Perceptual Learning

First published Wed Apr 5, 2017

“Perceptual Learning” refers, roughly, to long-lasting changes in perception that result from practice or experience (see E.J. Gibson 1963). William James, for instance, writes about how a person can become able to differentiate by taste between the upper and lower half of a bottle for a particular kind of wine (1890: 509). Assuming that the change in the person’s perception lasts, is genuinely perceptual (rather than, say, a learned inference), and is based on prior experience, James’ case is a case of perceptual learning.

This entry has three parts. The first part lays out the definition of perceptual learning as long-term changes in perception that result from practice or experience, and then distinguishes perceptual learning from several contrast classes. The second part specifies different varieties of perceptual learning. The third part details cases of perceptual learning in the philosophical literature and says why they are philosophically significant.

1. Defining Perceptual Learning

In 1963, the psychologist Eleanor Gibson wrote a landmark survey article on perceptual learning in which she purported to define the term. According to Gibson, perceptual learning is “[a]ny relatively permanent and consistent change in the perception of a stimulus array, following practice or experience with this array…” (1963: 29).[1] Gibson’s definition has three basic parts. First, perceptual learning is long-lasting. Second, it is perceptual. Third, it is the result of practice or experience. This entry expands on each of these features of the definition.

1.1 Perceptual Learning as Long-Term Perceptual Changes

Perceptual learning involves long-term changes in perception. This criterion rules out short term perceptual changes due to sensory adaptation (for more on sensory adaptation see Webster 2012). In the waterfall illusion, for instance, a person who looks at a waterfall for a minute, and then looks away at some rocks, sees the rocks as moving even though they are not. This is a short-term change in perception, lasting perhaps for fifteen to thirty seconds. Since it is not a long-term change in perception, however, it does not count as perceptual learning. In another short term adaptive change, a person who goes indoors after walking through a blizzard may have trouble as her eyes adjust to the new lighting. There is a change in her perception as a result of her experience in the blizzard. But it is not a long-term change, and so it does not count as perceptual learning.

While there are clear cases of long-term experience-induced perceptual changes and clear cases of short-term experience-induced perceptual changes, there may be intermediary cases where it is difficult to tell whether they count as long-term or not. In such cases, in order to determine whether the case is a genuine case of perceptual learning, it may be necessary to look at the mechanisms involved (see section 2 below on the mechanisms of perceptual learning). If the mechanisms involved are characteristic of other cases of perceptual learning, then that is a reason to count the case as an instance of perceptual learning. If the mechanisms involved are uncharacteristic of perceptual learning, then that is a reason not to count the case as an instance of perceptual learning.

1.2 Perceptual Learning as Perceptual Changes

Perceptual learning involves changes in perception.[2] This rules out mere changes in aesthetic taste, among other things. For instance, imagine a contrarian who likes things only insofar as other people do not like those things. Suppose he finds out that everyone else has come to like his favorite microbrew. This might cause him to change how he judges that beer aesthetically. However, the beer may well taste the same to him. So, it is not a case of perceptual learning, but a mere change in the person’s aesthetic judgment. The fact that perceptual learning involves changes in perception also rules out mere changes in belief. Suppose someone acquires the belief that the symphony movement they are hearing is a scherzo. If nothing changes in that person’s perception, this is not a case of perceptual learning. It is a change in the person’s belief, not a change in the person’s perception.

It is important here to distinguish perceptual learning from learning that is simply based on perception (see Dretske 2015: fn. 6).[3] Perceptual learning involves changes in perception, while learning that is based on perception need not. Looking at my table, I might learn that the cup is on the table. However, this does not involve any long-term changes in perception. It is learning that is based on perception, but it is not perceptual learning. Furthermore, I might learn to put the cup on the table into the dishwasher every time it is empty. Again, this is learning that is based on perception (I need to perceive the cup in order to move it). However, it is not perceptual learning.

One of the main reasons for holding that improvements in perceptual discrimination can be genuinely perceptual is due to somewhat recent evidence from neuroscience. As Manfred Fahle puts it, during the 1970s and 1980s, it tended to be the case that improvements in perceptual discrimination were thought to be cognitive rather than perceptual (2002: xii). However, during the 1990s, pressure was put on the cognitive interpretation due to new neuroscientific evidence in perceptual learning studies. In particular, studies found that learning-induced plasticity occurs in the adult primary sensory cortices much more than researchers had previously thought (Fahle 2002: xii). Neurological evidence of plasticity in adult primary sensory cortices due to learning provides some evidence that changes in perceptual discrimination can be due to perceptual learning. (See also Garraghty & Kass 1992: 522; Gilbert 1996: 269; Goldstone 2003: 238; Gilbert & Li 2012: 250; and Sagi 2011: 1552–53).

1.3 Perceptual Learning as Resulting from Practice or Experience

Perceptual learning involves perceptual changes of a particular kind, namely, those that result from practice or experience. For this reason, laser eye surgery or cataracts removal do not count as instances of perceptual learning. They are not really cases of learning because they do not result from practice or experience. So, while such cases involve long-term changes in perception, they do not count as cases of perceptual learning.

To be authentic cases of learning, perceptual changes have to be the result of a learning process. As a contrast case, suppose someone undergoes a long-term change in their perception due to a brain lesion. Such a change in perception does not result from a learning process, since the change in perception comes from the lesion, rather from practice or experience. Because of this, the case does not count as an instance of perceptual learning, even though it involves a long-term change in perception.

1.4 Potential Further Criteria for Defining Perceptual Learning

The conversation above roughly follows Eleanor Gibson’s definition of perceptual learning. However, there are also other accounts in the psychology literature. Robert Goldstone’s account of perceptual learning, for instance, agrees with Gibson’s account in many respects, but it additionally offers a story of why perceptual changes occur. On his account,

Perceptual learning involves relatively long-lasting changes to an organism’s perceptual system that improve its ability to respond to its environment and are caused by this environment. (1998: 587, italics added for emphasis)

This definition offers an answer to the question as to why perceptual learning occurs at all. On Goldstone’s account, perceptual learning occurs to improve an organism’s ability to respond to the environment.

Goldstone’s account admits of two different interpretations. On one interpretation, the account places a condition on perceptual learning: that to count as an instance of perceptual learning, a long-term perceptual change has to improve an organism’s ability to respond to the environment. Such an account gains plausibility if one thinks of “learning” as a success-term. The idea then is that each genuine instance of perceptual learning leads to success for the organism, namely, it improves the organism’s ability to respond to the environment. On a second interpretation of Goldstone’s account, however, it is not that each instance of perceptual learning has to improve an organism’s ability to respond to the environment. Rather, it is that perceptual learning is a general capacity for improving an organism’s ability to respond to the environment, even if perceptual learning fails to do so in some instances. Why might organisms have such a capacity? One possibility is that the capacity is a trait that improves fitness and is the product of natural selection. However, the biological origin of perceptual learning is an area of research that still needs to be carefully explored.

1.5 Contrast Classes

1.5.1 Perceptual Development

How much of the perceptual development we undergo as infants and young children is the result of learning? There are many difficulties distinguishing development from learning, conceptually (for some discussion, see Carey 2009, especially pp. 11–14). The issue of how to distinguish development from learning bears on the traditional philosophical debate between nativists and empiricists (see Markie 2015, for a summary of that debate). In the perceptual learning literature, for instance, Kellman and Garrigan reject the view that all perceptual development is the result of learning, a view that they consider to be empiricist (2009: 57). Specifically, they think that data on infant perception collected in and around the 1980s provide evidence that at least some perceptual development is innate:

What this research has shown is that the traditional empiricist picture of perceptual development is incorrect. Although perception becomes more precise with age and experience, basic capacities of all sorts – such as the abilities to perceive objects, faces, motion, three-dimensional space, the directions of sounds, coordinate the senses in perceiving events, and other abilities – arise primarily from innate or early-maturing mechanisms (Bushnell, Sai, & Mullin 1989; Gibson et al., 1979; Held 1985; Kellman & Spelke 1983; Meltzoff & Moore 1977; and Slater, Mattock, & Brown 1990). (Kellman & Garrigan 2009: 57)

In short, according to Kellman and Garrigan, evidence on infant perception—including evidence about object perception, the perception of faces, and the perception of three-dimensional space—tells against the view that all perceptual development is learned.

If not all perceptual development is learned, while all perceptual learning is learned, then there is a distinction between perceptual development and perceptual learning. One way to draw the distinction more fully is the following. Perceptual development involves perceptual learning. However, it does not just involve perceptual learning. It also involves what is called maturation. For instance, the abilities that Kellman and Garrigan describe above (object perception, the perception of faces, the perception of three-dimensional space, etc.) fall under the category of maturation.

There are many ways to try to draw the further distinction between perceptual maturation and perceptual learning. Some such ways are found in the debate between nativism and empiricism (see Samet 2008 and Markie 2015) and specifically in the difference between innate and acquired characteristics (see Griffiths 2009 and Cowie 2016). One potential criterion here is that cases of perceptual maturation involve perceptual abilities that are typical of the species, while cases of perceptual learning involve perceptual abilities that are not typical of the species. This criterion seems to get it right for some instances of perceptual learning, say, for those involved in birdwatching. After all, the perceptual abilities acquired in birdwatching are unique to birdwatchers, not typical of the entire human species. However, the criterion seems to get it wrong for other, more universal, instances of perceptual learning. For instance, since human faces are both ubiquitous and important to humans, the perceptual learning involved in face perception is in fact typical of the species.

In the literature on perceptual learning, by contrast, the distinction between perceptual learning and perceptual maturation is often drawn in terms of the role of the environment. On Goldstone’s account of perceptual learning, to count as perceptual learning, perceptual changes must be caused by the environment. It is important to understand why exactly Goldstone thinks that caused by the environment is a crucial feature of the definition. He thinks it is crucial since this criterion distinguishes between perceptual changes that are simply the result of maturation, and perceptual changes that are the result of learning. As Goldstone puts it, “If the changes are not due to environmental inputs, then maturation rather than learning is implicated” (1998: 586). Manfred Fahle puts it similarly by saying that the term maturation “ascribe[s] the main thrust of the changes in a behavior to genetics, not the environment” (2002: xi). For Fahle, this is what distinguishes it from perceptual learning.

1.5.2 Perception-Based Skills

A further point of contrast with perceptual learning is perception-based skills, such as dart-throwing or racecar driving. To understand the relationship between perceptual learning and perception-based skills, start by considering the following case. Williams and Davids (1998) reported that when expert soccer players defend opponents, they focus longer on their opponent’s hips than non-experts do. This tuned attention is a long-term change in perception that results from practice or experience. That is, it is an instance of perceptual learning (see section 2.3 below). Such changes certainly serve to enable perception-based skills. For instance, attending to the hips is part of what enables the soccer players to defend well. Since the hips provide a cue for what the offensive player will do next, when the defender attends there, it helps them to do all sorts of things: to keep the offensive player from dribbling by them; to keep the offensive player from completing a pass; and to keep them from shooting and scoring. Without the attentional tuning, the expert soccer players would not be able to perform as high above baseline as they do.

Perceptual learning can enable perception-based skills, yet it is important to distinguish these skills from perceptual learning. In fact, arguably, as Stanley and Krakauer (2013) claim, perceptual learning does not in itself give you a skill, properly speaking. One reason why, drawing on Stanley and Krakauer, is that skills quite plausibly require instruction (at least initially), or observation of someone else (2013: 3). Perceptual learning, by contrast, can at times be unsupervised learning (see Goldstone 2003: 241 and Goldstone & Byrge 2015: section 3). Long-term, learning-induced changes in perception sometimes happen through mere exposure to stimuli, and without any instruction whatsoever. Furthermore, arguably, as Stanley and Krakauer put it, “our skilled actions are always under our rational control…” (2013: 3; see also Stanley & Williamson forthcoming: 6). Yet, there is an important sense in which one cannot control a tuned attentional pattern like that of the expert soccer players mentioned above. Goldstone, for instance, cites a study on attentional tuning by Shiffrin and Schneider (1977). In that study, letters were used first as targets in the experiment, but later letters were used as distractors to be ignored (Goldstone 1998: 589). Due to their prior training with the letters, the subjects’ attention became automatic with respect to the letters in the scene, even though they were trying to deliberately ignore them. More generally, after training, it is difficult to rationally control a tuned attentional pattern because the attention is automatic toward particular properties.

1.5.3 Cognitive Penetration

Perceptual learning involves changes in perception that are long-term. This long-term criterion rules out some cases of cognitive penetration, that is, cases where one’s beliefs, thoughts, or desires influence one’s perception (see Macpherson 2012: 24). For instance, to borrow a case from Susanna Siegel (2012), if Jill sees Jack as angry because she just now believes Jack is angry, this need not be a case of perceptual learning, since it need not be a long-term change. After all, if Jill changes her belief that Jack is angry shortly after, she will no longer see his neutral face as angry. It would be a short-term change in her perception, not a long-term one. And so it would not be a case of perceptual learning.

Simply because some cases of cognitive penetration are not cases of perceptual learning, however, it does not follow that no cases of cognitive penetration are cases of perceptual learning. Jerry Fodor distinguishes between synchronic penetration and diachronic penetration, where only the latter involves “experience and training” (1984: 39). The case of Jack and Jill is a case of synchronic penetration, one where the penetration does not involve experience and training. However, at least some cases of perceptual learning might more plausibly fit into the category of diachronic penetration. (For more on the relationship between perceptual learning and cognitive penetration, see section 3.2)

1.5.4 Machine Learning

Machine perception seeks “to enable man-made machines to perceive their environments by sensory means as human and animals do” (Nevatia 1982: 1). Standard cases of machine perception involve computers that are able to recognize speech, faces, or types of objects. Some types of machine perception are simply programmed into the device. For instance, some speech recognition devices (especially older ones) are simply programmed to recognize speech, and do not learn beyond what they have been programmed to do. Other types of machine perception involve “machine learning” where the device learns based on the inputs that it receives, often involving some kind of feedback.

Like cases of perceptual learning, machine learning can be either supervised or unsupervised, although these distinctions mean something very specific in the machine case. In supervised learning, builders test the machine’s initial performance on, say, the recognition of whether a given image contains a face. They then measure the performance error and adjust the parameters of the machine to improve performance (LeCun, Bengio, & Hinton 2015: 436). Importantly, in cases of supervised learning, engineers program into the machine which features it should look for when, say, identifying a face. In cases of unsupervised learning, by contrast, the machine does not have information about its target features. The machine merely aims to find similarities in the given images, and if it is successful, the machine comes to group all the faces together according to their similarities (Dy & Brodley 2004: 845).

In machine learning, one major difficulty is that machines can develop racist and sexist patterns (for several examples, see Crawford 2016). The problem is often that engineers input a biased set of images (such as a set of images that include too many white people) into the machine, from which the machine builds its model (Crawford 2016). This suggests a potential corresponding source of bias in human perceptual learning, based on the inputs that humans receive through media.

2. Varieties of Perceptual Learning

The psychology literature provides ample evidence of perceptual learning. Goldstone (1998) helpfully distinguishes between four different types of perceptual learning in the literature: differentiation, unitization, attentional weighting, and stimulus imprinting. This section surveys these four types of perceptual learning (for further review, see Goldstone 2003; Goldstone, Braithwaite, & Byrge 2012; and Goldstone & Byrge 2015).

2.1 Differentiation

When most people reflect on perceptual learning, the cases that tend to come to mind are cases of differentiation. In differentiation, a person comes to perceive the difference between two properties, where they could not perceive this difference before. It is helpful to think of William James’ case of a person learning to distinguish between the upper and lower half of a particular kind of wine. Prior to learning, one cannot perceive the difference between the upper and lower half. However, through practice one becomes able to distinguish between the upper and lower half. This is a paradigm case of differentiation.

Psychologists have studied differentiation in lab environments. In one such study, experimenters took six native Japanese speakers who had lived in the United States from between six months and three years (Logan, Lively, & Pisoni 1991). The subjects were not native English speakers. The experimenters found that they were able to train these subjects to better distinguish between the phonemes /r/ and /l/. This is a case of improved differentiation, where the subjects became better at perceiving the difference between two properties, which they had more trouble telling apart before.

2.2 Unitization

Unitization is the counterpart to differentiation. In unitization, a person comes to perceive as a single property, what they previously perceived as two or more distinct properties. One example of unitization is the perception of written words. When we perceive a written word in English, we do not simply perceive two or more distinct letters. Rather, we perceive those letters as a single word. Put another way, we perceive written words as a single unit (see Smith & Haviland 1972). This is not the case with non-words. When we perceive short strings of letters that are not words, we do not perceive them as a single unit. Goldstone and Byrge provide a list of items for which there is empirical evidence of such unitization:

birds, words, grids of lines, random wire structures, fingerprints, artificial blobs, and three-dimensional creatures made from simple geometric components. (2015: 823)

While unitization and differentiation are converses, the one unifying and the other distinguishing, Goldstone and Byrge also conceive of them as “flip sides of the same coin” (2015: 823). This is because, as they put it, both unitization and differentiation “involve creating perceptual units…” (2015: 823). Regardless of whether the unit arises from the fusion or the differentiation of two other units, both instances of perceptual learning involve the creation of new perceptual units.

2.3 Attentional Weighting

In attentional weighting, through practice or experience people come to systematically attend toward certain objects and properties and away from other objects and properties. Paradigm cases of attentional weighting have been shown in sports studies, where it has been found, for instance, that expert fencers attend more to their opponents’ upper trunk area, while non-experts attend more to their opponents’ upper leg area (Hagemann et al., 2010). Practice or experience modulates attention as fencers learn, shifting it towards certain areas and away from other areas.

In the case of the expert fencer, a shift in the weight of attention to the opponents’ upper trunk area facilitates the expert’s fencing skills. However, shifts in attentional weighting can also fail to facilitate skills or even stifle them. For example, a new golfer with inadequate coaching might develop the bad habit of attending to their putter while putting, rather than learning to keep their “eye on the ball.” This unhelpful shift in attentional weighting may well stifle the new golfer’s ability to become a skillful putter.

One way to understand weighted attention is as attention that has become automatic with respect to particular properties. In other words, when the expert fencer attends to the upper trunk area, this attention is no longer governed by her intention (see Wu 2014: 33, for more on this account of automaticity). Rather, as the result of practice, the expert fencer’s attention is now automatic with respect to the trunk area. This italicized part is important. On Wayne Wu’s account of attention, for instance, one might ask whether attention is automatic with respect to different features of the process of attention: “where attention is directed and in what sequence, how long it is sustained, to what specific features in the scene, and so on” (p. 34). In the case of the expert fencer, plausibly her attention is automatic with respect to the trunk area, even if it is not automatic in other respects. This automaticity is the product of her learning process.

2.4 Stimulus Imprinting

Recall that in unitization, what previously looked like two or more objects, properties, or events later looks like a single object, property, or event. Cases of “stimulus imprinting” are like cases of unitization in the end state (you detect a whole pattern), but there is no need for the prior state—no need for that pattern to have previously looked like two or more objects, properties, or events. This is because in stimulus imprinting, the perceptual system builds specialized detectors for whole stimuli or parts of stimuli to which a subject has been repeatedly exposed (Goldstone 1998: 591). Cells in the inferior temporal cortex, for instance, can have a heightened response to particular familiar faces (Perrett et al., 1984, cited in Goldstone 1998: 594). One area where these specialized detectors are helpful is with unclear or quickly presented stimuli (Goldstone 1998: 592). Stimulus imprinting happens entirely without guidance or supervision (Goldstone 2003: 241).

3. The Philosophical Significance of Perceptual Learning

Perceptual learning is philosophically significant both in itself, and for the role that it has played in prior philosophical discussions. Sections 3.1–3.4 will focus on the latter. However, there are good reasons to see perceptual learning as philosophically significant in itself, independently from the role that it has played in prior philosophical discussions.

Why is perceptual learning philosophically significant? One reason is that it says something about the very nature of perception—that perception is more complex than it might seem from the first-person point of view. Specifically, the fact that perceptual learning occurs means that the causes of perceptual states are not just the objects in our immediate environment, as it seems at first glance. Rather, given the reality of perceptual learning, there is a long causal history to our perceptions that involves prior perception. When the expert wine-taster tastes the Cabernet Sauvignon, for example, that glass of wine alone is not the sole cause of her perceptual state. Rather, the cause of her perceptual state includes prior wines and prior perceptions of those wines. One way to put this is to say that perception is more than the immediate inputs into our senses. It is tied to our prior experiences.

Another way in which perceptual learning is philosophically significant is because it shows how perception is a product of both the brain and the world. In this respect, there are some similarities between the role of constancy mechanisms and the role of perceptual learning, in that both involve the brain playing a role in structuring perception in a way that goes beyond the perceptual input. Constancy mechanisms, such as those involved in shape, size, and color constancy, are brain mechanisms that allow us to perceive shapes, sizes, and colors more stably across variations in distance or illumination. In cases of constancy, the brain manipulates the input from the world, and this allows the perceiver to track the shape, size, or color more easily. Similarly, in cases of perceptual learning, the brain manipulates the input from the world. In many cases, this may actually make the perception more helpful, as when through learning the perceptual system weights attention in a particular way, say, towards the features relevant for identifying a Cabernet Sauvignon. Perceptual learning might upgrade the epistemic status of perception, putting the perceiver in a better position with respect to knowledge (see Siegel 2017). At the same time, people can learn incorrectly, leading to perceptions that are unhelpful, as when a new golfer with inadequate coaching develops the bad habit of attending to their putter while putting, rather than attending to the golf ball.

Perceptual learning is philosophically significant in itself. In addition, the rest of section 3 goes on to explore the role that perceptual learning has played in prior philosophical discussions.

3.1 The Contents of Perception

In the philosophy literature, cases of perceptual learning have often been used to show that through learning we come to represent new properties in perception, which we did not represent prior to learning. Siegel (2006, 2010), for instance, asks us to suppose that we have been tasked to cut down all and only the pine trees in a particular grove of trees. After several months pass, she says, pine trees might begin to look different to us. This is a case of perceptual learning, a long-term change in our perception following practice or experience with pine trees. Siegel uses the case to argue that perception comes to represent kind properties, like the property of being a pine tree. The idea is that the best way to explain the change in perception is that perception represents the property of being a pine tree after, but not before, learning takes place. That property becomes part of the content of perception: it comes to be presented in perceptual experience (for more background on the contents of perception, see Siegel 2016).

Thomas Reid’s notion of acquired perception has recently been interpreted in a way similar to Siegel’s pine tree case. According to Reid, some of our perceptions, namely acquired perceptions, are the result of prior experience. For instance, Reid writes about how through experience we might come to “perceive that this is the taste of cyder,” or “that this is the smell of an apple,” or that “this [is] the sound of a coach passing” ([1764] 1997: 171). Rebecca Copenhaver (2010, 2016) has interpreted Reid as claiming that through experience properties like being a cider, being an apple, and being a coach can come to be part of the content of our perception.

Cases of perceptual learning might also be used to show that through learning we come to represent new properties in perception, even if those properties are simply low-level properties like colors, shapes, textures, and bare sounds, rather than high-level kind properties like being a pine tree or being a cider. For instance, in discussing the perceptual expertise of jewelers, the 14th-century Hindu philosopher Vedānta Deśika writes,

[T]he difference among colours [of a precious stone], which was first concealed by their similarity, is eventually made apparent as something sensual…. (Freschi [trans.] manuscript, Other Internet Resources, pp. 12–13)

In this case, the jeweler comes to perceive new colors in the gemstone, which others cannot perceive. This is a case where through learning someone comes to perceive a new low-level property.

The cases from both Reid and Vedānta Deśika both speak to the internal complexity of perception mentioned in the previous section. If Vedānta Deśika’s description of the jeweler case is accurate, then perception is more than the inputs into our senses, since both an expert jeweler and a non-expert can have the same visual inputs, but have different perceptions. Similarly, to take a new example from Reid, suppose that a farmer acquires the ability to literally see the rough amount corn in a heap ([1764] 1997: 172). Since both a farmer and a non-farmer can have the same visual inputs, but have different perceptions, the causes of their perceptions are not just restricted to the immediate objects out in their environment. Perception is more complex than that.

One of the most detailed contemporary discussions of cases of perceptual learning is found in Siewert (1998: section 7.9). Siewert discusses in detail the role that learning plays in altering perceptual phenomenology, although he stops short of saying that this affects the high-level contents of perception. He writes, for instance, that there is a difference in perceptual phenomenology between just seeing “something shaped, situated, and colored in a certain way,” and recognizing that thing as a sunflower (or another type) (1998: 255). Siewert also writes that a person might look different to you after you know them for a long time than they did the first time you met them, and that your neighborhood might look different to you after you have lived there for a long time than the first time you moved in (pp. 256, 258). Furthermore, he writes about how a chessboard in midgame might look differently to a chess player than to a novice, and how a car engine might look differently to a mechanic than to someone unfamiliar with cars (1998: 258). These are all examples where learning affects one’s sensory phenomenology.

Several cases of perceptual learning in the philosophical literature involve language learning, both in the case of written and spoken language. As an example of the former, Christopher Peacocke writes that there is a difference

between the experience of a perceiver completely unfamiliar with Cyrillic script seeing a sentence in that script and the experience of one who understands a language written in that script. (1992: 89)

With regard to spoken language, as Casey O’Callaghan (2011) points out, several philosophers have made the claim that after a person learns a spoken language, sounds in that language comes to sound different to them (O’Callaghan cites Block 1995: 234; Strawson 2010: 5–6; Tye 2000: 61; Siegel 2006: 490; Prinz 2006: 452; and Bayne 2009: 390). Ned Block, for instance, writes, “[T]here is a difference in what it is like to hear sounds in French before and after you have learned the language” (1995: 234). It is tempting to think that this difference is explicable in terms of the fact that, after learning a language, a person hears the meanings of the words, where they do not before learning the language. On such a view, meanings would be part of the contents of auditory perception. However, O’Callaghan (2011) denies this (see also O’Callaghan 2015 and Reiland 2015). He argues that the difference is in fact due to a kind of perceptual learning. Specifically, through learning we come to hear phonological features specific to the new language. As O’Callaghan argues, these phonological features, not the meanings, explain what it’s like to hear a new language.

By contrast, Brogaard (forthcoming) argues that meanings are in fact part of the content of perception (see also Pettit 2010). After offering arguments against the opposing view, she relies on evidence about perceptual learning to help make the positive case for her view. In particular, she uses evidence about perceptual learning to rebut the view that we use background information about context and combine it with what we hear, in order to get meanings. Instead, she argues, language learning is perceptual in nature. She points to changes in how we perceive utterances, more in chunks rather than in parts, as a result of learning. Background information directly influences what we hear, she argues, altering how language sounds to us.

Both Siegel’s pine tree case and the case of hearing a new language fundamentally involve phenomenal contrasts. That is, the motivating intuition in both cases is that there is a contrast in sensory phenomenology between two perceptual experiences. Interestingly, in both cases the phenomenal contrast is due to learning. The question in both the pine tree case and the new language case is what explains the difference in sensory phenomenology. Siegel argues that the best explanation in the pine tree case is that the property of being a pine (and, more generally, natural kind properties) can come to be represented in perception. O’Callaghan (2011) argues that the best explanation for the difference in sensory phenomenology in the new language case is that we come to hear phonological features specific to the new language. Brogaard (forthcoming) argues that the best explanation in that case is that we come to hear meanings in the new language.

3.2 Cognitive Penetration

Recall that cases of cognitive penetration are cases where one’s beliefs, thoughts, or desires influence one’s perception (see Macpherson 2012: 24). One role of perceptual learning in the philosophical literature has been to explain away putative cases of cognitive penetration. For instance, it might seem at first glance that Siegel’s pine tree case is a case of cognitive penetration, a case where one’s newly acquired concept of a pine tree influences one’s perception. Connolly (2014b) and Arstila (2016), however, have both argued that the best way to understand Siegel’s pine tree case is not as a case of cognitive penetration, but rather through the particular mechanisms of perceptual learning. Connolly counts it as a case of attentional weighting, while Arstila understands it as involving both unitization and differentiation.

One reason why perceptual learning is a good instrument for explaining away putative cases of cognitive penetration is the following. In cases of perceptual learning, it is the external environment that drives the perceptual changes. As Raftopoulos puts it, “perceptual learning does not necessarily involve cognitive top-down penetrability but only data-driven processes” (2001: 493). For putative cases of cognitive penetration, the strategy for the perceptual learning theorist is to show how the perceptual changes involved may have been data-driven instead of top-down. Several philosophers have used this strategy at times, including Pylyshyn (1999: section 6.3), Brogaard and Gatzia (2015: 2), as well as Stokes (2015: 94), and Deroy (2013) might be interpreted in that way as well.

One exception to the trend of explaining away putative cases of cognitive penetration in terms of perceptual learning is Cecchi (2014). Cecchi argues that a particular case of perceptual learning—that found in Schwartz, Maquet, and Frith (2002)—should count as a case of cognitive penetration. The study in question found changes in the primary visual cortex due to learning, and also that these changes were brought about by higher areas in the brain influencing the primary visual cortex. Because the perceptual changes were the result of top-down influence, Cecchi argues that this case of perceptual learning should count as a case of cognitive penetration.

3.3 The Theory-Ladenness of Observation

One traditional debate in the philosophy of science is whether scientific observation is permeated with the theory of the scientist, or theory-laden (see the entry on theory and observation in science). As Raftopoulos and Zeimbekis point out, when asking whether observation is theory-laden, the answer will depend in part on what it means for a subject to possess a theory (2015: 18). On their view, theories can be tacit, rather than just “having a set of beliefs and concepts” (p. 18).

Assuming that theories can be held tacitly, perceptual learning might plausibly play a role in making observation theory laden. Raftopoulos and Zeimbekis, for instance, ask us to imagine a scientist who has undergone perceptual learning in her expert domain (2015: 19). Specifically, through repeated exposure to items in her expert domain, she has developed perceptual sensitivity to certain features, in accordance with her professional needs. This includes learned attention to particular dimensions, and involves physical changes early in her visual system (p. 19). As a result, the scientist might quite literally see the world differently within her expert domain than someone from outside her expertise would see it.

Such a case suggests that perceptual learning can make observation theory-laden. The scientist’s perceptual system comes to shape the kind of visual information that makes it into the scientist’s conscious perception, and does so based on her professional needs. As Raftopoulos and Zeimbekis put it, the case suggests

that non-cognitive, clearly perceptual influences on incoming visual information can be indirect bearers of the kinds of theoretical commitments that we usually think of as the content of conceptually couched theories. (2015: 19)

Although the case does not involve explicit beliefs directly influencing perception, arguably it involves a theory being held tacitly and appropriated into one’s perceptual system.

3.4 Modularity

According to the modular view of the mind (Fodor 1983), the basic systems involved in perception are encapsulated from information outside of it, excluding its inputs (see Robbins 2015, for a summary of modularity). It might then seem at first glance that cases of perceptual learning challenge the view that the mind is modular, at least insofar as they involve the modulation of perception through any background theory that the subject has. However, it is important to note that Fodor himself seems to allow for such cases of perceptual learning. While he thinks that perception is synchronically impenetrable, he allows for the possibility of diachronic penetration, that is, cases where “experience and training can affect the accessibility of background theory to perceptual mechanisms” (1984: 39).

Why think that a modular view of the mind should allow for diachronic penetration? When Fodor allows for diachronic penetration, he does so because the alternative is to say that all modular systems are specified endogenously (1984: 39). Fodor admits that this alternative would be too extreme, and he points out, for instance, that children learn something from hearing a language. In other words, the modules for language are not just specified endogenously. However, Fodor is conservative about the scope of diachronic penetration, suggesting that it may only happen within strict limits, perhaps limits that are themselves endogenously defined (1984: 39–40).

Other philosophers have argued that diachronic penetration of perception undermines modularity. Churchland (1988), for instance, sees Fodor’s allowance of diachronic penetration as “grudgingly conceded,” and he argues that diachronic penetration is in fact widespread, rather than something that happens within strict limits (p. 176). One such case, raised by Churchland, is the case of perceiving music. Churchland argues that a person who knows the relevant music theory and vocabulary “perceives, in any composition whether great or mundane, a structure, development, and rationale that is lost on the untrained ear” (1988: 179). Fodor replies that it is unclear whether such cases are genuinely perceptual (1988: 195). He suggests another possibility, which is that the person who knows the relevant music theory does not perceive it differently, but rather forms different beliefs about the music. Furthermore, even if the case is genuinely perceptual, Fodor replies that it could be that a trained ear results simply from repeated exposure to the relevant music, rather than through knowledge of theory (1988: 195).


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Special thanks for their comments to Susanna Siegel, Rebecca Copenhaver, and to the University of Pennsylvania Perceptual Learning Reading Group: Gary Hatfield, Adrienne Prettyman, Louise Daoust, Ting Fung Ho, Ben White, and Devin Curry. This entry was prepared with funding from the Cambridge New Directions in the Study of the Mind Project.

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