The Logic of Peter of Spain

First published Thu Apr 12, 2001; substantive revision Thu Sep 14, 2023

Peter of Spain (thirteenth century), exact identity unknown, was the author of a standard textbook on logic, the Tractatus (Tracts), which enjoyed a high renown in Europe for many centuries. His works on logic are typical examples of the type of manuals that gradually started to emerge within the context of twelfth- and thirteenth-century teaching practices. Until recently he was also identified as the author of a number of extant works on medicine.

1. Life and Works: Some Comments on the Historiography

Peter of Spain has been established as the medieval author of a work that became widely known as Summule logicales magistri Petri Hispani (Collection of Logic Matters of Master Peter of Spain). The great number of manuscripts and printed editions is evidence of the enormous success this work met with throughout European universities well into the seventeenth century. An interpolated version of his Tractatus, by then known as the Summulae logicales, was used by John Buridan as a basic text to comment upon. But finding out the true identity of the author of this influential Tractatus has proved to be a difficult task. For a long time it was assumed that he was a Portuguese who became Pope in 1276, under the name of John XXI. There is also another, earlier tradition, according to which the author of the Tractatus was regarded as Spanish, and a member of the Dominican order. Yet another attribution, dating from the fifteenth century, was to a Petrus Ferrandi Hispanus, who died between 1254 and 1259; this attribution would be consistent with the idea that Peter’s works on logic originated from the first half of the thirteenth century. According to still another attribution, the Summule was compiled by a Black Friar no earlier than in the late thirteenth or early fourteenth century.

The ‘Dominican-thesis’ can be divided into three traditions:

  1. The general view that Peter of Spain, author of the Tractatus, is someone who belonged to Order of Black Friars,
  2. The more specific view that the author of the Tractatus was a frater Petrus Alfonsi Hispanus O.P.,
  3. Another specific view that the Peter of Spain who created the Tractatus was the same Peter of Spain as the one who wrote the Legenda sancti Dominici and the Office of the Saint’s Feast, namely Petrus Ferrandi Hispanus O.P., who died in the 1250s.

Current research on the identity of Peter of Spain has once again taken up the idea that he must have been a member of the Dominican Order instead of Pope John XXI (D’Ors 1997, 2001, 2003). However, we are still in the dark about the true identity of Peter of Spain. The most recent information we have on this score is that a number of the Dominican candidates recently suggested as the author of the Tractatus can be deleted from the list (Tugwell 1999, 2006). The lack of further information also makes it difficult to establish the dates and specifics of his carreer.

It is still not possible to establish the date of origin of the Tractatus, the work that has enjoyed such enormous success. Recent scholarship suggests that it could have been written any time between the 1220s and the 1250s (Ebbessen 2013, 68–69). It has universally been recognised as a work by Peter of Spain. Another work that has been identified as Peter of Spain’s is a Syncategoreumata (Treatise on Syncategorematic Words), which was probably written some years after the Tractatus. Considering the fact that in all the thirteenth-century manuscripts the Syncategoreumata directly follows the Tractatus, and given the number of similarities between doctrinal aspects of these two works on logic, it is almost certain that they were written by the same author. Both works seem to have originated from Southern France or Northern Spain, the region where we also find the earliest commentaries on these treatises.

An extensive list of writings ascribed to an author by the name of Petrus Hispanus is provided by Meirinhos (2018). Besides the two works on logic, the Petrus Hispanus in the papa-tradition is the supposed author of a famous medical work Thesaurus pauperum, as well as fourteen other works on medicine. Writings by (a) Peter of Spain in the field of natural philosophy include a Scientia libri de anima, and commentaries on Aristotle’s De anima, De morte et vita, De sensu et sensato, De animalibus, and theological works include commentaries on works by pseudo-Denys the Areopagite as well as a collection of sermons. As yet there is no certainty about whether the author of these treatises also wrote the Tractatus and the Syncategoreumata, or about the dates of their origin.

Another Petrus Hispanus, referred to as Petrus Hispanus non-papa, has been identified as the author of the Summa ‘Absoluta cuiuslibet’, a late twelfth-century handbook on syntax closely linked with Priscian’s Institutiones grammatice, libb. XVII and XVIII, which became very popular later in the Middle Ages under the name Priscianus minor (Kneepkens 1987). The chronology of this work seems to rule out that this Peter of Spain is the same author as the author of the Tractatus.

2. Origins of Peter’s Works on Logic

Peter’s logic seems to have its origin in the continental tradition. Evidence of the educational carreer of the Tractatus appears from two commentaries (see De Rijk 1968, pp. 23–34 and De Rijk (ed.) 1972, Introduction, pp. LXXff.), which contain short lemmata and a number of questions (questiones) together with their solutions. The tracts as contained in these texts are very similar to the ones in the Tractatus. The Tractatus has features that are typical of the Paris tradition, such as the separate treatment of ampliation, restriction and distribution, as well as several other doctrinal elements (see De Rijk (ed.) 1972, pp. LXXXIV–LXXXVIII). We do not know whether Peter had any connection with Paris, nor can we say anything definitive about the identity of his teachers. Earlier sources for Peter’s works on logic can be traced back to Boethian-Aristotelian logic, and authorities in the field of grammar such as Priscian and Donatus.

Like the Tractatus, the Syncategoreumata also displays a continental origin. It appears to have continued along the lines of a similar work by Johannes Pagus. This work, which has been dated between 1225 and 1235, was later on further developed by Nicholas of Paris, who wrote his Syncategoreumata between 1240 and 1250 (see Braakhuis 1979, Vol. I, p. 248).

3. The Tractatus

The Tractatus can be divided into two main parts. One part deals with doctrines found in the so-called logica antiquorum—i.e., the logica vetus (old logic) and logica nova (new logic)—and the other contains doctrines covered by the logica modernorum—viz. the tracts that discuss the proprietates terminorum (properties of terms).

The first main part of the Tractatus divides into five tracts. The first tract, De introductionibus (On introductory topics), explains the concepts used in traditional logic—nomen (noun), verbum (verb), oratio (phrase), propositio (proposition)—and presents the divisions of and the (logical) relationships between propositions. The second tract, De predicabilibus (On the predicables), covers matters dealt with in Boethius’s accounts of Porphyry’s Isagoge. It gives an account of the concept predicabile and the five predicables—genus, species, differentia, proprium, accidens—i.e., the common features of and differences between the predicables, as well as of the terms ‘predicatio’ and ‘denominativum’. Tract three, De predicamentis (On the categories), discusses the ten Aristotelian categories, as well as some items already dealt with in the previous treatise. The fourth tract, De sillogismis (On syllogisms), mainly goes back to Boethius’s De syllogismis categoricis (On categorical syllogisms). It gives an explanation of the basic element of the syllogism, i.e., propositio, and of the syllogism, and then goes into mood and figure, the proper forms of syllogisms, and briefly deals with what are called paralogisms. The fifth tract, De locis (On topical relationships), is derived from Boethius’s De topicis differentiis (On different topical relationships) I and II. This tract starts off with an explanation of the notions argumentum and argumentatio, and then proceeds to deal with the species of argumentation: syllogism, induction, enthymeme, and example. Next, it gives a definition of locus (the Latin translation of the Greek topos): a locus is the seat of an argument (i.e., the locus is supposed to warrant the inference by bringing it under some generic rule.) The intrinsic loci (= the kinds of locus that occurs when the argument is derived from the substance of the thing involved) are covered first, followed by the extrinsic loci (= the kinds of locus that occur when the argument is derived from something that is completely separate from the substance of the thing involved) and intermediary loci (= the kinds of locus that occur when the argument is taken from the things that partly share in the terms of the problem and partly differ from it). Examples are: intrinsic—the locus “from definition”: ‘a rational animal is running; therefore a man is running’; extrinsic—the locus “from opposites”: ‘Socrates is black; therefore he is not white’; intermediary—‘the just is good; therefore justice is good’.

The second part of the Tractatus comprises subjects that were of major importance in the doctrine of the properties of terms. In the sixth tract, De suppositionibus, the theory of supposition is dealt with. The treatise begins with an exposition of significatio. The definition of significatio runs: significatio is the respresentation of a thing by means of a word in accordance with convention. Next it gives a definition of the related terms suppositio and copulatio, and the differences between the terms significatio, suppositio and copulatio. Of these three suppositio and significatio are the most important in Peter’s semantics. Suppositio is defined as the acceptance of a substantive verb for some thing. Suppositio is dependent on significatio, because supposition can only occur via a term that already has some significatio. Put in other words, significatio pertains to a word by itself, and supposition to a term as actually used in some context.

The tract concludes with a division of suppositio. The first division is into suppositio communis (common supposition) and suppositio discreta (discrete supposition)—e.g., the terms homo (man) and Sortes (Socrates) respectively.

The second division, suppositio communis, is divided into naturalis (natural) and accidentalis (coincidental). Suppositio naturalis is described as the acceptance of a common term for all those things that can share in the common universal nature signified by the term in question—e.g., homo (‘man’) taken by itself by its very nature is able to stand for all men, whether in the past, present or future; suppositio accidentalis is the acceptance of a common term for those things for which the term in question requires an additional term—e.g., in homo est (‘A man is’) the term homo stands for present men, whereas in homo fuit (‘A man has been’) and in homo erit (‘A man will be’) it stands for past men and future men respectively, owing to the additional terms fuit and erit.

The third division, suppositio accidentalis, is divided into suppositio simplex (simple supposition) and suppositio personalis (personal supposition). Suppositio simplex is the acceptance of a term for the universal ‘thing’ it signifies, as in homo est species (‘Man is a species’, animal est genus (‘Animal is a genus’), in which the substantive terms homo and animal stand for the universal man and animal, and not for any one of their particulars. Suppositio simplex can occur both in the subject- and in the predicate-term—e.g., homo est species (‘Man is a species’) and omnis homo est animal (‘Every man is an animal’) respectively. Suppositio personalis is the acceptance of a common term for one or more of its particulars, as in homo currit (‘A man is running’).

The fourth division, suppositio personalis, is subdivided into either derterminata (determinate = standing for a certain particular) or confusa (confused = standing for any individual falling under that name). Suppositio determinata occurs when a common term is taken indefinitely or in combination with a particular sign—e.g., homo currit (‘Man is running’) or aliquis homo currit (‘A/some man is running’). Suppositio confusa occurs when a common term is taken in combination with a universal sign (’Every man is running’).

The tract on supposition winds up with the discussion of a few questions regarding the attribution of supposition in a few cases.

The seventh tract of the Tractatus, on fallacies, which forms part of the Aristotelian-Boethian logic, is written in the tradition of the Fallacie maiores (Major fallacies). The eighth tract, De relativis (On relatives), deals with the relative pronouns as defined by Priscian in his Institutiones grammaticae. The relative pronouns are devided into: relatives of substance, such as qui (who), ille (he), alius (another), and relatives of accident, such as talis (of such a kind), qualis (of what kind), tantus (so much), quantus (how much). The former are subdivided into relatives of identity (qui and ille) and relatives of diversity (such as alter and reliquus, both of which can be translated as ‘the other’). The relative of identity is defined in terms of supposition as what refers to and stands for the same thing. These relatives are either reciprocal or non-reciprocal. With regard to the relatives of identity, Peter adds a dicussion of a number of questions about the rationale for using demonstrative pronouns, and some problems concerning how the fallacy of a relative having two diverse referents comes about.

The tract on relatives continues with a brief discussion on the relatives of diversity, accompanied by a rule about the supposition of the relative when it is added to a superior and an inferior in a premiss and a conclusion, as in aliud ab animali; ergo aliud ab homine (‘Something other than an animal; therefore something other than a man’). With regard to relatives of identity a rule of the “ancients”, who deny that a proposition introduced by a relative can have a contradictory opposite, is discussed and rejected. Another rule is given about the identity of supposition of a non-reciprocal relative and what it refers to. The tract concludes with short accounts of relatives of accident.

The ninth, tenth, eleventh, and twelfth tracts of the Tractatus, i.e., the short tracts De ampliationibus (On ampliation), De appellationibus (On appellation), De restrictionibus (On restriction) and De distributionibus (On distribution), are in fact elaborations of the theory of supposition. Ampliation is an extension of the supposition of a term. It occurs when an expression is combined with a modal term—e.g. homo potest esse Antichristus (‘A man can be the Antichrist’), and homo necessario est animal (‘A man is necessarily an animal’)—in which case the supposition of the term ‘man’ is extended to more than just individuals existing in the present. The tract on appellationes is very short: appellation is considered no more than a special case of restriction, i.e., the restricted supposition brought about by a present-tense verb. In this tract the rules of appellation are in fact specific kinds of rules of restriction. The subject of restriction in general is discussed in the eleventh tract. The rules of restriction are the same ones as were presented in the early Parisian textbooks on logic (see de Libera 1982, pp. 176–177). The final tract, on distribution, deals with the multiplication of common terms as a result of their being combined with universal signs. These universal signs are either distributive of substance (such as omnis, nullus), or of accidents (such as qualiscumque, quantuscumque). In this description ‘substance’ is defined as substistent modes of being, and ‘accident’ as accidental modes of being. Separate attention is given to the universal sign omnis (‘all’ or ‘every’) along with a discussion of the common rule that the use of omnis requires three appellata (particular things). The most frequently cited example in these discussions in the thirteenth century was the sophisma omnis phenix est (‘Every phoenix is’). According to Peter of Spain, the use of omnis does not call for at least three appellata; an exception to this rule is found in cases in which there is only one appellatum, as is the phoenix-case. The tract also pays attention to a number of tongue-twisting sophisma-sentences.

4. The Syncategoreumata

Peter’s treatise on syncategorematic words forms part of a separate genre that developed from the beginning of the thirteenth century. The term syncategorema comes from a famous passage in Priscian’s Institutiones grammatice II, 15, which introduces two types of wordclasses (partes orationis) distinguished by logicians, viz. nouns and verbs on the one hand, and syncategoremata, or consignificantia, on the other. The latter are defined as words that do not have a definitive meaning on their own, but acquire one only in combination with other, categorematic words.

Like the treatises of the Tractatus kind, the Syncategoreumata were developed from the (twelfth-century) theories on fallacies, as well as from grammatical doctrines (from the same period). From the second half of the twelfth century, there was a growing interest in the linguistic elements that are considered to lie at the basis of ambiguity and fallacious reasoning. Hence the increase of treatises presenting a systematic account of these terms. The connection between these treatises and Priscian’s grammar can be gathered from the attention different authors pay to the signa quantitatis (or quantifiers) and their interest in the meaning and function of syncategorematic terms.

The list of words to be included among the syncategoreumata was not always the same. Generally speaking it comprised exclusive words tantum (only), solus (alone), exceptive words such as preter (except), nisi (unless), consecutive words such as si (if) and nisi (if not), the words incipit (begins) and desinit (ceases), the modal terms necessario (necessarily) and contingenter (contingently), the conjunctives an (or), et (and), nisi (unless), in eo quod (in that), and quin (that not). In Peter’s work we also find a discussion of the terms quanto (‘how much’ or ‘as much as’) quam (‘than’ or ‘as’) and quicquid (whatever). Unlike that of some other authors (such as William of Sherwood and Robert Bacon), his list does not include the word omnis.

In the opening of his Syncategoreumata, Peter presents his rationale for this investigation, viz. that there is a close link between the use of these kinds of words in sentences and their truth-value. His idea is that the syncategoreumata must have some sort of signification, but not the same as the categorematic words. For this special kind of signification he uses the words consignificatio and dispositio.

The first two separate chapters of the Syncategoreumata are devoted to the words est and non respectively, which are said to be implied in all other syncategorematic words. Peter’s account of the first word focuses on the notion of compositio (composition), which is explained in great detail, by looking into the signification of nouns and verbs (signifying a composition of a quality with a substance, and that of an act with a substance respectively). Considerable attention is given to the composition featuring in the verb ‘is’, in the form of the question of whether the composition involved can be counted among beings or not, considering the fact that it can be used to express different kinds of states of affairs. The chapter on negation introduces the important distinction between an act as conceived of or in the manner of a concept (ut concepta sive per modum conceptus) and an act as carried out (ut exercita) (see Nuchelmans 1988). Among the former type we acts as expressed by the noun ‘negation’ and the verb ‘to deny, whereas an act of the latter type is what is expressed by the negative particle ‘not’. The remainder of this chapter deals with the function of the negation, which is to remove the composition found in whatever it covers, and discusses some well-known sophisma-sentences which turn on the specific function of negation.

The third chapter of the Syncategoreumata discusses the exclusive words solus and tantum. They are called exclusives because they carry out an exclusion, not because they signify one. An exclusion, furthermore, requires four things, namely, what is excluded, what is excluded from, the respect in which it is excluded, and the act of exclusion. The kinds of exclusion are divided into general and specific: the former involves an exclusion from something generic, whereas the latter from something specific. Questions that come up in this section have to do with the results of adding an exclusive term to different kinds of words, such as to a term falling under the category of Substance: does it exclude only other substances, or does it also exclude from things listed under another category? And what if it is added to a term listed under the category of Accident (such as colour, quantity, and so on)? The next question deals with the sorts of terms that can be meaningfully associated with an exclusion. For example, is it possible to exclude something from ‘being’ (as in ‘Only being is, therefore nothing other than being is’)? The tract proceeds with the kinds of things that can qualify for an exclusion. The fourth chapter, which deals with exceptive words, is compiled in a similar manner.

The fifth chapter is about the word si, which is said to signify causality in or via antecedence. The chapter also discusses the kinds of consecution or consequence, problems of inference connected with the referents of terms used in consecutive sentences, and how to contradict a conditional sentence. Special attention is given to the problem whether from an impossible antecedent anything follows.

The chapter on ‘begins’ and ‘ceases’ is a good example of the way in which extra-logical considerations found their way into medieval treatises on logic. Thus, apart from the semantics and inferential problems connected with the use of these words in propositions, the chapter also looks into the notions of motion and time. An important part of Peter’s ontological views can be gathered from chapter seven, which covers issues connected with the use of modal terms. Chapter eight discusses the signification and use of connectives, and the final chapter on syncategorematic words proper is concerned with the expressions quanto, quam and quicquid. A very short, concluding chapter of Peter’s Syncategoreumata deals with a somewhat isolated topic, i.e., the proper modes of response in an argument. The topics looked into are solution, the quantity and quality of syllogisms, and the ways to go about proving a syllogism.

5. Doctrinal Elements in Peter’s Logic

One of the most important elements in Peter’s logic concerns the doctrine of supposition. The theory of supposition has its origins in the twelfth century, when the medievals showed a growing interest in the ways in which words function in different contexts. This way of dealing with the semantics of terms has been dubbed the “contextual approach” (see de Rijk 1962–67, Vol. II, Part I, pp. 113–117).

The primary semantic property of a word is its significatio, in Peter’s definition, the “representation of a thing by a word in accordance with convention”. It is a natural property of a word, the presentation of some (universal) content to the mind. The significatio of a word depends on its imposition, i.e., the application originally given to the word in question. A word can have more than one significatio, if it was originally applied to two or more distinct (universal) natures.

The counterpart of significatio, the formal constituent of every meaning, is the word’s capacity to “stand for” different things (even though its significatio remains the same), depending on the context in which it is used. In the early stages of the development of the theory on the properties of terms, this feature of a word was called appellatio. For instance, the words ‘man’ and ‘horse’ can be used to stand for different individual men or horses. But they can also stand for themselves, e.g., when they are used in sentences such as ‘man is a noun’, or ‘horse is a noun’. Moreover, their meaning can differ according as the words are used in combination with verbs of different tenses.

In the final stages of the development of the theory, the notion of supposition becomes the general label that covers all the uses of a noun (substantive or adjectival), to which other recognised properties of terms (appellatio, ampliatio and restrictio) are subordinated.

The theory of properties of terms shows a radical inconsistency, which has been explained as “the persistent hesitation of medieval logicians between the domains of connotation (universals) and denotation (individuals)” (De Rijk 1982, pp. 167–168). This inconsistency runs throughout Peter’s account of supposition, and comes to the fore most prominently in what he says about natural supposition (suppositio naturalis). The main problem is in what way the property of natural supposition is related to a term’s significatio, which was defined as the acceptance of a word for a thing (res). By this definition, the significatio of the term ‘man’ covers both its intension and extension, i.e., the universal nature of man and the individuals that have this nature in common. Suppositio naturalis, on the other hand, is described as “the acceptance of a common term for all those things that can share in a common universal nature”; for example, the term ‘man’ taken by itself by its very nature stands for all the individuals that fall under it, whether they existed in the past, exist in the present or will exist in the future. From this definition and the example just presented it appears that the extensional features of significatio and suppositio naturalis overlap. The latter kind of suppositio has been explained by interpreters as the natural capacity of a significative word to stand for something.

There is a more telling difference between significatio and suppositio naturalis, however. Significatio is the natural property of any significative term to represent things, owing to its original imposition, whereas a term’s supposition only enters the scene when it is used. The expression “taken by itself” (per se sumptus) found in Peter’s account of suppositio naturalis, does not mean that no context is required, as is the case in significatio, but it merely indicates that for the moment the actual context is being disregarded. The link between significatio and suppositio is the following. When some word has acquired a signification by an impositor (= someone who bestows a meaning upon a word), then it connotes a univeral nature or essence, and acquires a natural capacity to stand for all the actual and possible individuals that share in this common nature; it owes this capacity to its significatio. If, however, we disregard for a moment the actual context in which the term in question is used and look upon the term as taken by itself (per se sumptus), then its supposition covers its entire extension. If we take the factual context in which the term is used into consideration, then its extension becomes limited, owing to the context. The context, or more precisely, the added significative term, can be of three kinds: the added significative term can be a predicate of a proposition in which the term at issue occurs, the added significative term can be an adjective, or the context can be of a social nature (see de Rijk 1971 and de Rijk 1985, pp. 183–203).

The distinction between significatio and suppositio naturalis persisted throughout the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. Behind it is the fundamental view that regardless of whether a word is used in some context or not, it always has a significatum, i.e., the universal nature or essence it signifies, which can be separated from what the word comes to mean in a specific context.

Besides suppositio naturalis, Peter’s (and other medievals’) conception of suppositio simplex also seems to hover between connotation and denotation. In the expression homo est species the term homo has suppositio simplex, but this is precisely too what the term homo signifies. So there scarcely seems reason to separate signification from supposition on this score. The specific use of suppositio simplex found in Peter of Spain and other medieval authors, as the representation of a universal nature, is rejected later on by authors such as William of Ockham. For the latter, the term homo in the example just given has suppositio simplex (for Ockham a special case of suppositio materialis) in that it stands for the mental concept of man (Kneale & Kneale 1978, pp. 268–269).

Peter of Spain’s logical works are commonly characterised as revealing a moderately ‘realistic’ outlook. To explain the contents of linguistic expressions and the function of logical terms, he is inclined to focus on their relationships to some extra-mental reality. This can be shown from the way in which he discusses the use of the word est (is), his account of suppositio simplex, and the way he analyses the occurrence of the word ‘necessarily’ in propositions. Moreover, his conception of the consecutive expression ‘if’ clearly shows his tendency to put the domains of reality and language on a par. (However, not all linguistic expressions are connected with extramental reality. Although ontology always plays a role in his accounts of language, it would appear that Peter is especially interested in the contents of linguistic epressions. In that regard it seems more appropriate to speak of an intensionalist semantics.)

In his Syncategoreumata, Peter analyses the significative function of the word ‘is’. To a certain extent his findings are not confined to that term alone, but cover all verbs, in which the verb ‘is’ is always understood. The most remarkable feature about his discussion of ‘is’ is his focus on the notion of composition. What he is particularly interested in is the kinds of things affirmative propositions featuring that verb can refer to, in his words, the type of composition involved in such propositions.

The notion of ‘composition’ plays a prominent role in Peter’s semantics. Before embarking on the specifics of the word ‘is’, he first looks into the compositiones involved in the noun and the verb. When it comes to the composition involved in the use of ‘is’, the starting-point for his account is the question whether the expression ‘is’ in a proposition of the form ‘S is P’ implies the ‘being’ of the composition. Whether it does or not depends on how we consider the composition. If we are talking about any composition whatsoever, in his words, the composition in general, the composition can indiscriminately be connected with beings and non-beings. This is because we can talk about both things that are and things that are not by making use of the same affirmative propositions. Hence anything expressed by a proposition of the form ‘S is P’ is a being in a certain sense (ens quodammodo). The type of composition he is referring to here is the mental content of some affirmation, which is something that only has being to a certain degree. However, the composition in general, that is, the state of affairs involved in such expressions, is primarily connected with being rather than non-being. It is when we talk about non-beings, such as chimaeras, that being in a certain sense once again enters the scene. Hence a distinction of the types of being referred to, or the types of composition involved in affirmative propositions into being in the absolute sense (ens simpliciter) and being in a certain sense (ens quodammodo). The difference between these two types of being is illustrated by the distinction between two types of inference: from ‘A man is an animal’, in which the composition involved is a being in the absolute sense, it follows ‘Therefore a man is’, but from ‘A chimaera is a non-being’, in which the composition is a being in a certain sense only, it does not follow ‘Therefore a chimaera is’.

The counterpart of Peter’s discussion of composition is the section on negation. Peter specifically goes into the question of what it is the negation denies. In his words, the negation removes the composition. The composition in this connection is identified with the affirmed state of affairs (res affirmata). What the negation removes is not the state of affairs, but the affirmation that goes along with it. The basis of both composition and negation turns out to be the same state of affairs, i.e., something that is formulated in the mind, to which we can assent or which we can deny to be the case.

The focus on matters of ontology is evidenced in other portions of Peter’s logic as well. For Peter, as for Henry of Ghent (who also wrote a Syncategoreumata) the expression homo (man) in homo est animal (‘Man is an animal’) has simple supposition: it stands for the universal nature of humanity. Accordingly, the expression is necessarily true, even if no man should exist. The term ‘necessarily’ thus has ampliative force: it enables the subject term ‘man’ to refer to individuals not only existing in the present ( which is the normal case when a present-tense verb is used), but also to those of the past and the future. This analysis runs contrary to what is found in some other Syncategoreumata authors, like Johannes Pagus and Nicholas of Paris, who maintain that the term ‘necessarily’ does not have ampliative force. Hence the expression homo necessario est animal (‘A man is necessarily an animal’) is only true on the condition that a man exists.

A similar point is made in connection with the use of modal terms. For Peter of Spain, logical necessity is based upon ontological necessity, or, the necessity of propositions has its foundation in the necessity of the things spoken about. Necessity is associated with different types of things, such as the relationships between certain concepts (such as genera and species), and the specific things the notions of which we come across in the different kinds of (scientific) knowledge (such as mathematical entities and their properties). His outlook on necessity is clearly revealed in his analysis of the inference homo necessario est animal; ergo Sortes necessario est animal (‘A man is necessarily an animal; therefore Socrates is necessarily an animal’). In his view the inference is not valid, because a transition is made from necessary being to a being at a certain time. For Peter then, the notion of necessity ultimately refers to a necessary state of affairs in reality, something that is always the case.

A fusion of the domains of language and reality also turns up in Peter’s account of the consecutive ‘if’, which he explains as signifying causality. Like his contemporaries he looks into the question whether from something impossible anything follows. In his account, the notion of ‘impossibility’ can be taken in two ways, viz. impossibility as such (or absolute impossibility), which amounts to nothing, or some impossible state of affairs, that is a combination of notions that do have a real foundation but are incompatible. From the latter type of impossibility, such as ‘A man is an ass’, something, but not anything can follow, e.g., ‘Therefore a man is an animal’. From impossibilities as such, e.g., ‘You know that you are a stone’, nothing can follow. The fundamental idea is that in order for something to follow from an antecedent, the antecedent in the consecutive relationship must be a something (res) of some sort (see Spruyt 1993, pp. 161–193).


Primary Sources: Works by Peter of Spain

  • Petrus Hispanus Tractatus called afterwards Summule logicales. First Critical Edition from the Manuscripts, with an Introduction by L.M. de Rijk, Assen: van Gorcum & Co., 1972.
  • Petrus Hispanus Syncategoreumata. First Critical Edition, with an Introduction and Indexes by L.M. de Rijk, and with an English Translation by Joke Spruyt, Leiden/Köln/New York: Brill, 1992.
  • Peter of Spain, Summaries of Logic. Text, Translation, Introduction, & Notes, by Brian P. Copenhaver, with Calvin Normore and Terence Parsons, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014.

Secondary Sources

  • Braakhuis, H.A.G., 1979, De 13de Eeuwse Tractaten over Syncategorematische Termen. Deel I: Inleidende Studie; Deel II: Uitgave van Nicolaas van Parijs’ Syncategoreumata, Dissertation (Department of Philosophy), Rijksuniversiteit Leiden.
  • Ebbesen, Sten, 2013, “Early Supposition Theory II”, Vivarium, 51: 60–78.
  • Klima, Gyula, 2011, “Two Summulae, Two Ways of Doing Logic: Peter of Spain’s ‘Realism’ and Buridan’s ‘Nominalism’”, in Margaret Cameron and John Marenbon (eds.), Methods and Methodologies: Aristotelian Logic East and West, 500–1500, Leiden/Boston: Brill, pp. 109–126.
  • Kneale, William and Martha Kneale, 1978, The Development of Logic, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kneepkens, C.H., 1987, Het iudicium constructionis. Het leerstuk van de constructio in de 2de helft van de 12de eeuw. Een verkennende inleidende studie gevolgd door kritische uitgaven van Robert van Parijs, Summa ‘Breve sit’ en Robert Blund, Summa in arte grammatica en door een werkuitgave van Petrus Hispanus (non-papa), Summa ‘Absoluta cuiuslibet’, Dissertation (Department of Philosophy), Rijksuniversiteit Leiden, Nijmegen: Ingenium Publishers.
  • Libera, Alain de, 1982, “The Oxford and Paris Traditions in Logic,” in Norman Kretzmann, Anthony Kenny, and Jan Pinborg (eds.), The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy from the Rediscovery of Aristotle to the Disintegration of Scholasticism, 1100–1600, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 174–87.
  • –––, 1984. “Les Appellationes de Jean le Page”, Archives d’histoire doctrinale et littéraire du moyen-âge, 51: 193–255.
  • Meirinhos, José, 2009, “Les manuscrits et l’attribution d’oeuvres à Petrus Hispanus”, in José Meirinhos and Olga Weijers (eds.), Florilegium mediaevale. Études offertes à Jacqueline Hamesse à l’occasion de son éméritat (Textes et Études du Moyen Âge: Volume 50), Louvain-la-Neuve: Fédération internationale des instituts d’études médiévales, pp. 349–77.
  • –––, 2018, “Petrus Hispanus’ Attributed Works: Searching for New Interpretations”, Enrahonar (Supplementary Issue 2018): 355-363.
  • Nuchelmans, Gabriel, 1988, “The Distinction actus exercitus/actus significatus in Medieval Semantics”, in Norman Kretzmann (ed.), Meaning and Inference in Medieval Philosophy: Studies in memory of Jan Pinborg (Synthese Historical Library. Studies and Texts in the History of Logic and Philosophy, 32), Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 57–90.
  • d’Ors, Angel, 1997, “Petrus Hispanus O.P., Auctor Summularum”, Vivarium, 35: 21–71.
  • –––, 2001, “Petrus Hispanus O.P, Auctor Summularum, Part II: Further documents and problems”, Vivarium, 39: 209–254.
  • –––, 2003, “Petrus Hispanus O.P, Auctor Summularum, Part III: ‘Petrus Alfonsi’ or ‘Petrus Ferrandi’?”, Vivarium, 41: 249–303.
  • Pinborg, Jan, 1972, Logik und Semantik im Mittelalter. Ein Überblick, Stuttgart-Bad Canstadt: Fromann-Holzboog.
  • de Rijk, L.M., 1962–67, Logica Modernorum: A Contribution to the History of Early Terminist Logic. Vol. I: On the Twelfth Century Theories of Fallaciesl; Vol. II: The Origin and Early Development of the Theory of Supposition, Assen: Van Gorcum & Co.
  • –––, 1968, “On the Genuine Text of Peter of Spain’s Summule logicales I: General problems concerning possible interpolations in the manuscripts,” Vivarium, 6: 1–34.
  • –––, 1971, “The Development of Suppositio Naturalis in Mediaeval Logic I: Natural supposition as non-contextual supposition,” Vivarium, 9: 71–107.
  • –––, 1982, “The Origins of the Theory of the Properties of Terms”, in Norman Kretzmann, Anthony Kenny and Jan Pinborg (eds.), The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy from the Rediscovery of Aristotle to the Disintegration of Scholasticism, 1100–1600, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 161–173.
  • –––, 1985, La philosophie au moyen-âge, Leiden/Köln/New York: Brill.
  • Spruyt, Joke, 1989, Peter of Spain on Composition and Negation: Text, Translation, Commentary (Artistarium Supplementa, 5), Nijmegen: Ingenium Publishers.
  • –––, 1993 “Thirteenth-Century Positions on the Rule ‘Ex impossibili sequitur quidlibet’”, in Klaus Jacobi (ed.), Argumentationstheorie. Scholastische Forschungen zu den logischen und semantische regeln korrekten Folgerns, Leiden/Köln/New York: Brill, pp. 161–193.
  • –––, 1994, “Thirteenth-Century Discussions on Modal Terms”, Vivarium, 32: 196–226.
  • –––, 2011, “The ‘Realism’ of Peter of Spain”, Medioevo, 36: 89–111.
  • Tugwell, Simon O.P., 1999, “Petrus Hispanus: Comments on Some Proposed Identifications”, Vivarium, 37: 103–113.
  • –––, 2006, “Auctor Summularum, Petrus Hispanus OP Stellensis?”, Archivum Fratrum Praedicatorum, 76: 103–115.

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