Treating Persons as Means
Sometimes it is morally wrong to treat persons as means. When a person says that someone is treating him merely as a means, for example, he often implies that she is failing to abide by a moral norm. Ethically disapproving judgments that a person is “just using” or sometimes simply “using” another are common in everyday discourse (e.g., Goldman & Schmidt 2018). Authors appeal to the idea that research on human subjects (Levine 2007: 140; Van der Graaf and Van Delden 2012), management of employees (Haywood 1918: 217), and criminal punishment (Duff 1986: 178–179) is wrong if it involves treating persons merely as means. The notion that treating people in that way is morally problematic has appeared in debate regarding terrorism (Card 2010: 131), pornography (Baird & Rosenbaum 1998: 103, 106), and surrogate motherhood (Macklin 1994: 64). However, treating others as means or, equivalently, using them is frequently morally permissible. Waiters use customers to get tips; customers treat waiters as means to cuisine; professors use students to test their ideas; students use professors to gain expertise, and so forth. Under what conditions is using another wrong? Philosophers since Kant have tried to answer this question, at least in part, by offering accounts of when a person uses another and does or does not just use the other, or, equivalently, treat him merely as a means. These accounts tend to be controversial. Precise sets of conditions for treating (or not treating) persons merely as means seem to have implications that to some extent clash with everyday understanding of doing so. Moreover, for Kantians, the prohibition on treating persons merely as a means is a moral constraint: it limits what we may do, even in the service of promoting the overall good. If a surgeon extracting vital organs from an unwilling “donor” would maximize the good, say, by preserving the lives of five people desperate for transplants, she would be treating the donor merely as a means and thereby acting wrongly, Kantians would say. Kant himself suggests that this constraint is absolute. The principle Kant deems to be the supreme principle of morality, the categorical imperative, deems morally wrong all actions that treat persons merely as means. But is it plausible to hold that all such actions are wrong? Upon reflection, is it even plausible to hold that to treat persons merely as means is, typically, to act wrongly, rather than just to have an ethically inappropriate attitude towards them?
Several concepts in ethics overlap with that of treating persons merely as means. For example, to say that a person is exploiting or manipulating another is often to imply that the person is using the other in a morally problematic way. Prototypical cases of coercion such as muggings are also cases of a person, the mugger, treating another, the victim, merely as a means. Other concepts that intersect with that of treating someone merely as a means include those of commodifying and of objectifying a person (Davis 1984: 392). Commodifying someone can involve using her as one would use a mere thing, instead of treating her, as one ought, as a being of higher status, for example.
This article does not try to untangle the relations between treating persons merely as means and these other concepts. It focuses on the notion(s), inspired by Kant and seemingly embraced in ordinary moral discourse, of treating persons, especially treating others, merely as means. In the idiom of the article, to say that someone is treating another as a means or, equivalently, using him, implies in itself no moral disapproval. To say that someone is treating a person merely as a means or, equivalently, just using him, suggests that she is using the other in a way subject to ethical criticism. The entry begins by focusing on the roots in Kant of discussion of treating persons merely as means. It then considers (morally neutral) notions of using another or treating him as a means, notions that are less straightforward than it might seem. The third section focuses on attempts to specify sufficient conditions for treating another merely as a means, some of which Kant himself suggests. According to Kant, to treat another merely as a means is to do something morally impermissible; it is to act wrongly. The next section examines challenges to this claim. Finally, the article considers accounts of when a person uses another, but not merely as a means.
- 1. Kantian Roots
- 2. Using Another
- 3. Sufficient Conditions for Using Others Merely as Means
- 4. Treating Another Merely as a Means and Acting Wrongly
- 5. Using Another, but Not Merely as a Means
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Kantian Roots
Kant sets forth several formulations of the categorical imperative, that is, the principle he holds to be the supreme principle of morality. One formulation, often called the “Formula of Humanity” states:
So act that you treat humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, always at the same time as an end, never merely as a means. (Kant 1785: 429, italics removed)
The Formula of Humanity contains the command that we ought never to treat persons merely as means. A few points regarding this command are helpful to keep in view. First, Kant holds that if a person treats someone merely as a means, then she acts wrongly. The Formula of Humanity encompasses an absolute constraint against treating persons merely as means. Second, Kant does not hold that if in acting a person refrains from treating anyone merely as a means, then she acts rightly (Kant 1797: 395). A person can, for example, act wrongly in Kant’s view by expressing contempt for another, even if she is not using him at all (Kant 1797: 462–464). She would be acting wrongly by failing to treat the other as an end in himself, rather than by treating him merely as a means. A third related point is that, according to Kant, it is both a necessary and a sufficient condition for one’s treating persons in a morally permissible way that one treat them as ends in themselves (Hill 1992: 41–42). Some Kantians, especially those engaged primarily in interpretation, rather than reconstruction, of his views thus understandably hold that far more important than understanding his position on treating persons merely as means is understanding his account of treating persons as ends in themselves (Wood 1999, 143). Fourth, Kant holds that a person can treat herself merely as a means. If a person acts contrary to certain “perfect duties to oneself” (Kant 1797: 421), including her duty not to kill herself (422–423), not to defile herself by lust (424–425), and not to lie (429–430), then she treats herself merely as a means, thereby contravening the Formula of Humanity. It is difficult to discern how, according to Kant, one treats oneself merely as a means in violating these duties (Kerstein 2008; Timmons 2017: Ch. 7). How, for example, does a person’s lying to another amount to her treating herself merely as a means?
In any case, this article’s focus is on treating others merely as means. Doing that is widely discussed as a possible violation of a moral constraint. More specifically, the article explores when someone uses another and either treats or refrains from treating the other merely as a means. It concentrates on concepts that seem to have roots in Kant’s work, but that are familiar from ordinary moral discourse. Kant himself devotes little discussion to clarifying the notion of treating others merely as means. Yet as is apparent below, some of his remarks have been a springboard for detailed accounts of the notion.
One salient issue outside the article’s purview is that of the scope of “others” in the prescription not to treat others merely as means. Does Kant embrace among these others all genetically human beings, including human embryos and individuals in a persistent vegetative state, or does he limit the others to beings who have certain capacities, for example, that to set and rationally pursue ends (Kain 2009; Sussman 2001)? How should Kant or other theorists set the scope of those whom we ought not to treat merely as means? Should we include some non-human animals (e.g., chimpanzees or dolphins) among them? How should we determine to whom to grant this moral status?
2. Using Another
In order to treat another merely as a means or just use him, an agent must use the other or treat him as a means. But when does someone count as doing that? As noted, using others or treating them as means is often morally permissible. In everyday discourse, expressions such as “She used me” can mean she just used me, or treated me merely as a means and so can imply a negative evaluation of action or attitude. But for our purposes talk of a person using another or treating him as a means implies no such moral judgment.
Accounts of treating others merely as means sometimes leave implicit the notions of using another they rely on (Kleingeld 2020). Some points regarding what using another does or does not amount to seem uncontroversial. It does not seem sufficient for us to count as using another as a means that we benefit from what the other has done (Nozick 1974: 31–32). If, on her usual route, a runner derives enjoyment from the singing of a stranger who happens to be walking by, she does not appear to be treating the stranger as a means. Moreover, not all cases of an agent’s intentionally doing something in response to another are cases of her using the other as a means. If someone frowns at another approaching, for example, he might not thereby be using the other at all; he might simply be expressing that the other is unwelcome.
However, inquiry reveals challenges in specifying what using another amounts to. We might say that an agent uses another or, equivalently, treats her as a means just in case the agent intentionally does something to the other in order to secure or as a part of securing one of his ends (Kerstein 2009: 166). For example, a passenger uses a bus driver if he boards her bus in order to get across town; a wife treats her husband as a means if she lies to him so that his birthday party will be a surprise; and a victim treats a mugger as a means if she punches him in order to escape from his grasp. In contrast, a pilot who drops bombs solely in order to kill enemy combatants might foresee that innocent bystanders will be harmed. Yet if he does not intentionally do anything to the bystanders, then he does not treat them as means, according to this account.
But does the account count too much as treating another as a means? Suppose that an usher at a concert is trying to prevent a small child from falling through railing on a balcony. She pushes a spectator out of the way to get to the child. The specification we are considering implies that the usher has used the spectator as a means; for she has intentionally done something to her (i.e., pushed her aside) in order to attain an end (i.e., to get to the child). Some might say that the usher has treated the spectator in some way, namely, as an obstacle to be displaced. Yet she has not used the spectator.
In order for an agent to count as using another, it is not enough that she do something to the other in order to realize some end of hers, some have suggested. She must also intend the presence or participation of some aspect of the other to contribute to the end’s realization (Scanlon 2008: 106–107; Guerrero 2016: 779). The usher does not intend the spectator’s presence or participation to play any role in her preventing the child from falling. She thinks of her simply as “in the way”. On one account, an agent uses another (or, equivalently, uses or treats another as a means) if and only if she intentionally does something to or with the other in order to realize her end, and she intends the presence or participation of the other to contribute to the end’s realization (Kerstein 2013: 58). On this account, an agent can count as using another when she is striving to benefit him. For example, a physician giving a patient a treatment to save his life is using the patient. Some find this implication of the account implausible (Parfit 2011: 222). Others do not, pointing to cases such as that of a physician using a patient in a study of a new drug in order to ameliorate the patient’s condition.
In any case, consistent with this account, an agent might use another through using the other’s rational, emotional, or physical capacities. A tourist might ask someone for directions, using the other’s knowledge to get to his destination; a politician might use his constituents’ fear of crime to gain their support for more spending on law enforcement; a doctor might use a vein from a patient’s leg to repair her heart. One important question left unanswered by this and other accounts of treating another as a means is one of scope. For example, does an agent use another if he uses biospecimens (e.g., cells) or information (e.g., concerning social media activity) derived from the other? If so, then the scope of a constraint on treating others merely as means would extend to the practices of biobanks and technology companies.
3. Sufficient Conditions for Using Others Merely as Means
Much debate concerning what it means to treat others merely as means stems from a single passage in the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals. Kant is attempting to demonstrate that the Formula of Humanity generates a duty not to make false promises:
He who has it in mind to make a false promise to others sees at once that he wants to make use of another human being merely as a means, without the other at the same time containing in himself the end. For, he whom I want to use for my purposes by such a promise cannot possibly agree to my way of behaving toward him, and so himself contain the end of this action. (1785: 429–430)
In these brief remarks, Kant hints at various ways in which we might understand conditions for treating another merely as a means. We might understand them in terms of the other’s inability to share the agent’s end in using him or to consent to her using him, for example. In this section, we discuss elaborations of these ways (and others) of formulating sufficient conditions for someone who is using another to be treating this other merely as a means.
3.1 End Sharing
On the basis of Kant’s remarks, we might claim that if another cannot “contain the end” of an agent’s action, that is, share the end the agent is pursuing in using her, then the agent treats the other merely as a means. Two agents presumably share an end just in case they are both trying, or have chosen to try, to realize this end. But what, precisely, does it mean to say that two agents cannot share an end? Returning to the example at hand, what does it mean to say that the promisee cannot share the promisor’s end? From the outset, it is important to specify precisely which of the promisor’s ends the promisee cannot share. It is presumably the promisor’s end of getting money from the promisee without ever paying it back. The promisor’s ultimate end might be one that the two can share (e.g., that of curing cancer). What sense of ‘cannot’ would be plausible to invoke in maintaining that a promisee cannot share a false promisor’s end?
3.1.1 Logical impossibility of end sharing
According to one interpretation of Kant, the promisee cannot share the promisor’s end in that it is logically impossible for him to do so (Hill 2002: 69–70). Suppose the promisor, a borrower, has the end of getting money from the promisee, a lender, without ever paying it back. At the time he makes a loan on the basis of this promise, the lender cannot himself share the end of the borrower’s getting the money from him without ever paying it back, goes this reading. If the lender shared the borrower’s end, then he would not really be making a loan. For according to our practice, it belongs to the very concept of making a loan, as opposed, say, to giving money away, that one believe that what one disburses will be repaid.
This interpretation of the false promising case leads naturally to the view that a sufficient condition for an agent’s treating another merely as a means is that it is logically impossible for the other to share the end the agent is pursuing in using her in some way. However, this proposed sufficient condition might fail to register as treating others merely as means paradigmatic cases of doing so (Kerstein 2009: 167–168). Take, for example, a loiterer who threatens an innocent passerby with a gun in order to get $100. It would presumably be good if a sufficient condition for treating another merely as a means yielded the conclusion that the loiterer is treating the passerby merely as a means; for he is mugging her, which, intuitively speaking, seems to be a clear case of treating another merely as a means. One might question whether the proposed sufficient condition does this. Even highly unlikely events are logically possible. It is improbable, but still logically possible, that the passerby shares the loiterer’s end of his getting $100, one might argue. For example, the passerby might aim to give $100 to the loiterer, but not recognize him when he threatens her and so hands over her money to him as a result of his threat. If this possibility is realized, then the account would not count the loiterer as treating the passerby merely as a means. One might also argue that in the case of the false promise, it is improbable, but still logically possible, that the lender loans money to a borrower (and thereby believes that it will be repaid), all the while sharing the borrower’s end that she get money from him (the lender) without paying it back. For example, the lender might believe that the borrower will pay him back, but share her end of her getting money from him without repaying it because he believes that if she does, she will bring about something he covets, namely, the demise of her reputation. Some philosophers insist, however, that this sort of scenario is not logically possible; for in order to be making a loan to another, a person must not only believe that his money will be repaid, but want and hope that it will be (Papadaki 2016: 78), they say. If these philosophers’ views are plausible, the proposed sufficient condition in view would deem as instances of treating others merely as means a range of actions many envisage as such.
3.1.2 Preventing the other from choosing to pursue one’s end
According to a different interpretation of Kant, another cannot share the end an agent pursues in using him in some way if how the agent behaves “prevents [the other] from choosing whether to contribute to the realization of that end or not” (Korsgaard 1996: 139). The lender in our example cannot share the borrower’s end of getting money without ever repaying it; for the borrower’s false promise obscures his end and thus prevents the lender from choosing whether to contribute to it.
This reading of possible end sharing might have implausible implications when incorporated into a principle according to which a person who uses another treats the other merely as a means if the other cannot share the end she is pursuing in using him (Kerstein 2013: 63). Consider young men hiking in the Rocky Mountains for the first time who find themselves on a mountain in late afternoon without water and unsure of the way down. To their relief, they spot another hiker, someone whom they saw park his car in the same area below. They follow him, using his knowledge of the terrain to get down the mountain safely. The young men realize that they could, but choose not to, tell the hiker that they are following him. Out of embarrassment for their dependence on him, they ensure that they remain undetected. The way they act prevents the man from choosing whether to contribute to the realization of their end. According to the notion of possible end sharing we are here considering, we might have to embrace a view that some find implausible: Since the hiker cannot share the young men’s end, they are treating him merely as a means and thereby acting wrongly. To avoid this implication, one might affirm the following: a person cannot share the end an agent pursues in using him if the agent’s behavior prevents the person from choosing whether to contribute to the realization of that end and the person has a right not to be prevented from making this choice (Papadaki 2016: 80). If the hiker fails to have a right not to be prevented from choosing whether to contribute to the young men getting safely down the mountain, then they do not treat him merely as a means according to the amended account. Of course, this amendment invites questions as to when a person has such a right, as well as making the account of treating others merely as means depend on an account of moral rights in a way that Korsgaard (or Kant) might not have intended.
3.1.3 Practical irrationality
The allusion in the false promising passage to possible end sharing is subject to a third interpretation: the promisee cannot share the promisor’s end in that it would be practically irrational for her to do so. In typical cases, it would be irrational for the promisee to try to realize the end of making a loan that is never to be repaid. This end’s being brought about would prevent him from realizing other ends he is pursuing, ends such as paying rent, buying groceries, or simply getting his money back.
The notion of practical irrationality at work here seems implicit in the Groundwork. Kant there (1785: 413–418) introduces a principle that Thomas Hill, Jr. calls (1992: 17–37) “the hypothetical imperative”: If you will an end, then you ought to will the means to it that are necessary and in your power, or give up willing the end. Willing an end presumably involves setting it and attempting to realize it. According to Kant, the hypothetical imperative is a principle of reason: all of us are rationally compelled to conform to this principle. An agent would be violating the hypothetical imperative and thus acting irrationally by willing an end yet, at the same time, willing another end, the attainment of which would, he is aware, make it impossible for him to take the otherwise available and necessary means to his original end. An agent would violate the hypothetical imperative, for example, by willing now to buy a house and yet, at the same time, willing to use the money he knows he needs for the down payment to make a gift to his niece. If he willed to make the gift, he would be failing to will the necessary means in his power to buy the house. The Kantian hypothetical imperative implies that it is irrational to will to be thwarted in attaining ends that one is pursuing. In typical cases, if a promisee willed the end of a false promisor, she would be doing just that.
There are two things that an agent who has willed something can do which would bring his action into compliance with the hypothetical imperative. He can either will the means that are necessary and in his power to the end (which, of course, would rule out his willing to be thwarted in attaining the end) or he can give up willing the end. For example, the hypothetical imperative would not imply that it was irrational for the person described above to cease willing now to buy a house and instead use the money that he knows would be required as a down payment on it to make a gift to his niece.
A person cannot share an agent’s end, according to this third account, if:
The person has an end such that his pursuing it at the same time that he pursues the agent’s end would violate the hypothetical imperative, and the person would be unwilling to give up pursuing this end, even if he was aware of the likely effects of the agent’s successful pursuit of her end.
By way of illustration, suppose that a doctor plans to use a healthy patient to obtain a heart and lungs for transplant, that is, to extract them from him in an operation that would kill him. We can imagine that the patient has many ends, for example, that of attending his daughter’s wedding. According to the hypothetical imperative, it would be irrational for him to pursue this end at the same time he was pursuing the doctor’s end of getting from him a heart and lungs for transplant. The account implies that the patient cannot share the doctor’s end if he would be unwilling to give up his end of attending his daughter’s wedding against the background of an awareness of the likely effects of the doctor’s successful pursuit of his organs (e.g., his life being lost and other lives being saved).
This notion of conditions under which a person cannot share an agent’s end might be included in the following account: An agent treats another merely as a means if the other cannot share the proximate end or ends the agent is pursuing in treating him as a means. An agent’s proximate end is something she aims to bring about directly from her use of the person. Her proximate end might also be her ultimate end, say, if she uses another to avoid pain. But her proximate end might be far removed from her ultimate end. Someone might, for example, use another to develop her skill as a violinist to earn a good living in an orchestra so she can put her little sisters through college, and so forth. The account invokes proximate ends because they are far more intimately connected to the use that brings them about than ultimate ends need be.
Yet, like the other accounts we have considered, this account is subject to criticism. One possible shortcoming stems from cases of competition (Kerstein 2009: 170–171). Sometimes people have the end of being the sole winner in a competition. A competitor pursuing such an end might, according to the account, be treating his competitor merely as a means and thus acting wrongly, even though she abides fully with the competition’s rules. To begin, competitors sometimes count as treating one another as means. To invoke one account of doing so (discussed in §2 above), Player A intentionally does something to her opponent, Player B, for example, tries to defeat him, which requires B’s presence or participation. Moreover, A’s proximate end in trying to defeat B might be to win top player for the year; and B’s proximate end in trying to defeat A might also be to win top player for the year. To focus on A, she is using B to realize an end, namely her (A’s) winning top player for the year, but B cannot share this end. In willing that A be top player of the year, B would, in effect, be willing to be thwarted in his attempt to win top player for the year, assuming that there can be no tie for top player. Finally, awareness on B’s part of the likely effects of A’s successful pursuit of being the top player would presumably not result in B’s being willing to give up his (B’s) end of being top player. In trying to defeat B to be number one, A would be treating B merely as a means and thereby acting wrongly, the account seems to imply, even if A competed fairly, that is, violated none of the competition’s rules. Some might find this implication implausible. Sometimes becoming the best in some endeavor involves defeating (and using) competitors to do so. But defeating (and using) competitors to be the best, especially when they have freely entered a competition, need not amount to acting wrongly, some might insist.
3.2 Possible Consent
In the passage on false promising, Kant references possible consent. He suggests that the victim of the false promise cannot agree to the use the false promisor is making of him. We might conclude that the victim cannot agree on the grounds that he cannot share the promisor’s end; for it would, in the sense invoked above (§3.1.3), be practically irrational for him to pursue this end. There is, however, another way of interpreting the victim’s inability to consent in the context of considering candidates for a plausible sufficient condition for an agent’s treating another merely as a means. Another account, prompted by the Groundwork passage, is this: An agent uses another merely as a means if the other cannot consent to her use of him (O’Neill 1989: 113). An agent cannot consent to being treated as a means if he does not have the ability to avert his being treated as such by dissenting, that is, by withholding his agreement to it. If an agent deceives or coerces another, then the other’s dissent is “in principle ruled out” (1989: 111) and thus so is his consent. Suppose, for example, that an appliance serviceperson tricks a customer into authorizing an expensive repair. The customer does not really have the opportunity to dissent to the person’s action by refusing to give his consent to it. For he does not know what her action is, namely one of lying to him about what is wrong with his refrigerator. (If he did know what her action was, then he would not be deceived.) Or suppose that a mugger approaches you on a dark street, points a gun at you, and tells you that unless you give him all of your money, he will hurt you. He leaves you no opportunity to avert his use of you by withholding your consent. Regardless of what you say, he is presumably going to use you, whether it is through your handing over your wallet or his violently taking it from you. Since you cannot consent to his action, the mugger is treating you merely as a means.
The account is subject to objections. It does not suffice for an agent to treat another merely as a means that the other simply be unable to consent to the way he is being used, some argue. If it did suffice, then a passerby giving cardiopulmonary resuscitation (CPR) to a collapsed jogger would be treating the jogger merely as a means and thus acting wrongly. But the passerby does not seem to be doing anything that is morally impermissible.
In light of this objection, someone might propose a different account: Suppose an agent uses another. She uses him merely as a means if something she has done or is doing to the other renders him unable to consent to her using him. Of course, although the collapsed jogger has no opportunity to consent to the passerby’s giving him CPR, the passerby has not put him in that position. So this account avoids the unwelcome implication that the passerby treats the collapsed jogger merely as a means.
However, this account is also open to objection. First, it fails to designate as such some cases that we, intuitively speaking, would surely classify as treating others merely as means (Kerstein 2013: 74). Think for example of a case where one person knocks someone out with a “date rape” drug. Another person, who had no knowledge of or involvement in drugging the victim, sexually assaults him. Since this other person has not rendered the victim unable to consent to his use of him, the account does not yield the conclusion that he treats him merely as a means.
The account arguably not only fails to capture some cases of an agent’s treating another merely as a means, but also designates as such some cases of deception that, intuitively speaking, are not. For example, in order to make your spouse’s birthday party a surprise for her, you need to lie to your sister-in-law about your whereabouts during a certain afternoon. You use her to quell your spouse’s suspicions regarding your plans. As you realize, if you told your sister-in-law about the party, she would be unable to keep the secret from your spouse. According to the account, you treat your sister-in-law merely as a means, since your deception leaves her with no opportunity to avert your use of her. This conclusion seems questionable to some, albeit not to others. Here is another case of what some think of as morally permissible deception (Parfit 2011: 178). Suppose that, in order to save the life of an innocent witness to a crime, you use her to pass on a lie you have told her to the perpetrator, Brown. If Brown did not believe the lie, he would kill the witness. You realize that if you let the witness in on what was necessary to save her life and told her to lie to Brown herself, she would not be able to do so effectively. Your treatment of the person renders impossible her consent to your use of her. But it is implausible to conclude that you are treating her merely as a means, some insist.
In these two cases, it makes sense to think that the person you are using can share your ends, in the sense specified in §3.1.3. Your sister-in-law can share the end of your spouse not getting suspicious regarding a surprise party, and, of course, the witness can share the end of Brown’s coming to believe some lie. Perhaps that is why in these cases the person’s inability to consent to your use of her seems to fall short of plausibly implying that you are using her merely as a means.
3.3 Actual Consent
A proposal for a sufficient condition for treating another merely as a means might invoke a notion of actual consent. Suppose an agent is using another, the proposal might go; he is using her merely as a means if she has not consented to his use of her (Nozick 1974: 30–31; Scanlon 2008: 107). A more detailed actual consent proposal is the following: “An agent uses another person merely as a means if and only if (1) the agent uses another person as a means in the service of realizing her ends (2) without, as a matter of moral principle, making this use conditional on the other’s consent; where (3) by ‘consent’ is meant the other’s genuine actual consent to being used, in a particular manner, as a means to the agent’s end” (Kleingeld 2020: 398). Both proposals face challenges. For example, suppose a patient arrives in the emergency room unconscious, with severe injuries. The physician on duty judges that only an experimental treatment could preserve the patient’s life. She therefore uses the patient in a study of a new technique to prevent blood loss. Both actual consent proposals imply, seemingly implausibly, that the physician used the patient merely as a means.
One might claim that an agent who uses another without the other’s actual consent treats him merely as a means unless particular conditions obtain: the agent lacks competency to consent, the other is rationally required to consent (e.g., perhaps to preserve his life), or the agent is rationally forbidden to consent (e.g., perhaps to being someone’s slave) (Formosa 2017: 99–100). This proposal would avoid the implication that the physician in the preceding example is using the patient merely as a means; for the patient obviously lacks competency to consent. Yet the proposal seems to suffer from a shortcoming that all the actual consent accounts mentioned have. They all seem to imply, implausibly, that an agent would be treating another merely as a means in cases such as this (Cohen 1995: 243): Someone uses another without the other’s consent to prevent the light from shining in her eyes, by positioning herself in an appropriate way.
3.4 Invoking Moral Notions (or Not)
A distinction worth noting in accounts of using others merely as means is that between ones that do and ones that do not appeal to moral concepts. A clear example of the former type of account is the following: X uses Y merely as a means if and only if (1) X uses Y as a means and (2) X’s use of Y violates a duty that X owes to Y (Fahmy 2023: 58). To determine whether an agent uses another merely as a means on this account, it is obviously necessary to rely on views regarding which duties the agent owes to the other. Not surprisingly, philosophers who offer such accounts sometimes invoke Kant’s notion that persons have dignity that demands respect as a basis for determining our moral duties (2023: 50) (Formosa 2017: 108). A worry concerning these accounts is that the light they shed on what treating others merely as means amounts to is limited by the clarity, or lack thereof, in the moral notions they invoke.
Other philosophers suggest sufficient conditions for a person treating another merely as a means that seem not to depend on any moral concepts (Kerstein 2013: 76) (Audi 2016: 4, 56–57). It is often easier to discern the implications, both plausible and implausible, of these accounts than the implications of accounts that rely on disputed or vague moral concepts such as our dignity or rights as persons. Of course, not only accounts of when agents treat others merely as means, but also accounts of when they do not do so (Section 5) differ in whether they are grounded in moral concepts.
4. Treating Another Merely as a Means and Acting Wrongly
Kant holds that if someone treats another merely as a means, the person acts wrongly, that is, does something morally impermissible. Some accounts of treating others merely as means seem not to yield the conclusion that if a person treats another in this way, then he acts wrongly. On one “rough definition”, we use another merely as a means if we both use the other and regard him
as a mere instrument or tool: someone whose well-being and moral claims we ignore, and whom we would treat in whatever ways would best achieve our aims. (Parfit 2011: 213 and 227)
For example, a kidnapper treats his victim merely as a means if she uses him for profit and thinks of him simply as a tool that she would treat in any way necessary for profit. This account takes quite literally “merely” in “treating others merely as means”. According to it, treating another merely as a means amounts roughly to treating the other solely or exclusively as a tool.
If this is how we understand treating others merely as means, then doing so does not always amount to acting wrongly, it appears. Suppose that a gangster considers a barista a mere tool to get coffee and that he would treat her in whichever way would best serve his interests. In buying coffee from her, the gangster treats her merely as a means on this account, but does not, it seems, act wrongly (Parfit 2011: 216).
On a more detailed, but similar, understanding of treating another
merely as a means, it also seems that the gangster might be doing so
and yet not be acting wrongly. According to this account:
“Treating a person merely as a means is doing something toward
that person . . . on the basis of instrumental motivation, with no
motivational concern regarding any non-instrumental aspects of the
action(s), and with a disposition not to acquire such a concern”
(Audi 2016 56–57).
These notions of treating others merely as means seem not to coincide with Kant’s notion of doing so. Recall Kant’s example of making a false promise to another for financial gain. Suppose that a particular false promiser would not do just anything to the other for gain for himself, for example, he would not murder the other’s family. And suppose that this false promisor does have non-instrumental motivational concern for the other in that he would not make this false promise if it would likely result in the other needing to declare bankruptcy. According to Kant’s notion, but not to these accounts, it appears, the false promisor would be treating the other merely as a means.
We might question whether treating another merely as a means amounts to acting wrongly even if we focus on the candidate sufficient conditions examined above. For the sake of simplicity, let us focus on the possible consent account (§3.2), according to which an agent treats another merely as a means if the other cannot consent to her use of him. (We could just as effectively employ other proposed sufficient conditions we have discussed for just using another.) Suppose that two muggers attack a victim. The victim violently pushes one of the muggers into the other, so that he (the victim) can make his escape. The victim uses the mugger he pushes, and the mugger presumably is unable to avert this use simply by dissenting from it. Yet many would object to the idea that the victim is acting wrongly. One response to this issue would be to build into accounts of treating another merely as a means the specification that one is not doing that if he is using someone in order to prevent himself or someone else from being treated in this way. Building in this specification would, of course, tend to make accounts somewhat unwieldy. Other examples might render more difficult to accept the idea that treating another merely as a means is always morally impermissible. Suppose, for example, that we use one person to save a million people from nuclear conflagration, without giving the one any opportunity to avert the use by dissenting from it. We thereby treat the one merely as a means, according to a possible consent account. But do we act wrongly? Some hold that we do not.
They might defend the view that while it is always wrong pro tanto to treat another merely as a means, doing so is sometimes morally permissible, all things considered. In other words, we always have strong moral reasons not to treat others merely as means, but these reasons can be outweighed by other moral considerations, presumably including the good of many lives being preserved. If, contrary to Kant’s view, the moral constraint against treating others merely as means is not absolute, then a question arises as to when it gets overridden.
5. Using Another, but Not Merely as a Means
We have explored sufficient conditions for treating another merely as a means. But just as challenging as pinpointing them is specifying when someone uses another, but not merely as a means. According to one proposal, if an agent uses another, she does not use him merely as a means if he gives his voluntary, informed consent to her use of him. To fix ideas let us say that the consent of the person being used is voluntary only if he is not being coerced into giving it and informed only if he understands how he is being used and to what purpose(s). This proposal seems intuitively attractive. If a person agrees to someone using him and understands her ends in doing so, then how can she be treating him merely as a means?
Appealing to reflective common sense, philosophers have tried to illustrate how. We might refer to one range of cases they invoke as exploitation cases because they seem to involve one person taking unfair advantage of another, which is a hallmark of exploitation (Wertheimer 1996). To cite one such case, suppose that a mother of modest means cannot afford to give her children a good education. A rich person proposes to finance her children’s enrollment at excellent schools in exchange for her serving as his personal slave (Davis 1984: 392). The mother might understand the use he intends to put her to and for what purposes. Moreover, if we think of coercion as involving an agent threatening to make someone worse off than she would be if she did not interact with the agent, then the rich person would not count as coercing the mother into agreeing to his use of her. The account of using another but not merely as a means that we are considering might, therefore, imply that the rich person is not just using the mother in making her his personal slave. That implication strikes some as implausible.
Another type of case that might cause problems for this account invokes unnecessary or otiose threats designed to force another to serve one’s purposes. Here is an example of such a case. An elderly salesperson thinks that his company is trying to force him into retirement by keeping its latest sales leads from him. Desperate to make a sale, he intends to use his office manager to obtain the latest leads. The manager has the password to a database housing the leads. He tells her that he really needs to close some deals, and unless she gets the latest leads for him, he is going to reveal to everyone in the office that she is lesbian. He believes reasonably, given his incomplete understanding of her and of the attitudes of his other co-workers, that this revelation would be damaging to her reputation. But the office manager takes the salesperson, whom she thinks of as a friendly colleague, to be making an ill-advised joke. Virtually everyone in the office is already aware of her sexual preference. And, she believes, the salesperson is cognizant that it is company policy that all salespeople are to be granted access to the latest leads upon request. She gives him a puzzled look and agrees to get him the leads right away.
The salesperson receives from the office manager her voluntary, informed consent to his use of her to get the leads. She understands that he intends to use her to this end. Granted, he threatens to make her worse off if she does not give him the leads. But it is not the threat, which she does not even register as such, that generates her agreement to his use of her. She agrees voluntarily. Yet, despite obtaining her consent for his use of her, some believe that the salesperson treats the office manager merely as a means and acts (at least pro tanto) wrongly. Others might argue that although the salesperson has revealed a moral deficiency, he has not done anything wrong. Rather, he has simply revealed a morally faulty attitude toward the office manager (Scanlon 2008: 46; Walen 2014: 428–429). If we judge that the salesperson does act wrongly, then we presumably take this case to illustrate that treating another merely as a means does not necessarily amount to harming her. In other words, in treating another merely as a means, an individual can wrong another without harming her.
Regardless of whether we judge in this case that the salesperson acts wrongly, the case helps to illustrate a distinction between agent-focused and patient-focused accounts of treating or not treating another merely as a means. According to the account we are considering, let us recall, if an agent uses another, she does not use him merely as a means if he gives his voluntary, informed consent to her use of him. This account focuses on the other, that is, on the individual treated as a means to determine whether the agent is treating him merely as a means. If he (i.e., the other) gives his informed, voluntary consent to being used in some way, then the agent does not treat him merely as a means, according to the account. To make this determination, an agent-focused account would, of course, focus more on the agent. Such an account might hold, for example, that if an agent uses another, she does not use him merely as a means if it is reasonable for her (the agent) to believe that the other gives his voluntary, informed consent to her use of him. According to the notion of reasonable belief invoked here, it is reasonable for someone to believe something roughly if the belief is justifiable given the person’s context (e.g., his upbringing, cognitive limitations, and so forth). Contrary to the patient-focused account, the agent-focused account is free from the implication that the salesperson is not treating the office manager merely as a means. It is not reasonable for the salesperson to believe that the office manager has given her voluntary consent to his use of her. It is, rather, reasonable for him to believe that he has coerced her into giving him the sales leads. A parallel patient-based vs. agent-based distinction applies, of course, to accounts of sufficient conditions for treating another merely as a means. One might, for example, hold that an agent just uses another if the other cannot share the end the agent is pursuing in using him (a patient-focused account). Or one might hold that an agent just uses another if it is reasonable for her to believe that the other cannot share the end the agent is pursuing in using him (an agent-focused account).
We have been considering actual consent accounts of agents using others, but not treating them merely as means. We can also develop accounts that invoke other concepts familiar from discussion of sufficient conditions for treating others merely as means, including the concepts of possible end-sharing and possible consent. For example, we might suggest that an agent who uses another does not use that other merely as a means if the other can consent to the agent’s use of him, that is, if the other can avert the use simply by dissenting from it. This suggestion, as well as others that invoke additional concepts we have considered, such as that of end sharing, might generate questionable verdicts regarding exploitation cases. For example, the mother of modest means discussed above can consent to the rich person’s use of her. Her dissent from it alone would stop it from occurring. But some would insist that the rich person is nevertheless treating her merely as a means in making her his personal slave in exchange for educating his children.
Another approach to conditions under which an agent uses another, but does not treat him merely as a means takes shape against a literal construal of treating others merely as means. On this construal, discussed above, we use another merely as a means roughly if we both use the other and regard him as a mere tool. According to the approach, we do not treat another merely as a means if our treatment of the other person “is governed or guided in sufficiently important ways by some relevant moral belief or concern” (Parfit 2011: 214). But when is an agent’s use of another governed in sufficiently important ways by some relevant moral belief or concern? The agent’s use of another is so governed, according to one response, when the agent tries to and succeeds in using the other only in ways to which the other can rationally consent.
But when can the other rationally consent? To simplify matters, let us make some background assumptions. Let us suppose that the people who might be used understand what will be done to them and to what purpose, as well as the effects the use will have. Let us also assume that those who might be used have the power to give (or to withhold) consent in the “act-affecting sense” (Parfit 2011: 183–184). When we ask whether they can rationally consent to being used, we are asking whether it would be rational for them to consent (or dissent) supposing that their choice would determine whether or not they were used.
Against the background of these assumptions, we can say that, on this account, a person can rationally consent to being treated as a means just in case he has sufficient reasons to consent to it. The account rests on an “objective” view of reasons, according to which
there are certain facts that give us reasons both to have certain desires and aims, and to do whatever might achieve these aims. These reasons are given by facts about the objects of these desires or aims, or what we might want or try to achieve. (Parfit 2011: 45)
For example, the fact that a child is in pain as a result of a splinter stuck in his finger gives me reason to want to and to try to get it out. On this account, we have impartial as well as partial reasons for agreeing to be treated in various ways. Our impartial reasons are “person-neutral” (2011: 138). We do not need to invoke ourselves when we describe the facts that yield these reasons. The fact that some event would cause tremendous pain to a particular person, for example, gives us reason (albeit perhaps not sufficient reason) to prevent the event or relieve the pain “whoever this person may be, and whatever this person’s relation to us” (2011: 138). Our partial reasons are “person-relative”: they “are provided by facts whose description must refer to us” (2011: 138). The fact that the little boy being hurt by the splinter is my son gives me a partial reason to pull it out. We each have partial reasons to be particularly attentive to our own well-being and to the well-being of those in our circle, for example, our family and friends. According to the account,
When one of our two possible acts would make things go in some way that would be impartially better, but the other act would make things go better either for ourselves or for those to whom we have close ties, we often have sufficient reasons to act in either of these ways. (2011: 137)
For example, regarding a case in which a person could either save himself from some injury or do something that would save some stranger’s life in a distant land, the person presumably has sufficient reasons to do either one. In a similar vein, a person can have sufficient reason to consent to being treated as a means by virtue of some impartial reason, such as the fact that his being so treated will save many lives, even if he also has sufficient reason to dissent from being treated as a means by virtue of some partial reason, such as the fact that his being so treated will result in suffering for him. In sum, this account holds that if an agent uses another, he does not use the other merely as a means if the other has sufficient reasons, as just characterized, for agreeing to be used.
The account seems to imply that cases thought to be paradigmatic of treating others merely as means do not involve treating them in this way. Take a case in which a pedestrian is on a bridge above a track where a train is barreling toward five people (Parfit 2011: 218). The only way to save the five would be to open, by remote control, a trap-door on which the pedestrian is standing, so that he would fall in front of the train. The train would kill him, but the impact would trigger its automatic brake. If a bystander opens the trap door, then she uses the pedestrian as a means to save the five. The pedestrian has sufficient reasons to refrain from consenting to being used to stop the train. After all, it will result in his premature death. But, according to the account, he also might have sufficient reasons to consent to being used to stop the train; for his being used in this way would save the lives of five people, contributing to an outcome which is presumably impartially best (2011: 220). Suppose the bystander opens the trap door and uses the person on the bridge to save the five. In so doing, she might be limiting her use of another to ways to which the other can rationally consent. If she is, then she is not treating the person merely as a means, according to the account.
Consider another well-known example. Five patients at a hospital are in immediate need of different organs. One patient needs a kidney, another needs a liver, and so forth. If a surgeon used a healthy person undergoing routine tests as a resource for organs, killing him in the process, all of the five would be saved (Harman 1977: 3–4). The healthy person presumably has strong partial reasons to dissent from being used for his organs. But he also arguably has enough impartial reason to consent, namely, that five people will thereby be saved, such that overall he has sufficient reason to consent. So, assuming that the surgeon is trying to treat people only in ways to which they can rationally consent, she might not be treating the healthy person merely as a means, even if before she succeeds in putting him under, he is begging for his life. If the account we are considering of using others, but not merely as means does entail that the bystander and the doctor in these two cases are not treating others merely as means, the account suffers from a significant flaw, according to some.
In the words of one philosopher, the idea that it is wrong to treat others merely as means is “both very important and very hard to pin down” (Glover 2006: 65). Our investigation has illustrated challenges in specifying what it means to treat others merely as means. It has not revealed one, univocal concept, grounded in common sense, of what just using another amounts to. In the end, there may be no such concept, but rather a set of overlapping notions, which point to a range of morally problematic actions or attitudes concerning the use of others.
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