie history of the view. We focus on Mackie’s argument just because it has informed so much of the last several decades of thinking about moral (and normative) error theory.
This error theory thesis has to be massaged a little to be even consistent. After doing some of the needed massaging, we’ll examine Mackie’s argument and the debate it spawned. Many of the arguments are on their faces specific to the moral domain, but applicable to normativity in general on further reflection. Many of the earlier error theorists applied their views only to the moral (Mackie 1977; Joyce 2001), while more recently, some have argued for an error theory about the normative in general (Streumer 2017). Since our concern here is with the normative, we’ll address that broader domain, except where an argument only applies to the moral, or where we are trying to be accurate to an historical argument (e.g., Mackie’s).
2.1 Formulating Error Theory
Error theorists claim – roughly! – that all normative claims are false. As we indicated above, it’s hard to give an analysis, much less necessary and sufficient conditions, for a claim’s being normative. But error theorists need to get at least a little clearer about their target. For example, is “Either the sun is shining or you shouldn’t believe in aliens” a normative claim? It has a normative disjunct, after all. If this disjunctive claim is normative, then the error theorist is in trouble, since surely it can be true by virtue of the truth of its first (non-normative) disjunct, even if it’s not the case that you shouldn’t believe in aliens. To avoid the complication illustrated by this example, error theorists would be well-advised to set aside disjunctive normative claims (or at least to set aside disjunctions of a normative claim with a non-normative claim).
We’ll cut to the chase here: it makes most sense for error theorists to make their claim about some properly defined set of basic normative claims. This would be, more or less, those claims that attribute a normative property to an individual or set of individuals (construed broadly, to include institutions, governments, etc.). So, on the modified reading, error theorists claim that all basic normative claims are false. This will presumably take care of the broader issue, exemplified above, of logically complex claims: if they’re normative, they are not in the primary scope of error theory.
A problem with this formulation is that some normative claims are analytic or conceptual truths. An example might be the claim that murder is wrong. A trivial example is the claim that wrongful killing is wrong. To address this issue we can take the error theorist to claim that all basic substantive normative claims are false. The idea here is that analytic and conceptual normative truths are not substantive. (But see Cuneo & Shafer-Landau 2014.)
This new formulation also entails that all (positive) normative principles are false – which we think error theorists will strongly consider a feature rather than a bug. In a world where all claims of the form “You should believe that P” are false, so will all claims of the form “If P has properties XYZ, then agents in situation S should believe that P” – assuming it is possible for something P to be XYZ. (It’s not totally clear how we should understand normative principles – see Morton (2020); Berker (2018); Rosen (2017) – but surely in a world where it’s not the case that anyone should believe anything, a principle outlining (possible) non-normative circumstances in which someone should believe something is false.)
But there is still a problem in this formulation. If all basic normative claims are false, this appears to generate straightforward contradictions. Here are two apparently basic normative claims:
- John’s action is morally wrong.
- John’s action is morally permissible.
And it would certainly seem that if the first is false, then the second is true, and vice versa. So if being morally wrong and being morally permissible are both normative properties, then both of these claims are basic normative claims. It follows, therefore, on this formulation, that error theory is not only false, but false of logical necessity, since it entails a contradiction.
If only it were so easy to refute error theory! Error theorists should, in the cool light of day, formulate their theory to avoid this glaring problem. They have a few options – we’ll outline three. First, they can say that error theory is the claim that basic normative claims are all neither true nor false, perhaps because they have a presupposition failure (Joyce 2001; Perl & Schroeder 2019; Olson 2014). This would allow them to get out of the contradiction between (1) and (2): neither is true (or false), so neither entails the falsity (or truth) of the other.
Second, perhaps error theory could narrow the class of basic normative claims – the claims that it holds to be false. If a basic normative claim is a claim that ascribes a normative property to something, error theory should be careful as to which normative predicates ascribe bone fide normative properties. It could then deny that permissibility is a bona fide normative property: to claim that something is permissible is really to deny that it is morally wrong. (Walter Sinnott-Armstrong (2006: §3.1) has suggested a very similar move for moral error theorists.)
This would allow the error theorist to affirm the truth of (2) above, and thus get out of the contradiction without sacrificing her commitment to error theory. Error theory doesn’t, after all, require one to deny the truth of all normative claims! And while this more nuanced error theory has lost a lot of the shock-value of the original rough formulation, it still stays true to the motivating idea that there are no instantiated normative properties, and no facts to normatively constrain us in the world (though there are “negative” normative facts, like the fact that this painting is not beautiful).
Finally, the error theorist could, instead, deny that “X is not permissible” entails “X is wrong”, or that “X is not wrong” entails “X is permissible”. Doing so would allow her to maintain the falsity of both (1) and (2). In short, nothing is wrong and nothing is permissible. Jonas Olson has advocated this view (Olson 2014: ch. 1; see Streumer & Wodak 2021), arguing that the connections between permissibility and wrongness are best accounted for in terms of conversational implicature, not conceptual entailment. This view will be attractive for any error theorist who shares Mackie’s belief that error theory does not commit one to any (positive) first-order normative claims at all (Mackie 1977: 15–17). It also allows the error theorist to get out of saying that all things are permissible, which can seem independently unpalatable. On the other hand, she will still be committed to the claim that nothing is wrong, and it might seem like a small difference between this and the claim that all things are permissible. See Olson (2014: §1.3) for a much fuller treatment of this problem of formulation, and possible solutions.
So, the error theorist has a few options in formulating her view. However, just for the sake of brevity – with the added bonus that it allows us to remain neutral between the above nuanced formulations – we’ll abbreviate the error theory as the view that all basic substantive normative claims are false.
2.2 The Argument from Queerness
Now that we have set aside the question of how to formulate the error theory, we can deal with the most important recent argument for the theory: Mackie’s Argument from Queerness. We won’t attempt a full scholarly treatment of Mackie’s argument here (though see Joyce & Kirchin 2010, as well as §3.2 of the entry on moral anti-realism); we are more interested in the broad concerns about normativity it spawned. The general thought here is that normative facts, if they existed, would be really weird. This is a thought many have shared, perhaps inchoately. As we’ll see, it is difficult to determine how exactly to flesh out the thought. (In what follows, we’ll follow the precedent set by Mackie and use the term “queer” for “weird”.)
The basic argument runs something like this:
- If there were moral facts, they would be queer.
- There are no queer entities.
- Therefore, there are no moral facts.
And, on certain understandings of the queerness involved, the argument can generalize to the normative:
- If there were normative facts, they would be queer.
- There are no queer entities.
- Therefore, there are no normative facts.
(It is possible to weaken the argument, claiming only, in place of (2), that we ought to believe there are no queer entities, or that it is not the case that we should believe there are queer entities, or even that there is strong prima facie reason against belief in queer entities. The conclusions would then, of course, be appropriately weakened. We will continue to consider the strong version above, though in the course of the discussion, we touch on weaker versions where they become salient.)
Speaking a little more precisely, if normative facts are queer, it is because they have some property that is queer, where that they have this property is essential to normative facts. The queerness in question would be a property of this property of normative facts. Hence, to support the first premise, the error theorist needs to establish:
- What property of normative facts makes them queer. That is, what is the first-order property of normative facts that instantiates the second-order property of being queer? This is presumably the property of being normative, but other answers might be given as well.
- What exactly the queerness consists in. That is, what is the nature of this second-order property that is instantiated by the first-order property of being normative, or, perhaps, by certain other first-order properties of normative facts?
And these issues – especially the second – need to be addressed in a way that makes the second premise plausible. We’ll consider these two issues in turn.
2.2.1 What feature of normativity is queer?
The first main issue for the argument from queerness that we mentioned above is, what it is about normative facts in virtue of which they are (supposedly) queer. There have been a host of different answers to this question.
Mackie himself is relatively unclear on this issue. Some take him to be concerned primarily with the motivational commitments of moral discourse – that moral discourse entails the truth of motivational internalism, (roughly) the view that genuine moral beliefs entail motivation to act in accordance with those beliefs (see Joyce 2001: ch. 1). David Brink argues that Mackie is unclear between two potentially problematic entailments of moral discourse: motivational internalism, and reasons internalism – the view that moral obligation entails reasons for action (Brink 1984). Jonas Olson argues that Mackie actually argues for the queerness of four distinct features of moral discourse: motivational internalism, a sui generis epistemic faculty, the supervenience of the moral on the non-moral, and finally, the irreducible normativity of moral facts (Olson 2014: chs. 5 and 6).
Theoretically, we could mix and match any of these supposedly queer features of normativity with any of the views about what queerness consists in. For example, it might be that the problem is that normative beliefs that entail motivation to act would be a fundamental addition to our ontology; maybe the problem is that facts that entail reasons for action are not parsimonious; maybe the supervenience of the normative on the non-normative is not parsimonious. But as a matter of fact, although no one is utterly clear on the question of what queerness consists in, the literature has converged on one family of answers to the question of what the queer feature of normativity is.
Post-Mackie, philosophers who take up the argument from queerness generally converge on the categoricity or irreducible normativity of reasons as the queer commitment of morality/normativity. Richard Garner (1990) thinks that moral facts are queer because they entail “intrinsic imperativeness”. Joyce variously describes this feature as the “inescapability” (2001: 31), “categoricity” (2001: 37) “practical clout” (2006: 57–58) or “practical oomph” (2006: 60) of moral requirements. In early work (2011), Olson also identifies categorical reasons as the queer commitment of morality, but in later work (2014) says that it is morality’s entailment of irreducibly normative favoring relations that is queer.
2.2.2 What does queerness consist in?
Even if there were a consensus on what feature of normative facts is queer, there we would still be the question of what exactly the queerness consists in. What it is about this feature that is supposed to be objectionable? And what exactly is the objection supposed to be? For instance, what exactly is objectionable about irreducibly normative favoring relations? Not everything irreducible is queer, presumably. Further, what exactly is the nature of the objection? What is the objection being signaled by calling irreducibly normative favoring relations queer? What exactly is it to be queer? This is the second main issue for the first premise of the argument from queerness, which we identified above. The answer is not entirely clear. Here are a few things that could be meant.
I. A kind of fact is queer if it is non-natural. Perhaps an irreducibly normative favoring relation could not be a natural relation and this is what would be queer about it. On this view, normative facts are not continuous with the natural order, and that in itself is what makes them objectionable. They are like facts about ghosts, or gods, or gremlins. (Notice that this still leaves open what it is about normative facts that makes them discontinuous with the natural order – that is the business of the next section.)
The problem, of course, even assuming that normative facts would be non-natural, is that it is not clear what exactly the objection is to the idea that there are non-natural facts. Clearly metaphysical naturalists would reject the idea, for metaphysical naturalism is the view that the only facts are natural ones. But we cannot simply assume that metaphysical naturalism is true, or that it would be objectionable to reject it. If the argument from queerness rests on this assumption, it will only be convincing to those who already are naturalists. For an error theorist who hopes to convince anyone who’s not a dyed-in-the-wool naturalist, this is not the right way to run the argument from queerness.
II. A kind of fact is queer if it would be fundamentally different from everything else – if it is “sui generis”, in the going lingo. Mackie often talks as if this is his concern:
If there were objective moral values, then they would be entities or qualities or relations of a very strange sort, utterly different from anything else in the universe. (Mackie 1977: 38)
Well, of course everything is different from everything else, so a lot must ride on that “utterly”. We think one way of reading the concern here is that queerness consists in fundamental difference in kind.
On this reading, for a class of things to be queer is for their existence to entail a new addition to the bottommost layer of reality. (We leave this metaphor unexplored, since that would mire us in controversy about how best to make sense of the notion of metaphysical fundamentality.) In other words, to determine whether a class of things is queer, we can run something like the following test: take two worlds, W1 and W2. They are qualitatively identical except that W2 has things of kind K, whereas W1 does not. (Or, more precisely, they are qualitatively identical except for the existence of things of kind K in W2, and any other differences entailed ipso facto by the existence of some K things.) Question: are there more kinds of things in the basic layer of reality in W2 than in W1? If so, then K things are queer.
Note that on this test, K things don’t have to be queer in virtue of their K-ness in order to be queer. It could be that they entail the existence of some distinct kind of thing, and that kind would constitute a fundamental addition to our ontology. Perhaps, that is, K things actually don’t fall in the fundamental layer of reality, but they entail the existence of L things, and those are both fundamental and not present in otherwise identical worlds without K things.
The problem with this understanding of the queerness objection is that it overgeneralizes. Every fundamental kind of thing turns out to be queer! Supposing that the property of physicalness is fundamental, then, comparing a world W1 without physical things to a world W2 that has physical things, W2 will have more kinds of thing in its basic layer than W1. So, physical things are queer! Combine this with the commitment in premise (2) that there are no queer things, and you get the result that there are no physical objects. (Even on the weaker versions of those premises, we get the result that we shouldn’t believe in physical objects, or that there is strong prima facie reason not to believe in them.) The argument can be run on any possible fundamental kind. (See Morton & Sampson 2014 on this point.)
And suffice it to say that the error theorist about normativity probably doesn’t want to be an error theorist about literally any possible fundamental kind of thing. Among other reasons, assuming that no non-fundamental kind of thing could exist without fundamental kinds, this would entail that nothing exists. And we’d be willing to bet that that is going to be too rich for any error theorist’s blood.
Now, perhaps there is some more local concern about normativity’s being fundamental. That is, perhaps there’s something queer about normative facts being at the bottommost level of reality that is unique to normativity: i.e., perhaps it’s queer that normative facts in particular would be at the bottom layer of reality. This would undermine the above overgeneralization objection. Maybe, for example, it is strange that normative facts would be fundamental because it is taken as a truism that normative facts depend on non-normative ones. And how could they depend (metaphysically?) on anything else if they’re fundamental? But such attempts at more local fundamentality worries would run into their own complications – e.g., what is the relationship between the kind of dependence involved between the normative and the non-normative, on the one hand, and fundamentality on the other? We won’t delve any deeper into such issues here.
III. Finally, perhaps a kind of fact is queer when a theory that included it would not be parsimonious. Olson sometimes talks like this is what he means:
[M]oral error theorists can apply Occam’s razor. If our moral practices and beliefs can be explained without appeal to irreducibly normative properties and facts, a theory that dispenses with such properties and facts will have the advantage of being in this respect the more ontologically parsimonious theory. (2014: 147)
So on this understanding of queerness, the problem is that normative facts somehow create a less parsimonious picture of the world.
There are many ways we can think of parsimony (see Sober 2015). We don’t need to get too technical here. We think that the most plausible view favoring parsimony would hold that, other things being equal, a theory is objectionable insofar as it entails the existence of more kinds of thing than a competing theory does. On this reading, we are getting close to the suggestion that queerness is a matter of adding a fundamental kind to our ontology, especially if parsimony applies (or is especially strong) only at the level of fundamental kinds.
At any rate, if queerness is just relative lack of parsimony, the error theorist is opening up a can of worms. Many people are not sold on the value of parsimony in theory selection – or are not sold on its value outside of empirical contexts (see Huemer 2009). Those who are sold on the value of parsimony count it as a pro tanto consideration to be weighed against a host of other factors. That means that even granting that normative facts are queer (in the sense that postulating them is less parsimonious than not doing so), this does not by itself establish that they do not exist, or that we shouldn’t believe in them. In other words, interpreting the first premise of the argument from queerness in this way undermines the second premise, at least where the second premise is read strongly as the claim that there are no queer facts. (See Morton & Sampson 2014 for a fuller argument against queerness as lack of parsimony.)
Of course, perhaps the error theorist could reply that it’s not queerness alone that shows that there are no normative facts. Perhaps, for example, this conclusion is supported by queerness – i.e., lack of parsimony, here – together with the fact that normative facts are not necessary as part of the explanation of any observation. Jean Hampton (1998: 21–22) seems to think that something like this is going on in the argument from queerness. This would make the argument from queerness a version of Harman’s (1977) argument. As such, it would mire the error theorist in all the issues surrounding that argument, which we will not delve into here. (But see Sturgeon 1985 and Majors 2007 for discussion.)
2.3 Other Arguments for Error Theory
The argument from queerness is not the only argument for error theory. Here we’ll just briefly outline one other – one that is more explicitly for normative error theory in general. The argument runs roughly as follows:
- There are no necessarily coextensive but distinct properties. (I.e, all necessarily coextensive properties are identical.)
- If any normative property N exists, then it is necessarily coextensive with some natural property.
- So, if any normative property N exists, then it is identical to some natural property.
- Normative properties are not identical to natural properties.
- Therefore, there are no normative properties.
Bart Streumer has given this argument, across a number of articles and a book (see his 2011, 2013, and 2017).
The first phase of the argument, to sub-conclusion (3), is defended by philosophers such as Frank Jackson (1998: ch. 5) and, in more general form, in a non-metaethical context, Jaegwon Kim (1993). (1) is presented largely as an intuitive criterion of property identity. Given certain assumptions, (2) can be proven just from the claim that the normative supervenes on the natural. This is the claim that there can be no normative difference in how things are without a natural difference in them (see entry on supervenience). We won’t walk through the proof here – though see Bader (2017) for a very succinct summary – but consider the following simplified version. Assume – the simplifying step – that the normative property wrongness supervenes on only one natural property: failure to maximize utility. Then, whenever an action instantiates wrongness, it instantiates that natural property, and vice versa – given that the relevant assumptions obtain. And, assuming that supervenience holds with metaphysical necessity, so will this covariation. Wrongness will be necessarily coextensive with the property of being a failure to maximize utility, so (given premise 1) it will be identical to that property.
Streumer defends (4), the last step to the error theoretic conclusion, the claim that normative properties are not natural ones. Arguments for this claim are, however, pivotal to many arguments about the nature of normativity, and not merely to an argument for the error theory. They are pivotal in arguments in favor of non-naturalism, the view that normative properties exist but are not natural properties. And they are pivotal in arguments in favor of non-cognitivist/expressivist theories, theories that hold that normative predicates do not ascribe or refer to normative properties at all, but have a very different semantic role. So, since arguments against normative naturalism are of very wide importance, we will consider them separately.
3. Can Normativity Be Given a Naturalistic Explanation?
We have been helping ourselves to the ideas of a normative property and a normative fact, but we haven’t yet considered in a systematic way views about what the normativity of such properties and facts might consist in. As we explained, the queerness argument for the error theory rests on the idea that some property of normative facts is queer, and the leading candidate seems to be the normativity of the normative facts. One way to answer the queerness argument, then, would be to provide an explanation of what the property of being normative consists in, and a naturalistic explanation would ideally put to rest the worry that there is something queer about normativity. This is one reason to take seriously the question whether normativity can be explained naturalistically.
Non-naturalists deny that normative properties are natural ones, often because they hold that the normativity of these properties rules out their being natural ones. The idea here is that natural properties are not and could not be normative. But the issue whether a normative property could be a natural one is not the same as the issue whether normativity can be given a naturalistic explanation. Normative naturalists hold that normative predicates ascribe or refer to natural properties, and some if not all normative naturalists would contend that normative properties are natural ones. But this does not commit them to the view that normativity can be explained naturalistically. It is open to a normative naturalist to deny that normativity can be explained at all. So the dispute between naturalists and their opponents, including non-naturalists, cuts across the issue raised by our question.
In this section, then, we explore whether normativity can be given a naturalistic explanation. In the next section, we explore a variety of putative explanations of normativity, including naturalistic ones.
We begin by clarifying our question. An explanation puts an explanandum into an explanatory relation with an explanans. So, first, what exactly is the explanandum in the case of our question? Second, what kind of explanatory relation is at issue? What relation between explanandum and naturalistic explanans are we looking for? There are different kinds of explanation. And third, the explanans of a naturalistic explanation would be something naturalistic, but what would count as a naturalistic explanans?
The explanandum in question is the property of being normative, one might say. But we need to bring this into sharper focus. The error theory contests the idea that there are normative properties and normative facts. Certain other anti-realist theories might agree with the error theory that there are not any normative facts – understood as worldly states of affairs – but, as we will see, might not deny that there are normative truths. And all of these theories, as well as realist theories, would agree that there are normative concepts and normative claims and judgments. As we said before, the main area of debate among these theories concerns whether there are worldly normative properties and facts. Nevertheless, our question in this section is about the possibility of providing a naturalistic explanation of normativity. Normative properties and facts (if there are any) instantiate the property of being normative, but so do normative concepts, normative claims, normative judgments, and normative truths (if there are any). The explanandum of the question we are asking, then, is this property of being normative. Is it possible to provide a naturalistic explanation of this property?
Perhaps, however, there is more than one such property. Perhaps there is a family of “normativity properties”. For it is not clear that normative properties, facts, truths, and claims would all be normative in virtue of having exactly the same property. Perhaps normative claims are normative in virtue of having the normative truth conditions they have, whereas these truth conditions are normative in virtue of the normativity of the properties that partly constitute them. Perhaps, then, what normative concepts, claims, truths, facts, and properties have in common, assuming there are such things, is not that they all instantiate the property of being normative, but rather that they instantiate one of the properties from the “normativity family”.
What kind of explanation is at issue? As we understand matters, we are looking for a “constitutive explanation”, an account of the essential nature of the property (or properties) of being normative, or a “real definition” of the property (or of each of the properties) (Rosen 2010; also Schroeder 2005, King 1998). A non-normative example of such an explanation would be the account of the property of being an acid according to which to be an acid is to be a proton donor. The question is whether there could be a relevantly similar naturalistic account of the essential nature of the property of being normative. Or, if there is more than one such property, the question is whether there could be naturalistic accounts of the essential natures of the normativity properties.
In a naturalistic constitutive explanation of the property (or properties) of being normative, the explanans (for each normativity property) would be a natural property, or perhaps a naturalistic “condition”, all the constituents of which are natural properties. For example, if to be an acid is to be a proton donor, then it is a necessary truth that every acid satisfies the condition, or has the complex property, of being a proton donor. Our question, then, is whether there could be a similar explanation of normativity. Could there be an explanation of the normativity of normative facts according to which, for such a fact to be normative is for it to satisfy a condition X, Y, Z where each constituent of this condition is something natural?
Unfortunately, it is tricky to specify what we mean by a “natural” property. For our purposes in this entry, as a first approximation, we might take natural properties to be, roughly, those that figure in scientific theories. Examples would be the properties that figure in biology, economics, psychology, and so on, including the property of being an acid, the property of being deciduous, the property of being inflationary, and so on. More broadly, as a second approximation, we might say that a natural property is such that any substantive knowledge we could have about its instantiation would be empirical. This broader usage would allow us to count the properties of being an automobile and being a lawn chair to count as natural ones. (For discussion of the idea of a natural property, see entries on moral naturalism and moral non-naturalism).
We have said that the explanandum of our question is the property of being normative or perhaps the family of normativity properties. A complication is that there are philosophical disagreements about the nature of properties, or about the use of the word “property”.
As we said before, we understand properties to be worldly characteristics that underlie objective, genuine, worldly similarities among things. Call this the “robust” or “realist” view of properties. On a very different “minimalist” view, to speak of a property is simply to talk in an abstract way about uses of predicates, such as their use in describing things. On such a view, our taking it to be true that it would be bad to drink more Dr. Peppers commits us to there being a “property” that is ascribed by “bad”, but this is nothing but a commitment to (roughly) whatever is involved in the predicative use of “bad”. Similarly, on such a view, the idea that there is a property ascribed by “normative” is merely a commitment to (roughly) whatever is involved in the predicative use of “normative”.
The upshot is that there are both minimalist and realist views about the nature of the explanandum of our question. On the realist view, the challenge is to explain the nature of the property or properties that underlie the objective similarity among normative properties, in virtue of which they are normative, as well as the objective similarities among normative concepts, normative facts, and normative claims. On a minimalist view, the challenge is very different. It is, roughly, to explain what is involved in the predicative use of “normative”. Minimalism leaves open what might be involved. For all that it says, the predicative use of “normative” might involve ascribing a realist property. However, there are alternatives, which, as we will see, are taken up by anti-realist metaethical views such as non-cognitivist expressivism.
It is worth mentioning that there are also minimalist views about the meanings of the words “true” and “fact”, or about how these terms are used. On one minimalist view about the meaning of “true”, for example, to say it is true that it would be bad to drink another Dr. Pepper is just a way of saying that it would be bad to drink another Dr. Pepper. And on one minimalist view about “fact”, facts are simply true propositions. These minimalist views seem to imply that uses of “true” and “fact”, as well as uses of “property”, do not have any metaphysical implications. Most important, they do not commit us to the existence of worldly states of affairs or worldly properties that underwrite genuine similarities among things.
Minimalist views of these kinds are not uncommon. Minimalism figures in the quasi-realist expressivism advocated by Simon Blackburn (2006). Arguably Parfit’s “non-metaphysical non-naturalism” (2011: vol 2, 486) or “non-realist cognitivism” (2017: 49) also incorporates minimalist views. So-called “quietist realist” positions also arguably involve a kind of minimalism (see Dworkin 1996 and 2011: part 1; Scanlon 2014).
In addition to the difference between realist and minimalist understandings of the explanandum, there is a difference between robust and formalist understandings. We will explain this distinction in section 3.1. The formalist view is a kind of deflationary view about normativity. It would sidestep our question, in effect. There is controversy about whether there is such a thing as robust normativity, but our question presupposes that there is such a thing and asks whether its nature can be given a naturalistic explanation. We will therefore set aside the formalist view after a brief discussion of it.
In section 3.2, we introduce the distinction between normative realism and normative anti-realism. We sketch the challenge that our question poses to normative realism, and the kinds of answers that realists might provide. Realism is, however, compatible with fundamentally different views about the explanation of normativity. In section 3.3, we consider the “primitivist” view that the nature of normativity cannot be explained at all, at least not in non-normative terms. Primitivism is characteristic of non-naturalism, but it is also available to naturalists.
In section 3.4, we introduce a distinction between “conceptualism” and “objectualism”, two views about the kinds of things that instantiate the property of being normative. “Objectualist” theories hold that there are worldly normative properties and states of affairs, whereas “conceptualist” theories deny this and hold instead that normativity lies exclusively, or at least fundamentally, in the realm of thought. Conceptualism is, we think, the characteristic position of anti-realists; at least, this is so if we set aside the error theory, but conceptualism is also compatible with normative realism. In section 3.4.1 and section 3.4.2, we look at anti-realist and realist versions of conceptualism, respectively.
Finally, in section 3.5, we turn to objectualism, and the issue whether there might be a successful form of reductive normative naturalism. This kind of theory would provide an ambitious answer to our organizing question. It would combine a realist, robust view of the property of being normative with the objectualist view that this property is instantiated by states of affairs and first-order ethical properties. It then contends that it is possible to provide a naturalistic constitutive explanation of the property (or properties) of being normative.
The question we address in this section concerns whether a naturalistic constitutive explanation of normativity can be provided. In this section, we address the question in abstract terms. In the following section, section 4, we explore a variety of putative explanations of normativity, including naturalistic ones. The best way to show that a naturalistic explanation of normativity is possible would be to provide one.
3.1 Normative Formalism
The basic idea of normative formalism can perhaps be conveyed if we mention that there at least seem to be truths about what one has most reason to do in a game. We pointed this out before, in discussing reasons fundamentalism. There also seem to be truths about what one ought to do in a game. In chess, for instance, one ought to castle early and there is reason to protect one’s queen. One might think, however, that this “ought” and this reason have in themselves no genuine authority over a person’s decisions, not even if she is playing chess. Of course, a person might have a prudential reason to play well, or she might have a moral reason to do so if she promised, but chess reasons in themselves have no authority over her. They are not “robustly” normative in the philosophically most interesting and important sense. Chess reasons have no genuine claim on anyone’s attention in the way that the moral reason to be loyal to friends does. Normative formalism rejects this line of thought. On the formalist view, the idea of normative authority, and the idea of genuine or robustly normative reasons or “oughts”, are empty. There is nothing to normativity beyond the fact that certain rules or norms “call for” certain actions or decisions in certain situations in the way that the rules of chess and considerations of strategy in chess call for castling early.
Formalism has been defended by Evan Tiffany (2007; see also Hubin 2001), and it seems to be implicit in places where it is not explicitly defended. It is compatible with a variety of positions, including normative realism, as we will explain. Yet formalism is a radical view. It seems to imply that, other things being equal, the reason to castle early is no different with respect to its authority over actions or decisions, and with respect to its normativity, from the reason to be honest and truthful.
For our purposes, the important point is that formalism offers an affirmative answer to the question we are discussing in this section, for it explains normativity on the basis of the logic and content of norms and rules that have currency in relevant social contexts (Tiffany 2007; Parfit 2011, II: 308–309). H.L.A. Hart arguably has a similar view about the normativity of law (1994: 257; see Copp 2019). If normative formalism is correct, then, there is a ready answer to Mackie’s argument from queerness. For, if formalism is correct, normativity is no more mysterious than facts about the rules of games or facts about social norms and social practices.
The controversial issue, however, is whether there is such a thing as the “robust” or “authoritative” normativity that formalism rejects. Our question presupposes that there is such a thing, for otherwise the organizing question we are asking in this section is neither especially interesting nor challenging. For this reason, we set aside the formalist view in what follows.
3.2 Normative Realism
Normative realism sees a strict analogy between normative truths, such as the putative truth that it would be bad to have another Dr. Pepper, and non-normative truths, such as the fact that Dr. Pepper is sweet. In each case, there is a declarative sentence that expresses a proposition that can be the intensional object of a belief, and, further, the belief, proposition, and sentence are true just when the state of affairs they represent obtains. So, if our beliefs are correct, there is the state of affairs or the fact that Dr. Pepper is sweet, and there is the state of affairs or the fact that it would be bad to have another Dr. Pepper. We believe both that Dr. Pepper is sweet and that it would be bad to have another one. And we express these beliefs by asserting that Dr. Pepper is sweet or that it would be bad to have another one, respectively.
Accordingly, normative realists hold both that there are states of affairs that are represented by, and that are the truth conditions of, normative propositions, and that there are properties that are referred to or ascribed by normative predicates. Mind-independent realist theories go beyond this basic position to add that the truth conditions of normative truths are “mind-independent” in some important sense. (We discuss the idea of mind-independence in section 5 of this entry.) So we can distinguish between the view we will call “basic normative realism” and the view we will call “mind-independent normative realism”. Some philosophers want to reserve the term “realism” for the mind-independent form, and we will also tend to follow this usage except where we want to describe a theory as an example of basic realism.
There is also the distinction, among realist theories, between normative naturalism and normative non-naturalism. As we said before, normative naturalists hold that normative predicates ascribe or refer to natural properties, and some if not all normative naturalists hold that normative properties are natural ones. We will discuss normative naturalism and non-naturalism in what follows.
Note a couple of points. First, there is nothing in normative realism that commits realists to holding that the normative properties and facts are robustly normative rather than merely formally normative. But we have set aside normative formalism. In what follows, we consider attempts to account for robust normativity. Second, as we will explain in section 3.4, normative realism is compatible with a kind of normative conceptualism, and this means that realists are not committed to holding that the wordly states of affairs that are the truth conditions of normative propositions, and the properties that are ascribed by normative predicates, are themselves normative. They could hold instead, roughly, that normativity is a feature only of normative concepts.
Anti-realist theories deny one or more of the claims that are definitive of realism, whether of basic realism or of mind-independent realism. There are several different kinds of normative anti-realism. One kind is normative nihilism, or the error theory, which we have already discussed. Non-cognitivist expressivism is another kind of anti-realist theory. A third kind is the non-realist cognitivism that was advocated by Derek Parfit (2011, 2017). Still another kind is a family of “constructivist ”theories, which reject the mind-independence condition, although some of them seem committed to the tenets of basic normative realism (Copp 2013). For examples, see Christine Korsgaard’s work (1996) and Sharon Street’s (2008, 2010). (This entry does not discuss non-realist cognitivism or constructivism. See the entry on constructivism in metaethics.) We consider anti-realist attempts to account for robust normativity in section 3.4 as well as in some of the subsections in section 4.
If a theory countenances the existence of normative facts, normative properties, normative propositions, and normative concepts, it ideally would want to explain what the normativity of each of these consists in. To bring the challenge into focus, consider a normative property such as wrongness. Ideally, one might think, realists would want to provide accounts on two levels. First, they might aspire to provide an account of the essential nature of wrongness itself, an account that reveals, inter alia, that wrongness is essentially normative. Second, realists might aspire to provide an account of the essential nature of the second-order property of being normative that is instantiated by wrongness. These accounts would be constitutive explanations, in the sense we introduced. Our question is whether the account of the latter, second-order property could be naturalistic.
With respect to the normative concepts – concepts such as the concepts <wrong> or <virtue> – the explanatory accounts we are looking for would be conceptual analyses, so they presumably would be a priori. This does not mean that they would be obviously true, nor even that any rational person who had the concept would recognize a correct analysis as being correct. (For discussion of this point, see entries analysis and moral non-naturalism, section on the open question argument). With respect to the normative properties – properties such as the property of being wrong, or that of being a virtue – the explanatory accounts we are looking for would be metaphysical analyses, so, arguably, they would not be a priori (Schroeder 2005, King 1998, Rosen 2010). Since these accounts would be (putative) accounts of the essential natures of the properties, they would be necessarily true if true at all, and they would underwrite identity claims. If it is the essential nature of something’s being an acid that it be a proton donor, then to be an acid is to be a proton donor. If it the essential nature of wrongness is being A, B, and C, then to be wrong is to be A, B, and C.
One might think it is obvious that there could not be a correct naturalistic constitutive explanation of any of the normative concepts or properties, nor of the normativity property or properties themselves. But before we turn to this issue, we will consider a variety of other views, both realist and anti-realist, and discuss their approaches to explaining normativity.
3.3 Primitivism: Non-Naturalism and Naturalism
One camp of realists holds that the nature of normativity cannot be fully explained. There is no correct constitutive explanation of normativity. We might express their view by saying that, for them, normativity is primitive. It is unanalyzable.
We distinguish primitivism about normativity as such from primitivism about the normative properties or concepts. Primitivism about the normative properties or concepts holds that the nature of these properties or concepts cannot be fully explained. There is no correct constitutive explanation of their nature. Primitivism about normativity as such holds that the nature of normativity cannot be fully explained.
It seems, however, that primitivism about normativity as such commits one to primitivism about the normative properties and concepts. For it is of the nature of the normative properties and concepts that they are normative. So primitivism about normativity implies that any constitutive account of the nature of a normative property or concept would have an unanalyzable constituent, the second-order normativity property. To illustrate, consider the view that all normative properties can be reduced to some condition about reasons. Perhaps for an action to be wrong is, in part, for there to be reasons against it. But reasons are normative considerations, so the primitivist about normativity will say that the normativity of reasons is primitive. Generalizing, according to primitivism about normativity, any constitutive explanation of a normative property would have the normativity property as an unanalyzable constituent. It therefore seems that primitivism about normativity implies or at least supports a primitivism about the normative properties and concepts.
Primitivists typically are non-naturalists who hold that normative properties belong to a metaphysically different kind than natural properties. There is, however, room for a primitivism that is naturalist. There might be natural properties the intrinsic nature of which is not open to analysis or to constitutive explanation, so we should perhaps be open to the idea that the normative properties are among the primitive natural ones. Perhaps, too, the second-order property of being normative is a natural one, where there is no correct constitutive explanation of its nature. There are also primitivist anti-realist theories, such as Parfit’s cognitivist anti-realism and constructivist theories that deploy unanalyzed conceptions of rationality.
There is, then, a primitivism about normativity as such as well as a primitivism about normative properties. There is also a primitivist view about normative concepts according to which these concepts are not analyzable. Non-naturalists typically hold that both the normative concepts and the normative properties are primitive and unanalyzable (see entry on moral non-naturalism). Further, naturalists who are primitivists about normative properties might also be primitivists about the normative concepts. Indeed, even naturalists who reject primitivism about normative properties might nevertheless accept primitivism about the normative concepts, and thereby hold that the normative concepts are unanalyzable (see Railton 2003).
It is tempting to say that a theory that provided a constitutive explanation of the nature of normativity would clearly be preferable to primitivism. For, we assume, the goal, in theorizing, is to explain things. Accordingly, regardless of the subject matter, other things being equal, a theory that says that such and such cannot be explained is on that count alone less attractive than a theory that offers an explanation, or that at least leaves open the possibility of an explanation. Nevertheless, of course, in the absence of an explanation, we need to be open to the possibility that one is not going to be found, and even, perhaps, to the possibility that, for some reason, no explanation could be found. There are physical constants that are unexplained in our best physical theories, for example. Perhaps normativity similarly is not open to explanation.
3.4 Normative Conceptualism
We have assumed that there are worldly states of affairs and properties, and we take it that there are normative truths, but this does not force us to the conclusion that there are normative states of affairs and normative properties. Normative objectualism holds that there are such things, but normative conceptualism holds that normativity lies in the realm of thought rather than in the realm of reality that we represent in our thought. Objectualism holds that there are states of affairs and properties that instantiate the normativity property (or one of the normativity properties), whereas conceptualism denies this and holds that it is only concepts and propositions that are normative. Conceptualist theories agree that there are normative truths, but deny that any states of affairs or properties are normative
3.4.1 Anti-realist conceptualism: non-cognitivist expressivism
One example of normative conceptualism is the anti-realist view generally called “non-cognitivist expressivism”, or simply “expressivism”. This is the view that, roughly, normative assertions express conative attitudes such as approval, disapproval, aversion, or subscription to a norm. Such attitudes are akin to desires rather than to cognitive states, such as beliefs, that represent the world as being one way or another. Expressivism holds that normative judgments are at least partly constituted by conative attitudes taken toward things.
In the simplest cases, a normative judgment might just be an attitude. For example, one might hold that the assertion that it would be bad to drink Dr. Pepper expresses an aversion to drinking Dr. Pepper, and, moreover, that this aversion just is the judgment that it would be bad to drink Dr. Pepper. In more complex cases, a normative judgment might have some non-normative content, but inasmuch as it is normative, it would be partly constituted by an attitude. An example of this might be the assertion that Justin was bad to drink another Dr. Pepper.
Expressivists accordingly take normative judgments to be very different from ordinary beliefs. The belief that Dr. Pepper is sweet is a cognitive state of mind that takes the proposition that Dr. Pepper is sweet as its intensional object and that represents Dr. Pepper as having the property sweetness. The assertion that Dr. Pepper is sweet expresses this belief. But, in the expressivist view, the assertion that it would be bad to drink another Dr. Pepper does not express a cognitive state of mind that takes a proposition as its object and that represents drinking another Dr. Pepper as having a property. It rather expresses an aversion or some similar conative attitude.
One consideration that has motivated expressivism is the idea that having a normative judgment entails being motivated in some appropriate way. For example, we would expect that a person who thinks it would be bad to have another Dr. Pepper is motivated to avoid or to oppose having another Dr. Pepper. According to the position called motivational judgment internalism (MJI), such motivation is entailed by having a normative judgment. Motivation is internal to normative judgment. Expressivists argue that the best explanation of MJI is the expressivist thesis that normative judgments consist at least in part in motivating conative attitudes of some kind, such as aversions or attractions.
Expressivism has also been motivated by some of the considerations that we explored in discussing arguments for the error theory. There is the idea that normative states of affairs would be metaphysically problematic – perhaps because, it might seem, states of affairs of this kind would have to have an intrinsic practical force that is unintelligible – or, it might seem, they would have to have an unintelligible intrinsic magnetism or repulsion. If this is correct, then, it might seem, it would be a mistake to postulate the existence of normative states of affairs. This reasoning can be contested, as we saw. But even if it is correct, it need not lead to an error theory. There is the alternative of taking our normative judgments to consist in conative attitudes, such as aversions or attractions, rather than to be beliefs that purport to represent normative states of affairs. Expressivism can seem in this way to make room for normative truths without postulating the existence of normative states of affairs.
Expressivism can make room for normative truths and facts if it is combined with minimalist views of the meanings of “true” and “fact”. The result of such a combination would allow expressivism to make sense of the claim that it is true, and a fact, that it would be bad to drink another Dr. Pepper. For, on the minimalist view, to claim these things would simply be a way of claiming that it would be bad to drink another Dr. Pepper.
Expressivism might also be combined with a minimalist view of the use of the term “belief”, according to which beliefs are the psychological states, whatever their nature, that are expressed by assertions. On this view, an expressivist could agree that we believe it would be bad to drink another Dr. Pepper. But, for the expressivist, this “belief” or judgment is a conative state of aversion or something like aversion. It is not the kind of cognitive state that is expressed when we assert that Dr Pepper is sweet. On this view, then, there are at least two radically different kinds of belief – cognitive states that take propositions as their objects and conative states that consist in having a conative attitude to something. And there presumably are also mixed states.
As we mentioned, Blackburn has a view that combines expressivism with minimalism about “true”, “fact”, and “property”, and his view also incorporates a minimalism about “belief” (Blackburn 2006). He calls this position, “quasi-realism”.
An expressivist would presumably deny that there is a worldly state of affairs of its being bad to have another Dr. Pepper. There is the aversion to drinking another Dr. Pepper, of course. But the claim that it would be bad to drink another Dr. Pepper is not a psychological claim. It is not a claim about an aversion, although it expresses an aversion. That is, this aversion is not a state of affairs that makes it true that it would be bad to drink another Dr. Pepper. It is a psychological state that we express in saying it would be bad to drink another Dr. Pepper.
Expressivism is, then, an example of normative conceptualism. Properly understood, it says, normativity is not a feature of states of affairs in the world; it is a feature of a way or ways of thinking of things. There are no normative states of affairs in the world. There are only normative ways of thinking.
It is arguable that so-called quietism, as well as Parfit’s cognitivist anti-realism, are also examples of normative conceptualism. They contend that normative thought and talk do not commit us metaphysically to anything we wouldn’t otherwise be committed to. So, presumably, they must agree with expressivism that normativity is not to be accounted for by anything in our metaphysics. Perhaps, then, it is a feature of our ways of thinking of things.
Return now to the question whether normativity can be given a naturalistic explanation. For the expressivist, this is the question whether the normativity of normative judgments can be given a naturalistic explanation. And their answer would presumably be affirmative. We have just sketched the kind of explanation an expressivist would provide. We have, and we endorse, the “belief” we might express by saying it would be bad to drink another Dr. Pepper. This thought consists in having an aversion to drinking another Dr. Pepper. There is a variety of such attitudes or “stances”, to use Blackburn’s term (2006), and they are the characteristic constituents of normative thoughts. For a thought to be normative is, roughly, for it to have some such constituent. This is a sketch of the expressivist answer to our question.
Note that this account of normativity explains normative thought and talk in a way that we might also use to explain slurring thought and talk, such as talk about “kikes”, “huns”, “Yankees”, and the like. One might think that this counts against expressivism since, we take it, the emotionally-laden slurring ways of thinking of Jews, Germans, and Americans, are not normative.
There are several examples of expressivism, including Allan Gibbard’s somewhat different but complementary approaches (1990, 2003), and Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons’s cognitivist expressivism (2006). We do not explore these different theories. For detailed discussion of expressivism, see Mark Schroeder (2010). See also the entry on moral cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism.
3.4.2 Realist conceptualism
Normative realism is a kind of cognitivism. It says that just as the assertion that Dr. Pepper is sweet expresses a belief, so the assertion that it would be bad to drink another Dr. Pepper expresses a belief – both express a cognitive state of mind that takes a proposition as its object and that represents the world as being one way or another. Quasi-realism would allow us to call conative states of mind, such as an aversion to drinking another Dr. Pepper, “beliefs”, but it holds that beliefs of this kind are conative states that are different in their intrinsic nature from ordinary beliefs. Cognitivists, including normative naturalists and non-naturalists, hold that normative judgments are ordinary beliefs, cognitive states that represent worldly states of affairs that are their truth conditions.
We have already seen that there is an important difference between primitivist forms of normative realism and forms of realism that aim to explain the intrinsic nature of the normativity properties. But there is also an important difference between forms of normative realism that affirm, and those that deny, that there are normative worldly states of affairs and normative properties.
Realist normative conceptualism holds that normativity is a feature of some of our ways of thinking of certain properties and states of affairs rather than being a property of those properties and states of affairs themselves. Hence, normativity is to be found in the realm of thought rather than in the realm of reality that we represent in our thought. Realist normative conceptualism is a form at least of basic normative realism since it holds that normative judgments represent worldly states of affairs that are their truth conditions, and that normative concepts are concepts of worldly properties. What it denies is that these states of affairs and properties are themselves normative. Matti Eklund calls this view, or at least naturalist versions of it, presentationalism (Eklund 2017: ch 6).
Normative conceptualism is an attractive position for normative naturalists because it enables them to hold that the properties referred to by the normative concepts are natural ones, but without having to provide a naturalistic constitutive explanation of the normativity property instantiated by these properties. It avoids this challenging problem because it denies that the property of being normative is instantiated by any properties and, indeed, by any states of affairs. It holds that only normative concepts and propositions are normative.
There is a subtly different version of naturalist normative conceptualism. On this version, there are normative states of affairs and properties, but their being normative is entirely derivative from the normativity of the normative ways of thinking that represent these states of affairs and properties. Their being normative consists in their being represented by normative propositions or concepts. Their normativity is extrinsic, rather than intrinsic. It would seem to follow that these states of affairs and properties could exist, or might have existed, without being normative. The property we represent in thought as wrongness is normative only because we think of it this way, and we might not have thought of it in this way. This implication should be compared with the implication, of the other version of naturalist normative conceptualism, that there are no normative states of affairs or properties.
Unless it embraces primitivism, normative conceptualism still needs to explain what it is about the normative concepts in virtue of which they are normative. But this is a challenge it shares with all other forms of ethical naturalism and ethical non-naturalism, and perhaps also with all forms of ethical anti-realism. Further, it is open to naturalist normative conceptualism to embrace primitivism and agree with non-naturalists that the normative concepts are not analyzable in non-normative terms. For this thesis is not problematic to naturalism. Naturalism is primarily a metaphysical thesis about what there is. It is not a thesis about the analysis of our concepts or ways of thinking.
One problem faced by realist normative conceptualism is that it arguably is a necessary truth that the properties referred to or represented by normative concepts are normative. For instance, arguably, if any property is referred to or represented by our concept <wrong> it is the property wrongness. And unless it embraces error theory, normative conceptualism agrees that there is a property that is referred to or represented by our concept <wrong>. So it is committed to there being a property wrongness. And it would seem to be a necessary truth that any such property is normative in itself and not merely in virtue of the fact that some normative concept of ours refers to it or represents it. If this is right, then unless it embraces error theory, realist normative conceptualism faces a fatal problem.
3.5 Normative Objectualism
Objectualist theories, unlike conceptualist ones, hold that there are worldly states of affairs and properties that are themselves normative. Objectualist theories take it that normativity is found in the world, and not merely in the realm of thought about the world. It holds that certain properties and facts instantiate a normativity property.
As we saw, normative realism is compatible with both normative formalism and normative conceptualism, but it is typically objectualist. In this section, then, we return to normative realism in its objectualist form. In section 3.1, we saw that normativity formalism provides an affirmative answer to our guiding question, since it explains normativity by reference to rules or norms or social practices. We set aside normativity formalism because the controversial issue is whether a robust or authoritative normativity can be given a constitutive naturalistic explanation. In section 3.2 we discussed the explanatory challenge faced by realist theories, and in section 3.3, we considered primitivist realist theories, which deny that any constitutive explanation of normativity is possible. Section 3.4 considered both anti-realist and realist versions of normativity conceptualism. Non-cognitivist expressivism is a kind of normativity conceptualism that offers a naturalistic constitutive explanation of the normativity of normative judgments and concepts. Realist versions of conceptualism would either be primitivist, or they would aim to provide a constitutive explanation of the normativity of normative judgments and concepts. In this section, we turn to objectualist forms of ethical realism and the question whether theories of this kinds are able to answer our guiding question.
There are both naturalist and non-naturalist forms of normativity objectualism. Non-naturalism, however, is typically primitivist. It gives a negative answer to our guiding question. As we saw, ethical naturalism can also be primitivist. But if a theory is going to offer a constitutive explanation of normativity, or constitutive accounts of the normative properties and concepts, in each case the explanans proposed by the theory is almost certain to be a natural property or condition. That is, the theory is almost certain to be a kind of reductive normative naturalism. Accordingly, this section discusses theories of this kind.
There are many varieties of normative naturalism, as we have seen. All such theories have in common the realist claim that there are worldly states of affairs that are represented by, and that are the truth conditions of, normative truths, and that there are properties that are referred to and ascribed by normative predicates. Objectualist views add that these properties and states of affairs are normative. Naturalist views add that these states of affairs and properties are natural ones.
Reductive normative naturalism claims that naturalistic constitutive explanations of normativity and of the normative properties and concepts are available, at least in principle. We began section 3 with the question whether normativity can be given a naturalistic constitutive explanation. Reductive normative naturalism offers an affirmative answer. Some naturalists might merely have the aspirational view that although an adequate reduction is not yet available, we should expect there to be one in the offing, since the normative states of affairs and properties are natural. But the most interesting forms of reductive normative naturalism offer accounts of the nature of normativity, or at least sketches of such. Theories of this kind propose, for each normative explanandum and for the property of normativity itself, a natural property as its explanans.
A distinction needs to be drawn between analytic and non-analytic reductive normative naturalism. Both kinds of theory claim that normative properties are natural ones and both offer sketches of naturalistic constitutive explanations of these properties. Analytic theories contend that their analyses are conceptual truths, whereas non-analytic ones do not contend this.
There are many objections to normative naturalism in general and to reductive normative naturalism in particular. In this entry, we do not investigate these objections in detail, or arguments in favor of naturalism. For an examination of these objections and arguments, see entries on moral naturalism and moral non-naturalism.
One might think it is obvious that there could not be a correct naturalistic constitutive explanation of normativity or of the normative properties. Consider the property wrongness, assuming there is such a thing. Assuming that this property is normative, a correct constitutive explanation of the essential nature of this property would need to identify a natural property (or naturalistic condition) as the explanans, and this natural property would have to be normative. According to a kind of meta-ethical utilitarian naturalism, for example, for an action to be wrong is for it to fail to maximize the general happiness. Since wrongness is normative, this theory is correct only if the property failing to maximize the general happiness is normative. But it might seem obvious that this property is not normative, and therefore that the utilitarian naturalist view cannot be correct. It is part of the essential nature of wrongness that it is normative, but, one might think, it obviously is not part of the essential nature of the property of failing to maximize the general happiness that it is normative. Indeed, it might seem, this property obviously is not normative. Failing to maximize the general happiness is normatively relevant, the utilitarian thinks, because an action that fails in this way is wrong for this reason – but this is not a matter of its nature. Or so one might think. And, generalizing, one might think that there could not be a correct naturalistic constitutive explanation of the nature of any of the normative properties because natural properties are not normative.
For a similar reason, one might think there could not be a correct naturalistic constitutive explanation of the (second-order) property of being normative, or of any of the normativity properties. A correct naturalistic account of the essential nature of any such property would need to identify a natural property (or naturalistic condition) as the explanans, where this explanans would be the essential nature of the normative property. But if natural properties and conditions are not normative, no such thing could be the essential nature of the property of being normative.
These arguments simply raise the issue whether it is correct that no natural property is normative. A utilitarian naturalist might respond to the above argument, for example, by claiming that the nature of the property of failing to maximize the general happiness is such that actions with this property are wrong, and, since wrongness is essentially normative, normativity is inherent as well in the nature of the property failing to maximize the general happiness.
At the root of all of the objections to normative naturalism is perhaps the “Just too Different” objection, the claim that normative properties are just too different in their nature from natural properties for them to be natural properties (Parfit 2011; Enoch 2011; Copp 2020a). This is an intuitive claim rather than an argument. Derek Parfit contends, for example, that the normative concepts rule out naturalism; that wrongness could no more be identical to some natural property than heat could be identical to a cabbage (Parfit 2011, vol. II: 325). A naturalist might respond that, similarly, heat seems to be too different from mean molecular kinetic energy for it to be identical to that, yet the consensus seems to be that heat is identical to mean molecular kinetic energy, or something like that. So “just too different” intuitions are hardly decisive.
In the next section of this entry, we briefly consider several examples of proposed constitutive explanations of normativity, including both naturalist explanations and other kinds.
4. Attempts to Explain the Nature of Normativity
In order to explain what normativity consists in, philosophers have pursued just a few basic strategies. First, it is evident that there is a close relationship between normative beliefs and decisions or actions, at least when a person is rational. Given this, some theories propose a kind of constitutive relationship between normativity and motivation, or between normativity and intentions to act, or between normativity and agency. Second, it has seemed evident to some philosophers that normativity must somehow have a deep psychological ground if normative demands are not to seem alien to people. So some theories propose that normativity is tied to the essential nature of persons as rational, or to what is essential to agency, or at least to the “identity” of agents, or their “practical identity”. Third, some theories look at the role of normative beliefs in the lives of human beings, in orienting humans to what will make for flourishing lives, or in coordinating and organizing human beings in joint activities in their societies in ways that allow their societies to flourish.
This entry will briefly introduce eight kinds of theory. Be aware, that these will be merely sketches of the basic ideas. Note also that the theories are not all intended as examples of reductive normative naturalistic realism. In some cases, the intention is merely to illuminate the nature of normativity without achieving a constitutive explanation of normativity. Some of the examples are realist, but some are anti-realist, expressivist or constructivist. And among the realist cases are examples of both mind-independent normative realism and of basic normative realism. We begin with a perspective on the nature of normativity that has been taken to support non-cognitivist expressivism, although it can also be interpreted in a way that is friendly to realism. We then sketch two ideas that are examples of basic-realist approaches, but that eschew mind-independence. They are sometimes classified as “constructivist” and anti-realist. It is not until we reach the final two cases, in section 4.7 and section 4.8, that we find clear examples of naturalistic constitutive explanations of robust normativity that are also examples of mind-independent realism. What follows, then, are eight strategies that have been used in attempting to explain normativity.
4.1 Explaining Normativity via Motivation
One familiar view is that normative thought has a special, internal, connection to motivation. According to motivational judgment internalism (MJI), it is a necessary truth that a person who believes she ought to do something is motivated accordingly. Generalizing, perhaps all normative thoughts are such that, necessarily, a person with a normative thought is thereby motivated accordingly. This connection to motivation arguably must be due to the content of normative beliefs, since not all beliefs have such a close connection to motivation. And this suggests an account of normativity. It would say, roughly, that normative propositions are such because, necessarily, anyone who believes such a proposition is motivated accordingly.
A different view would invoke the neo-Humean view that no belief (properly so called) entails or necessitates motivation; beliefs motivate only when combined with an appropriately related desire. On this view, if moral judgments entail motivation, then moral judgments are not (ordinary) beliefs, properly so-called. They must instead be at least partly constituted by conative states that do necessarily motivate. In this way, MJI can lead to non-cognitive expressivism.
The expressivist, Allan Gibbard, has proposed, for example, that normative states of mind are planning states, akin to intentions. To judge that it does not make sense to have another Dr. Pepper consists in something like planning not to have another Dr. Pepper. Gibbard has developed a systematic and sophisticated account to put flesh on this basic idea (Gibbard 2003).
Unfortunately, MJI is controversial and there are a variety of counter-examples and arguments against it (Brink 1989; Copp 2007: chap 8; Svavarsdóttir 1999; for relevant discussion, see entry on reasons for action: internal vs. external). Accordingly, defenders of the basic intuition have qualified and amended MJI. Michael Smith contends, for example, that it is a necessary truth that a person who believes she ought to do something is motivated accordingly unless she is practically irrational (1994). He has also proposed a naturalistic account of what it is to be practically rational. His approach lends support to a form of naturalistic normative realism rather than to a form of expressivism.
4.2 Explaining Normativity via Desire-based reasons
A widespread view is that normative facts are analyzable in terms of facts about reasons. So in this and the next sections, we investigate attempts to explain the nature of normativity by explaining the nature of reasons.
It is widely thought that a person has reason to satisfy her desires. On this view, for instance, if I want some ice cream, I have reason to get some. Some philosophers hold that all practical reasons are basically of this nature. The basic idea is that practical reasons are essentially facts about desire satisfaction, but there are different versions of the idea. For example, some would insist that the desires in question are not necessarily the desires that a person actually has, but are instead ones that she would have if she were fully informed and if she brought all relevant facts vividly to mind (Brandt 1979). See the entry on reasons for action: internal vs. external.
One might combine the idea that normative facts are analyzable in terms of facts about reasons with the idea that practical reasons are essentially facts about desire satisfaction. On this basis, one might conclude that all normative facts are fundamentally facts about desire satisfaction – or informed desire satisfaction, or the like. One might then propose that the normativity of a fact consists in its being analyzable as a fact (of some relevant kind) about desire satisfaction. This then would point the way toward a naturalistic constitutive explanation of normativity. This basic strategy has been developed in detail by Mark Schroeder (2007).
Views of this kind would be classified as realist, if one had in mind what we earlier called “basic realism”, or as irrealist or anti-realist, if one had in mind what we earlier called “mind-independent realism”. Sharon Street has a view of this kind that she classifies as constructivist (2008, 2010).
One problem is that our second-order desires can conflict with our first-order ones. We can desire to get rid of some of our desires, for example, and in this case it might seem that the latter desires don’t give us reason to satisfy them. Following Harry Frankfurt, one might argue that only desires that are endorsed by higher order desires, or at least not undermined by them, ground reasons (Frankfurt 1971).
There are also attempts to undermine these approaches. Christine Korsgaard has argued, for example, that one has a reason to satisfy a desire only if the object of the desire is something that is valuable itself, or something that will tend to promote something valuable (Korsgaard 1996).
4.3 Explaining Normativity via Practical identity
It can seem that desires can be too shallow in our psychology to ground reasons. Christine Korsgaard has suggested that normativity might instead be grounded in our “practical identity” – in features of ourselves that we value (1996). Our practical identity is to be understood as a matter of attitudes we take to ourselves and our lives, but it is something more central to our sense of ourselves than mere desire. On Korsgaard’s account, a parent who values parenthood thereby has reasons to act as parents are meant to act. Some people have practical identities that are regrettable, of course, such as the practical identity of a gangster. But, Korsgaard argues, a person’s practical identity grounds reasons for her only if it is compatible with the practical identities of everyone else.
The strategy outlined in the preceding section is to take the normativity of a fact to consist in the fact’s being, or being analyzable as, a fact about reasons. One might then take up Korsgaard’s account of reasons as facts about practical identity and propose that the normativity of a fact consists in the fact’s being, or being analyzable as, a suitable fact about practical identity.
This account can still seem to leave too much to a person’s contingent psychology. It would seem to imply that a rootless person who is aimless and untethered has no reasons whatsoever since he has no practical identity. He values nothing about his life. Yet, plausibly, there are still things he has reason to do and not to do.
The theory of normativity on offer here might be classified as an example of basic realism, but it isn’t an example of mind-independent realism. It tends to be classified as a constructivist and anti-realist (Street 2010).
4.4 Explaining Normativity via Essential features of agency or action
It has seemed to some philosophers that a better strategy would be to explain normativity in terms of agency. We are agents, and cannot help but be agents, performing actions (Korsgaard 1996).
David Velleman (2000) considers the idea that the key to understanding normativity in action is to discover what stands to action as truth stands to belief. It is constitutive of belief that it aims at the truth. Truth is normative for belief. That is, roughly, beliefs ought to be true, and a believer is subject to a requirement to be responsive to the truth. Similarly, perhaps, it is constitutive of action that it aims at the good. The good is normative for action. That is, actions ought to promote the good, and a person who acts is subject to a requirement to be responsive to the good. Velleman argues, however, for the different idea that it is constitutive of agency that agents have the aim of knowing what they are doing. Self-knowledge is the constitutive aim of action. Further, Velleman argues, this determines the criterion of success in action, which in turn determines which considerations count as reasons for action.
Christine Korsgaard has proposed (1996), roughly, that in order to count as an action, something done by a person must be done for a reason, and this means it must accord with norms that any rational agent could accept. Given what actions are, one can act only if one acts in accord with such norms.
These ideas could be interpreted as offering, or at least pointing in the direction of, constitutive accounts of normativity. The basic idea would be that it is constitutive of a fact’s being normative in relation to action or belief that the fact be appropriately related to the essence of action or belief, respectively.
One response to proposals of these kinds is that, if agency is understood as these philosophers suggest, then agency is optional. That is, perhaps, a person can opt out of the aim to have self-knowledge, or to do things that accord with norms of practical reason, by opting to do things that do not count as actions in the preferred sense that these proposals spell out. See David Enoch (2006).
A different response points out that, on these accounts, the concept of action itself turns out to be normative in a covert way, for, on these accounts, it is of the essence of action that it aim at self-knowledge, or that it must accord with norms of practical reason. But the idea that an aim is non-optional is arguably normative, as is the idea of norms of practical reason. Hence, arguably, these accounts do not explain what normativity consists in. They rather change the explanandum from the nature of normativity to the nature of agency or action.
4.5 Explaining Normativity via “Self-legislation”
One approach, which is suggested by Kant, seeks to explain normativity in terms of norms that one could rationally will to serve as requirements incumbent on all agents (1785 ). This can be described as a matter of self-legislation, since each person is viewed in effect as herself legislating these norms to serve as requirements on all agents. On this view, as Kantians develop it, the content of everyone’s “self-legislation” must be the same, assuming relevantly similar circumstances. For the view assumes that there are standards of rational willing that constrain what anyone could will to serve as requirements incumbent on all agents.
Whether such an account can succeed in providing a constitutive explanation of normativity depends on whether the normativity of these standards of rational willing can be given a constitutive explanation. For these standards are viewed as normative constraints on willing, and rationality here is taken to be normative. So if the nature of normativity is what we are trying to explain, we haven’t succeeded if our account rests on the assumption that there are normative constraints on willing.
4.6 Explaining Normativity via Categorical requirements
A similar problem arises for attempts to explain normativity in terms of the idea of a categorical requirement of rationality. There is a standardly accepted distinction between hypothetical requirements and categorical ones (Kant 1785 ). Hypothetical requirements are, roughly, requirements that are grounded in, or hold in virtue of, the contingent desires or attitudes of the agent who is so required. An example might be the requirement to maintain your car, which presumably presupposes that you want your car to continue running. Categorical requirements have no such presupposition. It might seem that any genuinely robust normative requirement would be categorical, since all other requirements depend on, and so are hostage to, facts about person’s contingent psychology.
The challenge is to explain the nature of, and the grounding of, these categorical requirements. If we try to explain this in terms of what one could rationally will to serve as requirements incumbent on all agents, or in terms of what one could rationally will everyone to do, we run up against the same problem as afflicted the account that invokes the idea of self-legislation, which we just discussed. A normative naturalist might propose a naturalistic explanation of categorical requirements but would need to take a very different approach (see Copp 2015)
4.7 Explaining Normativity via Natural function
There are at least the following two “kinds of goodness” that seem to be naturalistically unproblematic, and, generalizing, there seem to be two kinds of naturalistic normativity. First, where K is a functional kind, a good K is one that performs the function well. A good toaster does well at toasting bread. A good printer is one that prints well. And the criteria for performing well are naturalistically specifiable in line with the purpose of the relevant kind of thing. Second, where K is a biological kind, the things needed by Ks in order to flourish are good for Ks. Water and sunlight are good for oak trees, for example. And for a K to flourish is for it to do well at living the kind of life for which it is suited. It is good for a cheetah to be able to run fast. It is good for an oak tree to produce abundant acorns. These ideas have been used and extended by several philosophers, including Philippa Foot (2001) and Judith Thomson (2008) in developing theories of normativity.
Perhaps the most straightforward of these theories is Foot’s proposal that the virtues of human beings are the general psychological properties needed by humans to thrive in living the kind of life that we do. Just as it is good for a wolf to be able to fit into the pack, it is good for a human to be sociable – to be charitable, honest, trustworthy, and so on. For Foot, the virtues are grounded in the distinctive kind of life human beings have, which is not to say they are grounded in our species membership. Any agent that lived this kind of life would have the same virtues, regardless of the agent’s species. So, for Foot, human goodness is merely analogous to the good for the wolf and the cheetah. For Paul Bloomfield, however, there is more than merely an analogy. He develops a theory that is similar to Foot’s, but one that rests on the nature of our species and on what members of the species need in order to achieve their natural function (2001, 2014, forthcoming).
Views of this kind are examples of mind-independent normative realism and of reductive normative naturalism. They can be seen as neo-Aristotelian, and they have been developed chiefly, although not exclusively, in tandem with virtue theories. For discussion, see Fitzpatrick 2014 as well as entries on morality and evolutionary biology and virtue ethics.
There are things to worry about in theories of this kind. If a person is thriving even though she does not have the psychological properties that are generally needed in order to thrive, one might think she need have no reason to change. If a person is not living in typical conditions for a human, it is not clear that it would be good for her to have the psychological properties that are generally needed in order to thrive. This might actually be bad for her.
4.8 Explaining Normativity via Practices well-suited to address problems of normative governance
People cannot thrive except with the help of others. We live in societies, and plausibly we need to do so in order to cope with the many problems and issues we face in meeting our needs and pursuing our values, as well as to enhance our opportunities, and to allow us to devote time and attention to developing our talents. This means we are faced with a generic problem, the “problem of sociality”, which arises because there are sources of conflict and disagreement that can interfere with our ability to live successfully in societies. Societies do better at coping with this generic problem when their members share a moral code that calls for them to cooperate with one another, to avoid force and fraud, and, generally, and with qualifications, not to interfere with one another.
To the extent that we are autonomous, in a familiar sense of that term, we pursue what we need, and we aim to realize our values. Yet each of us has a tendency to fail to be resolute in this pursuit, to succumb to temptation by immediate pleasures, to fail to give enough weight to future goods or to present risks. This is a generic problem, the “problem of autonomy”, and we do better at coping with it if we subscribe to a standard or a norm requiring us, roughly, to efficiently pursue what we need and value. If our psychology and our strivings are well regulated by such a norm, we are “rational”, and we enhance our autonomy.
In both of these cases, and others, there is a generic problem that we do better at coping with if we (or enough of us) subscribe to norms or standards with a content well-suited to addressing the problem. Pluralist teleology begins with this idea and uses it, first, to develop an account of the truth conditions of normative propositions of morality (Copp 2007, 2009), prudential rationality (Copp 2007: chap 10), and epistemology (Copp 2014), and second, to develop an account of normativity (Copp 2015). This account says, roughly, that normative facts of a given kind are grounded in the content of the system of standards that would best address the corresponding problem of normative governance. This view is another example of mind-independent normative realism and of reductive normative naturalism.
There are things to worry about. One might worry that this approach seems unable to make sense of the idea that, when morality and prudential rationality come into conflict, there might be something that one ought to do “all-things-considered” (Copp 2020c). One might also worry that normativity is smuggled into the rankings of norms on the basis of how well-suited they are to enabling us to cope with a problem of normative governance. If so, the account might not be a successful constitutive explanation of normativity. One might also worry that the view implies that it is a contingent matter whether certain unsettling moral claims are true (Copp 2020b).
Each of these eight strategies for explaining normativity has of course been contested. In cases in which the explanans uses normative concepts, there is the objection that the account doesn’t explain normativity as such, but only reduces normativity to one variety of normative consideration. In cases where the explanans does not use normative concepts, there is the potential to provide an analysis of what normativity consists in. However, of course, every putative analysis invites objections. And, in every case where the putative analysis is substantive and philosophically interesting, it can be denied with some plausibility.
A familiar challenge is the “so what” challenge. So what if this act is required by the system of norms best suited to address the problem of sociality, what is that to me? So what if sustaining my practical identity requires this act; what is that to me if doing this act would involve a great sacrifice? So what if my agency in a special privileged sense depends on my performing this act; why should I care about being an agent in this sense?
It is no accident that this all-purpose objection bears a family resemblance to Moore’s open question argument. And the best responses to it are similar to familiar responses to Moore. A substantive analysis of a philosophically interesting concept would not be informative if it were obviously correct. And nothing guarantees that the best analysis of a philosophically interesting concept will be obviously correct. Further, a metaphysical analysis of what the normativity of a worldly property or state of affairs could consist in is not likely to be a priori. The more informative and interesting a putative analysis is, the less likely it is that it will seem obviously correct, so the more it will seem open to objection. (See entries on analysis and moral non-naturalism, section on the open question argument).
5. Is Normativity Mind-Dependent?
Many of the views just canvassed share a common theme: normativity is explained in terms of the mental states, events, or attitudes of individuals or collections of individuals. (We’ll call these “mental states” for short.) Many other views – including some of those just canvassed – think that there is some important sense in which the normative facts are independent of mental states. This debate can be (and often has been) traced back all the way to the Euthyphro, where Socrates considers whether what is pious is determined by what the gods love, or whether it’s the other way around (see Berker 2018; Wright 1992). This debate has come to be known as the debate over the mind-dependence of normativity. Normative realists have generally been taken to be committed to mind-independence (see, e.g., Shafer-Landau 2003; McGrath 2010; Enoch 2011), although we have attempted to remain neutral on this point by distinguishing “mind-independent realism” from “basic realism”, which is compatible with mind-dependence (see Cuneo 2007).
In this section, we’ll cover arguments for and against the mind-dependence of the normative. But before we get there, we need to answer a framing question: what precisely are we talking about when we talk about the mind-dependence of the normative? Above we framed this as the question of whether normativity is explained in terms of mental states. But as we’ll see below, that formulation is not entirely clear.
5.1 What is Mind-Dependence?
First, what is the important scope of mind-dependence? Is the important question whether some normative facts are mind-dependent, or whether all such facts are? We think it is the latter. Mark Schroeder claims, with regard to reasons in particular, that it is uncontroversial that some reasons are explained by mental states – Ronnie has a reason to go to the dance because he loves to dance, but Bradley has a reason to avoid the dance because he hates dancing. What would be controversial is the idea that all reasons are explained by mental states; this is actually entailed by Schroeder’s “Humean” view of reasons (Schroeder 2007). We agree that the interesting question is whether all normative facts are mind-dependent, or whether, instead, some are mind-independent.
We also note, however, that there could be important questions about the mind-independence of distinct normative subdomains. For example, there are the questions whether all moral facts are mind-dependent, whether all aesthetic facts are mind-independent, etc.
Second, it would be good to get a clearer idea of what kind of dependence is involved in mind-dependence. In brief, we are going to try to be as ecumenical as possible, not tying mind-dependence to any narrowly defined or parochial metaphysical relation. Rather, mind-dependence concerns broad metaphysical dependence on the mental. This is for two reasons: first, this just seems to us to be what important debate in the vicinity is about. It’s not as if mind-dependence concerns metaphysical constitution by the mental, rather than reduction. Certainly advocates of the view that wrongness is constituted by disapproval disagree on some points with those who think that wrongness reduces to disapproval. But in general they seem to agree on an important point: that the there is some kind of robust metaphysical dependence of wrongness on some mental state. It is our sense that this agreed-upon claim is what is at stake in debates about mind-dependence.
The second reason to define mind-dependence ecumenically is that this is the best way of making sense of the extant literature. Sharon Street’s body of work is an example. She describes her position as committing her to mind-dependence (Street 2016: 298n). But she describes it differently in different places: she writes (2012) that normative truth consists in what follows from within the practical point of view; or (2008) that normative facts are constituted by facts about the agent’s judgments; she (2016) characterizes mind-dependence views at those on which “things [are] valuable ultimately because we value them” (emphasis added). So we should understand the defining relation of mind-dependence so that it encompasses all of these relations. Below, we will call this generic relation “grounding”, for simplicity. This term is imperfect – grounding has become intensely theorized and disputed – but we use it as a stand-in for a broad kind of metaphysical dependence.
Finally, we think that the relevant notion of mind-dependence rules out there being mind-independent normative constraints on the kinds of mental states that can ground normative facts. A few examples will explain what we mean. Take the view that what we have reason to do is grounded in what an ideally rational agent in our situation would want to do, where rationality is an irreducibly normative property. Or take the view that value is grounded in being the appropriate object of an attitude such as admiration, where appropriateness is irreducibly normative. Both views ground some significant set of normative facts in mental facts, but they also entail that other normative facts (facts about rationality and appropriateness, respectively) are not grounded in mental states. Such views do not, on our reckoning, count as mind-dependent, for two reasons. First, we have established that the important question about mind-dependence is whether all normative facts are mind-dependent, and these views are views on which some aren’t. Second, and most important, the relevant normative facts are partly grounded in other normative facts that are themselves not grounded in mental facts: facts about rationality or appropriateness are in the grounds, where these facts explicitly do not “ground out” in mental facts.
This leaves us, so far, with the claim that mind-dependence views are those that fully ground all normative facts (or some significant subset thereof) in mental facts. Yet as we’ll see, even this formulation leaves some problems.
Many have worried that the debate over mind-dependence is not a significant one. Gideon Rosen (1994) argued that the notion of mind-independence does not track our intuitive notion of objectivity. His arguments often take the form: X-facts are a paradigm example of mind-dependent facts, but they depend on Y-facts, and Y-facts seem perfectly real and objective even though they are obviously mind dependent. Facts about humor, for example, may depend on what humans find funny – but facts about what humans find funny are perfectly objective! Other of his arguments take the form: X-facts are clearly objective, but they depend on mental facts, and so are mind-dependent. Facts about fox terriers, for example depend causally on the intentions of those who bred them – but surely facts about fox terriers are objective!
Russ Shafer-Landau points to a different kind of problem: mundane first-order normative truths depend on mental facts. Thus, if particular normative facts are mind-dependent just when they depend on mental facts, and if we don’t distinguish kinds of dependence, it looks like many mundane first-order claims commit one to the mind-dependence of the relevant particular normative fact:
We obviously can’t enter a moral assessment of an agent’s motivations and intentions without recourse to what is going on in her mind. And the moral status of an action may depend very importantly on how pleased or miserable it makes others, whether it prompts feelings of anger or empathy, whether one who is harmed has given his consent to the treatment, etc. (2003: 15)
This problem has been discussed by, for example, Enoch (2011: 2–3), Rosati (2018), and Morton (forthcoming). The problem is that mind-dependence is not something that should be an entailment of mundane first-order moral claims that, presumably, would be accepted by theorists on both sides of the debate about mind-dependence.
As it stands, this problem can be solved by appeal to our earlier clarification: the claim worth arguing about is whether all normative facts (or at least all moral facts) are mind-dependent. As long as there are some moral facts that don’t depend on mental facts, Shafer-Landau’s point shouldn’t worry us.
There is, however, a related, although perhaps more subtle point, that arises for certain ethical theories. Utilitarianism, for example, entails that all particular moral facts depend on mental facts about happiness and unhappiness. This means that – assuming a normative fact is mind-dependent just when it depends on mental facts – utilitarianism is by definition a theory on which all particular moral facts are mind-dependent. (The theory does not imply that the fact that it itself is true is mind-dependent.) But surely it would be a mistake to think that utilitarianism implies that all particular moral facts are mind-dependent in the sense at issue in meta-ethical debate about realism! And utilitarianism is not unique. Many other moral theories hold that that which makes right actions right (and good actions good, etc.) is purely mental. Consider a view on which all moral evaluations depend on the intentions of the actor, for example. So we need a solution to this puzzle – an account of the nature of mind-dependence (in the sense relevant to the meta-ethical debate) that doesn’t commit such theories one way or the other on whether particular moral facts are mind-dependent (in that sense).
This is a puzzle about the very notion of mind-dependence. One solution would be Shafer-Landau’s (2003: 15): he suggests that mind-dependence is ultimately a matter of how “the moral standards that fix the moral facts” are “made true”. We could parlay this into a general account of the mind-dependence of normative facts in the following way: a particular normative fact is mind-dependent when the normative principle that governs its grounding in the non-normative is mind-dependent. And a principle is mind-dependent when it is grounded in mental facts. This solution allows mundane first-order claims to make no commitment on the issue of mind-dependence. The important question regarding the mind-dependence of a particular normative fact will be what explains or grounds the connection between, for example, causing unhappiness and being wrong. For example, is the principle of utility only true because I believe it or because of some other mental fact? If so, the principle is mind-dependent, and this mind-dependence is inherited by the fact that my act is wrong.
Another way to solve the problem would be to be pluralists about the kinds of mind-dependence that could be relevant. Fine (2012) suggested, in a broader context, that metaphysical grounding is fundamentally distinct from normative grounding. So perhaps when utilitarianism says the moral depends on the mental, it means that it normatively depends on the mental, while the meta-ethical debate about mind-dependence (about the moral) concerns the claim that the moral metaphysically depends on the mental. This is a suggestion that has not been fully explored yet (though it is discussed in Berker (2018), Enoch (2019) and Morton (forthcoming)).
Either proposal would solve the problem with utilitarianism. If mind-dependence (in the sense relevant to the meta-ethical debate about realism) is a matter of whether normative principles are grounded in mental facts, then utilitarians are free (as far as their utilitarianism goes) to endorse either the mind-dependence or the mind-independence of the moral. Utilitarianism just says that the particular moral facts are grounded in mental facts, but does not commit one way or the other on the grounding of the Principle of Utility. Similarly, if mind-dependence is a matter of metaphysical (as opposed to normative) grounding of particular facts in the mental, then utilitarianism can (and should) be read as the claim that moral facts are normatively grounded in happiness facts. Utilitarianism is silent on the further claim that moral facts are metaphysically grounded in happiness facts (or any mental facts whatsoever), which leaves it open to the utilitarian to either affirm or deny the mind-dependence of moral facts – i.e., to either affirm or deny mind-independent moral realism.
The puzzles around mind-dependence remain not fully explored, and it seems to us that more work is needed here. Nevertheless, we will press on now to consider arguments for and against the mind-dependence of the normative (or in some cases, the moral in particular). For simplicity, however, we will continue to talk about mind-dependence as concerning whether normative facts are grounded in mental facts. We will not attempt to cash this out in terms of either or both of the above more nuanced accounts.
5.2 Arguments for Mind-Dependence
We will cover four main arguments for the mind-dependence of (some significant subdomain of) the normative. The first is an epistemological argument. The general form of that argument is as follows:
- If normative facts were mind-independent, then we would not have substantive normative knowledge.
- But we do have substantive normative knowledge.
- Therefore, normative facts are mind-dependent.
The “substantive” qualifier is here because, even according to those who embrace premise (1), we could have knowledge of “non-substantive” claims such as “Either Bob’s act was wrong or it wasn’t”. Defining substantiveness more precisely is hard, but we could focus on the important case of (knowledge of) atomic normative truths.
Premise (2) of the argument is taken as given by those who advance this argument, but of course some would deny it. Premise (1) might seem strange, since we have substantive knowledge of many kinds of facts that surely are mind-independent, such as facts about the stars. But (1) is intended as a claim specifically about knowledge of normative facts. The claim is that there is something about the normative such that we could not have knowledge of facts of this kind if they were mind-independent. The claim has been supported in a variety of ways. Some have followed Benacerraf and Field’s formulation of a problem for mathematical Platonism (Benacerraf 1973 and Field 1989). Enoch (2011: ch. 7) and Setiya (2012: ch. 2) both take this to be a main epistemological worry for realism. The argument is roughly that if normative facts were mind-independent, there would be no explanation of the reliability of our substantive normative beliefs – which would undermine our substantive normative knowledge. Some think that there could be no such explanation because normative facts do not (and cannot) cause anything. It is controversial, however, whether normative facts ever have causal impact on anything. (See sec 3.2 of entry on moral skepticism and the extensive literature on moral explanations, including Harman 1977 and Sturgeon 1985.)
Of far more popularity recently are evolutionary debunking arguments (or “EDAs”), which aim to establish (1) by way of genealogical arguments. (However, see White (2010) for discussion of non-evolutionary genealogical arguments.) The basic form of an EDA is as follows:
- If normative facts were mind-independent and evolution had influenced our normative faculties in such-and-such a way, then we would not have substantive normative knowledge.
- Evolution has influenced our normative faculties in such-and-such a way.
- Therefore, if normative facts were mind-independent, then we would not have substantive normative knowledge.
Sharon Street (2006), Richard Joyce (2006: ch. 6), and Allan Gibbard (2003: ch. 13) all present early versions of this argument, though it has spawned an extensive literature. The argument is typically aimed at moral realism, but it is clear that mind-independence is the tenet of realism that is supposed to be causing the problem. (This is explicit in various places, e.g., Street 2006: 110). However, it could certainly be argued that it is not mind-independence in general that causes the problem, but non-naturalistic views in particular (see the debate between Street 2008 and Copp 2008). We’ll put that debate aside for now and present the argument according to most of its proponents’ view of it – that it targets mind-independence in general.
Different kinds of support have been offered for the first premise of the EDA – it could be that mind-independence and evolutionary influence would mean it would be a huge coincidence if our normative beliefs were true, and that fact undermines our normative knowledge. (Street 2006; see also Bedke 2014, though Bedke’s objection is against non-naturalism in particular). Or perhaps evolution would mean that beliefs about mind-independent normative facts would be insensitive: we would have those beliefs regardless of whether they were true. Shafer-Landau (2012) presents a good overview of different arguments here.
A third argument for mind-dependence relies on claims about the nature of reasons. Bernard Williams (1979) famously argued that in order to have a normative reason to act, I must have some motive that will be furthered by my so acting. This has been called “reasons internalism”. Humean theories of reasons claim that in order to have a reason to act, I must have some desire that is furthered by so acting. Such claims are mere necessitation claims, but could be leveraged as an argument for mind-dependence. For, one might claim, the fact that having a relevant desire is a necessary condition of having a reason could be easily explained on the basis that reasons – or the relevant domain of normative facts – are grounded in or explained by the relevant motives or desires, as in Schroeder (2007). (Of course, this superficial reading would have to be more nuanced based on our reading of the nature of the mind-dependence debate.) Mind-independence theories of reasons, it could be argued, have a harder time explaining reasons internalism, or Humean theories of reasons.
Finally, some have argued against the mind-independence of the moral by appeal to fundamental moral disagreements. These are moral disagreements that would survive some set of idealizing conditions like full non-normative information and full rationality. Mackie (1977) himself thought that moral disagreement undermined the “objectivity” of morality – which, for our purposes, can be equated with mind-independence – but because Mackie thought moral talk was committed to objectivity, he concluded that there are no moral facts. Michael Smith (1994: 6) argues that if moral facts are objective, then moral opinions should converge under ideal conditions: thus fundamental moral disagreement would undermine objectivity.
Mind-independence theorists could accept this and argue that fundamental moral disagreement is not actual or possible (depending on whether the objection is about actual or merely possible fundamental disagreement). Alternatively, mind-independence theorists could deny that fundamental moral disagreement undermines mind-independence (Shafer-Landau 2003: ch 9; McGrath 2010). They could point out that there is fundamental disagreement in other domains, such as physics or history, yet we do not take this to undermine objectivity-claims in those domains. But some, such as Richard Rowland (2017), argue that moral disagreement is relevantly different from disagreement in other domains.
5.3 Arguments for Mind-Independence
We will consider two main arguments for the mind-independence of the normative. First is a recent argument by David Enoch for the mind-independence of morality (2011: ch. 2). Enoch argues that when we are in certain kinds of interpersonal conflict with someone else, to the extent that that conflict is due to preferences, or attitudes, or desires (etc.), we should not stand our ground but should stand back from our own position and seek some sort of impartial, egalitarian solution to the conflict. For example, if two friends want to do something fun, and one wants to go to the movies while the other wants to play video games, neither should insist on their position over the other’s without budging. (Maybe they should flip a coin.) Enoch calls this constraint “Impartiality”.
Yet, Enoch argues, this entails that on many mind-dependence theories, we should find a way of compromising in the same way, when we have a moral disagreement. This is easiest to see on the view that our moral judgments simply report mental states, which Enoch calls “Caricatured Subjectivism”. On Caricatured Subjectivism, our moral disagreements just are disagreements about mental states, and so should be governed by Impartiality. Enoch argues that the same result follows on any theory that grounds moral truth in mental states: on such views, we ought to find some way of compromising when we have a moral disagreement.
This, Enoch argues, is a morally odious entailment: in many moral disagreements, it is not only permissible but required that we stand our ground. Imagine – to use Enoch’s case – disagreeing with someone about whether a dog’s pain counts, morally speaking. And imagine you then have to decide on a particular case, for example, on whether to cause a dog serious pain, about which you also disagree. Should you split the difference and cause just a small amount of pain, or flip a coin, or pursue some other compromise? No, Enoch argues: you should stand your ground. In this way, moral disagreements are analogous to (non-moral) factual disagreements and unlike conflicts of conative attitudes.
Enoch’s argument has its limitations, as he admits. His argument assumes that, on a given mind-dependence view, when two agents disagree morally, their disagreement reduces to or is relevantly analogous to a disagreement of conative attitudes. But if you have a view on which all moral agents necessarily share certain attitudes, thus entailing that certain moral truths are necessary, then all or at least many moral disagreements will not be relevantly analogous to a disagreement of conative attitudes. Hence mind-dependence views of these kinds avoid Enoch’s objection since his argument does not show that disagreements, as understood by such theories, are governed by Impartiality. (Similarly, cultural relativism, “no priority” views, and any view which gives an irreducibly normative constraint on which mental states can ground moral facts, also avoid Enoch’s objection, according to Enoch.)
Enoch’s argument also has the limitation that it only applies to morality, rather than mind-dependence views of normativity in general. This limitation appears on the face of the argument, since it relies on the premise that it is morally objectionable not to stand our ground in some moral disagreements. It does not seem equally objectionable in any sense to compromise in cases of epistemic, or aesthetic, or prudential disagreements (though maybe the case could be made in some or all of these domains).
A second argument, or class of arguments, depends on what Sharon Street (2009) calls ideally coherent eccentrics (ICEs): characters who have some intuitively bad motive (or desire, or belief, etc.) that survives some idealization process. What process is relevant will depend on the particular mind-dependence view under consideration, but the idea is that some ICEs will survive any plausible idealization process. Generally, we can say that they have some objectionable mental state that coheres both with their other relevant mental states, and with the non-normative facts. The outcome, in abstract terms, is that for any given view of normativity V on which normative fact N for agent A is fully grounded in mental fact M, there is some ICE for whom M obtains, and thus N obtains for that ICE on V, but it is intuitively clear that N does not obtain for that ICE. So we should reject V.
The strategy can be illustrated by a concrete example. Allan Gibbard talks about the infamously cruel Roman emperor Caligula, and imagines that he wants to torture for fun while harboring no conflicting attitudes (1990: 145). The argument is, then, that Caligula plainly would be wrong to torture just for fun despite the fact that his desire to torture for fun is coherent with his other attitudes and resistant to change under any idealization process. So the wrongness of his torturing for fun is not grounded in his actual attitudes nor is it grounded in the attitudes of his that would survive some idealization process.
The argument from ICEs has some shortcomings. First, it seems only to strike against theories according to which specific moral facts concerning specific agents are grounded in the attitudes or idealized attitudes of those agents. Second, recall that, for reasons we explained before, we take the debate about mind-dependence to concern whether normative principles are fully metaphysically grounded in mental facts. The example of Caligula, and similar examples found in Parfit (2011: ch 2, sec 11), Williams (1989 [1995: 39]) and Hume (1739–40: Book 2, Part 3), are not on point, for they all concern an agent with a specific mental profile and a specific moral claim involving that agent. The interesting question is whether we can use the basic idea of ICEs to develop analogous objections to views that fully ground normative principles in mental facts.
Mind-dependence theories differ from one another in various ways. Yet the ICE strategy can perhaps be modified in ways that would allow it to strike against a wider variety of mind-dependence theories, and perhaps against all such theories. For example, ICE strategy is on its face not aimed at views like cultural relativism, which would nevertheless still count as a mind-dependence view on our definition. But we can easily conceive of ICE-analogues at the cultural level: assume the relevant relativistic view is that moral facts for A are grounded what A’s culture believes. We can imagine A’s culture believing, without internal inconsistency, that genocide is morally commendable – but it clearly is not. Again, the ideally coherent Caligula wants to torture for fun and has no conflicting desires. This will entail that he has a decisive reason to torture for fun on the view that decisive reasons are grounded in desires (at least when those desires don’t conflict with any others). Or take the view that believing one has a reason to X engenders a reason for one to X. We can then imagine that Caligula believes he has a reason to torture for fun. Combining this particular mind-dependence view with the modified Caligula example entails that Caligula has a reason to torture for fun. Nothing seems to suggest that any particular mind-dependence view is going to escape criticism. And, mind-independence proponents will argue, the only way we can account for the facts that Caligula is wrong to torture for fun and lacks a decisive reason to torture for fun is by allowing that some normative facts are fully mind-independent.
It is open to any given mind-dependence theory to argue that it does not have the morally objectionable entailment suggested in the ICE argument. Perhaps the theory could argue that it’s impossible for the relevant mental state not to be in conflict with other relevant mental states, or the non-normative facts – maybe, that is, it is impossible for the ideally coherent eccentric in question to exist. On the other hand, mind-dependence theorists could argue, as Sharon Street (2009) does, that the ICE could exist, and that the relevant normative entailments do obtain – but that they are not problematic. That is, for instance, perhaps the ideal Caligula really does have a reason to torture for fun
Mind-dependence theorists could try to take the edge off these entailments. Taking the case of reasons as an example, they could argue, as Williams (1989 [1995: 39]) suggested, that even though, on Williams’s theory, a cruel husband might have no reason to be nicer to his wife, we can still say that he is “ungrateful, inconsiderate, hard, sexist, nasty, selfish, brutal, and many other disadvantageous things”. Of course, this strategy depends on each of those properties not entailing that someone with that property has a reason to try to avoid it. This is tenuous at best: it seems doubtful at the very least to say that we have no reason to avoid being ungrateful or sexist, etc.
The mind-dependence theorist can also consistently say that, even if the ICE lacks the reasons in question, we can nevertheless force him into therapy, or help his wife leave him, or try to have him arrested (Manne 2014). These actions don’t require that the cruel husband have any reasons whatsoever, but depend only on what the sympathetic onlooker or the wife has reason to do. But some will still find this unsatisfying: the husband shouldn’t be acting the way he is. And, of course, here the mind-independence theorist is happy to advertise the benefit she can offer: the husband has a reason to treat his wife better no matter what’s going on in his head (or his heart).
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