Peter Damian

First published Wed Aug 27, 2003; substantive revision Thu Oct 1, 2020

Peter Damian, an eleventh-century monastic leader and Church reformer, has received a modest place in the historiography of early medieval philosophy because of his little tract De divina omnipotentia. In this work, Damian treats two questions related to the limits of divine power: can God restore virginity to a woman who has lost it, and, can God change the past? Damian has often been depicted as a thinker who, in his defense of divine omnipotence, went as far as denying the universal validity of the principle of non-contradiction. For the most part, this depiction of Damian is unfounded. Nevertheless, De divina omnipotentia is an interesting document related to the early developments of medieval discussion concerning modalities and divine omnipotence.

1. Life and Works

Peter Damian (Petrus Damianus or Petrus Damiani) was born in or around 1007 in Ravenna, Italy. He acquired the name Damianus or Damiani after his elder brother Damianus, who cared for him in his youth. Peter studied liberal arts and law in Ravenna, Faenza and Parma, and gained a reputation as a teacher of rhetoric. About 1035, Damian experienced a religious conversion and entered the monastery at Fonte Avellana, near Gubbio. Because of his zealous devotion and his learning, Damian was soon entrusted with administrative and teaching tasks in his own and other monasteries. He became prior of Fonte Avellana in 1043, and led the monastery to a new prosperity. Damian developed into one of the most influential persons in the Church of his time who, through his writings and personal contacts, sought to foster monastic reform and reform of the Church. In 1057, Damian was nominated Cardinal-Bishop of Ostia against his will; he was relieved of at least some of the duties related to the office a few years later. Because of Damian’s rhetorical skills and his knowledge of Canon Law, the Pope used him as his legate on several occasions. Damian died when returning from one such mission on the 22nd or 23rd of February 1072 in Faenza.

Peter Damian was a voluminous writer. The most important part of his production is his letters, which number 180. Damian’s treatises are also included in the collection of letters because they take the form of letters. The only one of Damian’s works which is considered to be of philosophical interest is Letter 119, which is better known as De divina omnipotentia (On Divine Omnipotence). This letter is addressed to Abbot Didier of Monte Cassino and his community, and it is dated at the beginning of 1065.

The recent book-length studies on Damian’s life and thought by McCready (2011) and Ranft (2012) are not philosophical in orientation, but they can be usefully read to gain an understanding of Damian's career and his personality.

2. Passage 612A–B and Damian’s Reputation

Damian’s reputation as a thinker who denies the universal validity of the principle of non-contradiction goes back to a series of studies that the German scholar J.A. Endres published early in the twentieth century (Endres 1906, Endres 1910, and some others). This notion is one of the central pieces in Endres’s more comprehensive thesis about a controversy between “dialecticians” and “anti-dialecticians” in the eleventh century — “dialecticians” being thinkers with a rational tendency while “anti-dialecticians” are suspicious of or hostile towards use of secular arts in discussions related to Christian faith. Peter Damian is Endres’s prime representative of the anti-dialectical attitude. Endres’s interpretation of Damian’s position ultimately depends on a single passage in De divina omnipotentia, passage 612A–B (in the Migne edition). To better understand that passage, some preliminary remarks about the content and aim of De divina omnipotentia should be made. (However, see also Section 6.)

In De divina omnipotentia, Damian treats two questions related to divine power: Can God restore virginity to a woman who has lost it? Can God bring it about that what has been done has not been done? These questions had been brought up at a mealtime discussion during Damian’s recent visit to the Abbey of Monte Cassino. The first question was suggested by a passage in a letter by Jerome which had been read aloud during one of the meals (596C–D). Damian maintained the view of divine omnipotence and claimed that God can restore virginity. The second question was suggested by the first one: some people asked Damian whether, in his view, God can undo the done; for example, can God bring it about that Rome was never founded (601C)? The general tendency in Damian’s treatment is clear: he aims at defending the doctrine of divine omnipotence. It is also clear that Damian’s answer to the first question is affirmative: he explicitly and emphatically declares that God can restore virginity to a woman who has lost it.

Given the information in the previous paragraph, one can construct the following argument for the claim that Damian has to deny the universal validity of the principle of non-contradiction: (1) Damian maintains that God can restore virginity to a woman who has lost it. (2) But restoration of virginity consists in removing those events in the woman’s past that are incompatible with her being a virgin. (3) Therefore, Damian has to maintain that God can undo what has been done. (4) But the undoing of what has been done involves a contradiction. (5) Therefore, Damian has to claim that the principle of non-contradiction is not universally valid.

This construction of Damian’s view is not entirely unrelated to the text of De divina omnipotentia. There is a passage in De divina omnipotentia where Damian touches upon the connection between the question of restoring virginity, the question of undoing the done, and the validity of the principle of non-contradiction, viz. the very passage on which Endres based his view about Damian’s position. The passage reads as follows (the preceding sentences are also included to provide the context):

Let the quibbling of the impious question be once more put forth; let it also be seen from what root it was produced, for then the stream that ought to be engulfed by the ground lest it should flood and ruin the rich fruits of sound faith may just dry out with its source. For in order to prove that God could not restore a virgin after her lapse, they add, as if it were a consequence [of the original question] (quasi consequenter): for would even God be able to bring it about that what has been done, has not been done? As if [it were so that] if it is ever established that a virgin has been spoilt, it could not happen that she would be intact again. This is assuredly true as far as nature is concerned, and the opinion holds. Also, that something has been done and that the very same thing has not been done cannot be the case. These, to be sure, are contraries to each other in such a way that if one of them is, the other cannot be. For of what has been it cannot truly be said that it has not been, and, the other way around, of what has not been it is not correctly said that it has been. For contraries cannot coincide in one and the same subject. This impossibility, then, (haec porro inpossibilitas) is indeed rightly affirmed if it is attributed to the lack of means of nature, but on no account should it be applied to the divine majesty. For he who has given birth to nature easily removes the necessity of nature when he wills. (611D–612B).

Towards the end of this passage, Damian appears to be saying that God can restore virginity and undo what has been done even if it requires that the principle of non-contradiction is violated. At least this is how Endres interpreted the passage. According to Endres, Damian counts the principle of non-contradiction among the laws of nature; as such, it belongs to the sphere of the contingent and cannot restrict the agency of God Almighty. Because of this passage, the critique of dialectic and other secular arts that Damian presents elsewhere (see, e.g., 603C–604A, 610D–611D) acquires a new significance. Damian was not satisfied with simply criticizing the misplaced and mistaken use of dialectic in theology; he aimed at denying the possibility of science existing independent of theology (Endres 1906, 30–31; 1910, 23–30).

Recent commentators disagree about the correct interpretation of 612A–B, but none of them find Endres’s conclusions justified (see, e.g., Gonsette 1956, 100–101; Cantin 1972, 139–140, 173–176, 203–206; Remnant 1978, 260–261; Resnick 1992, 110–111; Knuuttila 1993, 65–66; Holopainen 1996, 36–39, 42; Gaskin 1997, 232–233, 240–243; closest to Endres’s view comes Bauke-Ruegg 1998, 443–451). The problem with Endres’s reading of 612A–B is that it fits badly with what Damian says elsewhere in De divina omnipotentia. Namely, Damian rejects as outrageous the suggestion that God could bring about something that violates the principle of non-contradiction (see Section 5.1). Either Endres’s reading of 612A–B is altogether wrong, or at least the passage does not have the weight that Endres wants to give it.

There is a curious feature in Damian’s idea about restoring virginity. Damian talks about kinds of restoration of virginity that do not require any interfering with past events (see Section 4). This is significant because it ruins our constructed argument for the claim that Damian has to deny the universal validity of the principle of non-contradiction (above, steps [1]–[5]). If Damian does not share the assumption that restoration of virginity consists in removing some events in the past (step [2]), then the two questions in De divina omnipotentia can be treated and answered separately. Even though Damian affirms the possibility of restoring virginity, he need not affirm the possibility of undoing the done.

Passage 612A–B (or 611D–612B) appears to be connected to this issue. The beginning of the passage shows that Damian intends to make a point about the relation (or unrelatedness) of the two questions in De divina omnipotentia. (By “impious question” Damian means the question about undoing the done.) From 612B onwards, Damian discusses God’s power to reverse the laws of nature and arrives at the conclusion that God can restore virginity through a miracle within some present moment of time (cf. Section 4). As for Damian’s claim about “this impossibility” (haec ... inpossibilitas), which applies to nature but not to God, it is not clear whether he refers to the impossibility of bringing about something that violates the principle of non-contradiction or the impossibility of restoring virginity. If he refers to the latter, his point would be to say that God can restore virginity even though it is not possible to undo the done (Holopainen 1996, 36–39).

Passage 612A–B is too ambiguous to support any substantial claims about Damian’s view; Damian does not deserve his reputation as a thinker who denies the universal validity of the principle of non-contradiction in order to defend the divine omnipotence. (At the same time, it must be added that Damian is not quite clear about the validity of the principle of non-contradiction for those things for which God is not responsible. See Section 5.1.)

3. Definition of Omnipotence

Damian’s central interest in De divina omnipotentia is to defend the doctrine of omnipotence against certain challenges. The defense that Damian offers rests on a specific understanding of what constitutes omnipotence.

The doctrine of omnipotence (omnipotentia) implies that God “is capable of everything” (omnia possit; e.g., 596C–D, 610C–D). In Damian’s view, it does not follow from the doctrine that we should think that God would be able to do anything whatsoever. Admittedly, there are many things that God cannot do, e.g., God cannot lie (e.g., 597C). Lying is an evil thing. In Damian’s view, an agent need not be able to do evil in order to qualify as omnipotent because not being able to do evil is no sign of impotence or inability. Actually, God cannot do anything that is evil and he can do anything that is good. By “omnipotence”, Damian means this ability to do anything that is good. This ability can properly be characterized as “omnipotence” because evil things are “nothing” (nihil). To be capable of “everything” (omnia), an agent must be capable of anything that is “something” (aliquid), but he need not be capable of “nothing” (598D–599A, 600A–B, 610C–D).

The remarks about “nothing” and “something” are related to Damian’s conception of the major metaphysical division among things in the world. The things in the world can be divided into the good (bona) and the bad or evil (mala), and these are quite different from each other (see 602A–C, 608B–610D, 618B–C). What is characteristic of good things is that they are (esse) and that they are something (aliquid). The good things that are have been made by God and are willed by God. Evil things are not willed by God, and they are far away from him. The being of evil is apparent and not real. Evil things seem to be, but in the testimony of the truth, they are not (non esse); they are not something but nothing (nihil). God is not the author of evil, for “nothing was made without him” (sine ipso factum est nihil, John 1:3).

In some passages, Damian assumes that divine omnipotence can be characterized as God’s ability to bring about anything that he can will. Because God can will anything that is good, and he cannot will anything that is evil, this amounts to the same as the characterization of omnipotence as God’s ability to bring about anything that is good (cf. 596C–597B, 599A, 600A–B). However, the characterization of omnipotence as God's ability to bring about anything that he can will reveals an important aspect in Damian’s view of divine power, viz. divine freedom. Damian is very emphatic about God’s freedom in his creative activity. In his omnipotence, God can do anything that is good, but he need not do everything that is good — he need not do anything at all (600B, 605C, 607A; for the Augustinian background, see Knuuttila 1993, 66–70).

Given Damian’s understanding of omnipotence, it is, in principle, easy to determine whether God can do some given thing or not. One just has to find out whether the thing in question is a good thing or a bad thing. If it is a good thing, then God can both will it and bring it about. If it is evil, it is something that God cannot even will (cf. 600B).

4. Can God Restore Virginity?

To determine whether God can restore virginity, we need to find out whether getting virginity back is a good thing. In Damian’s view, there is no doubt about it. As the loss of virginity is an evil, getting virginity back would be a good thing. Since God Almighty can will and do anything that is good, he can will to restore virginity, and he can restore it. This is Damian’s general solution to the first question (599C–600B).

Damian expands his solution by explaining that there are two relevant ways of understanding what the restoration of virginity means (see 600C–601B). Restoring virginity concerns either the fullness of merits (iuxta meritorum plenitudinem) or the integrity of the flesh (iuxta carnis integritatem). Restoration of virginity according to merit is possible, maintains Damian, for it consists of returning to the Lord. And, surely, the creator of humans can also repair the damage that the loss of virginity causes to the flesh. Thus, Damian can end his main discussion concerning the first question by boldly declaring that God can restore virginity to a woman, no matter how many husbands she has had, and that he can also repair the sign of virginity in her flesh, so that it is as good as when she emerged from her mother’s womb.

As already intimated (Section 2), the restoration of virginity that Damian affirms as possible does not imply any interfering with past events. This goes both for restoration of fullness of merits and restoration of the integrity of the flesh. In the remarks related to restoration of virginity that Damian presents later in De divina omnipotentia, he mainly concentrates on the restoration of virginity according to the integrity of the flesh (see 611B–D, 614C).

Damian makes some comparisons that make it clear that the restoration of virginity is a miracle within some present moment of time. Damian says that restoring virginity is a lesser miracle than the virgin birth. The virgin birth is like going through doors without opening them; the restoring of virginity is like closing doors that have been opened (611B–C). Damian further compares the virgin birth and the restoration of virginity to the eternal life of Enoch (Sirach 44:16; Hebrews 11:5) and the resurrection of Lazarus (John 11) (614C). What seems to be common to the restoration of virginity, the resurrection, and the closing of doors is that, in all three cases, something is restored to its original state. Such a restoration need not affect the past in any way. Restoring virginity does nothing to the fact that a woman has lost her virginity and has been without it, as the resurrection of Lazarus does not remove the fact that he has died and been dead. Restoration of virginity is an “ordinary” miracle comparable to some of the miracles that are reported in the Bible.

In De divina omnipotentia, Damian presents some systematic remarks concerning God’s power to produce miracles. God has sovereign power over nature. As the author of nature and its laws, he has reserved to himself the right to change the laws of nature according to his free choice and bend them as he wishes. Nature cannot but obey the will of its maker (612B–D). As evidence for this view, Damian enumerates a large number of miracles and miraculous phenomena that are contrary to the ordinary laws of nature (612D–614B; cf. 610D–611D). The discussion ends with the renewed affirmation that God is capable of restoring virginity if he wills (614C). None of the miracles that Damian mentions imply that God could undo the done or bring about a contradictory state of affairs. The aim of Damian’s discussion appears to be to argue that God can miraculously restore the physical integrity of the flesh even though it is not possible to change the past (cf. 615A–B and Section 2).

5. Can God Undo the Done?

5.1. Damian’s Main Approach

The second question discussed by Damian in De divina omnipotentia asks whether God is able to bring it about that what has been done has not been done. Damian’s discussion of the question is somewhat complicated, and he is not too explicit about what he is doing. There are some interrelated passages which offer what can be identified as Damian’s main approach (601C–610D, 615A–B, 618B–D, 620C–D). Towards the end, there is a passage which Damian marks as an additional consideration (619A–620C; see Section 5.2).

Damian’s main approach to the second question is to argue that the past cannot be undone because what God has made cannot lose its status of having been. Before directly arguing this point, Damian presents two preliminary considerations which help to put the question in the proper setting. The first of these preliminary considerations is related to some discussions within the art of dialectic whereas the second is theological in nature.

In the first preliminary consideration (602D–604B; see also 609A and 615A–B), Damian connects the question about undoing the done to what he says is a disputed question of dialectic, “the question about the consequence of necessity and impossibility” (quaestio ... de consequentia necessitatis vel inpossibilitatis, 604A).

In Damian’s view, those who have put the question about God’s ability to undo what has been done have acted impetuously, for they do not understand the import of their query. They are asking whether God can bring it about that what has been done, will not have been done. However, the kind of impossibility that is implied here concerns not only what is past but also what is present or future. One must also ask whether God can bring it about that what is, is not, or whether he can bring it about that what will be, will not be. In Damian’s view, the logic in these questions is the same. The rules of dialectic say that from the factuality of any statement, regardless of the tense, you can infer its necessity and the impossibility of its contradictory in the following manner: what has been, necessarily has been, and it is impossible that it has not been; what is, necessarily is, as long as it is, and it is impossible that it is not; what will be, necessarily will be, and it is impossible that it will not be (602D–603B).

What should one think of the necessity and impossibility which follow from any true singular statement? Does it follow that everything happens of necessity (so that not even God can do anything about it)? There was a disputed question in the dialectic of Damian’s time which dealt with these kinds of queries. The root of the question is Aristotle’s discussion of singular future statements in De interpretatione 9 which the eleventh-century dialecticians read in Boethius’s Latin translation. They also knew what Boethius said about the theme in his two commentaries to De interpretatione and in Philosophiae consolatio. These works provide the background for the question that Damian refers to, but the formulation which Damian knows appears to be of early medieval invention (see Holopainen 1999, 230–232; Holopainen 2006). Damian himself says that the question is an old question from the liberal arts which has newly been taken up again. However, the contemporary discussion is different from the ancient one in that the ancients discussed the question purely as a question of dialectic, whereas the contemporary writers have turned it into a quasi-theological question that has bearing on divine power (604A).

Another contemporary source with information about the question is the discussion in Cur deus homo II.17 by Anselm of Canterbury, some thirty years later. Anselm makes a distinction between two kinds of necessity: there is preceding necessity (necessitas praecedens) and there is subsequent necessity (necessitas sequens). Preceding necessity is an efficient kind of necessity, and it is the cause of a thing’s being the case. The subsequent necessity does not cause anything, but is caused by a thing’s being the case. The necessity which follows from any true singular statement in any tense is subsequent necessity. Anselm’s discussion implies that the question about the consequence of necessity and impossibility arises from the failure to keep the two kinds of necessity separate (Knuuttila 1993, 74; Knuuttila 2004, 122–124; Marenbon 1996, 12–16; Holopainen 1999; Binini 2017, 251–253).

Damian does not tell us how the question about the consequence of necessity and impossibility can be resolved. It is possible that he was familiar with the kind of solution that one can find in Cur deus homo II.17 (see Holopainen 1999, 227–232; Holopainen 2006, 116–119). At any rate, Damian takes it for granted that the question can be solved in a manner which does not restrain omnipotence for he rejects the question as irrelevant to a discussion about divine power (604A–B; cf. 609A and 615A–B). In the same context, Damian also makes a comment about applying dialectic to theology: when dialectic and other branches of human knowledge are applied to the investigation of theological matters, they must serve as a maid (ancilla) serves her mistress; they must not try to adopt the leading position. Damian also accuses his discussion companions of being incompetent in the field of their art: they do not yet know the rudiments of dialectic, but nevertheless they try to apply it to theological issues (603B–D).

The second preliminary consideration in Damian’s main approach to the second question focuses on divine providence. Drawing mainly on Augustine’s writings, Damian presents a lengthy discussion concerning God’s eternity and his relation to created beings (604C–608A; see also 599A–B and 618C–D). God is immutable, both in himself and in his relation to creation. He is not in any time or place, but all times and places, as well as all creatures, are contained in “the treasure of God’s wisdom”, or in his providence (providentia). To God there is no past or future; everything is present to him in an eternal now. To him, nothing changes or moves; everything that streams by or goes past in time stands immutably and eternally in his providence.

The doctrine of divine providence puts the question about changing the past in a new perspective (see 607A–610D). This doctrine warrants Damian’s claim that the same considerations apply to things past, present and future, at least when we are discussing God’s power. The doctrine of divine providence also makes it immediately clear what the answer to the second question has to be: the past cannot be changed because the past events are immutably present in the divine providential plan which is immutable (607A).

To Damian, asking whether God can undo the done is asking whether God can bring about a contradictory state of affairs. In Damian’s view, it is obvious that this is something that God cannot do:

You, therefore, while you demand that one and the same thing both has been and has not been, is and is not, will be and will not be, you truly strive to confuse everything that has been made or is to be made and to show that it wavers between being and non-being. Certainly, the nature of things will not tolerate this. For nothing can be and not be at the same time; but what is not in the nature of things, is undoubtedly nothing. You ask, therefore, harsh critic, that God make what is not his, that is to say nothing. But behold! the Evangelist stands against you, saying that nothing is made without him (John 1:3). God has not yet learned to make nothing. You, teach him, and command him to make nothing for you! (608C; translated in Holopainen 1996, 32).

The passage provides a justification for the idea that God’s inability to undo what has been done does not contradict his omnipotence. In Damian’s view, omnipotence consists of God’s power to bring about anything that is good. A contradictory state of affairs would be nothing and evil, and therefore the ability to bring it about is not included in omnipotence (cf. Section 3).

In another passage (608D–610D), Damian appeals to the efficacy of God’s will to argue that a contradictory state of affairs cannot become actualized. Here, different considerations apply to the good and the evil (cf. Section 3). The good things are because God wills them to be. God’s will as the efficient cause of the being of beings has such intensity that what he wills to be, cannot not be, and what he does not will to be, cannot be. Good things, then, are unequivocally in the case that they are, and a contradictory state of affairs cannot be realized through some good thing’s being and not being at the same moment. As far as good things are concerned, we can say that the validity of the principle of non-contradiction is a consequence of divine omnipotence: it is an indication of the might of God’s will as the efficient cause of being. The same is true of the validity of the consequence of necessity and impossibility; what some people see as a limitation to God’s power is really an expression of his power (608D–609A, 610B).

Damian’s view is blurry when it comes to the validity of the principle of non-contradiction for evil things. He states that a contradictory state of affairs cannot be realized through some evil thing’s being and not being at the same time. However, he supports this statement by pointing out that the being of evil things is apparent and not real: they cannot both “be” and “not be” at the same time because they never have the kind of “being” (esse) that good things have (610B–C). This leaves open the possibility that some evil thing could have and not have its quasi-being at the same moment of time (cf. Resnick 1992, 110–111). It is not clear whether this is an intended feature of Damian’s view or not. In any case, the issue is not relevant for Damian’s discussion about the power of God because God gives being in an unequivocal manner.

In the conclusion to his main approach, Damian focuses on the principle of non-contradiction as he understands it. He first lets us understand that we need not bother about the evil things. As for the rest, i.e., the good things, it is outrageous to suggest that their being would not be unequivocal:
When therefore this question is proposed, with these words: “How can God bring it about that what has been done will not have been done”, let a brother of sound faith answer that what has been done, if it was an evil, was not something but nothing, and on that account it must be said not to have been, because what the Maker of things did not order to be, did not have the grounds for existence. For he said, and they were made, he ordered, and they were created (Psalms 32:9). For everything was made by him, and nothing was made without him (John 1:3). And therefore to ask, “How can God make it so that what has been done will not have been done?” is the same as to ask, “Can God bring it about that what he has made he will not have made?” Undoubtedly, what God has made, God will not have made! Therefore, who utters this is to be spat upon, and he is not worthy of reply, but rather should be condemned to branding. (618B–C; translated in Holopainen 1996, 40).

In Damian’s view, the past cannot be undone because what God has made cannot lose its status of having been (because God has made what he wanted to make, and his will is immutable in eternity). For the same reason, the principle of non-contradiction is universally valid for everything which has being from God. Also, the things that have being from God cannot but be when they are, and therefore the consequence of necessity and impossibility is valid for them (609A).

5.2. A Supplementary Approach

Towards the end of De divina omnipotentia, Damian presents an additional approach to the question of undoing the done (619A–620C). Damian clearly marks the passage as an additional consideration that can be used to combat those impudent people who are not satisfied with his principal solution (619A). In spite of this, the passage has often been mistaken for Damian’s principal statement of the matter; in many selections from the text, only the additional approach is included whereas Damian’s main approach is omitted (except for the question about the consequence of necessity and impossibility).

Damian’s main approach has been to show that divine omnipotence remains intact even though God cannot undo the done. In the supplementary approach, he pursues a different strategy: there is a sense in which it can be said, and not in a foolish way (non inepte), that God “can” (potest) bring it about that what has been done, has not been done. This can be proved as follows. Since God’s power (posse) is coeternal with God himself, it is immutably the same. Before the beginning of time, it was possible for God that none of those things that we know as the past would come into being. Therefore, this is possible for him now and always (620A–B).

In his additional approach, Damian purposefully put forward ideas that he knew were problematic. For if it is true that God cannot undo what has been done, there must be something wrong in any argument that seems to prove that he can. To save the faithful among the readers from too much bewilderment, Damian suggests that the additional consideration that he presents is principally of a grammatical nature. Namely, he points out that when we speak about God’s ability to bring it about that what has been done, has not been done, the expression “He can (potest) do it” is appropriate for speaking of the eternal God; from our temporal point of view, “He could have (potuit) done it” is the appropriate way of expressing it (619A–C). If we follow this lead, the statement that God can undo what has been done collapses into the statement that God could have chosen to make the past different from what it actually was (Remnant 1978; Moonan 1980; Holopainen 1996, 42). Of course, this is not changing the past properly speaking. What Damian assumes here is that God could have chosen a different providential plan, not that God could make changes in the providential plan that he has actually chosen.

6. Damian’s Objective

It is easy to misunderstand Damian’s position regarding the validity of the principle of non-contradiction and the possibility of altering the past. This is partly due to the disorderliness of some of Damian’s ideas. There is also another important factor which promotes misunderstanding. In Damian’s view, there are some ideas that you should not articulate even though they are true. The idea that God cannot undo the done counts among these.

The situation from which De divina omnipotentia resulted begun from Damian’s attempt to regulate what one may utter about God. Damian had been sitting at the table of Abbot Didier in Monte Cassino and eating. While they were eating, a passage in Jerome’s letter to Eustochium was read in which it is claimed that even though God is capable of everything (omnia possit), he cannot restore virginity to a woman who has lost it. Damian stated that he had always found it disturbing that an inability (inpossibilitas) was so lightly ascribed to God. A discussion followed in which Damian defended the view that God has the power of restoring virginity whereas Didier argued for Jerome’s view that he cannot restore it. In Damian’s view, there is a sense in which we can say that God can restore virginity, and therefore we must affirm that he can restore it (596C–601B).

Damian’s objective at the table of Monte Cassino was to protect the doctrine of divine omnipotence by advising that we should abstain from saying anything which implies that God is powerless in some respect. Some of the monks sitting at the table were less interested in Damian’s advice and more interested in the issue of omnipotence in itself. They were bold enough to put a question to Damian: if God is omnipotent in all things, as Damian has asserted, does he have the power of bringing it about that what has been done has not been done (601C)? We can be sure that Damian found this question very annoying. It is a difficult question, and it is a question that is difficult to handle without making statements about what God cannot do. Damian does not offer us any report about how the discussion continued. However, there is a remark in De divina omnipotentia which suggests that Damian himself was accused of implying that God is impotent in a certain respect (620D).

Damian’s objective in De divina omnipotentia is twofold. First, Damian reiterates his point about moderation while talking about God (e.g., 597B–599A, 603B–604B, 614D–616C). He strongly advises that we should abstain from spreading certain kinds of statements, even in cases where they are found in the Bible (597B–C). Damian’s most important motive here seems to be to protect the faith of the simple believers:

For if it should reach the common people that God is asserted to be impotent in some respect (which is a wicked thing to say), the unschooled masses would instantly be confused and the Christian faith would be upset, not without grave danger to souls. (597C; tr. Spade 3.18–22).

Second, Damian defends himself against the accusation that he said that God is impotent in a certain respect (620D). His delicate task in De divina omnipotentia is to convince his readers of the view that divine omnipotence remains intact even though God cannot undo the done, without ever saying that God cannot undo the done because this is “a wicked thing to say”.



  • Pierre Damien, Lettre sur la toute-puissance divine, ed. and tr. A. Cantin (Sources chrétiennes 191), Paris: Cerf, 1972. (The best edition available of De divina omnipotentia, with French translation and commentary. Cantin reproduces the column numbers in Migne’s Patrologia Latina, vol. 145.)
  • Pier Damiani, De divina omnipotentia e altri opuscoli, ed. P. Brezzi, tr. B. Nardi (Edizione nazionale dei classici del pensiero italiano 5), Firenze: Vallecchi, 1943. (Critical edition and Italian translation of De divina omnipotentia and some other works.)
  • Die Briefe des Petrus Damiani, 4 vols, ed. K. Reindel (Monumenta Germaniae Historica. Die Briefe der deutschen Kaiserzeit 4.1–4), München 1983–1993. (Critical edition of Damian’s letters; De divina omnipotentia is Letter 119, in volume 3, 1989, 341–384.) [Reindel edition available online]

English translations

There is an English translation of De divina omnipotentia (Letter 119) in Peter Damian, Letters 91–120, tr. O.J. Blum (The Fathers of the Church. Mediaeval Continuation 5), Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press 1998, 344–386. (Unfortunately, there are mistakes in the translation of some passages of Damian’s treatise which are crucial to its understanding. See the Supplement Document.)

Secondary literature

  • Bauke-Ruegg, J., 1998, Die Allmacht Gottes, Berlin: de Gruyter (especially pp. 430–457).
  • Binini, I., 2017, Possibility and Necessity in the Philosophy of Peter Abelard, Ph.D. thesis, Pisa: Scuola Normale Superiore.
  • Cantin, A., 1972, Pierre Damien, Lettre sur la toute-puissance divine. Introduction, texte critique, traduction et notes (Sources chrétiennes 191), Paris: Cerf.
  • Dressler, F., 1954, Petrus Damiani. Leben und Werk, Roma: Herder.
  • Endres, J.A., 1906, “Die Dialektiker und ihre Gegner im 11. Jahrhundert”, Philosophisches Jahrbuch, 19: 20–33. [Endres 1906 available online]
  • –––, 1910, Petrus Damiani und die weltliche Wissenschaft (Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie des Mittelalters 8.3), Münster: Aschendorff. [Endres 1910 available online]
  • Gaskin, R., 1997, “Peter Damian on Divine Power and the Contingency of the Past”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 5: 229–247. doi:10.1080/09608789708570965
  • Gonsette, J., 1956, Pierre Damien et la culture profane, Louvain: Publications Universitaires & Paris: Béatrice-Nauwelaerts.
  • Holopainen, T.J., 1996, Dialectic and Theology in the Eleventh Century, Leiden: Brill (especially Ch. 2: “Peter Damian: De divina omnipotentia”, 6–43).
  • –––, 1999, “Necessity in Early Medieval Thought: Peter Damian and Anselm of Canterbury”, in Cur Deus Homo, P. Gilbert et al. (eds.), Roma: Herder, 221–234.
  • –––, 2006, “Future Contingents in the Eleventh Century”, in Mind and Modality, V. Hirvonen et al. (eds.), Leiden: Brill, 103–120. doi:10.1163/9789047409670_008
  • Knuuttila, S., 1993, Modalities in Medieval Philosophy, London and New York: Routledge.
  • –––, 2004, “Anselm on Modality”, in The Cambridge Companion to Anselm, B. Davies & B. Leftow (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 111–131. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521807468.006
  • McArthur, R., and M. Slattery, 1974, “Peter Damian and Undoing the Past”, Philosophical Studies, 25: 137–141. doi:10.1007/BF00373165
  • McCready, W.D., 2011, Odiosa sanctitas: St Peter Damian, Simony, and Reform, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies.
  • Marenbon, J., 1996, “Anselm and the Early Medieval Aristotle”, in Aristotle in Britain during the Middle Ages, J. Marenbon (ed.), Turnhout: Brepols, 1–19. doi:10.1484/M.RPM-EB.4.000075
  • Moonan, L., 1980, “Impossibility and Peter Damian”, Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 62: 146–163. doi:10.1515/agph.1980.62.2.146
  • Ranft, P., 2012, The Theology of Peter Damian: “Let Your Life Always Serve as a Witness”, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Remnant, P., 1978, “Peter Damian: Could God Change the Past?”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 8: 259–268. doi:10.1080/00455091.1978.10717050
  • Resnick, I.M., 1992, Divine Power and Possibility in St. Peter Damian’s De divina omnipotentia, Leiden: Brill.

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