Perceptual Experience and Concepts in Classical Indian Philosophy

First published Thu Dec 2, 2010; substantive revision Tue Jan 12, 2021

Classical Indian Philosophy accepts perception (pratyakṣa), or perceptual experience, as the primary means of knowledge (pramāṇa). Perception (pratyakṣa) is etymologically rooted in the sense-faculty or the sense-organ (akṣa) and can be translated as sensory awareness, while pramāṇa, on the other hand, is derived from knowledge (pramā) and, literally means ‘the instrument in the act of knowing’. However, the standard interpretation of perception accepted by classical Indian philosophers, barring the Buddhists and the Vedāntins, is that it is a cognition arising within the self—the knowing subject—from mental operations following a sense-object contact. It, therefore, is neither an instrument in the act of knowing, nor a mere sensory awareness. Definitions of perception from various classical Indian philosophy schools are given in section 2 below.

The same is true of concepts. There is no one agreed notion or definition of concept understood as the meaning of a general term in Classical Indian Philosophy. Rather, we have a variety of views ranging from robust realism about concepts as real properties, essences or universals to extreme nominalism which admits only of unique particulars with versions of conceptualism in between. The robust realist position is defended by the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika and Mīmāṃsā schools, the nominalist by the Buddhist schools and the conceptualist by the Vedāntins and Jainas. I will not be discussing the conceptualist position or their arguments here because ultimately this position ends up collapsing into a version of realism or nominalism.

1. Introduction

The etymology of perception in Sanskrit underlines a major and, perhaps the most controversial, issue in classical Indian epistemology, viz. is the sensory core all there is to the content of a perceptual experience? Put differently, it is asked whether the content of a perceptual experience is restricted to being unconceptualized (nirvikalpaka), or can any part of it be conceptualized (savikalpaka) as well? The Naiyāyikas generally take perception to be a two-staged process: first there arises a non-conceptual (nirvikalpaka) perception of the object and then a conceptual (savikalpaka) perception, both being valid cognitions. For Buddhists, non-conceptual perceptions alone are valid, while Grammarians (Śābdikas) deny their validity altogether. Sāṃkhya and Mīmāṃsā agree with the Nyāya position. These two realist schools, Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā, contest the Grammarian as well as the Buddhist positions. Advaita Vedānta position on perception seems to agree, in spirit, with the Buddhists, but their reasons for supporting non-conceptual perceptions alone as ultimately valid (paramārthika satta) are very different. This debate, on the role of concepts in perception, is discussed in detail in section 3.

Yet another debate about the nature of universals and concepts looms in the background of this debate. How do we know universals or concepts? The Buddhist introduce the doctrine of apoha to provide the resources for constructing concepts from sensory content to further the nominalist project of explaining thought and language in a world of particulars. In response to Buddhist nominalism, Nyāya philosophers present a defense of realism in the course of which they argue for a theory of real perceivable universals. This debate will be the focus of secion 4.

A very critical question germane to these epistemological issues is raised by the Buddhist philosopher Vasubandhu (c. 4th century CE): how do we distinguish veridical perceptions from the non-veridical ones? This is taken up in the last section.

Before we start out with the definitions, the following observation may be noted. It is true that the classical Indian philosophers were seriously concerned with the notions of enlightenment, the highest good, freedom from the cycle of rebirth and the attainment of ultimate bliss, etc. Therefore, some even question whether they were concerned with any epistemological questions at all, much less the ones raised here? But they were! For Naiyāyikas, in particular, this was a major focus: the reason offered in the early Nyāya tradition, in Vātsyāyana’s (c. 450–500 CE) commentary on the Nyāya-sūtra, is that without knowledge of objects there is no success in practical response to them. Not very enlightening, perhaps. However, a much sharper justification comes from Gaṅgeśa (c. 12th century CE), the founder of the Navya-Nyāya school, in the introduction to his great work, Jewel Of Reflection On The Truth (Tattvacintāmaṇi):

In order that discerning persons may have interest in studying the work, Akṣapāda Gautama (c. 2nd century CE) laid down the sūtra: ‘Attainment of the highest good comes from right knowledge.’.

It should not then be surprising that one of the most sophisticated classical Indian treatises dealing with perception, Kumārila’s (c. 7th century CE) Pratyakṣapariccheda (a portion of Ślokavārttika pertaining to the fourth sūtra of Mīmāṃsā-sūtra), discusses the nature and validity of perception without any consideration of its role in the ascertainment of religious and moral truth; in fact, the Mīmāṃsā-sūtra itself characterizes perception as not being a means of knowing righteousness (Dharma). It is true that epistemological debates in classical Indian philosophy arose in the religio-philosophical context; however, there is plenty of evidence on record to show that classical Indian philosophers were haunted by the very same epistemological concerns that have troubled the minds of Western philosophers through the ages. The controversial classical Indian epistemology issue—whether perception is conceptualized or not?—continues to be debated in the Western and Indian philosophy journals even today. That said, what makes this historical inquiry significant is that the epistemological issues in classical Indian philosophy are introduced against the backdrop of radically different metaphysical and ethical presuppositions.

2. Perspectives on Perception

Most classical Indian philosophical schools accept perception as the primary means of knowledge, but differ on the nature, kinds and objects of perceptual knowledge. Here we first survey Buddhist and orthodox Hindu schools’ definitions of perception (excluding Vaiśeṣika and Yoga schools since they simply take on board Nyāya and Sāṃkhya ideas, respectively) and note the issues raised by these definitions. As mentioned above, the orthodox schools generally accept both non-conceptualized (indeterminate) and conceptualized (determinate) perceptual states in sharp contrast to the Buddhist view that perception is always non-conceptualized or indeterminate awareness.

2.1 Buddhist nominalism

The oldest preserved definition of perception in the Buddhist tradition is the one by Vasubandhu (c. 4th century CE), “Perception is a cognition [that arises] from that object [which is represented therein]” (Frauwallner, 1957, p. 120). However, the more influential and much discussed view is that of later Buddhist Yogācāra philosopher Diṅnāga (c. 480–540 CE) for whom perception is simply a cognition “devoid of conceptual construction (kalpanāpodhaṃ)”. Taber (2005, p. 8) notes two important implications of this definition. First, perception is non-conceptual in nature; no seeing is seeing-as, because that necessarily involves intervention of conceptual constructs, which contaminate the pristine given. Perception is mere awareness of bare particulars without any identification or association with words for, according to Diṅnāga, such association always results in falsification of the object. Referents of the words are universals which, for the Buddhist, are not real features of the world. Second, Diṅnāga’s definition only indicates a phenomenological feature of perception; it says nothing about its origin and does not imply that it arises from the contact of a sense faculty with the object. Therefore, for the Buddhist idealist, the object that appears in perceptual cognition need not be an external physical object, but a form that arises within consciousness itself. Both these ideas led to vigorous debates in classical Indian philosophy between the Hindus and the Buddhists. The first of these ideas relates to the notion of non-conceptual perception, the second to idealism. Diṅnāga’s philosophy is idealist-nominalist in spirit and his epistemological position is in sync with the Buddhist metaphysical doctrines of no-self, evanescence of all that exists and emptiness which, expectedly, evoke strong reaction from the realist Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika and Mīmāṃsā schools.

In recent literature, there has been a scholarly debate on whether the Indian Yogācāra philosophy is a form of idealism or not. This debate is murky because there are various versions of idealism discussed in the literature in Buddhist philosophy. At least three versions have been discussed in recent literature in Buddhist philosophy: subjective idealism (the view that there are no mind-independent objects); metaphysical idealism (the view that external objects do not exist); and, epistemic idealism (the view that what we are immediately aware of is intrinsic to cognition). Lusthaus (2002) and Coseru (2012) have argued, respectively, for a “phenomenological” and “phenomenalist naturalist” interpretation of Yogācāra in opposition to the standard idealist interpretation. The main argument for the phenomenological reading is that the epistemic claims made by the Yogācāra philosophers do not commit them to ontological claims. This would avoid the charge of metaphysical idealism but is still open to being interpreted as offering an epistemic or subjective idealism. Lusthaus sees Yogācāra philosophers’ denial of solipsism and affirmation of other minds as a fatal blow to the subjective idealist interpretation of Yogācāra. Idealism does not necessitate solipsism as is made clear in Berkeley’s version of subjective idealism and Hegel’s absolute idealism which explicitly requires other minds. Thus, there is reason to think that the epistemic idealist interpretation of Yogācāra is not threatened by its commitment to other minds.

Kellner and Taber (2014) have argued that Vasubandhu’s argues for a standard metaphysical idealist position, which is to deny the existence of physical objects outside of consciousness.Kellner and Taber (2014) also present a new reason for the revival of the standard idealist reading of Yogācāra. Their argument for this reading is based on Vasubandhu’s argumentative strategy rather than the logical structure of individual proofs. They claim that in the Viṃśikā Vasubandhu uses the argument from ignorance, according to which, the absence of external objects is derived from the absence of evidence for their existence. They also note that Vasubandhu uses the same strategy to refute the existence of the self in the Abhidharmakośabhāṣya IX. The argument from ignorance seems like a bad strategy. It is often listed as a logical fallacy of the general form: since statement P is not known or proved to be true, P is false. But because the general form of the argument is bad, it does not necessarily follow that every argument of that form is unsuccessful. It may well succeed because of other features, for example the semantic meanings of the terms or when the arguments are arguments to the best explanation. Kellner and Taber emphasise that some arguments from ignorance are successful when they function as arguments to the best explanation especially in contexts where there are agreed-upon standards of verification. For example, the medical community agrees that the most accurate and sensitive test for typhoid is testing the bone marrow for Salmonella typhi bacteria. If it turns out that it cannot be proven that one has typhoid (because of the lack of Salmonella typhi bacteria in one’s bone marrow), then it is false that one has typhoid. No matter how suggestive the symptoms are, if the specific bacteria do not show up in the bone marrow within a specific time period, then one does not have typhoid. So, then, the question is: Is Vasubandhu’s argument from ignorance successful for establishing idealism? I fear not. That is because there are no universally agreed-upon criteria among Classical Indian philosophers (not even among fellow-Buddhists) as to what counts as evidence for the existence of external things.

More recently in a series of papers on Buddhist idealism, Kellner (2017a) revisits Vasubandhu’s argument from ignorance to establish the non-existence of external objects and Dharmakīrti’s objections to it. Dharmakīrti was among the first Indian logician’s to pay attention to how we can know about non-existence. Dharmakīrti is worried about the validity of arguments from ignorance in general and was the first to argue that these arguments cannot be used to establish the absence of a class of entities. He posits non-apprehension (anupalabdhi) as a special kind of reason (hetu) to prove non-existence of objects, but is careful to qualify again that non-apprehension can only prove the situationally specific absence of particular objects, it cannot prove the non-existence of an entire class of objects. Arguments from ignorance and non-apprehension cannot prove the ontological non-existence of objects. Dharmakīrti thus is only interested in supporting the weaker epistemic idealist position that external objects are imperceptible. As far as his arguments go they never establish anything beyond this conclusion. Some, for example Ratié (2014, 361) argue that Dharmakīrti does not need to add anything to this to establish the stronger metaphysical idealism. The stronger thesis follows because of his ontological principle “to be is to be causally efficacious” (arthakriyā). If external objects are completely imperceptible in that they cannt even produce the minimal effect of perceptual awareness, then they are as good as being non-existent. Kellner, however, notes that such a conclusion is excluded by Dharmakīrti’s logical theory which highlights the evidential gap between imperceptibility and non-existence. For him, absence of evidence does not equate to evidence of absence.

Dharmakīrti’s target is to show that external objects are imperceptible, any further conclusion about the existence or otherwise is totally irrelevant, only to be oursued by those interested in futile metaphysical arguments. Following Kellner (2017b) his argments for the imperceptibility of external obejcts can be divided into two groups. The first group of arguments point to defects in the realist theory of perception supported by the Hindus and fellow Buddhists. The second group focuses on positive argument against the imperceptibility of external objects based on the nature of cognition. It is this group which contains Dharmakīrti’s distinctive and novel contribution to the debate and deserve much more attention than they have received in the contemporary philosophical literature. The first group of arguments leads Dharmakīrti to conclude the self-reflexive nature of cognition. Cognition is ‘aware of itself’ and of nothing else. The second group of arguments then defends this conclusion by appeal to the nature of cognition.

Dharmakīrti begins by pointing to the well-known fact that there is incongruence between the external object and our perception of it. Visual perception, for example, is limited to certain aspects or features of the object. The external object as a whole is never visually perceived. We do not perceive cups and pots, but only its colour, shape, size and so on. So, he asks, what reason is there to cup and pots over and above visual perception of shapes, sizes and colours. This incongruence allows him to conclude that perception does not have the form of the external object or it’s form is deviant. Next he questions whether the realist commitment to causation and resemblance between the form (image, impression) and the external object establishes that perception must have external objects. Causation cannot work on its own by virtue of the well-known fact that our cognitions can and do have internal mental causes. And the notion of resemblance is too weak and vague to do any real work in indexically linking particular forms to objects in front of one’s eyes. These two negative arguments suggest the conclusion that there is no external object to be experienced by cognition. This conclusion is then supported by two further positive arguments referred to as saṃvedana-argument and the sahopalambhaniyama-inference in the literature. The saṃvedana-argument appeals to the nature of cognition as that which appears in a certain way. And this “appearing-to-in-a-certain-way” highlights the intransitive nature of cognition. Cogniton by its nature is self-illuminating, it shines forth itself. This argument is no doubt terse and can do with further explication but Dharmakīrti does not elaborate. The second argument, sahopalambhaniyama-inference is also tersely encapsulated in a single sentence in the text: “No object [is observed] without awareness, nor is an awareness observed being experienced without an object; thus they are not different” (Pratyakṣapariccheda, 390). Taber (2010, 292–3) presents a useful reconstruction of the argument. The argument draws on the logical principle of Identity of Indiscernibles: two things having exactly the same properties are identical. However, the argument at issue just points to sharing of one crucial propert: the property of being perceived at the same time. This crucial property is regarded as sufficient evidence to establish that the two things are “non-different”. Both these arguments deserve further elaboration before we can properly assess whether they are succesful in establishing the conclusion. This new literature in ceratinly a start in the right direction and opens up new research questions for contemporary philosophers.

2.2 Nyāya realism

The most comprehensive, and the most influential, definition of perception in classical Indian philosophy is offered in Gautama’s Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.4:

Perception is a cognition which arises from the contact of the sense organ and object and is not impregnated by words, is unerring, and well-ascertained.

Expectedly, each part of this definition has raised controversy and criticism. If perception is a cognition (and non-erroneous), then it is a state of knowledge, rather than a means to knowing! How does that constitute a primary means of knowledge? Some Naiyāyika commentators, Vācaspati Miśra (c. 900–980 CE) and Jayanta Bhaṭṭa (c. 9th century CE) among them, suggest that the sūtra is to be understood by adding to it the term ‘from which (yataḥ),’ since the preceding sūtra-s indicates that Gautama’s formulation of this sūtra was intended to define an instrument of knowledge. Another issue has been the interpretation of the word ‘contact’. In what sense are the eye and the ear, the sense organs for vision and auditory perception, respectively, in contact with their objects? Here a careful look at the term ‘sannikarṣa,’ generally translated as contact, helps resolve the issue; ‘Sannikarṣa’ literally means ‘drawing near,’ and can be interpreted as being in close connection with or in the vicinity of. Thus perception is that which arises out of a close connection between the sense organ and its object.

More substantial debates on the nature of perception focus on the adjectives in the latter part of the sūtra, viz., non-verbal (avyapadeśyam), non-erroneous or non-deviating (avyabhichāri), and well-ascertained or free from doubt (vyavasāyātmaka). There is some disagreement among the Naiyāyika commentators about the interpretations of the adjectives non-verbal and well-ascertained. Vātsyāyana, in his commentary on the Nyāya-sūtra, argues that the adjectives non-verbal and well-ascertained are really part of the definition; non-verbal to point out that perceptual knowledge is not associated with words (Bhartṛhari, the famous Grammarian, on the other hand, holds that awareness is necessarily constituted by words and apprehended through them) and well-ascertained to affirm that perceptual knowledge is only of a definite particular and specifically excludes situations in which the perceiver may be in doubt whether a perceived object ‘a’ is an F or a G. Vācaspati Miśra, argues that the adjective well-ascertained need not be used to exclude the so-called perception in the form of doubt, as doubtful knowledge, being invalid, is already excluded by the adjective non-erroneous. Rather, the term vyavasāyātmaka stands for determinate perceptual judgment. Thus understood, the adjectives non-verbal and determinate seem to be complementary; a piece of non-verbal perceptual knowledge cannot be said to be, at the same time, determinate. Vācaspati Miśra posits that these two adjectives indicate two different forms of perceptual cognition and are not to be regarded as its defining characteristics. According to him, Gautama included these adjectives to identify two kinds of perceptual knowledge: avyapadeśyam indicates non-conceptual or non-verbal perception and vyavasāyātmaka indicates conceptual or determinate perceptions. He contends that by the term non-verbal, Gautama refutes the Grammarian view and includes non-conceptual perception and, by the term well-ascertained, he refutes the Buddhist view and includes conceptual or judgemental perceptions as valid. Pradyot Mondal (1982) traces the history of this controversy among Naiyāyikas. He offers overwhelming scholarly evidence in favor of the view that Naiyāyikas mostly regard the adjectives as part of the definition of perception and do not agree with Vācaspati’s interpretation. For most Naiyāyikas “non-verbal” is included to deny the causal role of words in origination of perceptual cognition and, therefore, it applies to non-conceptual and conceptual perceptions both, the difference being that the former is inexpressible in language, while the latter is not. Thus Mondal claims that the adjective “non-verbal” is sufficient on its own to reject the Grammarian and the Buddhist views of perception. The Nyāya pphilosophers seek the middle ground between these positions to defend their thoroughly realist view. They argue that their is some mental shaping in almost all perceptual events, memory dispositions acquired on account of previous experiences are among the causal factors contributing to the current perception. Perceptual experience in this sense is laden with or infused by concepts. This, however, does not compromise the realism, since the concepts themselves are repeatable features of real objects and are perceptually acquired in past encounters with these features. For perception to be a source of knowledge it must be concept-laden, such that it is verbalizable and determinate (Phillips, 2019). The exact role of concepts in perception—in dispute in the Nyāya/Buddhist debate—will be discussed in the next section.

The early Naiyāyikas held that perception is determinate, but under pressure from the the Buddhists opponents Vācaspati Miśra (in about the 10century AD) conceeds that there is also concept-free indeterminate perception. In his commenatry on the Nyāyasutra 1.1.4, Vācaspati interprets the qualifiers non-verbal (avyapadeśyam) and well-ascertained or free from doubt (vyavasāyātmaka) as indicating two types of perception: indeterminate and determinate. Indeterminate perception is thus conceived as the first stage of sensory processing without any mental shaping. The indeterminate sensory percept generated at this stage is then classified by the mind resulting in a determinate perception of a whole object qualified by its parts (or features). This idea is later taken up by the Navya-Naiyāyika Gaṅgeśa, according to whom, indeterminate perception is indispensable for explaining how our concepts originate in reality. Determinate perception of a thing as qualified by its features, e.g., That’s a cow, requires a prior grasp of the qualifier ‘cowness’. The usual explanation will turn to memory dispositions acquired by previous encounters with cow. This explanation however cannot be extended to a child’s perception of a cow for the first time. In the first instance, Gaṅgeśa claims, the ‘cowness’ is grasped indeterminately in that cowness is grasped but not as related to a particular cow.

Gaṅgeśa also objects to the notion ‘sensory connection’ in the classical Nyāyasutra definition of perception, arguing that this makes the definition too wide and too narrow at the same time: too wide because it implies that every awareness is perceptual being produced by virtue of a connection with the ‘inner’ sense faculty or mind (manas); too narrow because it fails to include divine perception, which involves no sensory connection. Gaṅgeśa offers a simpler definition of perception as an awareness which has no other awareness as its chief instrumental cause. Being concerned that his definition may be interpreted as ruling out conceptualized or determinate perception that may have non-conceptual or indeterminate perception as one of it causes, he argues that indeterminate perception can never be the chief instrumental cause of determinate perception, although it is a cause, since it supplies the qualifier or the concept for determinate perception. This simpler definition has other problems. Perception is a source of knowledge so Gaṅgeśa must explain how this definition rules out non-veridical perceptions. So, he spends the longest Section in the Chapter on Perception in his Tattvacintāmaṇi Jewel of Reflection on the Truth about Epistemology on giving a general account of illusion as “appearance of something other than it is”.

2.3 Mīmāṃsā realism

The Purva Mīmāṃsā-sūtra (MS) were originally composed by Jamini around 200 BCE. The fourth MS 1.1.4 says:

The arising of a cognition when there is a connection of the sense faculties of a person with an existing (sat) object—that (tat) is perception; it is not the basis of the knowledge of Dharma, because it is the apprehension of that which is present. (Taber, 2005:44)

There is no consensus among Mīmāṃsā commentators on whether this is intended as a definition of perception, even while an initial reading of it suggests that it may be. Kumārila, the noted Mīmāṃsā commentator argues that the first part of the sūtra is not intended as a definition because of the context in which it figures; the sūtra-s preceding it are concerned with an inquiry into righteousness (Dharma). Moreover, the sūtra construed as a definition of perception, results in too wide, and not too accurate, a definition, because it only says that perception arises from a connection between the sense faculty and an existing object and does not exclude perceptual error or inferential cognition. Taber (2005, 16), on the other hand, suggests that it is possible to construe MS 1.1.4 as a valid definition, and indeed such a construal was proposed by an earlier commentator, the so-called Vṛttikāra quoted at length by Śābara in his Śābarabhāṣyam. This, the most extensive commentary on the Mīmāṃsā-sūtra, suggests that the words of the sūtra (tat = ‘that’ and sat = ‘existing’) be switched around for a different reading for the first part of the sūtra, which would then state that, “a cognition that results from connection of the sense faculties of a person with that (tat) [same object that appears in the cognition] is true (sat) perception”. This switch rules out perceptual error and inference; both these present objects other than those that are the cause of the perception.

2.4 Sāṃkhya definition

In the oldest Sāṃkhya tradition, perception is the functioning of a sense organ. This is clearly inadequate, as the ancient skeptic Jayarāśi Bhaṭṭa (c. 8th century CE) is quick to point out. Perception in this sense cannot be a means of knowledge (pramāṇa) as it does not distinguish between proper and improper functioning of sense organs and, therefore, between valid and erroneous perceptions. A more sophisticated definition is later devised wherein perception is “an ascertainment [of buddhi or intellect] in regard to a sense faculty (Sāṃkhyakārikā 5 in Yuktīdipikā)”. This implies that perception is a modification of the intellect in the form of selective ascertainment of an object, brought about by the activity or functioning of a sense faculty. In some respects, this characterization of perception as an “ascertainment” of the intellect neatly captures the idea that perception, being an instrument of knowledge, is the primary means of knowledge. Ascertainment residing in the intellect is regarded as the instrument of perception, while residing in the self it is regarded as the result of the process of perception. Furthermore, the Sāṃkhyakārikā states that the function of the senses with regard to the objects is “a mere seeing” (Sāṃkhyakārikā, 28b), and the function of the intellect, referred to as ascertainment, can be thought of as “identification” of the object as in “this is a cow”, etc. (Sāṃkhyakārikā 5ab). This suggests a two-stage process: first the functioning of the sense faculty results in “mere seeing” of the object (non-conceptualized awareness) and, later this mere seeing is acted upon by the intellect or mind and results in a conceptual identification of the object. This two-stage process is very similar to the detailed account of conceptual (savikalpaka) perception offered by the Mīmāṃsakas and the Naiyāyikas.

2.5 Advaita Vedānta: direct knowledge

According to Advaita Vedānta the defining characteristic of perception is the directness of knowledge acquired through perception (Bilimoria, 1980:35). In highlighting the directness of the perceptual process, the Advaitin differs from Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā proponents for whom the contact of the sense faculty with its object is central to the perceptual process. Vedānta Paribhāṣā (ed. 1972: 30) cites pleasure and pain as instances of perception that are directly intuited without any sense object contact. For the Advaitin perception is simply the immediacy of consciousness; knowledge not mediated by any instrument (Gupta et. al., 1991, p. 40). It is worth noting that this definition is very close to that accepted by Navya-Naiyāyikas. Like the latter, the Advaitins regard the role of the sensory connection as accidental, rather than essential, to the perceptual process. The Neo-Advaitins accept the distinction between conceptual or determinate perception (they refer to it as viṣayagata pratyakṣa) and non-conceptual or indeterminate perception (nirvikaplapka pratyakṣa), but do not think of non-conceptual perception as simply a prior stage of conceptualized perception, as other Hindu schools do.

3. Nirvikalpaka and Savikalpaka Pratyakṣa

The Sanskrit term kalpanā is variously translated as imagination or conceptual construction and is meant to be the source of ‘vikalpa’, roughly translated as concepts, but which may stand for anything that the mind adds to the ‘given’. The time-honored differentiation of perception into conception-free perception (nir-vikalpa pratyakṣa) and conception-loaded perception (sa-vikalpa pratyakṣa) is made on the basis of concepts (vikalpa) (Matilal, 1986: 313).

3.1 The basis of Buddhist nominalism

The distinction between non-conceptual and conceptual was first drawn by Diṅnāga who contended that all perception is non-conceptual because what constitutes seeing things as they really are must be free from any conceptual construction. The claim is that a verbal report of proper perception is strictly impossible, for such a report requires conceptualization, which is not perceptual in character; the objects of conceptual awareness are spontaneous constructions of our mind and are essentially linguistic in character. On the other hand, what is seen, ‘the given’, does not carry a word or a name as its label and neither is such a label grasped along with the object, nor inherent in it, nor even produced by it; objects-as-such, the real particulars (svalakṣaṇas), do not, as Quine would say, wear their names on their sleeves. Furthermore, the sense faculty cannot grasp a concept or a name; if I have never smelt garlic before I first encounter it, I cannot smell it as garlic, though I can smell IT; an olfactory awareness can only grasp a smell present in the olfactory field. The Buddhists argue that a perceiver apprehends only the real particulars, arbitrarily imposes concepts/words on them and believes, mistakenly, that these are really there in the objects and integral to them. The conceptual awareness conceals its own imaginative quality and, because it results directly from experience, the perceiver takes it to be a perceptual experience. The perceiver fails to notice that imagination is involved and mistakenly thinks that he really perceives the constructed world. From the Buddhists standpoint, therefore, a perceiver can only perceive real particulars so that any perceptual experience is always and only at the non-conceptual level.

3.2 The development of Hindu realism: the Nyāya mission

The Nyāya view evolves in response to Buddhist account of perception. They regard perception as a cognitive episode triggered by causal interaction between a sense faculty and an object. This interaction first results in a sensory impression, nothing more than mere physiological change. This preliminary awareness, non-conceptual perception, is a necessary first step in the process of perception and is invariably followed by a structured awareness leading to conceptual perception. A cognition that is independent of preliminary sensory awareness cannot result in a perceptual judgment. The first awareness does not destroy the perceptual character of the second; rather, it facilitates this subsequent awareness. Non-conceptual perception is an indispensable causal factor for generation of conceptual perception, although memory, concepts and collateral information may also be required. It is important to note that the Nyāya notion of vikalpa (in their distinction of nir-vikalpa and sa-vikalpa) is different from that of the Buddhists. Unlike the latter, the Naiyāyikas do not think of vikalpa-s as mental creations or imaginative constructions but as objectively real properties and features of objects. Vikalpa in this sense indicates the operation of judging and synthesizing rather than imagining or constructing. Thus conceptual perceptions truly represent the structure of reality. Of the five types of concepts (vikalpa-s) recognized by the Buddhists, viz. nāma (word), jāti (universal), guṇa (quality), kriyā (action) and dravya (substance), the Naiyāyikas, regard all but the first vikalpa as categories of reality (Mondal, 1982, p. 364). Unlike the Grammarians, the Nyāya schools do not accept the objective reality of words; words are not inherent to the object presented in perception. Rather, the Naiyāyikas hold that the relation between word and object is created by convention in a linguistic community. Although a concept is associated with a word (nāma-vikalpa) by means of a convention, it is not merely a fabrication. For example, when someone brings garlic clove near my nose and teaches me by pointing to it that it is called garlic, then subsequently confronted with the garlicky odor and a similar clove, I can see it and smell it as garlic. Thus perceptual awareness includes knowledge of words but, insofar as it is perceptual awareness, it is brought about by sensory contact with the object and, its properties which exists independently of words.

The Buddhists reject this argument on the basis that the conventional meaning of a word relates the word with the concept or the universal. Universals or concepts cannot be objects of our perception; they cannot be sensed. Universals, attributes and concepts are theoretical constructs for the Buddhists; what is sensed is the actual object, the exclusive particular, the ultimate existent. The Buddhists offer two arguments in favor of the claim that only particulars are real. First, knowledge by means of words or verbal testimony is very different from perceptual knowledge, for what we are aware of when we hear the words “garlic is pungent” is very different from what we are phenomenologically aware of when we smell garlic; words do not denote or stand-in for actual objects and can be uttered in the absence of any objects, but perception cannot arise in the absence of objects. Second, the particulars are real or existent because they have causal efficacy (arthakriyāsāmarthya). Only particular real garlic can flavor one’s food or ruin it, but the universal garlichood cannot do any of these; in this sense, only the particulars are real for they fulfill the purposes (artha) of humans.

The foregoing discussion shows that the epistemological debate between the Buddhists and the Naiyāyikas regarding the nature of perception rests on, and brings to the fore, their metaphysical disagreement about the nature of universals. The Naiyāyikas are realists about universals; universals are objective features of the world that impress themselves upon minds; they are not mere figments of our imagination. The Naiyāyikas hold that particulars are qualified propertied wholes and we directly perceive them as they are, without any kind of manipulation or imposition; we do not impose universals on property-less real particulars, rather we find stable, durable, relational wholes in reality that do not require any imposition or manipulation. They argue that there is no evidence of a world of bare particulars, as claimed by the Buddhists. Therefore conceptual or determinate perception does not involve distortion of reality; rather it presents things as they really are. To see a piece of sandalwood as it really is, we do not need to see the sandalwood as a colorless, odorless pure particular; indeed, since the piece of sandalwood is really brown and really fragrant, to see it as a propertied whole is to see it as it really is.

The idea that the world consists of propertied particulars seems to put pressure on the notion of non-conceptual perception. If there are no indeterminate particulars, what is the object of indeterminate perception? Indeed some Navya-Nyāya thinkers hold that the raw data of perception (‘real particulars’ in the Buddhists sense) is too inchoate and elusive to count as objects of knowledge. Recently, Arindam Chakrabarti (2000), a prominent contemporary Navya-Nyāya thinker offered seven reasons for altogether eliminating non-conceptual, or immaculate perceptions as he calls them, from Nyāya epistemology in an attempt to understand the “deeper relation between direct realism and concept-enriched perception”. Chakrabarti’s skepticism about non-conceptual perception as a cognitive state stems from the fact that we cannot assign an intentional role to the object of indeterminate perception because the object of non-conceptual perception is incapable of being apperceived or directly intuited in any fashion. Chakrabarti’s gauntlet has been picked by several Nyāya enthusiasts (Phillips, 2001 and 2004; Chadha, 2001, 2004 and 2006) and defenders of Buddhist doctrine (Siderits, 2004). This debate brings to the fore an important feature of non-conceptual perception first highlighted by Gaṅgeśa, suggesting that while there is no direct, apperceptive evidence for non-conceptual perception, it is posited as the best explanation for the availability of the qualifier (property, feature), since the cognizing subject is not immediately aware of the object of non-conceptual perception. Phillips (2001: 105) presents Gaṅgeśa’s argument for the inclusion of non-conceptual perception as an essential part of Nyāya epistemology:

…it [nirvikalpa pratyakṣa] is posited by the force of the following inference as the first step of a two step argument. “The perceptual cognition ‘A cow’ (for example) is generated by a cognition of the qualifier, since it is a cognition of an entity as qualified (by that qualifier appearing) like an inference”. The second step takes a person’s first perception of an individual (Bessie, let us say) as a cow (i.e., as having some such property) as the perceptual cognition figuring as the inference’s subject (pakśa) such that the cognizer’s memory not informed by previous cow experience could not possibly provide the qualifier cowhood. The qualifier has to be available, and the best candidate seems to be its perception in the raw, a qualifier (cowhood), that is to say, not (as some are wont to misinterpret the point) as divorced from its qualificandum (Bessie) but rather as neither divorced nor joined, and, furthermore, not as qualified by another qualifier (such as being-a-heifer) but rather just the plain, unadorned entity. In the particular example, the entity is the universal, cowhood, or being-a-cow, although, again, it would not be grasped as a universal. Or as anything except itself.

The Navya-Nyāya notion of non-conceptual perception differs from that of the Buddhists in many respects, two of which are very important. First, according to Navya-Naiyāyikas, there is no apperceptive evidence for non-conceptual perception, unlike the Buddhists who contend that conception-free awareness is necessarily self-aware. The Navya-Naiyāyikas, as is obvious from the quote above, emphasize that the evidence for a non-conceptual sensory grasp of universals comes in the form of an inference. Second, according to Navya-Nyāya, the object of non-conceptual perception is a qualifier (concept), although not given as that in the first instance, but not a bare particular as the Buddhists hypothesize. It is, as the above quote explains, posited by the force of an inference; the ‘bare object’ of non-conceptual perception becomes the qualifier in a resultant determinate perception. While this does not satisfactorily address Chakrabarti’s concern that lack of apperceptive evidence implies that the subject cannot assign an intentional role to the object of non-conceptual perception, Chadha (2006) argues that the subject’s not being in a position to assign an intentional role to the object of non-conceptual perception is no hindrance to the intentionality of non-conceptual perception itself. Non-conceptual perception is awareness of a “non-particular individual” (Chakrabarti, 1995) and can be assigned the intentional role of a qualifier in virtue of the recognitional abilities acquired by the subject on the basis of the perceptual episode. The subject sees a non-particular individual but, since there is no apperceptive or conscious awareness, the subject does not see it as an instance of a universal or a qualifier. Chadha explicates Gaṅgeśa’s insight that a qualifier is given as a non-particular individual, neither divorced from nor joined to the qualificandum and, therefore it is wrong to suggest that lack of apperceptive evidence implies that non-conceptual perception is not an intentional perceptual state.

More recently, Chaturvedi (2020) analyses counter-arguments against Gaṅgeśa’s defense of non-conceptual perception offered by the sixteenth century Dvāita Vedanta scholar Vyāsatīrtha. Chaturvedi argues that Vyāsatīrtha’s objection undermine Gaṅgeśa’s main inferential proof of non-conceptual perception to show that it has a necessary role to play in generating concept-laden determinate perception. In addition, Vyāsatīrtha’s questions the internal consistency of Gaṅgeśa’s that the contents of indeterminate perception is not available for introspection. Despite all the problems pointed out by the Vedantin, Chaturvedi argues that there is still hope to reconstruct Gaṅgeśa’s account of indeterminate perception with some help from recent empirical science can help to restore the overall plausibility of the view.

3.3 The Mīmāṃsā advance in realism

Kumārila argued against the Buddhist position to show that perception is not always devoid of concepts. In Pratyakṣapariccheda, he principally targets Diṅnāga’s theory, while simultaneously addressing some of Dharmakīrti’s ideas and arguments. Kumārila, like Naiyāyikas, holds both the two kinds of perception as valid. For him the initial non-conceptualized perception is borne of the undifferentiated pure object (śuddhavastu) and is comparable to the perception of an infant and others who lack a language. The ‘pure object’ is the substratum for the generic and specific features of the object, but the subject is not distinctly aware of any of these and simply cognizes the object as an indeterminate particular, as “this” or “something”. Although Kumārila agrees with the Buddhists that the object of immediate perception is inexpressible in language, he maintains that it is different, in at least one respect, from the real particular (svalakṣaṇa) of the Buddhists; the latter being a structure-less unitary whole, whereas the former is non-unitary and grasps both the particular and the universal aspects of the object. Otherwise, Kumārila argues, it could not give rise to conceptual awareness, which explicitly identifies such features. Diṅnāga’s counterpoint to this is that conceptual awareness at second stage cannot be a perception, since it involves application of concepts and words which, in turn, requires memory. If we admit conceptual awareness as perception, we are forced to accept that a sense faculty is capable of remembering (since perception is a cognition brought about by the functioning of the sense faculty) but that cannot be the case because a sense faculty, being a mere instrument of cognition, is in itself unconscious and cannot remember anything. Kumārila admits that conceptual awareness is aided by memory and concepts, but argues that that does not rob it of its perceptual character for the sense faculty is still functioning while in contact with the very same object. He further suggests that we should not expect a perceptual cognition to arise as soon as there is contact between a sense faculty and its object. He uses the analogy of entering a dimly lit room after walking in the blazing sun; even though the contents of the room are directly available to the sense faculties of the subject who has just walked in, he does not immediately apprehend the objects in front of him. However, the subject may become distinctly aware of the objects in the room and their features in the following moments. The perceptual character of the latter awareness is maintained so long as the connection between the sense faculty and the object is intact, even when other conceptual awarenesses or memories intervene between the initial contact with the object and the subsequent awareness. A conceptual awareness can be referred to as a perception even though the mind, qua memory, is involved because the functioning of the sense faculty is the factor responsible for arising of the awareness. Furthermore, he insists that the mind must be involved in all perceptions since it functions as a link between the sense faculty and the self; the sense faculty is turned on or activated by a connection with the self and, the self as the subject of knowledge is involved in all cognitions. He points out that even Buddhists do not deny this, since they hold that self-reflexive awareness accompanies every cognition. He contends that the Buddhists are wrong to insist that only a cognition arising directly from the functioning of a sense faculty is perception; they agree that we perceive inner states, e.g., pleasure and pain, and if the mind is accepted as the operative sense faculty in the self-reflexive awareness of such cognitions, it follows that they should admit that the mind is also the sense faculty that gives rise to conceptualized cognitions. He, however, clarifies that not every cognition that follows a contact between a sense faculty and an object is a perception, for if one were to open one’s eyes momentarily (in the above analogy) and construct a judgment such as “that was table” with eyes closed again, it would not be a perceptual cognition since it solely depends on the memory of a fleeting sensory contact.

Later, Dharmakīrti, using a methodology very different (and akin to proof by contradiction) from his predecessor Diṅnāga, raises new problems for the Nyāya-Mīmāṃsā view. Assuming, he says, for the sake of the argument, that universals are real. Then the judgments “This is a cow,” “It is an animal,” relate two distinct entities, namely a particular (or object) and a universal (or concept) arguably via a non-relational tie as in being substratum and superstratum, with the proviso that the substratum object has the power to let the universal reside in it. This leads to all the universals (such as cowness, animalhood, etc) then being tied to the object by this simple and single power. In such a scenario, any perceptual judgment involving the universal cowhood as in the case of “This is a cow” makes subsequent judgments “This is an animal,” “This is a substance,” etc., superfluous. For, if one perceives an object along with its power to let any one universal reside in it, one must be able to perceive its power to attract all other universals that reside in it. Thus, there would be no distinction between “This is a cow” and “This is a substance”; clearly an unacceptable thesis. Matilal (1986, 326) notes two points in connection with this argument. First, Dharmakīrti assumes that an object, or a unique particular, is perceived in its entirety and no part of it is left unperceived. Second, the realist has objectified all the universals including the relation-universal. If, as the realist believes, the object of perception—the particular—has the power to accommodate all universals in it, then the onus is on him to show why only a single universal manifests itself in a perceptual judgment. This concern is pertinent, especially against the Nyāya philosophers who admit only one single relation-universal: inherence, which supposedly unites all nesting universals with the object. The Naiyāyikas readily respond to this argument by pointing out that the redundancy objection rests on Dharmakirti’s assumption that an object is grasped in its entirety in perception. This assumption is false; perception is perspectival, we never see all sides of an ordinary three-dimensional object, but we still see it.

Furthermore, Dharmakīrti’s argues that conceptual or judgmental awareness is phenomenologically distinct from non-conceptual awareness. In the latter we are confronted with the object of perception which is vivid and immediate, while in the former no object is present. In the judgment “this is a cow”, even the ‘subject’ of the judgment does not refer to the object of perception, since words do not refer to perceived particulars but to universals which extend across space and time. Dharmakīrti admits that the words we apply to things have some objective basis in those things; we call something a cow because it has a certain effect, it gives milk, is gentle, or it calls forth a certain cognition, etc. This effect, in turn, inclines us to associate the word ‘cow’ with other things that have the same effect and we do that by jointly dissociating them from things that lack that effect. Universals, according to the Buddhists are arbitrarily constructed “exclusions” (apoha); words serve the purpose of separating things off from other objects. For example, the word ‘cow’ singles out a class of things by excluding them from things they are not, all things assembled together under the concept ‘cow’ are distinct from each other and do not share a single nature that the word ‘cow’ names. A conceptual awareness insofar as it imputes a word to a particular object and, therefore a universal nature it shares with all others of the same universal-kind, essentially falsifies the object. Kumārila objects to the Buddhists theory of universals (apoha) on the grounds that it is counterintuitive and circular. The theory of universals (apoha) contradicts our intuition that meaning of a positive word is positive; there is nothing negative about the word ‘cow’. A negative entity can be the meaning of a word only where something is negated. Moreover, if we accept that understanding x requires eliminating non-x, then in turn we presuppose knowledge of non-x, which entails an understanding of non-non-x, and so on (Drefyus, 1997, 215). The Mīmāṃsakas also take on board the concerns raised by the Naiyāyika philosopher Uddyotakara (c. 7th century CE), who questions the theory of exclusions on the specific grounds that it fails to offer an adequate theory of reference and relation between concepts and reality. He argues if the word ‘cow’ primarily designates a negative entity, either this entity is a cow in disguise or is different from a cow. If it is a cow in disguise then the Buddhist view of universals is no different from the Nyāya common sense realism that words are used to single out phenomena in the world. If the negative entity is different from a cow, then the word ‘cow’ does not refer to real cows, making it difficult to explain how any word can refer to real objects or classes thereof. This last point begs the question because the Buddhist denies that words refer to the objects in the real world. For him words refer to universals, and that is precisely what the world does not contain. The onus is put back on the realists to show that universals, which serve as meanings of words, are real properties of objects rather than imagined or mentally constructed features. This challenge is taken up by the Naiyāyikas and their position against the nominalist stand of both the Buddhists and the Grammarians is presented later below.

3.4 The Śābdika (Grammarian) nominalism and realist objections

Bhartṛhari, the most notable Grammarian, highlights the intimate relation between language, thought, and knowledge. Two aspects of his theory have important implications for the nature of perceptual experience. First, there is no non-linguistic cognition in the world; all knowledge appears permeated by words. Though Bhartṛhari’s theory may leave room for extraordinary, or other-worldly, cognitions, there is no scope for pure non-conceptualized perception in this world. The essence of his theory is: words do not designate objects in the external world directly, but through the intervention of universals, which are inherent in words. Thus universals constitute the basis of our knowledge of the external world, since they are intimately connected with language and mind on the one hand, and the world on the other. Given this, the Grammarians question the very possibility of non-conceptual perception? The second aspect is underscored by Kumārila who ascribes the so-called Superimposition Theory to Bhartṛhari (Taber, 2005, 27), according to which, a word has its “own form” superimposed upon its meaning. This has implications for determinate conceptual perception, which (for the pluralists and direct realists of Mīmāṃsā and Nyāya persuasions) arises purely out of the object itself and involves discrimination and determination of its nature.

Bhartṛhari’s argument can be thought of as an attack, on the adjective ‘non-verbal’ (avyapadeśyam) in the Nyāya definition of perception, aimed at their belief that for cognitive comprehension language is an inessential detail. For him, bare sense-impressions cannot count as awarenesses because they are nor effective enough, nothing is accomplished by them and, they do not result in appreciable mental activity. Bhartṛhari gives an example: a man walking along a village path to approach his house would invariably touch some grass on the road, and in some sense this would be tactile awareness at a pre-linguistic level (Vākyapadīya, Ch.1, verse 123). But this would not count as an awareness unless combined with the further ability to sort it out or verbalize it; consciousness cannot reveal an object to us unless we discriminate it, and the process of discrimination requires verbalization. What about a baby’s awareness, or that of a mute person, asks Vātsyāyana? Bhartṛhari points out that a baby’s sensations or a mute person’s awarenesses may still count as cognitive because they are linguistically potent. A pre-linguistic state of an infant can be cognitive if and only if it has speech potency, which is the cause of verbal language. So also, in the non-conceptual perceptual awareness (in adults and even some animals) speech-potency is latent; it is an essential trait of human consciousness and the defining characteristic of cognitive awareness (Vākyapadīya, Ch.1, verse 126). All knowledge of what is to be done in this world depends on speech-potential; even an infant has such knowledge due to residual traces from previous births (Vākyapadīya, Ch.1, verse 121). The initial sensory awareness of external objects which does not grasp any special features of them, nonetheless illuminates them in a non-specific manner as mere things by such expressions as ‘this’ or ‘that’ (Bhartṛhari; 123 and 124). Thus, insofar as the initial sensation is an awareness, it can be verbalized. The following analogy is offered as an argument for positing the presence of speech-seed (verbal disposition, as some modern philosophers call it) in pre-linguistic awareness: think about the experience of trying, but failing, to remember a verse heard before. Bhartṛhari claims that the entire verse exists in the cognitive faculty as speech-potency but because of lack of other contributory factors there is no verbalization. Similarly, a non-linguistic experience of a mute-person is an awareness because of the presence of verbal disposition or speech-seed even though there is no actualization of speech. There are no non-conceptual perceptions, because ordinary objects are not given to us without a concept (vikalpa) or some mode of presentation; verbalization makes the concept explicit. There are infinite concepts associated with an object, none integral to it. However, we always perceive an object in a concept as an instantiation of a universal; it is a cow, white, bovine, four-legged, etc. The point to note is that concepts or universals (vikalpa-s) are word-generated and superimposed on the objects; there are no ‘thing-universals’ or real universals over and above these. Bhartṛhari’s defends linguistic nominalism, according to which, words are the only universals that exist; thing-universals are word-generated illusions. As Matilal remarks, for Bhartṛhari there is not much of a distinction between words and concepts, they are two sides of the same coin (Matilal, 1986, 396).

Naiyāyikas and Mīmāṃsakas, the common sense realists, raise specific objections to the Grammarian view on the grounds that it is not borne by experience. We have separate awarenesses of words and universals. While we may not perceive something as a cow prior to acquiring the word ‘cow,’ we are surely aware of cowness before we acquire the linguistic expression, just as we are aware of and can discriminate shades of red even before we acquire the names of some of those shades. A non-conceptual awareness of the object is implied by the subsequent occurrence of a conceptual awareness with determinate content. Kumārila also points to other phenomena which indicate that the awareness of the meaning of a word (the object) is independent and distinct from the word itself. Furthermore, awareness of the meaning and that of the word are usually different kinds of representations; there is no possibility of confusing or conflating these. Kumārila brings to attention linguistic phenomena that reinforce the point that words and meanings must be distinct representations, e.g., homonymy, synonymy, categorizing and recognizing grammatical parts of speech, etc. The ability to distinguish and discriminate types is perhaps enhanced by knowledge of language and concepts, but is not completely dependent on it. Those who are not trained in music can certainly hear the difference between distinct notes, even though they are unable to identify them by name. Vātsyāyana also appeals to the ordinary experience of people who are conversant with words. Ordinarily, words are apprehended as names of objects. The knowledge of the word-object association comes after the perceptual knowledge derived through sense-object contact. Such contact results in a perceptual awareness which, in turn, provides the occasion for recalling the appropriate word, if indeed the appropriate word exists in the experiencer’s linguistic repertoire. Perceptual knowledge is antecedent to verbal knowledge and cannot owe its existence to words. Vācaspati Miśra specifically objects to Bhartṛhari’s claim that infants and adults who lack a language perceive objects by memory impressions of their names from previous births. Objects are vividly and clearly given to us in perception, but the memory-impressions of previous births are at best vague and indistinct. Vācaspati Miśra asks, “How can such a vague and unclear thing be identified with a clear and distinct perception?” (Nyāyavārttikatātparyaṭīkā, 127). His other argument against Bhartṛhari is the obvious point that words do not necessarily refer to their objects, for example words in quotation marks do not refer to objects, only to themselves. Moreover, if the word and its denotation were identical, a blind man would grasp red or redness when he grasps the word ‘red’ and a deaf person would grasp the word ‘red’ when he grasps a red thing (Nyāyavārttikatātparyaṭīkā, 129).

The Naiyāyikas also have a general response to nominalists—Buddhists as well as Grammarians. They posit monadic universals that correspond to natural and metaphysical kinds and one dyadic universal, viz. inherence. The main nominalist objection is that once we accept real universals in our ontology we risk overpopulating the world with entities corresponding to every expression that designates a property. For example, if we accept horsehood and cowhood as universals, we also need to accept universalhood as another universal. The Naiyāyikas propose that not every expression which designates a property generates an objective universal (jāti); some property-expressions correspond to subjectively constructed categories (upādhi), which though useful for analysis, are not ontologically real. Uddyotakara argues that to correspond to a real universal a general term must meet two conditions: (i) a general term should be based on a ground, which accounts for the common awareness of a number of different objects, that makes the application of the term possible, and (ii) that ground should be a simple (non-compound), unitary property or entity that cannot be analyzed or explained away otherwise (Commentary on Nyāya-sūtra, 2.2.65). Universalhood is a bogus universal; it violates the second condition. There is no simple basis or ground for universalhood as opposed to universals such as cowhood and horsehood; the ground of being one-in-many can be analyzed in terms of inherence. The same applies to universals like ‘barefooted’, ‘cook’, ‘reader’ etc.; the basis for their application is presence of compound features such as bare feet, etc. However, this stratagem forces the Naiyāyikas to admit that many general terms designate bogus universals and, consequently, they start succumbing to the nominalist pressure. Matilal (1986, 420–421) notes that there is another way in which it happens to Navya-Nyāya: A real universal must partake of the nature of ‘one-in-many’. The Navya-Naiyāyika, Udayana (c. 10th century CE), lists a third necessary condition for disqualifying a property from being regarded as a real universal. Under this condition, an abstract property that belongs only to one individual is also a bogus universal even though it is simple and unanalyzable; skyness in the sky is bogus because it is only a nominal attribute. However, since both cowhood and skyness are simple properties, they are grasped as such in perception without further qualification. In this sense, Naiyāyikas maintain that some real universals are directly perceptible. When we see a cow, we do not necessarily see ‘it’ as a ‘cow’, the cow and the cowness are not given as separate entities in our awareness, rather they appear fused. This leads to the peculiar Nyāya view that real universals and basic properties are grasped in our awareness as ‘epistemic firsts’ or ultimates (Matilal, 1986, 421). Gaṅgeśa calls such perception, in which universals are grasped as such, non-conceptual (nirvikalpaka) perception.

3.5 The Advaita Vedānta: a compromise on Hindu realism

The Advaita Vedānta theory compromises on the realism of earlier classical Hindu philosophy. Their early view on perception is akin to the Buddhists, although arrived at from a different perspective. Maṇḍana Miśra says:

Perception is first, without mental construction, and has for its object the bare thing. The constructive cognitions which follow it plunge into particulars. (Brahma-Siddhi, 71.1-2)

He draws a distinction between perceptual cognition and constructive cognition, but is careful to use vikalpa-buddhi, rather than savikalpaka pratyakṣa, for the latter cognition. For him perception is always non-conceptual (nirvikalpaka) perception and it is of a universal, indeed of the highest universal, Being (sat). According to early Vedāntins, the real is bereft of all character since its nature is non-differentiated consciousness or Brahman. Therefore, perceptual cognition, which presents the real, must be non-conceptual or indeterminate for it is the knowledge of the existence of a thing without any qualifications or predications. Maṇḍana Miśra also denies the thesis that non-conceptual (nirvikalpaka) perception is non-verbal. This surprising claim is clearly owed to Bhartṛhari’s influence, as is evidenced by the example used by Maṇḍana Miśra in the argument. Confronted by an opponent with the claim that verbal knowledge involves duality and relation, and therefore must involve concepts, Maṇḍana Miśra replies that verbal knowledge is not necessarily relational: a baby’s non-verbal knowledge of its mother’s breast, grasps it merely as ‘this’ (of course we do not assume that the baby articulates the word ‘this’; the word, as in Bhartṛhari’s account, has a more subtle form in the baby’s mind) and, therefore, the highest knowledge of the Ultimate reality (Brahman) in which there is no duality, no relations, no concepts, may still be verbal.

Neo Advaita-Vedāntins, however, accept a distinction between non-conceptual (nirvikalpaka) perception and conceptual (nirvikalpaka) perceptions from empirical or practical (vyāvahārika) standpoint; from ultimate (paramārthika) standpoint such distinction is untenable. A brief description of conceptual (viṣayagata, Advaita-Vedānta term for savikalpaka) perception will help put in perspective Applebaum’s (1982) reconstruction of their notion of non-conceptual (nirvikalpaka) perception later. Determinate perception is the result of the activity of mind (manas) or antaḥkaraṇa (literally translated as ‘inner vehicle’)—the terms are frequently used interchangeably. Advaitins maintain that the mind (antaḥkaraṇa) ‘goes out’ through the respective sense organ (the eye, say) and pervades the object of attention. As a result of this contact, the object presents itself as data to the receptive mind (antaḥkaraṇa) which, in turn, transforms into mental state (vṛtti) (Bilimoria, 1980, 38). As soon as the data are presented to inner faculty, there is an identification of consciousness associated with the mental state (antaḥkaraṇa-vṛtti) with the consciousness associated with the object. To say that vṛtti and data are identified is to say that the form of the mental state, if all goes well, corresponds one-to-one with the form of the object; the mental state is a reflection of the object of perception, and as such is non-different from the object. Thus results a determinate judgment (vṛttijñāna) of the form “this is a jar”. Furthermore, according to them, we do not perceive our mental states; we directly perceive the objects themselves. Bilimora explains,

The vṛtti in the form of the object impresses itself as it were in the mode of the subject itself, and thereby comes to be apprehended, but as a predicate—and not as the pure subject-content which is the ‘I-notion’—in the subject’s apperception. (Bilimoria, 1980, 41)

The initial mental state subsides and the subject becomes directly aware of the object itself; the cognition is self-evident to the subject, just like the cognition of pleasure and pain. In this reflective stage, the mind (antaḥkaraṇa) integrates the mental contents corresponding to the object with familiar or recognized percepts. Determinate perception of the totality of the object occurs with the completion of the assimilative process.

David Applebaum (1982) notes that Bilimoria’s discussion of the Advaitin’s notion of perception focuses on the necessary conditions or criteria for valid or veridical perceptions. According to him, this approach while justified in the light of perception’s inclusion among the means of knowledge (pramāṇa-s) is mistaken because it only focuses on sensation as a species of mental state (vṛtti). For the Advaitin, sensation is not a mode exhausted by the judgmental content of a mental state (vṛtti), it has epistemic value independently of its role in judgmental perception. Applebaum quotes from the Upanisadic texts to support this view:

Manas is for men a means of bondage or liberation … of bondage if it clings to objects of perception (visayasangi), and of liberation if not directed towards these objects (nirviṣayam). (Applebaum, 1982, 203)

Non-conceptual perception furnishes us with knowledge of pure existence (sanmātra) rather than with protodata to construct imagined particulars. Therefore, it is not simply a prior stage of conceptual perception and so also not necessarily a mental state produced in cooperation with the object. Applebaum (1982, 204) suggests that non-conceptual perception in this sense focuses attention on sensing, in which consciousness turns its attention inwards to the activity of the sense-organs resulting in deepening and broadening their proprioceptive content. Proprioception, he claims, points the way to the soul or self (ātman); mind (antaḥkaraṇa) returns to its presentational activity, its function of monitoring and unfolding the sensory manifold to create conditions for the emergence of self (ātman), which according to the Advaitin, is identical with the Ultimate reality (Brahman). In non-conceptual (nirvikalpaka) perception, consciousness is returned to itself and opens up the possibility of manifesting or seeing the Seer (ātman) or knowing the Ultimate reality (Brahman).

4. Constructing Concepts or Knowing Universals?

The problem of universals, as we have seen, is at the epicentre of the debate between Hindu philosophers and their Buddhist opponents. The doctrine of exclusion (apoha) is the Buddhist attempt to account for the relation between concepts and sensory content. The doctrine of apoha basically claims that the term ‘cow’ does not refer to the universal ‘cowness’ or ‘cowhood’ because there is no such general entity; rather, the term refers to every individual that is not a non-cow. The apoha theory of meaning is originally propounded by Dignāga and his followers is an attempt to explain the functioning of language, conceptual thought and inference without appeal to real universals. For these Buddhists, universals are merely imaginary constructs which lack causal efficacy and the awarenesses that they produce are faint (asphuṭābha). The unique particulars alone are ultimately real, but they do not have any common properties, and thus cannot be brought under any concept, nor can they be expressed by words. They are inexpressible. Dignāga explains that language functions through what is known as “exclusion of the other” (anyāpoha/apoha). This claim needs to be unpacked. Matilal explains,

[A] word expresses a concept, and a concept, being a fiction, cannot POSITIVELY qualify or characterize the particular … but it can NEGATIVELY disqualify the particular from being claimed by other fictions or concepts. Thus, construction and verbalization are to be understood as “exclusion” of all rival claims. If we associate the name cow, or the cow, with a particular, it means that it is not what we cannot call a cow (1971, 44–45).

The idea is that the meaning of the word ‘cow’ is a negation: not non-cow. If you exclude all the things that are not cows, you have the reference of the word ‘cow’. The Hindus, in particular the Nyāya philosopher Uddyotakara and the Mīmāṃsā philosopher Kumārila raise many epistemological and metaphysical objections to Dignāga’s apohavada. The basic problem metaphysical problem is how to understand apoha as a non-existence. Both the Hindu schools regard non-existence as a real property of a thing (absence of a pot in a room) and therefore are not convinced that by introducing apohas the Buddhist will be able to ultimately avoid reference to universals. The epistemological issues concern how it is possible to know apohas as they cannot be known by perception and any appeal to inference would be circular. These philosophers also raise linguistic concerns that are important because the apoha doctrine does double duty as a Buddhist theory of meaning. First, since apoha is basically an absence, the meanings of all words would be synonymous. Second, how is it possible to learn which apoha a word refers to?

More recently, two new annotated translations of primary texts, the first by Eltschinger et al. (2018) and the second by Taber and Kataoka (forthcoming) have become available. These translations offernew insights into the debates between the Hindus and Buddhists. In the text Kumārila takes up the linguistic concerns raised above. He notes that if the relation between a word and a meaning is established by not observing that the word is applied to certain things, and one never observes what the word is applied to, then the word simply would have no meaning at all (Apohavāda, 75). Kumārila developed this concern into what is known as the mutual presupposition argument. The objection goes: If someone is taught the meaning of the word ‘cow’ by being told, “The word ‘cow’ refers to what is not non-cow,” then one must know what a non-cow is. But how can one comprehend what a non-cow is if one does not already know what ‘cow’ means. The meaning of ‘cow,’ it seems, presupposes the meaning of ‘non-cow,’ while the meaning of ‘non-cow’ presupposes the meaning of ‘cow’ (Apohavāda, 83–85ab, reprinted in Taber). The apoha theory, as we can see in the examples, is introduced using general terms like cow, white and so on. The theory may seem to work in the case of general terms because there are entities that are cow and others that are not cow, there are entities that are white and others that are not white and so on. But such a dichotomy does not hold in the case of every word. Sen (2011) offers the example of the word ‘all’ (sarva). There is no entity called ‘not all’ (asarva), which may be obtained by negating the meaning of the word ‘all’. Nor can it be suggested that the expression ‘not all’ is applicable to unity, duality, etc., because the word ‘all’ stands for a collection, the components or constituents of which may be things that are one, two, and so on in number; and once all the constituents of this collection are negated, the word ‘all’ will become an empty expression (Sen, 2011, 182). Kumārila also argues that the Apohavāda is unable to account for words which designate actions, connectives like ‘and’, ‘or’ ‘not’ and ‘but’, verbal prefixes and prepositions, adjectives like ‘knowable’ and ‘cognizable’ and so on (Taber and Kataoka forthcoming).

The Buddhist philosopher Dharmakīrti (a follower of Dignāga) takes up these concerns on behalf of the Buddhist in his Pramāṇavārttikasvavṛtti (PV(SV) heceforth). Dharmakīrti responds to this concern but rather than addressing all the categories separately; he offers a general argument. He claims that all meaningful discourse serves to rule things out: “an utterance is inseparably related to delimitation” (PV(SV) 122–123). The point is illustrated by using examples of commands (PVSV61, 20–26). If one desires only water and does not care how it is brought one says “Bring water”, but if one desires a pot of water, one would have to say, ‘Bring water in a pot’. Similarly, one mentions ‘water’ to rule out other substances, ‘bringing’ to rule out other actions. Taber and Kataoka (forthcoming) summarise it thus: “a word is only uttered when certain things are to be excluded by uttering it, not otherwise, and presumably this would be true of all parts of speech”. Dharmakīrti adds two other conditions. First, words are uttered only when there is some doubt. Second, words are almost always uttered in a sentence and their excluding function is specified by the context and relation to other words in the context. Dharmakīrti’s also responds to the first concern raised above: aren’t all words synonymous on the Buddhist view? No, says Dharmakīrti, because apohas are not real properties, rather they are “differences”. Apohas are contrasts that distinct individuals share by differing from the same (more exactly, qualitatively similar) other things. They are not properties that things in themselves have by virtue of belonging to a class (say of cows). Rather, they are absences things have in virtue of not having certain properties. So, for example, a certain individual –say a spotted cow—has one absence (that of being a not non-cow) insofar as it is viewed, together with certain other individuals as different from non-cows, and has another absence (that of being not non-spotted) insofar as it is viewed together with certain other not non-spotted individuals which may include cows, horses, humans. Different words that are applied to the same object – cow and spotted – have different meanings depending on the corresponding differences or exclusions from other things. Explaining these stanzas in his PV(SV) Dharmakīrti says,

Therefore, although the nature [of a particular, which might serve as the subject of an inference] is undivided, the “difference” (viśeṣa) [that is,] distinction that is known through any “property” (dharma) [that is,] name whatsoever cannot be imparted by another [property or word] (because that other word would exclude other things). Thus, all words do not have the same meaning (25, 24–25 ).

There is an unusual view of the nature of particulars expressed in this passage. Dharmakīrti, following Dignāga, holds that the nature of a particular is one, unified. Sometimes he expresses this misleadingly by saying that a thing is “without parts” or “without aspects”, when what he probably means is that the different aspects of its nature are fused into one; they are inseparable, completely integrated. If one apprehends any part of the nature of a thing one must apprehend the thing in its entirety, because its nature is undivided. This is exactly what happens in perception, a thing is grasped completely. It is only inference (and other conceptual cognitions) we ascertain apohas which are not intrinsic properties of the thing nor aspects of their natures. Perception is always veridical owing to its direct link with real thing, provided that all of its causes are in place. Conceptual cognition or inference is characteristically erroneous insofar as it mistakes the general features that it abstracts from and superimposes on a particular for the thing in itself. Still, some conceptual cognitions are ‘correct’ in a sense. Kellner clarifies the sense in which they are correct is that they identify things correctly and can serve as a solid basis for successful action, whereas others are incorrect because they misidentify things and lead people astray – identifying a mirage as a reflection caused by sun’s rays is in this sense correct, whereas identifying it as a water body is false (2004, 2). In addition, Kellner clarifies that there is a kind of perceptual ascertainment, over and above sensory perception, which enables us to superimpose or ascribe features/properties of the object. We may superimpose them correctly or incorrectly depending on the environmental factors (lighting, distance, etc.) as well as the cognisor’s mind being focussed in ascertaining certain aspects of perceived reality (Kellner, 2004, 42). Concepts, in this Buddhist sense, are well-formed rules for identifying exclusions. Even though the Buddhists talks about the awareness produced by concepts as faint impressions, it is not meant to be taken in the sense of Hume’s ideas which are a blurry expression of the real thing. Rather, the point is that the concepts are constructed from abstracting general features of objects and then superimposing them back on the objects. General features or properties cannot be known in sensory perception as the Nyāya and the Mīmāṃsā opponets believe. Rather, as we see, general features can be correctly or incorrectly superimposed on the particulars in the perceptual or inferential ascertainments. They are correctly ascertained when they lead to successful action, incorrectly ascertained when they lead us astray.

In the secondary literaure discussing the apoha theory, Tillemans (2011) draws a useful distinction between the two versions of the apoha doctrine offerd by Diṅnāga and Dharmakīrti: the top-down approach and the bottom-up approach. The former is presented by Diṅnāga. According to the top-down version, the negation operator in the exclusion, the apoha somehow manages pick out real particulars in the world while avoiding any commitment to universals. Apoha, in this sense functions like a sense or meaning, a not-non X expressed by the word X, which enables us to pick out real particulars while at the same time avoiding a commitment to real universals in virtue of the special features of double negation. The latter is presented by Dharmakīrti who uses the causal approach to link language and the world. According to this version of the doctrine, apoha provides a way to bridge the gap between sensory perception of particulars and expressions of belief and judgement in thought and language. The top-down version of the apoha doctrine was subjected to various criticisms from the Hindu realists, especially by Kumārila who criticised the doctrine on grounds of circularity. The thought is that in order to understand the exclusion class of non-cows, we have to first have an idea that some particulars are cows. In other words, one must be able to refer to cows before one can refer to non-cows. The bottom-up approach developed by Dharmakīrti was basically a response to this circularity worry. His version of the apoha doctrine is developed as a strategy to bridge the gap between non-conceptual perceptual content and conceptual content. Dreyfus (2011) develops Dharmakīrti’s naturalized account of concept formation by elucidating the mediating role of representations that link reality to conceptuality. Representations, in this sense, stand for agreed-upon fictional commonalties and are projected on to discrete individuals (Dreyfus, 2011, 216).

The top-down approach is promising but there is a concern that a bottom-up account might not succeed in offering a completely reductive story about concepts. In response to this concern, Ganeri (2011) develops a hybrid account that combines the resources of the top-down and bottom-up approaches. The idea is that we work up from basic sentience and down from the language of reference and predication to meet at the middle-ground of feature-placing in the formation of proto-concepts (Ganeri, 2011, 244). These proto-concepts show that sense experience can normatively constrain belief and judgement, though it does not give us a full-blown reductive account of concepts in non-conceptual terms.

The doctrine of apoha and Ganeri’s hybrid version may well be ingenious, but it is a far cry from what would satisfy the Hindu realist. According to Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika, universals exist in this very world of ours. We do not need to construct concepts from sensory content, rather universals are part and parcel of this sensory content. Chadha (2014, 289) explains that according to Nyāya, for a universal to exist all that is required is that it be exemplified; in a Quinean twist – to be is to be exemplified. There is no further requirement that it exist independently as an abstract entity or in Plato’s heaven; universals are given directly in perception insofar as their loci are perceived. Taber (2017) develops the Mīmāṃsa views about how universals are cognised. In the first verse of his Ākṛtivāda, the Kumarila explains what is at stake for the Mīmāṃsakas in the debate about universals. Unlike the Naiyāyikas, the Mīmāṃsa philosophers are not motivated merely by epistemological requirements, their main aim is to defend the eternality of the Vedas. This requires that the language, and in turn the words and their meanings are eternal. Therefore, the meaning of a word cannot be a particular which is perishable. It must be a universal that exists eternally. But like the Naiyāyikas, the Mīmāṃsa philosophers believe that universals are not merely inferred, but are directly perceived. Kumarila’s argument for the perceptibilty of universals s developed in response to the Buddhist doctrine of apoha. To the Buddhist who says that we cannot perceive universals distinct from particulars, because perception can only cognise particulars. Kumarila replies by offering example. When we perceive a man at a distance and wonder whether he is a Brahmin or some other kind of man, we do so because we perceive the universal humanity directly. This would be possibble if at least some universals were not directly given in perception.

It is useful to think of a universal in this sense as a non-particular individual (Chakrabarti, 1995). Examples abound: Dusky is what many particulars are, though they may be spatiotemporally separated by many miles and years; rainy is what several days of the year can be at the same time in different places and at different times in the same place. If we are not thinking of universals as abstract entities in Platonic heaven or in the mind, but as individuals out there in the world, it is easier to grasp the idea that they can be perceived. The Nyāya equation of universals and properties might tempt one to think that Nyāya conceives of universals as natural properties in David Lewis’ sense of the term (Lewis, 1983), but such is not the case. Nyāya universals are as robust as Armstrong’s universals: they capture facts of resemblance and the causal powers of things. Naiyāyikas will happily endorse Armstrong’s ‘One over Many’ argument as the main reason for including universals in their ontology (Armstrong, 1978). Udayana puts the point thus: “Causality is regulated by universals, so is effect-hood. It is a natural universal if there is no obstruction [in establishing it]; it is a conditional [nominal] universal when we have to establish it through effort [construction?]” (Kiraṇāvālī, in Praśastapāda 1971, 23).

Although Gautama mentions universals in the Nyāyasūtras as the meaning of general terms,there is no explanation in these original sūtras as to how they might be known. Praśastapāda was the first to argue that universals are sensorily given. He argues that universals, when they inhere in perceptible loci (e.g., ‘cowness’ in an individual cow), are perceived by the same sense organs that also perceive those loci (Padārthadharmasaṃgraha, 99). This thesis is explicated in detail by Jayanta Bhaṭṭa in Nyāyamañjarī where he argues against the Buddhist nominalists as well as the holistic monist pan-linguist Bhartṛhari and his followers. Jayanta makes an allusion to the view that universals are given in indeterminate perception, a view later developed in detail by Gaṅgeśa in Tattvacintāmaṇi (the chapter on “Perception,” the section on “Indeterminate Perception”). Most of Jayanta’s arguments against the Buddhist nominalist are discussed in detail in Chakrabarti (2006), however, he does not discuss the issue about universals being given in indeterminate perception. This is, as we have mentioned in the above sections, because Chakrabarti is sceptical about the coherence of the notion of indeterminate perception. Chadha (2014) argues that Gaṅgeśa makes a unique contribution to this debate in proposing the idea that universals or qualifiers are given as objects in indeterminate perception. He spells out his argument in terms of qualifiers rather than real universals, because the logical and epistemological role of a real universal is the same as that of a simple nominal property. Gaṅgeśa is concerned with basic, unanalyzable properties that can be grasped as such in our awareness. Basic properties in this sense are simple; they can be grasped without further qualification. They are, according to Nyāya, the ‘epistemic firsts’ comparable to non-conceptual perception in Buddhist epistemology. Gaṅgeśa’s argument is presented by Bhattacharya (1993, 10–11) using a specific form of inference (parārthānumāna) developed in Nyāya for convincing others. It has a five-proposition structure:

  1. Proposition: The determinate perception of the form ‘a cow’ (or ‘that’s a cow’) is produced by the cognition of the qualifier.
  2. Reason: Because this is a qualificative cognition.
  3. Pervasion with an example: Every qualificative cognition is produced by a prior cognition of the qualifier, for example, inference.
  4. Application: The perception of the form ‘a cow’ is a qualificative cognition.
  5. Conclusion: Hence, it is produced by the cognition of the qualifier.

The weight of the argument rests on the third sentence. Gaṅgeśa supports it offering various examples of qualificative cognition, namely inference, recognition, analogy, verbal testimony, and so on. The point is that unless some awareness of dung is present in a person, (s)he cannot infer that there is dung on the hill on the basis of seeing some animals grazing on the hill. Universals like fireness and dungness are given directly in indeterminate perception. Gaṅgeśa’s argument maintains a causal uniformity among pramāna-generated cognitions of an entity as qualified (Phillips and Tatacharya 2004, p. 398). However, there is a problem: if anything that is known through a qualifier requires a prior cognition of the qualifier, there will be a regress of cognitions. Gaṅgeśa’s answer is that an indeterminate perception blocks the threat of such a regress, because the qualifier is then grasped directly rather than through another qualifier. In other words, the object is perceived through the property, but the property itself is perceived directly rather than through another property. The indeterminate perception, which precedes the determinate perception of an object through a mode, that is, as possessing a certain property, is not itself a perception through a mode. Simply put, we need to grasp the universal cowness in order to have an awareness of a particular as qualified by cowness. Chadha (2014) argues that Gaṅgeśa’s argument thus shows that the postulate of indeterminate perception of universals is a necessary requirement for realism.

5. Perceptual Illusion

The skeptics challenge strikes at the claim made by the Naiyāyikas that perception should be non-erroneous (avyabhichāri) and well-ascertained or free from doubt (vyavasāyātmaka). They ask: how do we distinguish between veridical perceptions and the non-veridical ones? In case of a perceptual doubt, say, seeing something at a distance which looks like a pole or an old tree-trunk, we are uncertain which it is but are a priori sure it cannot be both. In case of perceptual illusion, I see a snake but I misperceive as there is only a rope in front of me. Illusoriness of the experience (seeing a snake) is exposed with reference to another veridical experience (seeing a rope), but again, we are a priori sure that both cannot be true together. Then, the Buddhist skeptic, Vasubandhu, raises the ante with the question: could they not both be false simultaneously? The skeptical argument is premised on a denial of the realist thesis that experiences refer to a mind-independent reality. Vasubandhu’s argument for idealism appears right at the beginning of Vimśatikā, when he states:

This [the external world] is consciousness only, because there is appearance of non-existent things, just as a person with cataracts sees non-existent hairs, moons et cetera. (Feldman, 2005, p. 529).

Vasubandhu offers many other examples of dreams, delusions, hallucinations, etc., where we are aware of non-existent objects that are products of our imagination and not objects external to the mind. If it is possible for awareness to create its own object and then grasp it (as in a dream) then, Vasubandhu argues, everything that we seem to be aware of could be a making of awareness.

The standard reply to this view appeals to the intuition that illusory experience is parasitic on veridical experience. The Naiyāyika, Vātsyāyana explains that an erroneous cognition depends on a principal cognition as its basis. “This is a man” for a tree-trunk, which is not a man, has for its basis a principal cognition of a man. If a man has never been perceived in the past, an erroneous cognition of a man, in what is not a man, can never be produced (Nyāya-Sūtra-Bhāṣya, 4.2.35). A similar argument is put forth by the Advaita-Vedanta founder Śankara. He challenges Vasubandhu’s view on the ground that it is incoherent; when the Buddhists say “that which is the content of an internal awareness appears as though external,” they are

assuming the existence of an external thing even while they deny it … For they use the phrase ‘as though’ … because they become aware of a cognition appearing externally … For nobody speaks thus: Viṣnumitra appears like the son of a barren woman. (Brahma-Sūtra-Bhāṣya, 2.2.28)

Feldman (2005, p. 534) argues that this does not suffice to defeat Vasubandhu’s idealism. The illusory experience of x, no doubt requires a memory impression which can be produced by a previous cognition, but there is no further requirement that the previous experience be veridical, because such impressions can be produced by illusory experiences. Feldman uses the case of someone who has only experienced snakes in dreams. He can mistake a rope for a snake, because the previous dream experience provides the necessary memory impression. Feldman’s argument ignores the gravity of the concern raised by Vātsyāyana and Śankara, however. They reject Vasubandhu’s argument on the grounds that we cannot imagine (dream, hallucinate, etc) an absolutely unreal thing, like a barren woman’s son. The Nyāya theory of imagination, working in the background here, says that to imagine something is to superimpose or attribute properties belonging to one kind of thing to a thing of different kind, provided that there is some resemblance between the two kinds of objects (Uddyotakara’s Nyāya-Sūtra-Bhāṣya, 3.1.1). For example, to imagine a centaur is to attribute a property belonging to the human-kind to a thing of the horse-kind. There is some general resemblance between the two kinds: both are animals and have legs. However, an ‘absolutely unreal’ thing can have no properties, and hence a fortiori no properties in common with an existing thing. They, therefore, cannot be an object of imagination.

Uddyotakara presents an even stronger argument against the skeptics. In his Nyāya-Vārttika he turns Vasubandhu’s own argument against him. Uddyotakara asks: how do we know that the object of a dream experience is non-existent? Vasubandhu accepts that the dreamer does not know that he is dreaming; the knowledge that the object is non-existent occurs only when he awakens and no longer apprehends the object. If non-apprehension of an object in the waking state is required to support the claim that the objects of dream experience do not really exist out there, then apprehension in the waking state must be an indicator of their existence, otherwise there would be no contrast between what is apprehended and what is not (Nyāya-Vārttika, 4.2.33). If there is no such contrast, then Vasubandhu’s argument fails because there is no support for the claim that objects of dream experiences do not exist in the external world. And, if there is such a contrast between apprehension and non-apprehension, then at least some external objects must exist. Clearly, Vasubandhu’s argument for thesis of universal delusion (or idealism) does not succeed completely, nor are the realists totally defeated.

We close this entry on the note that Sūtra-s were primarily composed in the seven centuries from 5th BCE to 2nd CE and, thereafter, for the next millennium and more, the philosophical work was carried forward by Sūtra commentators (tikākār-s) from respective schools. This latter period saw these epistemological debates rage among scholars from these schools. Note also that there is no consensus on the dates given here; most Western scholars accept these, while Indian schools place them further back in antiquity.


Texts in English translation

  • Aksapada Gautama, Nyāya-Sūtra, with Vatsyayana’s Nyayabhasya, Uddyotakara’s Nyayavartikka, and Udayana’a Parisuddhi, A. Thakur (ed. and trans.), vol. 1, Mithila, 1967.
  • Bhartr̥hari, Vākyapadīya, Abhyankar K.V. and Limaye V.P. (eds.), Poona University, 1965.
  • Gaṅgeśa, Tattvacintāmaṇi, Epistemology Of Perception: Gaṅgeśa’s Tattvacintāmaṇi, Jewel Of Reflection On The Truth (About Epistemology): The Perception Chapter (Pratyakṣa-khaṇḍa), Transliterated Text, Translation, And Philosophical Commentary, by Stephen H. Phillips and N.S. Ramanuja Tatacharya. Treasury of the Indic Sciences. New York: American Institute of Buddhist Studies, 2004.
  • Jayanta Bhatta Nyayamanjari: The Buddhist Refutation of jati. A Critical Edition (trans.) Kei Kataoka in The Memoirs of Institute for Advanced Studies on Asia, 160: 636(1)–594(43), 2011.
  • Uddyotakara, “NyāyaVārttika”, in The Nyāya-Sūtras of Gauṭama: With the Nyāya-sūtra-Bhāṣya of Vātsyāyana and the Nyaya-Vartika of Uddyotakara, Gangānāṭha Jhā (trans.), Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1984.
  • Uddyotakara, “The Nyāya Proofs for the Existence of the Soul”,  Translations from the introductory commentary on Nyāya-Sūtra-Bhāṣya, Arindam Chakrabarti (trans.), published as an appendix to A. Chakrabarti, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 10: 211–238, (1982).
  • Vācaspati Miśra, Nyāyavārttikatātparyaṭīkā, Anantlal Thaur (ed.), Indian Council of Philosophical Research, 1996.
  • Vasubandhu, Viṃśatikā-Vṛtti, Triṃśatika, and Tri-Svabhāva-Nirdeśa, Thomas Kochumuttom (trans.), in A Buddhist Doctrine of Experience: A New Translation and Interpretation of the Works of Vasubandhu the Yogācārin, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1982.
  • Kumarila Bhatta,  A Hindu Critique of Buddhist Epistemology: The ‘Determination of Perception’ Chapter of Kumarila Bhatta’s Slokavarttika commentary by J. Taber (trans.), Routledge Curzon Hindu Studies Series, New York: Routledge Curzon, 2005.
  • Kumarila Bhatta, Kumārila on Apoha: an Annotated Translation of the Apoha Chapter of Kumārila’s Ślokavārttika, in “Meaning and Non-existence: Kumārila’s Refutation of Dignāga’s Theory of Exclusion,” trans. John Taber and Kei Kataoka (forthcoming). Wien: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, forthcoming.
  • Dharmakīrti, Dharmakīrti’s Theory of Exclusion (Apoha). Part 1, On Concealing: An Annotated Translation of Pramāṇavārttikasvavṛtti 24, 16–45, 20 (Pramāṇavārttika 1.40– 91) by Vincent Eltschinger, John Taber, Michael Torsten Much, and Isabelle Ratié, Tokyo: International Institute for Buddhist Studies, 2018.

General works

  • Armstrong, D. M., 1978, Universals and Scientific Realism (Volumes I and II), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Appelbaum, D., 1982, “A Note on Pratyakṣa in Advaita Vedānta”, Philosophy East and West 32:2, pp. 201–205.
  • Bhatt, Govardhan P., 1989, The Basic Ways of Knowing, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Bhattacharyya, Sibajiban, 1987, Gangesa’s Theory of Indeterminate Perception Part 2: Containing the text of Gangesa’s Nirvikalpakavada with an English translation and explanatory notes. Indian Council of Philosophical Research, New Delhi.
  • Bilimoria, P., 1980, “Perception (Pratyakṣa) in Advaita Vedānta”, Philosophy East and West, 30(1): 35–44.
  • Chadha, M., 2014, “On Knowing Universals: The Nyāya Way”, Philosophy East and West, 64(3): 287–303.
  • –––, 2001, “Perceptual Cognition: A Nyāya-Kantian Approach”, Philosophy East and West, 51(2): 197–209
  • –––, 2004, “Perceiving Particulars-as-Such Is Incoherent: A Reply to Mark Siderits”, Philosophy East and West, 54(3): 382–389
  • –––, 2006, “Yet Another Attempt to Salvage Pristine Perceptions!”, Philosophy East and West, 56(2): 333–342
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