Paul of Venice

First published Wed Aug 22, 2001; substantive revision Tue Apr 30, 2024

Paul of Venice was the most important Italian thinker of his times, and one of the most prominent and interesting logicians of the Middle Ages. His philosophical theories (culminating in a metaphysics of essences which states the ontological and epistemological primacy of universals over any other kind of beings) are the final and highest result of the preceding realistic tradition of thought. He fully developed the new form of realism started up by Wyclif and his Oxonian followers in the last decades of the 14th century, and renewed Burley’s attacks against nominalistic views. The metaphysical convictions at the basis of his philosophy are an original version of the most fundamental theses of Duns Scotus (viz. univocity of being; existence of universal forms outside the mind, which are at the same time identical with and different from their own individuals; real identity and formal distinction between essence and being; thisness as the principle of individuation; real distinction among the ten categories). But Paul puts much more stress on the ontological presuppositions and entailments of the doctrine. Simultaneously, he was open to influences from many other directions, as he held in due consideration also the positions of authors such as Albert the Great, Thomas Aquinas, and Giles of Rome, and critically discussed the doctrines of the main Nominalists of the 14th century, namely William Ockham, John Buridan, and Marsilius of Inghen, sometimes playing mutually incompatible theses against each other. This contributes to making his works stimulating and enriching from an historical point of view, but also makes it difficult to grasp his own ideas in their relationships and unity. These reflections help us to explain why for about one hundred and fifty years Paul was erroneously, but unanimously, believed to be an Ockhamist in logic and metaphysics and an Averroist in psychology and epistemology.

1. Life and Works

Paul of Venice (Paulus Nicolettus Venetus, Paolo Nicoletti Veneto), O.E.S.A. was born in Udine, Italy, around 1369. He joined the Augustinian order near the age of fourteen, when he entered the convent of Santo Stefano in Venice. He studied first at Padua, but in 1390 he was assigned to Oxford, where he spent three years. He became Doctor of Arts and Theology by 1405. He taught in Padua, Siena (1420–24), and Perugia (1424–28), and lectured in Bologna (1424). At various times he held positions of leadership in his order (Pope Gregory XII designated him Prior General of the Augustinians in May 1409) and served as ambassador of the Venetian Republic. He died in Padua on 15 June 1429, while commenting the De anima (On the Soul) of Aristotle.

Paul wrote many philosophical and theological treatises (the complete list of his writings and a guide to extant manuscripts are in Perreiah 1986; for the dating of his main philosophical works see Conti 1996, pp. 9–20), including: Logica parva (The Small Logic), ca. 1393–95; Logica magna (The Great Logic—LM), ca. 1396–99; Sophismata aurea (Golden Sophisms), ca. 1399; a commentary on Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics (In Post.), C.E. 1406; Summa philosophiae naturalis (Summa of Natural PhilosophySN), C.E. 1408; a commentary on Aristotle’s Physics (In Phys.), C.E. 1409; a commentary on Aristotle’s On the Soul (In De anima), ca. 1415–20; Quaestio de universalibus (On UniversalsQdU), ca. 1420–24; a commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics (In Metaph.), ca. 1420–24; a commentary on the Ars Vetus, that is, on Porphyry’s Isagoge, Aristotle’s Categories, and the Liber sex principiorum (Expositio super Universalia Porphyrii et Artem Veterem AristotelisIn Porph., In Cat., and In Sex pr. respectively), C.E. 1428.

2. Logic

The main contributions of Paul of Venice to the history of logic in the Middle Ages concern the notion of formal distinction and the analysis of predication.

2.1 Identities and Distinctions

Paul’s formulation of the theory of identity and distinction is a further development of Duns Scotus’ and Wyclif’s doctrines on the subject. The Italian master recognizes two main types of identity: material (secundum materiam) and formal (secundum formam). There is material identity when the material cause is the same, either in number (it is a case of the same thing called in different ways) or by species (it is a case of two objects made of the same kind of stuff). There is formal identity when the formal cause is the same. This happens in two ways: if the form at issue is the singular form of the individual composite, then there is a unique object known in different ways; if the form at issue is the common essence instantiated by the singular form, then there are two distinct objects belonging to the same species or genus (In Metaph., book V, tr. 2, chap. 3, fol. 185ra). Correspondingly, the main types of distinction (or difference) are also two: material and formal. There is material distinction when the material cause is different, so that the objects at issue are separable entities. In general, there is formal distinction when the formal cause is different. This happens in two ways: if the material cause is also different, then it is a particular case of material distinction. If the material cause is the same, then a further analysis is necessary. If the material cause is the same by species only, then it is an improper case of formal distinction; but if the material cause is the same in number, then there is properly formal distinction, since the forms at issue have different definite descriptions but share the same substrate of existence, so that they are one and the same thing in reality. For example, there is a proper formal distinction in the case of the two properties of being-capable-of-laughing (risibile) and of being-capable-of-learning (disciplinabile), which are connected forms instantiated by the same set of individual substances (In Metaph., book V, tr. 2, chap. 3, fol. 185rb).

Material distinction is a necessary and sufficient criterion for real difference, traditionally conceived, whereas there is formal distinction if and only if there is one substance in number (i.e. material identity in the strict sense) and a multiplicity of formal principles with different descriptions instantiated by it. Paul therefore inverts the terms of the question in relation to what earlier approaches had done. By means of the formal distinction Duns Scotus and John Wyclif had tried to explain how it is possible to distinguish many different real aspects internal to the same individual substance (the passage is from one to many). On the contrary, Paul is attempting to reduce multiplicity to unity (the passage is from many to one). What Paul wants to account for is the way in which many different entities of a certain kind (i.e. of an incomplete and dependent mode of existence) can constitute one and the same substance in number.

2.2 Predication

The starting point of Paul’s theory of predication is his doctrine of universals. Just like Wyclif and his followers (Alyngton, Penbygull, Sharpe, Milverley, Whelpdale, Tarteys), the Augustinian master claims that

  1. There are real universals, which are common essences naturally apt to be present in and predicated of many similar individuals.
  2. Real universals and their individuals are really the same and only formally distinct.
  3. Predication is first of all a real relation between metaphysical entities (QdU, fols. 124ra, 124vb, 127va, 132va).

But his analysis of predication is different from those of both Wyclif and his followers. In fact, Paul divides predication into identical predication and formal predication and defines them in a different way than his sources do.

To speak of identical predication it is sufficient that the form signified by the subject-term of a (true) proposition and the form signified by the predicate-term share at least one of their substrates of existence. This is the case for propositions like ‘Man is (an) animal’ and ‘The universal-man is something white’ (‘Homo in communi est album’). One speaks of formal predication in two cases:

  1. When for the truth of the proposition it is necessary that the form signified by the predicate-term is present in all the substrates of existence of the form signified by the subject-term, in virtue of a formal principle (made clear in the proposition itself) that is in turn directly present in all the substrates of existence of the form signified by the subject-term. This is the case for propositions like ‘Man is formally (an) animal’ and ‘Socrates qua man is an animal’.
  2. Or else when the predicate of the proposition is a term of second intention, like ‘species’ or ‘genus’. This is the case for propositions like ‘Man is a species’ and ‘Animal is a genus’ (SN, part VI, chap. 2, fol. 93vab; QdU, fols. 124vb–125rb).

As is evident, identical predication is extensionally defined, whereas formal predication is intensionally defined, since formal predication entails a relation modally determined between the subject-thing and the predicate-thing. In fact, formal predication presupposes that there is a necessary connection between the subject-thing and the predicate-thing of the given proposition. For this reason, Paul denies that sentences like ‘(What is) singular is (what is) universal’ (‘Singulare est universale’), which Wyclif and his followers acknowledged as true, are in fact true propositions. For Wyclif and his followers, the sentence at issue is an example of predication by essence. But for Paul of Venice, it is an example of formal predication; no individual qua individual is a universal, or vice versa, as no second intention intensionally considered is any other second intention (QdU, fol. 133va; In Porph., prooem., fol. 3ra–b). As a consequence, Paul rewrites the preceding sentence in this form: ‘(What is) singular is this universal’ (‘Singulare est hoc universale’), where the presence of the demonstrative ‘this’ changes the kind of predication from formal to identical. So corrected, the sentence is true, since it signifies that a certain entity, in itself singular, is the substrate of existence of a universal essence (QdU, fol. 133va–b).

As a result, Paul builds up a mixed system, where the copula of the standard philosophical sentences he deals with can have a threefold value: it means a partial identity between the subject-thing and the predicate-thing in the case of identical predication; it means a necessary link between forms in the case of the first type of formal predication; it means that the subject-thing in virtue of itself is necessarily a member of a given class of objects, which the predicate-term of the proposition labels and refers to, in the case of the second type of formal predication—that is, when the predicate is a term of second intention.

3. Semantics: The Meaning and Truth of Propositions

Paul of Venice deals with the problem of the meaning and truth of sentences in his Logica Magna and in his commentaries on the Metaphysics and on the Categories. His theory is substantially the same in all these works, but in the two commentaries he stresses the ontological implications of his semantic choices slightly more, and modifies his solution of the question of the meaning of a true negative sentence. Paul’s purpose is twofold. He intends (1) to determine the ontological status and nature of the complexe significabile more precisely; and (2) to develop a general theory of the proposition which would be logically more rigorous and less compromised by a metaphysics of the possible than that supported by Gregory of Rimini, his main source on that subject. For this reason Paul deals with the question of the truth and falsity of a proposition before examining the problem of its meaning, and solves the latter on the basis of the answer to the former, thus inverting the order followed by Gregory.

As a sign of special respect, Gregory of Rimini is the only author cited by name in the two treatises of Paul’s Logica Magna devoted to the questions of the meaning and truth of a sentence. Paul’s critique is nevertheless all-embracing. He lists thirteen arguments against Gregory’s theses: six are philosophical and seven theological (LM, II, tr. 11, pp. 96–104). We can focus on the most important ones, as they help us to better understand Paul’s final choices on the matter.

The main philosophical arguments concern Gregory’s theory of the levels of being. As is well known, the aim of Gregory’s theory of complexe significabile seems to be to identify and describe an objective and independent molecular entity existing in re, which can be the significatum or the referent of a sentence, and therefore guarantees the success of our effort to understand the world. According to Gregory, this entity is the complexe significabile, that is something (1) complex but one in number, which cannot be identified with the things that the subject and/or the predicate of the sentence signify; (2) real but distinct from the extramental categorial items as well as from their corresponding mental signs; and (3) the proper and adequate object of a possible act of signification (see the prologue of his commentary on the first book of Sentences, q. 1, a. 1, pp. 3–4). It is precisely in order to provide the complexe significabile with a suitable ontological status, and every sentence with a significatum that Gregory elaborates a theory of the levels of being. According to it, the world is constituted by (1) the categorial items (or atomic objects) which are the ground of existence of every other being; (2) the states of affairs connected to them; and (3) the possible states of affairs that the atomic objects could cause if they were combined in a different way from the actual one. In fact, Gregory claims that the terms ‘something’ (‘aliquid’), ‘thing’ (‘res’), and ‘being’ (‘ens’) are synonyms, and that they have a threefold meaning. They can be taken (1) for anything signifiable in any way (that is, by a simple or a complex expression, truly or falsely)—this would be the sense in which Aristotle in the chapter de priori of his Categories says that it is necessary that an expression is called true or false when a thing is or is not. (2) For anything signifiable by a simple or a complex expression, but truly. And (3) for an existing essence or entity (ibidem, pp. 8–9). This distinction implies that (1) the complexe significabilia are not real in the same sense as the entia praedicamentalia are; (2) the complexe significabilia designated by false sentences have a feebler reality than those designated by true sentences, but they are nevertheless real and constitutive elements of the world; and (3) the reality of complexe significabilia (both true and false) is different from that of the categorial items on which this reality is grounded.

Paul denies (1) that states of affairs, both actual and possible, are constitutive parts of the world really distinct from the categorial items, and (2) that whatever is signifiable by a complex expression is a thing. In fact, according to Paul, the term ‘something’, taken in the first or second sense enumerated by Gregory, is a transcendental term, and as a consequence it immediately signifies all possible substances and accidents in just the same way. Therefore, if being a man (hominem esse) were something, in the first or second sense of the term ‘something’, then being a man would be a substance or an accident, and so something in the third sense of the term—that is, an atomic object (or categorial item). If the supporters of Gregory’s opinion were to claim that ‘something’ is not a transcendental term—remarks Paul—, it would follow that ‘something’ would be either less general than a transcendental term or more general. In the first case, the logical consequence is that the term ‘something’ signifies a categorial item, and thus it still follows that if being a man is something in the first or second way, it is something in the third way. In the second case, it follows that ‘something’ is more general than ‘being’, and therefore that the following inference is invalid:

«if being a man is something, then being a man is»,

a consequence which is the opposite of what Gregory intended to hold (LM, II, tr. 11, pp. 96–98).

The second main philosophical argument against Gregory’s theory is meant to show that what is signified by a sentence (or complex expression) cannot be qualified as a thing. Paul explicitly denies that, according to Aristotle, whatever is signifiable by a complex is a thing (ibidem, p. 104).

From a theological point of view, the main inconvenience arising from Gregory’s opinion is that there would be many eternal things none of which is God—a thesis condemned at Paris in 1277. In fact—argues Paul—this complexe significabile, that God is, is a thing different from God Himself, according to Gregory, and it is from eternity (ibidem, p. 100).

In sum, Paul agrees with Gregory that what is signified by a simple expression is different from what is signified by a complex expression, and that what is signified by a complex expression is also real, but disagrees with him about the meaning of the term ‘res’. In his view, only positive beings are things, and what is signified by a complex expression is not a positive being, as it is not an item in one of the ten categorial lines. In other words, according to Paul, even though states of affairs are not really, but only formally, different from individual things, they cannot in any way be regarded as things in the world.

As a consequence, the chief feature of Paul’s theory of the complexe significabile is his claim that the adequate significate of a proposition is really identical-to and somehow (and more precisely, formally) distinct-from what is signifiable by the subject-term and/or the predicate-term alone (ibidem, p. 156). All the other theses derive from this, which is the cornerstone of his theory of the proposition.

Paul defines the propositio as a well formed (congrua) and complete (perfecta) mental sentence, which signifies the true or the false (LM, pars II, tractatus de propositione, fol. 101rb–va), and sums up his position on the problem of truth and falsity in four points:

  • if the adequate significate of a proposition is true and it is not inconsistent that the proposition, thus adequately signifying, should be true, then the proposition is true;
  • if a proposition, adequately signifying that things are in some way, is true, then its adequate significate is true;
  • if the adequate significate of a proposition is false, then the proposition is false;
  • if a proposition is false, and it is not inconsistent that its adequate significate is false, then its adequate significate is false (LM, II, tr. 10, p. 62).

The obvious consequence of these rules is that, with the sole exception of insolubilia, which are called false not because they signify the false, but because they affirm themselves to be false or not to be true, all the other kinds of proposition are true if and only if what they signify is true, and false if and only if what they signify is false (ibidem, p. 64).

In his commentary on the Categories, Paul explains that the direct and adequate objects of propositions, which make them true, are molecular things (res complexae) existing outside the soul. Such entities are complexe significabilia, the significata of propositions, that is extramental realities made up of a subject-form and a predicate-form linked together in one and the same substance or set of substances (In Cat., cap. de subiecto et praedicato, fol. 48ra). Thus, Paul’s approach to the question of the truth of a proposition is ontological, as is Gregory’s, since according to him the true is an attribute of things and only secondarily of thought, but at the same time it is consistent with the fundamental principle of every form of correspondence theory of truth, that of the isomorphism of language, thought, and the world. In fact, in his commentary on the Metaphysics Paul distinguishes three different but connected kinds of truth: truth of imitation (veritas imitationis), truth of disclosure (veritas manifestationis), and relational truth (veritas respectiva). The first type of truth is the measure of the conformity (adaequatio) which all the things have in relation to their corresponding ideas in the mind of God, from which they derive. The second type is also a real property of extramental things, which measures their various degrees of disposition to be apprehended by our intellect. Relational truth, unlike the first two veritates, is not an absolute property of things, but, just as its name suggests, a relation, and more precisely a relation of conformity which has its substrate of existence in our intellect, its fundamentum in mental sentences, and its terminus ad quem in the molecular objects existing outside the soul. Despite the fact that it is related to the activity of the intellect, the veritas respectiva is the effect caused in our intellect by the existence of the veritas manifestationis. If things were not intelligible by themselves, they could not be grasped and recognised by our intellect for what they are (In Metaph., lib. VI, cap. 4, fol. 233rb–va). So, like Gregory, Paul also supports the idea that human knowledge is true only qua knowledge of the ontological truth, and that sentences are true only in so far as they are signs of the ontological truth.

On the basis of this account, what then is the relationship that holds between atomic objects (the incomplexa or categorial items) and molecular objects (or complexa or complexe significabilia)? And what is (if anything is) the significate of a false proposition? Paul answers these questions in the Logica Magna and in the commentary on the Categories. His conception undergoes a certain development: in the Logica Magna he denies that what is signified by a true negative proposition is something real, since it is neither an atomic being, nor an aggregate, nor a molecular being (II, tr. 11, p. 122). In the commentary on the Categories he modifies his opinion on this subject, since he admits that there are in re a kind of negative state of affairs signified by true negative propositions. Moreover, he now identifies the significate of any false sentence with a second mental proposition existing obiective and not subiective in our intellect.

The thesis of the Logica Magna that what is signified by a true negative proposition is not something real was not consistent with the universal principle adopted by Paul in this context: a sentence is true if and only if it is a signum veri, nor with what he affirms about the reality of what is signified by a true affirmative sentence, which he identifies with the molecular truth which derives from the veritas manifestationis proper to the atomic beings, and which is at the same time really identical-with and formally distinct-from them (ibidem, pp. 156 and 166).

It is clear that if he was not also able to give a form of reality to the significata of true negative sentences, they could not be considered true, but, paradoxically, would be false, because they would be without any referent in reality. For this reason in the commentary on the Categories Paul distinguishes between the significate of a true sentence and the significate of a false sentence. Paul persists in thinking that if there is no adequate significatum in the world, that is, if there is not something complex to which the mental proposition refers in extramental reality, then the uttered sentence and the mental proposition are false, but he now accepts Burley’s idea that there are two different kinds of mental expressions, those which exist subiective in the intellect, as its acts of understanding, and those which exist obiective in it, as the direct objects of those acts of understanding. According to Paul, the mental proposition existing obiective in our intellect is the significatum ultimum et adaequatum of false propositions (In Cat., cap. de priori, fol. 136vb).

As far as true propositions, both affirmative and negative, are concerned, the case is different. In Paul’s opinion, a true affirmative proposition signifies a molecular truth, that is a complex reality which is part of the whole reality (the esse reale of the Summa philosophiae naturalis—see below) of a finite corporeal being. So, like Gregory, Paul denies that what verifies the proposition ‘Socrates is white’ is Socrates and the accidental form of whiteness taken together. On the contrary, he claims that the significatum adaequatum of that proposition is the whole reality of Socrates or his being white (LM, II, tr. 11, p. 170). In fact, if the realities signified by true propositions were aggregates made up of the two entities signified by the subject-term and the predicate-term, then these two propositions, ‘the sun heats the house’ and ‘the house is heated by the sun’, would be interchangeable not only with respect to their reference, but also wth respect to their significates, because what verifies both of them would be the existence of the sun, the house, and the action of heating. But according to Paul, the two propositions are only extensionally equivalent, and intensionally different, because of their own different significata (ibidem). ‘The sun heats the house’ signifies a state (of affairs) connected with the being of the sun, but ‘the house is heated by the sun’ signifies a state (of affairs) connected with the being of the house. Thus it is incorrect that, according to Paul, the significate with which the adequate significate of a proposition can be in fact identified is the one thing that, by being in a certain state, renders the proposition true. It is quite the opposite: a certain state of the thing signified by the subject of the sentence is the adequate significate of that same sentence. Paul maintains (1) that the adequate significate of a proposition is, implicitly or explicitly, determined by the composition of its parts, and (2) that it is impossible for the adequate significate of a simple expression (a term) to be the adequate significate of a complex expression (a proposition), since otherwise, an absolutely simple term would adequately signify the true or the false—an evident absurdity (LM, II, tr. 11, p. 196). So, in order to be consistent with these claims, in the commentary on the Categories Paul states that true negative propositions too have something complex which corresponds to them in reality, a sort of negative state of affairs grounded (1) in the two esse realia proper to the things signified by the subject and predicate-terms, or (2) in the laws which rule the order and the metaphysical structure of the world (In Cat., cap. de substantia, fol. 66ra).

4. Ontology

Paul’s world consists of finite beings (that is, things like men or horses) really existing outside the mind, each made up of a primary substance and a host of forms existing in it and by it. The forms of a primary substance belong to ten different types of being, or categories. Therefore a finite being cannot be totally identified with the primary substance. (In fact no primary substance contains the whole being of a finite being.) Rather it is an ordered congeries of categorial items. Primary substances are not simple items but complex objects, since they are compounded of particular matter and form—a form that is really identical with and formally distinct from the specific nature itself that the primary substance instantiates (SN, part VI, chap. 1, fols. 92vb–93ra). The concepts of matter and form are relative, since their meanings are connected with each other (In Post., fol. 40rb). Being the form of something and being the matter of something are converse relations of three different kinds, whose arguments and values are:

  1. the metaphysical constituents of the individual substance (i.e. singular matter and form);
  2. the metaphysical constituents of the specific natures (i.e. genus and difference); and
  3. the categorial items (i.e. individual and universal substances and accidents) considered according to their various degrees of generality.

The specific nature (or essence) can be conceived from a twofold point of view: intensionally (in abstracto) and extensionally (in concreto). Intensionally viewed, the specific nature simply expresses the set of essential properties that compose a categorial form, without any reference to the existence of individuals which, if there are any, instantiate it. Extensionally viewed, the specific nature is that same form conceived of as instantiated by at least one singular entity. For instance, human nature intensionally considered is humanity (humanitas); extensionally it is man (homo) (In Porph., prooem., fol. 9va). Both of them are substantial forms superordinated to the whole human compound, but while humanity is properly a form, i.e. something existentially incomplete and dependent, man is an existentially autonomous and independent entity. Thus they differ from each other in the same way as a predicate (for example ‘P’) differs from a formula (for example, ‘P(x)’).

Because of the complexity of the metaphysical composition of the finite corporeal being, every creature has four different levels of being: real, essential, temporal, and individual. Real being is nothing but the whole reality of the finite being. Essential being is the mode of being proper to the specific nature that a certain singular directly instantiates. Temporal being is the state of affairs designated by infinitival expressions like ‘being a man’ (‘hominem esse’) or ‘being white’ (‘esse album’)—that is, the object of the act of judging. Finally, individual being is the actual existence of the primary substance of a finite being as distinct from the whole reality of the finite being itself (SN, part VI, chap. 1, fol. 92vb).

Paul asserts the following relationships among these four levels of being and the essence of a creature: the essence and being of any creature are not really distinct from each other; the essence of a thing is formally different from its real being and from its essential being; the essence and the essential being of a thing are formally (ratione) different from temporal and individual beings; specific and generic essences can keep on being even though no individual instantiates them, but in this case they do not have any actual existence (esse actuale). From that point of view, Socrates being a man (Sortem esse hominem) is in reality Socrates himself considered together with all the properties of which he is the bearer. On the other hand, the proposition identifies only one of these properties, that signified by the predicate-term (in our example the property of being a man), which is formally different from the form (in our example that of humanity) connoted by the predicate-term itself (ibidem, fols. 92vb–93ra).

According to Paul, who follows Duns Scotus and Wyclif on this subject, being is univocally shared by everything real, since it is the stuff that the ten categories modulate according to their own essence (In Phys., book I, tr. 1, chap. 2, t. c. 13; In Metaph., book IV, tr. 1, chap. 1, fols. 122ra–125vb, passim; In Porph., chap. De specie, fol. 22rb). In view of this position, Paul maintains no real distinction between essence and being (In Metaph., book IV, tr. 1, chap. 2, fol. 127rb; book VI, chap. 1, fol. 223vb). Like Duns Scotus and Wyclif, Paul speaks of a formal difference (or difference of reason) between essence and being in creatures, as the essence and the essential being of a thing are one and the same entity considered from two distinct points of view, intensionally (the essence) and extensionally (the being) (SN, part VI, chap. 1, fol. 93ra).

This analysis identifies the opposition between essence and being with the opposition between universals and individuals. Like Wyclif, Paul thinks of essence as a universal form intensionally considered, and existence (taken in the strict sense) as the mode of being proper to primary substances. Thus, when Paul affirms that essence and being are really identical and formally different, he simply restates the thesis of the real identity and formal distinction between universals and individuals that was typical of the Realists of the late Middle Ages. Consequently, like Burley and Wyclif, Paul holds that a formal universal actually (in actu) exists outside our minds only if there is at least one individual that instantiates it, so that without individuals common natures (or essences) are not really universals (SN, part VI, chap. 2, fol. 94ra).

This means that the relationship between common natures and singulars is ultimately grounded on individuation, since no actual universality and no instantiation is possible without individuation. On this subject Paul successfully reconciles the Scotistic approach with certain Thomistic theses. Paul claims that the principle of individuation is twofold, immanent and remote. The immanent principle is the one whose presence necessarily entails the existence of the individual it constitutes, and whose absence necessarily entails the non-existence (or disappearance) of the individual. The remote principle, on the other hand, is just what the immanent principle presupposes, but whose presence and absence alone are insufficient for causing the existence or disappearance of the individual, as it continues being after the corruption of the individual. Thisness (haecceitas) is the immanent principle of individuation, whereas form, matter, and quantity are the remote principle. Thisness in turn has a twofold origin, as it derives from matter and form together in the case of corporeal substances, and as it derives from the essence (quidditas) alone in the case of angelic intelligences (SN, part VI, chap. 5, fol. 95vb). Furthermore, according to Paul there is a close similarity between the thisness, which he now calls individual difference (differentia individualis), and the specific difference. The specific difference is what differentiates the species from the genus, since it is the determination or property which, once added to the genus, results in the species. On the other hand, the specific difference is really identical with the genus, from which it is distinct only in virtue of a formal principle. The same happens to the individual difference: it is what differentiates the individual from the species; from the ontological point of view, it is really identical with and formally distinct from the species itself; and it is the formal principle in virtue of which the individual is what it is, something particular, concrete, and perfectly determined in itself (SN, part VI, chap. 5, fol. 96rb; chap. 26, fol. 112rb–va; QdU, fol. 128va; fol. 129rb; In Metaph., book III, tr. 1, chap. 1, fol. 83vb).

As far as the problem of angelic individuation is concerned, the logical consequence deriving from such premisses is that it is impossible to find two angels who share the same specific nature and are numerically distinct, since only one haecceitas can spring up from an incorporeal species (SN, part VI, chap. 5, fol. 96ra). This solution is close to the inner meaning of Duns Scotus’ position and contrasts with Aquinas’ view, although Paul affirms that the angelic intelligences are specifically, and not numerically, different. In fact, according to St. Thomas, angels are specifically different because they are incorporeal, and without matter no individuation is possible. On the contrary, Paul of Venice thinks angels are individuated by means of thisnesses, but not multiplied by them, because of the absence of matter, so that there is only one angel per species. Since specific natures of incorporeal beings do not include any reference to matter, only a unique principle of individuation (ratio suppositalis) can flow from such species. As a consequence, no angel is one in number in the strict sense of the term (as being one in number necessarily implies the actual presence of a multiplicity of things of the same species), even though broadly speaking every angel is one in number, as two (or more) angels are, after all, “many things”—but never many angels of the same kind (SN, part VI, chap. 5, fol. 95vb).

In his last work, the commentary on the Ars Vetus, Paul summarizes his position as follows:

  1. The individual is the final result of a process of individuation whose starting point is a specific form.
  2. The individuation is what differentiates the individual from its species.
  3. The individuation is nothing but the thisness itself.
  4. The thisness and the specific form are only formally distinct from the individual they make up (In Porph., chap. De specie, fol. 60ra).
  5. The principle of individuation, when causing the passage from the level of universals to that of singulars, does not play the role of form (or act) in relation to the specific nature, but the role of matter (or potency), as it is what the specific form structures (In Cat., chap. De substantia, fol. 60ra).

In this way Paul of Venice tried to solve the aporetic aspects of Duns Scotus’ theory of individuation. Scotus said nothing about the problem of the relation between the thisness and the particular matter and form that constitute the individual. The Franciscan master was also silent about a possible identification of the thisness with one of the two essential forms of the individual substance, the forma partis (for instance, the individual soul) and the forma totius (the human nature). Paul identifies the principle of individuation with the informing act through which the specific nature molds its matter. This identification had been already suggested by the opposition between immanent and remote principles of individuation described in the Summa philosophiae naturalis. In fact, all the constituents of the individual compound (matter, form, and quantity) had been contrasted with the thisness, which for that reason could not be identified with any of them. Moreover, it is obvious that:

  1. It is the union of the singular form with its matter that establishes the “birth” of the individual.
  2. It is its separation from the matter that establishes the “death” of the individual.
  3. The union of the singular form with its matter is the necessary and sufficient condition for the passage of the specific essence from its abstract (or intensional) mode of being to its concrete (or extensional) mode of being.

5. The Body-soul Problem and the Theory of Knowledge

According to the standard medieval realist theories of knowledge, as exemplified by Thomas Aquinas and Giles of Rome, the primary object of the human intellect is the essence of material things. Such essences become intelligible to us only when our intellect has abstracted them from the individualising properties connected with the matter, so that we can have direct knowledge of universals only. Yet, an intellective knowledge of individuals is possible, if the intellect, after abstracting the intelligible species through which it grasps essences, turns its attention to the phantasm from which it has drawn the intelligible species itself. This action, the conversion to phantasm, produces a reflexive (that is, indirect) and incomplete knowledge of the individual thing represented by the phantasm itself. On the other hand, according to the standard medieval nominalist theories of knowledge, as exemplified by Ockham, individuals alone are the object of our intellect, and the main form of human cognition is not the abstractive one, but intuitive cognition, which properly concerns the existence and non-existence of individual things, as it is that immediate apprehension of a thing (that is, an individual substance or quality) as existent which enables us to form a contingent proposition concerning the existence of that same thing. By contrast, abstractive knowledge is an apprehension of terms by which it is impossible for us to have evidence of whether or not a certain thing exists. Thus, intuitive and abstractive cognition attain the same singular objects, but in different ways, since abstractive cognition is indifferent to existence and produces a universal sign of a multiplicity of singulars.

These different epistemological explanations depend also on differences in ontology. According to medieval Realists, individuals cannot be the proper (not even a proper) and adequate object of knowledge for any intellect, since (1) their world includes common natures or essences besides individual things; (2) individuals stem from species by means of prime matter (plus quantity); and (3) prime matter is per se something opaque and unintelligible. Apart from the unsuitable theological consequences (how is it possible that God knows human beings perfectly, if every kind of individual is per se something not completely intelligible?), the realist account entails a paradox, as the phantasm already enables us to grasp the substance and the accidental properties of an individual thing far before the conversion to itself which follows intellective cognition, because it is an appropriate image (or representation) of the particular material object perceived by the senses. On the other hand, the punctum dolens of any nominalist description of the process of knowledge lies in the difficulty in explaining the nature and origin of abstractive cognition and the relation which holds between the universal sign and the individuals which it refers to—how can they constitute a natural set? How can we know under a universal form (universaliter) something which is in itself absolutely singular?

It is just in order to do away with the peculiar problems of the realist paradigm that Paul of Venice worked out a new version of the standard medieval realist theories of knowledge, critical of the most common solutions proper to his intellectual environment, and where much more stress is put on the question of class-membership, and on the intellective cognition of individuals.

As to the problem of the relation of soul to body, Paul rejects the Augustinian conception and follows the Aristotelian view of the soul as form of the body, so that in his opinion the subject of knowledge is not the soul alone, but the whole human composite. Not even sensation can be attributed simply to the soul using a body, as Augustine had thought. Moreover, against Aristotle and following Aquinas, Paul claims that, although it is the form of the body, the human soul is a self-subsistent form, and therefore incorruptible. However, unlike Aquinas, he maintains that the human soul is two-fold, as the complete human soul (anima totalis) derives from the close union of two distinct principles, the cogitative and the intellective. This fact does not break the unity of the human soul nor of the human composite, since (1) the cogitative principle is the cause of the animality and the intellective one of the rationality of man; (2) neither of them can exist in man without the other; and (3) the cogitative soul is in potency in relation to the intellective one (Summa philosophiae naturalis, ed. Venetiis 1503 [= SN], pars v, ch. 5, fols. 68vb and 69ra; see also Scriptum super libros De anima ed. Venetiis 1504 [= In De an.], II, t.c. 23, fols. 47rb-48ra).

Like Thomas Aquinas and Giles of Rome, Paul maintains that there is a real distinction between the soul and its faculties, but, in opposition to them, he holds that there is only a formal distinction (ratione et definitione) between the faculties themselves (SN, p. v, ch. 4, fol. 68ra-b). Whereas the faculties of the cogitative soul depend on bodily organs for their operations, the faculties of the intellective soul, i.e. the active intellect, the passive intellect, and the will, are independent, even though in the state of union with the body they need sensation for exercising their powers, and no act of sensation can be produced without the concurrence of the body (SN, p. v, ch. 10, fols. 71va-72ra.). Besides the vegetative faculty (which regulates nutrition, growth, and reproduction) and the power of locomotion, the faculties of the cogitative soul are the following: the five exterior senses, the general sense (sensus communis), the fantasy (phantasia), the vis aestimativa (or cogitativa properly so called), and the memory. Against Avicenna, Paul explicitly denies that there is a fifth internal sense, the imagination, since he thinks that its presumed operations are the same as those of the fantasy (SN, p. v, ch. 30, fol. 84ra). The general sense distinguishes and collates the data of the special exterior senses. The fantasy conserves the species apprehended by senses and freely combines them together to produce figments. The cogitativa recognizes those properties of things which cannot be perceived through the senses, like, for example, that something is useful for a certain purpose, or friendly, or unfriendly. The memory is the ‘warehouse’ where all the species are stored, so that the cogitative soul can perform its tasks even without the presence of any material object (see SN, p. v, ch. 30, fol. 84ra-va).

According to Paul, the qualities which are the adequate and per se object of the exterior senses cause a peculiar modification in the bodily organs, that is the presence in them of a forma intentionalis or species sensibilis, which does not imply any material mutation in the organ itself, as such a form is a resembling image (similitudo) of the real form which started the process totally lacking extension, and therefore unable to modify in any way the matter of the bodily organs (cf. SN, p. v, ch. 23, fol. 79va, and ch. 30, fol. 84rb). As a consequence, Paul affirms that the species sensibilis is a pure form without matter in a two-fold sense: it is not grounded on matter, and it has no extension. Yet, as a resembling image of a real form it contains in itself a sort of logical description of the matter to which the real form gives structure (see SN, p. v, ch. 23, fol. 79 vb). When the species meets the potentia sensitiva of the bodily organ, a sensation is produced, by means of which the soul becomes aware of the external existence of a certain reality (SN, p. v, ch. 28, fol. 83ra). This process is totally passive, as exterior senses can give birth to sensations only in virtue of the actual presence of the material object (SN, p. v, ch. 10, fol. 71va-b). The species sensibilis present in one of the exterior senses and the species sensibilis present in the sensus communis (and in the other internal senses), differ specifically (specifice) from each other, since they are images of objects of different types. In fact, the species present in the general sense is a species of species, as it is not the logical image of the external quality which caused the process of sensation, but an image of the species present in the exterior sense (SN, p. v, ch. 28, fol. 83ra). The higher level of sense-knowledge is therefore qualitatively distinct from the lower. At the higher level, every passage from a faculty to another entails a sort of purification of the forma intentionalis, which progressively loses the information on the individual characteristics of the external object (SN, p. v, ch. 40, fol. 90va). So the perceived thing is first apprehended by the cogitativa as this singular bearer of certain properties, then as a bearer of certain properties, a change that Paul qualifies as a transition from the condition of intentio singularis signata to the condition of intentio singularis vaga (In De an., III, t.c. 11, fol. 137rb). Not only does the cogitativa effect the transformation of the intentio singularis signata into an intentio singularis vaga, it also abstracts the substance, which is a sensibile per accidens (something accidentally perceptible) from the perceived accidental properties which are sensibilia per se (perceptible by themselves—In De an., III, t.c. 11, fol. 137rb; see also SN, p. v, ch. 11, fol. 72ra).

As we have already seen, in Nicoletti’s view the phantasm is a representation of the thing which started the process of knowing. Altough immaterial and free from any reference to the individualising properties (of the thing at issue), the phantasm is not completely intelligible, since the intentio singularis vaga still contains a sort of logical description of the generic matter which the singular thing is made of, and through it to the general conditions for individuation. For example, when we apprehend Socrates as a man, we know human essence just as instantiated by a singular item, and not in itself, as a specific type. In order to have the concept of man, there is need of a further and higher activity on the part of the soul, which has to abstract from the phantasm the universal or intelligible species, which applies to all men. This further activity is the proper action of the active intellect, which illumines both the phantasm and the possible intellect, so impressing on the latter the species intelligibilis abstracted from the former (In De an., III, t.c. 11, fol. 137rb).

As for the possible (or passive) intellect, according to Nardi, Ruello, and Kuksewicz, Paul was an Averroist, as he would have supported the thesis of the unicity and separate character of such an intellect for the whole human species. But this is false. On the contrary, Paul’s point of view for this question is close to that of Thomas Aquinas, whose arguments against the unicity of the passive intellect he utilizes in his commentaries on the De anima and on the Metaphysics (after 1420). If his affirmations in the Summa philosophiae naturalis are a bit ambiguous and it is therefore possible to miss their deepest meaning, in these two Aristotelian commentaries he clearly rejects all the main theses of later medieval Averroism (see Amerini, 2012). He thinks that (1) the claim of the unicity of the possible intellect for the whole human species is lacking in a solid philosophical basis, since it can be maintained from the physical point of view only, according to which everything is considered qua affected-by or connected-with motion, but (2) it is false from the metaphysical point of view, which is the most comprehensive of all. From this viewpoint, according to which the possible intellect has to be considered a substantial form (and more precisely, the form of the human body), it is evident that it has a beginning in time, but certainly not an end, and that, like any other material substantial form, it is multiplied according to the multiplication of bodies, since one and the same principle in number cannot be the form of a multiplicity of substances. Furthermore, given that different men can form different opinions about the same thing or event, one and the same intellect could hold contradictory views at once, in apparent violation of the law of contradiction (see In De an., III, t.c. 27, fol. 149ra).

In the SN Paul had spoken of the active intellect in terms of a separated substance. The active intellect is connected to the possible intellect and the human soul by inherence and to the phantasm as the phantasm is directly present before it (cf. SN, p. v, ch. 38, fol. 89ra). On the contrary, in the commentary on the De anima, he (1) identifies the active intellect with God Himself, considered as the first cause, and its own activity with God’s activity of illumination in and outside the soul, and (2) affirms that the active intellect is joined to the possible intellect neither by inherence nor by information, but as a form directly present in it (In De an., III, t.c. 19, fol. 143ra). This fact explains why the first of the four main effects produced by the active intellect is set in the external world, and the fourth one both in the external world and in the human mind. In turn, the mutual connections and distinctive features of the actions performed by the active intellect explain why (1) individuals are proper objects of intellection for us; (2) the intelligible species is singular and not universal; and (3) the same intelligible species by means of which we grasp substantial essences is the medium in virtue of which we can understand the peculiar structure of the individual which instantiates that essence (In De an., III, t.c. 11, fols. 136vb and 137rb-va)—all theses which are just the opposite of the most common realist convictions on the matter, as Paul himself points out (In De an., III, t.c. 27, fol. 137va).

As a consequence, he explicitly polemicizes with Giles of Rome and Thomas Aquinas on the problem of the cognition of individuals. He sums up their position in four theses, accepts the first one, and argues against the last three. The four theses are the following:

  • the primary object of our intellect is the quidditas rei;
  • the first intelligible species produced in our intellect is universal (that is, it enables us to know a common item) and abstract;
  • singulars are known only after the intellection of the universal;
  • singulars are not directly known by our intellect, but indirectly by reflection (In De an., III, t.c. 11, fol. 136vb).

As far as the second thesis is concerned, Paul thinks that the first intelligible species present in our mind is about a singular item and enables us to know it, as the first intelligible species is drawn from the phantasm, which is formally and per se the mental representation of an individual item, and therefore singular itself (phantasma est intentio singularis). The third and fourth theses are questioned together. Paul raises two main objections against them. The first one runs as follows: if we can know the individual which causes the process of intellection only after the cognition of the universal, then something in the cognition of the universal functions as a medium for this new apprehension. It cannot be the universal itself, as it is not more similar to this individual than to any other; so it must be something singular, distinct from the universal and added to it. But, if so, then this singular is to be known per se and directly (because if per accidens and/or indirectly, then only in virtue of something else, which in turn would become the new medium for the cognition of the individual, and so on) far before the conversion to the phantasm, which is therefore totally superfluous. The second objection is even more articulated. Paul observes that, if our intellect apprehends the singular thing which starts the process of understanding only by means of the conversion to the phantasm, then the phantasm acts upon the intellect, impressing an image (or species) on it. If the image impressed is universal, then the passive intellect cannot apprehend any singular thing by means of it; as a consequence, it can only be particular; but in this case the phantasm performs just the same action as before the conversion to itself, which is therefore redundant. Nor can one say that the phantasm does not act upon the passive intellect, because in this case the conversion to it would be even more unnecessary, if possible, and material items would be known by us in the same way as God and the (angelic) intelligences, which are immaterial (In De an., III, t.c. 11, fols. 136vb-137ra).

As is evident, the Italian master is aware of the paradox entailed by the standard realist account of human knowledge and his theory is a serious attempt to avoid it. Paul refuses Aquinas’s and Giles’s views since they imply that the intellectual apprehension of the universal essence, because of its two-fold relation to the phantasm, at once presupposes the sense-apprehension of the individual thing (which instantiates that essence) and is presupposed by the intellectual apprehension of the individual thing. Since at the level of sense-apprehension of individual items the human soul, through the cogitativa, is already able to recognize the substance (of those individual things), the intellectual apprehension cannot in any way add new information on the res at issue and must be totally identical with the sense-apprehension. As a consequence, instead of elaborating an interpretative pattern of human knowledge based on the form of the spiral, where the same things come back to our soul at different moments in the process of abstraction, Paul tacitly develops in an original way some suggestions drawn from Walter Burley’s prologue to his last commentary on the Physics. In criticizing Averroes’s thesis that the quidditas of material things is the primary object of our understanding and the material and individual things themselves a secondary object, Paul explains our knowledge in terms of a sort of straight line which proceeds from the most superficial to the deepest levels of reality, and states that our intellect is equally apt to receive both universal and singular species, and, as a consequence, that it is apt to know both common essences and singular things (In De an., III, t.c. 11, fol. 136va-b).

This solution introduces the chief thesis of the nominalist approach to epistemology (the direct knowledge of individuals) into a realist context; nevertheless it is consistent with the metaphysical presuppositions proper to the late medieval realist way of thought. With the noteworthy exception of Walter Burley, according to any late medieval Realist, in the extramental world universal essences and individual things come together, since they are really identical and only formally distinct, although universal essence belongs to a deeper level of reality. In a certain way they are two different aspects of the same thing. This fact explains what happens in the process of knowledge according to Paul: since the intelligible species is directly connected with the essence of a thing and indirectly, by means of the phantasm, with the singular thing itself (cf. In De an., III, t.c. 11, fol. 137rb), our intellect grasps the universal essence and the individual thing at the same time, so that both of them are the primary objects of our mind, even though the universal essence is the primary object by nature (primitate naturaeIn De an., III, t.c. 11, fol. 137va; see also SN, p. v, ch. 39, fol. 90va).

6. Theology: the Doctrine of Divine Ideas

Paul deals with the problem of divine ideas in his commentary on book VII of the Metaphysics (tr. 3, chap. 2) and at the end of the Quaestio de universalibus (tenth conclusion: universalia platonica et idealia sunt ex natura rei in mente divina causaliter ponenda). The cornerstone of his theory of divine exemplarism is the conviction that there is a close parallelism between human artificers as producers of artifacts and God as a creator—only in this way, according to Paul, can the main goal of every theory of divine ideas (that is, the explanation of the rationality of creation as a free act of God) be achieved. Paul develops four rational pieces of evidence for supporting the thesis of the eternal existence in God’s mind of a multiplicity of ideas, conceived of as the formal patterns and principles (exemplaria) of creatures.

The first argument goes as follows: since the prima causa produces individuals which differ in species (type) from each other (say men and horses), they are produced according to different formal principles, as the effects of the same principle are identical in type. The second is that if A and B are two different creatures (say a man and a donkey) that God is going to create, their mutual differences cannot be grounded on their own beings, since they are not yet existing things; therefore they have to be found in something pertaining to God’s productive potency, which will act according to different principles present in it. The third argument is unsound: Paul argues that since in God each generic principle (ratio generis) is different from any corresponding specific principle (ratio speciei), therefore specific principles too are different from each other. Unfortunately, the proof he makes use of for showing the difference in reality between generic and specific principles is inconsistent. He affirms that if the generic and specific principles were not distinct, then God could not create something according to the generic principle without creating it according to a correlated specific principle—while this is just what happens, since no animal can be created which is not an animal of a certain species or type (a man, or a monkey, or a mouse). The fourth argument is that, since God knows that animal is the genus of man and that being-an-animal is included in the definition of man, He thinks of them by means of two different principles; otherwise He could not distinguish them (QdU, fols. 133vb–134ra).

In the commentary on the Metaphysics, the Italian master, after denying that the ideas are self-subsistent entities, as Plato thought, maintains that the meaning of the term ‘idea’ is twofold: (i) broadly speaking (communiter), an idea is a specific essence or nature (quidditas specifica), existing in a mind as a causal model for the production of something; (ii) properly speaking (proprie), an idea is a specific essence existing in God’s mind as a causal model for the production of something (In Metaph., book VII, tr. 3, chap. 2, fol. 298va). From these definitions, which he considers consonant with the teaching of Aristotle and Averroes, Paul derives four consequences or theses, which, taken together, represent the very core of his theory of divine ideas:

  1. Ideas are ideas of specific essences and not ideas of genera or of individuals, because ideas are formal principles, and they are acts or forms in relation to any other thing; on the contrary, both genera and individuals are as matter in relation to species.
  2. Ideas are present in the mind as in a substrate, or subject, since ideas are the tools of the mind, and the mind can only use tools closely connected with and existentially dependent on it.
  3. Ideas are efficient causes (causae effectivae) in relation to their effects.
  4. Ideas are models (exemplaria) in relation to their effects, since their effects are similar to them. This entails that ideas are both direct objects of knowledge (obiecta cognita absolute) and that by means of which the mind knows something else (obiecta cognita respective), just as the phantasm is a direct object for our knowledge and that by means of which we know the individual from which it has been drawn. As a consequence—Paul adds—an idea is not the notion of something (cognitio rei), but the essence of a thing (quidditas rei) considered according to its intelligible being in a mind (In Metaph., book VII, tr. 3, chap. 2, fol. 298vb; see also QdU, fol. 134vb).

In sum, according to Paul, divine ideas play a threefold role in relation to God and creatures: they are (i) the specific essences of individual things themselves, considered according to their intelligible being in the mind of God; (ii) God’s principles of cognition of creatures; and (iii) the eternal models of creatures. If we also take into account that in his opinion (i) divine ideas are really the same as the divine essence and formally distinct from it, and (ii) this distinction originates from their being efficient (co-)causes in relation to the different kinds of creatures, we can easily realize how close his position was to Wyclif’s, which was considered heretical because of its consequences: metaphysical and theological necessitarianism; restriction of divine omnipotence; denial of the process of transubstantiation in the Eucharist. In order to avoid this form of necessitarianism, Paul, both in the commentary on the Metaphysics and in the Quaestio de universalibus, maintains that in God there is an infinite number of ideas, some of which only have been brought into existence by Him. In fact, there is a formal difference between the supreme principle of understanding of possibles, which is the divine essence itself as infinitely imitable ad extra, and divine ideas, which are the practical principles of the production of creatures (In Metaph., book VII, tr. 3, chap. 2, fol. 298va; see also QdU, fol. 135rb). But he admits that we should conclude that ideas in God are finite in number, if we considered the problem exclusively from the point of view of natural philosophy (ibidem).

The differences between Paul’s doctrine and that of Thomas Aquinas, his main source, on the one hand, and Wyclif’s, on the other hand, are evident. Paul agrees with Wyclif against Thomas that divine ideas are the specific essences of individual creatures, considered according to their intelligible being in the mind of God, and efficient (co-)causes in relation to the different kinds of creatures, while he agrees with Thomas against Wyclif that there is a distinction between being a mere principle of understanding (ratio) and being an effective model of production (exemplar). If Paul did not accept such a distinction, his theory would be substantially the same as Wyclif’s. On the contrary, not only does he accept this Thomistic distinction, but he develops it in an autonomous way, which makes his admission of the existence of an infinite number of ideas in God superfluous. According to Thomas, divine rationes and divine exemplaria are two different types of ideas, the former linked to pure speculative knowledge only, the latter linked to practical knowledge. Only exemplaria are ideas in the strict sense of the term. Paul’s definition of divine ideas excludes that the (Thomistic) divine rationes can be considered ideas, since a divine idea is the (i) specific nature (of a certain set of individuals) existing in God’s mind, (ii) principle of actuality, and (iii) efficient cause in relation to creatures. Now, the Thomistic rationes do not satisfy any of these requirements. Within Paul’s system, what plays the role of the Thomistic rationes is the divine essence itself, which is the supreme principle of knowledge of possibles, but not an idea. Moreover, in Paul’s view, divine ideas are formally distinct from the divine essence. This means that, in principle, the divine essence and divine ideas are different entities. In fact, Paul’s definition of formal distinction inverts the terms of the question in relation to the preceding approaches, as Paul is attempting to reduce multiplicity to unity (the passage is from many to one). What Paul wants to account for is the way in which many different entities of a certain kind (i.e. of an incomplete and dependent mode of existence) can constitute one and the same substance. Hence, within Paul’s theory of divine ideas the gap between the sphere of the possible and the sphere of the existent is deeper than in Thomas’. The possible is grounded on God considered as a knower, while the existent is grounded on God considered as a maker; ideas play a role only in creation, while the sole divine essence is sufficient for allowing God to know possibles (see In Metaph., book XII, tr. 2, chap. 3, part 2, fols. 466vb–467ra).

Therefore, Nicoletti’s view can be summarized as follows: (i) divine ideas are really identical with and formally different from the divine essence; (ii) ideas are both direct, but secondary, objects of divine intellection (the primary object being the divine essence itself) and that by means of which God knows every existent other than Himself; (iii) there are no ideas of individuals or of prime matter. Paul’s position is more influenced by (Neo-)platonic presuppositions than that of Thomas Aquinas. Aquinas appealed to a sort of non-real mode of existence of divine ideas, originating from the relations of imitability holding between the divine essence and possible creatures, so that the existence of divine ideas is purely of reason. Paul of Venice tries the opposite way of hypostatizing ideas—his peculiar version of the formal distinction enables him to do so without compromising divine simplicity. He can therefore claim that the divine essence is the substrate of divine ideas, as if they were a sort of accidents inhering in a substance. As a consequence, the statement that the ideas are direct but secondary objects of divine intellection means that God’s intellection first grasps the divine essence and then ideas, even though God’s intuition of Himself and God’s intuition of ideas are not distinct. In fact, divine ideas are not the specific natures of creatures as creatures are conceived of terminative in themselves by God, but as they are conceived of subiective in Him, that is, by means of a different reality (the divine essence) and according to their relation of ontological dependence upon the divine essence itself. The identity between divine ideas and the esse ideale proper to specific natures, and the relation of one-to-many holding between specific natures and the individuals which originate from them, explain how God can know individuals perfectly—even though mediately, through ideas. In fact, infinite individual causal principles derive from one and the same divine idea, formally distinct from each other. They correspond to the thisnesses (haecceitates), which on the level of existence give rise to individuals from species. As thisnesses are the formal principles in virtue of which individuals are what they are, something particular, concrete, and perfectly determined in itself, so these individual causal principles deriving from ideas are what causes the passage from the specific ideal standard to the analytical description of its instantiations (QdU, fol. 135ra). Prime matter, which is a necessary constituent of any corporeal thing, is known by God in the same way as individuals are: not in itself, but derivatively in something else (ibidem, fol. 135rb).

7. Philosophy of Nature: Potency, Act, and Prime Matter

As happens very often in the case of medieval authors, the salient features of Paul of Venice’s general view about potency and act (and possible and real as well) are partly determined by the concrete applications that the theory pursues. The specific areas that the theory is called to cover are: (1) the (meta)physical explanation of the nature and modalities of change and coming to be; (2) the determination of the form of existence of universals with respect to singulars; and (3) the explanation of the process of creation. Paul proceeds by divisions that allow him to order this subject according to a tree-like scheme that follows in some ways that adopted by Porphyry in the chapter on species in his Isagoge. We can leave out the minor divisions to concentrate on the main one only. At the basis of Paul’s doctrine of act and potency we find a distinction between potency considerd as a disposition to exist, or logical possibility (the potentia ad esse), and potency as a disposition (proper to something which already exists) to perform or achieve something or to undergo a change, or natural possibility (the potentia in esse) (see SN, pars vi, ch. 7, fol. 97ra). This distinction should allow him to separate the logical-theoretical sphere (the potentia ad esse) from the physical one (the potentia in esse). The example chosen to illustrate the nature of the potentia ad esse, that is, the birth of the Antichrist, manifests, however, an internal ambiguity in his doctrine. The existence of the Antichrist, in fact, is a possible not in the sense of non-impossible (i.e., something not contradictory in itself) but in the sense of that which, while not yet real, is however infallibly destined to become real.

As a matter of fact, the Italian master does not always adequately distinguish between the concept of potency (potentia) as pure logical possibility (as it was taught by Duns Scotus) and that of potency as preformation, that is, a sort of latent pre-existence, in some other thing, of what will be actual/real but is not yet such. This last sense of potency is the one prevalent in Paul, who seems to use the logical sense only in theological contexts, in connection with the theme of divine omnipotence, which enables God to create many more species than He did (see QdU, conclusio decima). As a consequence, in the theory of potency and act of Paul of Venice, two different fields of investigation converge: the one related to the problem of changes of state and the one related to the analysis of the modal concept of possible. Nicoletti tends to trace back in some way the notion of (logical) possible to that of disposition to undergo a change. He therefore denies that there are possibilities that will never come into being (In Metaph., IX, tr. 1, ch. 2, fol. 342rb): “The opinion of those who claimed that something is possible even if it will never be was false” (Falsa fuit opinio dicentium aliquid posse esse quod tamen nullo modo erit). Yet, such a denial – he adds – is valid ony within the philosophy of nature; it must be rejected from a theological point of view ( ibidem).

The thesis (which he shares with Wyclif and his followers) of the composition of potency and act proper to all categorial items (universal and individual substances, and universal and individual accidents – see SN, pars vi, ch. 4, fol. 95rb) is in accord with this approach. In Paul’s opinion, each categorial item is act, and hence form, with respect to the entity that according to the high-low direction immediately precedes it in the categorial line (linea praedicamentalis), and in potency, and hence matter, with respect to the entity that immediately follows it – taking the terms ‘matter’ and ‘form’ in a broad sense (communiter), since ‘matter’ stands for any potential nature and ‘form’ for any act (or form) contracting some given nature (cf. ibidem). For instance, the highest genus of the category of substance is immediately composed of act and potency; intermediate genera and lowest species immediately of genus and difference, and mediately of act and potency (because of the supreme genus, which is the original constitutive element of their natures); and individuals immediately of essence and being (that is to say, as Paul puts it, of specific nature and an individuating principle, or ratio individualis, and mediately of genus and difference (because of the lowest species), and of act and potency (because of the highest genus) (SN, pars vi, ch. 4, fol. 95rb; In Metaph., V, tr. 2, ch. 2, fol. 184ra; and book XII, tr. 1, ch. 4, fols. 433va and 434ra-b; In Cat., cap. de substantia, fols. 54vb, 55ra, and 55rb-va).Thus, for example, mammal is in act with respect to animal, of which it actualises a potentiality, and in potency with respect to feline, which in turn actualises a potentiality of mammal. The Porphyrian (see Isagoge, chs. on genus and on species) and neo-Platonic idea of potentiality as a productive capacity reinforces this interpretation. As a result, what is potential, because it is more universal, comes first and is more important than what is actual, and therefore real (In Metaph., V, tr. 2, ch. 4, fol. 193ra) – a scale of values that overturns the Aristotelian one. As is evident, the notions of act and potency are central to Paul’s ontology, since potency and act constitute the first, basic, and most universal type of composition of created beings. Every other type of composition somehow presupposes it.

If the concept of act is taken up quite faithfully from Aristotle, Paul’s concept of potency conflates the Aristotelian one with the Neoplatonic one. For this reason, the Aristotelian pre-eminence of act over potency is weakened in more than one aspect – as we have already seen. And finally, the pure potentiality of Aristotelian prime matter is read in terms of the theory of rationes seminales, and therefore as an innate disposition to receive any form. In Paul’s opinion, prime matter has in itself the “right” places to set every form, since it is like the coffer in which are contained in potency all the forms of the things that will be generated in nature. His theory combines the two Aristotelian notions of matter (that of matter as the ultimate substratum, common to all the materials of which things are made, and that of matter as a pure potentiality) with Augustine’s notion of rationes seminales, the “germinative” principles of natural species. According to Paul, with the exception of those forms directly created by God, such as celestial intelligences and human souls (see In Metaph., V, tr. 2, ch. 4, fol. 193ra), all substantial forms derive from some passive potency (defined as the capacity to undergo change) present in prime matter and really distinct from it. Such potencies are universal (so to speak), in the sense that the continuous generation of singular things to which they give rise is aimed at the maintenance in being of a specific nature. Every potency is capable of producing a form of a certain kind an infinite number of times. Hence, no natural form passes from absolute non-being to being, but from potency to act, since it has always had its own kind of existence (potentialiter et seminaliter) as a sort of disposition in prime matter. Such potencies (or dispositions) are perpetual, ingenerable, and incorruptible, coeternal with matter itself. As a consequence, according to Paul, the generation of natural forms is like a passage from an indefinite and potential being, typical of what is universal, to the full and actual existence of what is singular. In order to produce a complete thing (namely, a thing composed by matter and form) from matter, in addition to the raw material with its dispositions (or potencies), the intervention of natural agents, both singular and universal, is required. The potencies of matter, inasmuch as they order matter to the production of complete things different in species are, in a broad sense, “germinative” principles of the natural species. On the contrary, a ratio seminalis in the strictest sense of the term is that disposition, caused by an agent in a suitable material, which predisposes that material to receive a form of the same kind of the form proper to the agent itself – a disposition which is by nature capable of operating even without the natural agent. Thus the potencies of matter are like the primordial seeds of the species (that are to be produced) “sown” in the matter itself (SN, pars vi, ch. 6, fol. 96va)

According to Paul of Venice, such “germinative” principles (rationes seminales) are of three types: substantial, qualitative, and relative (SN, pars vi, ch. 7, fol. 97rb). All of them are really distinct from matter and are based on a unique passive potency (i.e., a disposition) that is identified with the essence, so to speak, of prime matter (SN, pars vi, ch. 7, fol. 97vb) – and in this reference to a sort of essence of prime matter we can see the influence of Scotism. As a consequence, this basic potency is a kind of second-order potency, since the forms it brings into being are nothing but the potencies of prime matter, which in themselves are dispositional properties. Moreover, this general potency of prime matter consists precisely in the property of being in potency with respect to any kind of form, and therefore in being able to receive all of them (ibidem). The ultimate outcome of Paul’s approach is a form of necessitarianism ex hypothesi, in that every possible object, although not necessary in itself, would nevertheless be necessary with respect to the conditions and circumstances that bring it into being, since conditions and circumstances have to produce it, if they have the capacity to do so.

Paul is aware of the particular form of necessitarianism inherent in his approach to that issue; hence, he tries to mitigate its effects, in order to safeguard the contingency of human events as well as divine freedom, and to loosen, at the level of individuals, the rigid causal chain implied by his theory of potency, act, and prime matter. In the last part of his Quaestio de universalibus, where he expounds his conception of divine exemplarism (decima conclusio) and in his commentary on the Isagoge (cap. de specie) and in that on the Categories (cap. de substantia), where he speaks of individual substances, he states that (1) the properties and dispositions proper to individuals are not precisely determined, but vary randomly within a more or less wide spectrum of possibilities whose limits are fixed by the specific form (In Metaph., IX, tr. 1, ch. 2, fol. 341vb). And, (2) although reasoning as natural philosophers we should recognise that the models according to which God created things are finite in number and correspond to the types of things that actually exist, reasoning as theologians we come to understand that God did not create all possible species, but only some of them, because divine ideas as rationes (i.e., principles of knowledge and not models for creation) are infinite in number and correspond to the purely possible, i.e., to that whose notion is not contradictory (QsU, decima conclusio, ms. Paris, BN 6433B, fol. 135ra). This means, for example, that Socrates’ height, weight, and actions are not established a priori in their individual nature or measure, and neither is Socrates’ life, but their typical form is. As a human being, Socrates’ features and behavior cannot deviate from certain physical-biological parameters and certain laws, but the concrete ways of their realisation are not given a priori and determined by his individual substance. As a whole, human beings would actualise, i.e., make real, in time (if they had endless time at their disposal) all the infinite possibilities inherent in their nature (a sort of ‘weak’ principle of plenitude applied to species only), but no human individual as such (i.e., as an individual) is obliged by nature to actualise precisely those potentialities/possibilities that he/she makes real.

In this way, Paul of Venice implicitly states two theses concerning individuals: (1) the thesis of the partial indeterminacy of their features and properties, and (2) that of the substantial unpredictability of their behavior. According to him, the only way to ascertain the presence of some potency, i.e., of a real possibility, is to ascertain its realisation, i.e., the passage to actuality. Moreover, he seems to admit the existence in individuals of potencies/possibilities that will not reach actuality – that is, of capacities that will never be developed. All men can laugh, and this potency/possibility is real even in those who have never laughed and never will (commentary on the Isagoge, cap. de proprio). Yet, we can reasonably infer the presence in a given individual of a undeveloped potency/possibility if we have previously observed its actualisation in many other individuals of the same species. What is absolutely inconceivable from this perspective is the possibility of a real novelty, i.e., a real change, in the universe. In this view, whatever effect is produced (the ‘act’) is immediately traced back to a pre-existing reality (the ‘potency’) which is not different from the effect it is intended to explain, but is, in some way, the effect itself at an incomplete stage of being. What is now real was already present in reality, but in a different way. Creation itself, as we have seen, is interpreted according to this scheme by means of the theory of divine exemplarism. In conclusion, it can be said that in a sense the world has always existed, if not in act then at least virtually (as a real and not merely logical possibility) in God’s mind and omnipotence.


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