Philo of Larissa

First published Thu Oct 5, 2006; substantive revision Thu Mar 25, 2021

Philo (159/8–84/3 BCE) was the last known head of Plato’s Academy during its skeptical phase. Under his leadership, the Academics abandoned the radical skepticism of Arcesilaus and Carneades (who professed to live without rationally warranted beliefs) in favor of a form of mitigated skepticism allowing for provisional beliefs that did not claim certainty. But Philo himself seems to have gone a step further in his controversial “Roman Books”, where he rejected the Stoic definition of knowledge on which the Academics’ mitigated skepticism relied. The evidence suggests that he proposed instead a weaker, fallibilist theory that allowed for ordinary knowledge but did not support the theoretical dogmatism of the Academics’ philosophical rivals. By challenging the accepted epistemological framework of the Hellenistic period, Philo thus inadvertently helped to set the stage for the subsequent revival of Platonism as a dogmatic tradition based on the interpretation of Platonic doctrines. He is most widely known, however, as the teacher of Cicero, through whose work Academic skepticism became known in the Latin-reading world.

1. Life and Work

The external facts of Philo’s career are largely undisputed. He was born in 159/8 BCE (but see Fleischer 2017b). After eight years of study with Callicles, a student of Carneades, in his native Larissa, Philo moved to Athens in 134/3 BCE, where he spent fourteen years with Clitomachus, another of Carneades’ students, who was the scholarch (or head) of the Academy from 129/8 (or perhaps 127/6) to his death in 110/9 BCE. Philo was elected to replace Clitomachus in that year, and remained the scholarch until his death in 84/3 BCE.

Philo’s tenure as head of the Academy was troubled by two events. First, in the late 90s BCE his authority was challenged by the secession of his student Antiochus of Ascalon, who set up a rival anti-skeptic “Old Academy”. (A second student, Aenesidemus, also left the Academy to found or revive the radically skeptical Pyrrhonist school, probably in the 90s BCE; but the dating of this secession to Philo’s tenure as scholarch is insecure.) Secondly, civil unrest in Athens and the threat of the Mithridatic war led to an exodus of Academic philosophers to safer cities. Philo himself moved to Rome in 89/8 BCE, where he continued to give lectures and published his “Roman Books”. It is unclear whether he ever returned to Athens after its “pacification” by the Romans in 86 BCE. The name of his successor as scholarch, who probably oversaw the final demise of the Academy as an institution, is also unclear. (The section of Philodemus’ Catalogue of Academic Philosophers—our main source for his biography—dealing with Philo’s death, his students, and his successor, is at several points illegible; see Fleischer 2017c.) None of Philo’s written works survive, but we possess a summary of a work on ethics, some direct evidence for his Roman Books and earlier epistemological views, and indirect evidence for a work on rhetoric.

2. The Evidence for the Development of Philo’s Views

Since the evidence for Philo’s various epistemological views is philosophically rich but radically incomplete, their interpretation is unsurprisingly controversial. The primary sources agree that Philo’s views evolved between his election as scholarch in 110/9 BCE and the publication of the Roman Books in 88 BCE; but the precise stages of his epistemological evolution and the arguments that led Philo to change his mind are not explicitly described in the texts we have.

Our evidence indicates (and no scholar disputes this) that Philo began as an adherent of the radical skepticism attributed to Carneades by Clitomachus. The two central questions that the evidence appears to leave open are:

  1. Did Philo change his epistemological position in the period preceding the Roman Books?
  2. What was the epistemological position of the Roman Books?

In order to understand these questions it is important to know something about the context in which Philo’s views evolved. Several sources make it clear that when Philo arrived in Athens in the 130s BCE, the Academy was sharply divided over the legacy of Carneades. One side, led by Clitomachus, advocated radical skepticism as the authentic Carneadean position, while another, led by Metrodorus of Stratonicea, promoted some form of mitigated skepticism. We know, however, that Philo was elected scholarch in 110/9 BCE as a representative of the Clitomachian, i.e., radically skeptical, wing of the Academy (see Numenius fragment 28). We also know that the epistemological views in his Roman Books in 88 BCE were regarded as shocking innovations by Academics of all kinds (see Cicero Academica [Ac.] 2.18).

With respect to the first question, this suggests that, if Philo abandoned radical skepticism prior to the Roman Books, then he adopted the form of mitigated skepticism earlier attributed to Carneades by Metrodorus. Otherwise he held the same view from the 130s BCE until leaving Athens in 89/8 BCE.

On the second question, about the epistemological position of the Roman Books, the limited textual evidence has elicited from interpreters three answers: some form of mitigated skepticism, fallibilism, or Platonism. The first answer implies that Philo’s view developed once, from radical to mitigated skepticism, whether prior to (Sedley 1981; Vezzoli 2011; Tarrant 2018) or in the Roman Books (Glucker 1978; Lévy 1992, 2010). According to the second answer, the Roman Books adopted a form of fallibilism. Philo’s innovation in the Roman Books may then be understood either as his first departure from radical skepticism (Hankinson 1995; Thorsrud 2009) or as a second change of view, now from mitigated skepticism (M. Frede 1987; Barnes 1989; Striker 1997; Brittain 2001). The third answer, that the Roman Books advocated a form of Platonism, may similarly presume Philo’s views developed either once, from radical skepticism directly to Platonism (Glidden 1996), or twice, first from radical skepticism to mitigated skepticism and then to Platonism (Tarrant 1985).

Given these two questions and the interpretive constraints on their answers, we arrive at a schema of five accounts of Philo’s epistemological development:

  • Radical Skepticism → Mitigated Skepticism
  • Radical Skepticism → Fallibilism
  • Radical Skepticism → Platonism
  • Radical Skepticism → Mitigated Skepticism → Fallibilism
  • Radical Skepticism → Mitigated Skepticism → Platonism

The resolution of these questions depends primarily on an interpretation of Cicero’s Academica, our principal, and only first-hand, philosophical source for Academic skepticism. But this text strongly suggests Philo held three epistemological positions over his career, since Cicero identifies and distinguishes three positions held by different Academics in Philo’s lifetime: a radical skepticism associated with Clitomachus (e.g., in Ac. 2.78, 2.108); a form of mitigated skepticism held by a group of Academics who regarded it as incompatible with the Roman Books (Ac. 2.148, 2.11–12 & 2.18); and the Roman Book view (Ac. 2.18). So it is clear that the Roman Books did represent a third distinct Academic position. It also seems clear that they represented Philo’s third epistemological view, because the interpretation of Carneades that generated the second view is explicitly tied to Philo and Metrodorus (Ac. 2.78, cf. 2.148), while we know that the Roman Books offered a novel interpretation of Arcesilaus and Carneades that was contested by the proponents of the second view (Ac. 2.11–12, 2.18). We can thus safely infer, in response to the first question above, that Philo advocated mitigated skepticism at some point in the 90s BCE, prior to the Roman Books of 88 BCE and after his election to the scholarchate as a Clitomachian radical skeptic in 110/9 BCE. That this is correct is confirmed by the criticisms of mitigated skepticism aimed at Philo by his student Antiochus before the Roman Books (see section 3.4 below), and by the fact that virtually all the generic references to Academic skepticism in later writers assume that it was a form of mitigated skepticism (see, e.g., Gellius Attic Nights 11.5.8, Photius Library 212.170a, Plutarch Stoic Contradictions ch. 10, and Sextus Outlines of Skepticism [PH] 1.226–31). Since Metrodorus was regarded as unorthodox, the only plausible candidate for the creation of this received view of Academic skepticism is a work by Philo from the 90s BCE.

The second question above is much simpler to dispose of once the first has been resolved. If Philo had previously been a mitigated skeptic and the Roman Books presented an epistemological innovation, his final position was not mitigated skepticism. But we have excellent evidence that it wasn’t a (recognizable) form of Platonism, since Antiochus and Numenius flatly rejected it, despite being avowed revivers of Platonism. (The only evidence in favor of the Platonist hypothesis is an explicitly unsupported fantasy in Augustine, to the effect that Platonist doctrines were secretly taught in the Academy throughout its skeptical phase [Against the Academics 3.37–43].) The fallibilist interpretation of the Roman Books is thus at least prima facie the most plausible candidate offered to date. Whether it is in fact a satisfying candidate will depend on its ability to present a coherent philosophical interpretation of the development of Philo’s epistemological views from the evidence we have.

The following sections thus offer an interpretation of Philo’s philosophical development on the hypothesis that he held three distinct epistemological views, as proposed by the Radical Skepticism → Mitigated Skepticism → Fallibilism account above. It is worth stressing, however, that, given the uncertainties of our evidence, the exegetical and historical arguments above cannot be regarded as conclusive. The case is not closed (see, e.g., Glucker 2004 and Tarrant 2018).

3. Epistemological Views

3.1 Academics vs. Stoics

Philo’s distinct epistemological views share one fundamental feature: all of them deny the possibility of knowledge according to the dominant Stoic conception of it. The essential context for understanding Philo is thus the critique of Stoic epistemology offered by Academic philosophers, and especially by Arcesilaus and Carneades, over the preceding hundred and fifty years (c. 280–130 BCE).

The Stoics’ epistemology was designed to accommodate their belief that it must be possible, in principle, to achieve the sort of inerrant wisdom Socrates had desired. The Stoic theory depends on three innovations (see, e.g., Cicero Ac. 1.40–2.). (1) They defined the formation of a belief as a matter of assenting to an occurrent thought or impression that something is, or is not, the case. (2) They isolated a certain kind of perceptual (and perhaps also non-perceptual) impression as “cognitive” (cataleptic), because it was self-warranting, such that assenting to these impressions constituted a “cognition” (catalepsis—lit. a “grasp”) of the state of affairs they represented. And (3) they took secure knowledge of the sort Socrates sought to be the state of an agent whose beliefs are constituted entirely by perceptual and non-perceptual cognitions. As a result, given their ethical doctrine that secure knowledge was necessary and sufficient for happiness, and since, according to (3), such knowledge could be achieved by restricting one’s assent to cognitive impressions, the Stoics identified the avoidance of opinion and error—i.e., assent to non-cognitive impressions, whether inadequately warranted (opinion) or false (error)—as the overriding principle of rationality.

The Academics attacked every part of this Stoic theory—their practice was to argue against all philosophical positions—but their criticism focused, unsurprisingly, on the central notion of the cognitive impression. The Stoics standardly defined a cognitive impression as one that came from what is, was stamped and impressed exactly in accordance with it, and was, accordingly, such that it couldn’t be false (see, e.g., Sextus Adversus Mathematicos [ M] 7.248 or Cicero Ac. 2.77). They took this to mean, roughly, that an impression is cognitive if and only if

  1. its content is true
  2. it is caused in the appropriate way for correctly representing its object, and
  3. its truth is warranted by the inimitable richness and detail of representation guaranteed by its causal history (see M. Frede 1999).

The general Academic tactic against this view was to concede the possibility that an impression might meet conditions [a] and [b], but argue that condition [c] never obtained. They appealed to our experience of twins etc. and in abnormal states such as dreams, illusions and episodes of madness to show that it was always possible to have a false impression with exactly the same richness and detail of representation as a true one; it follows that meeting condition [b] could never suffice to show that condition [c] obtains, with the result that the warrant claimed in [c] is never available to us. (See, e.g., Sextus M 7.402–10 & Cicero Ac. 2.84–90).

The Academics used these arguments to point out that if our impressions are never self-warranting in the way cognitive impressions are supposed to be, and if the Stoic definition of the cognitive impression is correct, there is no cognition. Hence, if all knowledge depends on cognitions, as the Stoics claim, nothing at all can be known. The Academics also offered a corollary to this argument, drawing on the Stoic principle of rationality mentioned above:

  1. if there are no cognitive impressions (as the Academics have argued)
  2. and if the wise person never assents to a non-cognitive impression (as the Stoics think)
  3. then the wise person will never assent to anything, viz. she will suspend her assent universally.

Thus, according to the Stoic theory, once it is shown that there are no cognitive impressions as they define them, if there are any wise people, they will have no beliefs; and, whether there are any wise people or not, it is never rational to assent to any impression. (See, e.g., Sextus M 7.150–7 & Cicero Ac. 2.66–8 & 2.77–8).

The Stoics, of course, came up with plenty of sophisticated counter-arguments to the criticisms of the cognitive impression, to which the Academics devised equally subtle responses. But one argument in particular seems to have seriously troubled the Academic students of Carneades: the Stoic “inactivity” objection. This was a very simple practical reductio, connected to the corollary argument given above: if the Academics were right it would be impossible to act at all (let alone well), since voluntary action depends on beliefs and thus on assent (see, e.g., Cicero Ac. 2.24–5 and 2.34–7). But since action (indeed, good action) is possible, the Academics must be mistaken. The later Academics saw three ways in which they could respond to this counter-argument without giving up their arguments against cognitive impressions. They could:

  1. deny the connection the Stoics discerned between voluntary action and belief or assent; or
  2. reject the Stoic principle of rationality by allowing for rationally defensible assent to non-cognitive impressions, i.e., opinions (thus rejecting premise [ii] above and the conclusion [iii]); or
  3. accept the force of the Stoic position by allowing that knowledge must after all be possible, though on some weaker definition of cognition than the Stoic one.

These three options turn out to define the three Academic positions Philo held: position [1] was the core of Clitomachus’ defense of radical skepticism; position [2] was the basis of Philo’s defense of mitigated skepticism; and position [3] was the one Philo defended in the Roman Books.

3.2 Radical Skepticism

The dialectic of Academic and Stoic argument and counter-argument outlined above may give the impression that Carneades, and the earlier Academic skeptics more generally, were committed to the conclusions that they argued for, i.e., that there are no cognitive impressions, that nothing can be known, that the wise person will suspend assent universally, etc. But there are several reasons to doubt that Carneades straightforwardly believed on the basis of these arguments that nothing can be known and that it is irrational to assent to any impression (see M. Frede 1987). First, such a position is obviously inconsistent: since beliefs are assents on the Stoic view (and Carneades’ arguments rely on Stoic assumptions), the two conclusions cannot be consistently held at one time by a rational agent. Secondly, the arguments only work if one already accepts a basically Stoic epistemological framework, i.e., their theory of impressions, their empiricism, their conception of knowledge, their psychological doctrine etc. But Carneades had no reason to accept any of these highly contestable views rather than, e.g., the Platonic or Epicurean alternatives. And, thirdly, we know that the Academic method of argument was dialectical: Carneades made it his practice to argue for and against any and all philosophical views. And, in this particular case, there is good reason to think that his arguments were designed to show the inadequacies of the Stoic view and their apparently skeptical consequences for the Stoics themselves. This is more or less directly attested in some sources (Numenius fr. 27, Sextus M 7.159–64, cf. 7.150), as well as evident from the fact that Carneades was happy to try several incompatible responses to the Stoic reductio argument—viz. options [1] and [2] above—both of which can easily be read as further criticisms of Stoic epistemological views (see Striker 1980 [1996] and Allen 1994).

So Carneades was not committed to the views that nothing can be known and that it is always irrational to assent on the basis of these anti-Stoic arguments: the latter do not give him reasons to believe their conclusions. Nevertheless, it seems likely that he was committed to them in some sense, since the Stoics and other philosophers kept on arguing against these views as if they were his, or the Academic, position, and some of his students clearly agreed. (Carneades’ actual position remains controversial; see Bett 1989 and Allen 2004 [2020].) Clitomachus, at any rate, advocated an interpretation of Carneades’ skepticism that saw his method of argument on either side of all philosophical questions as motivated by some sort of commitment to the view that it is irrational to assent to anything less than what one knows to be true, and as resulting in a similar kind of commitment to the view that nothing can be known. And it was this interpretation of Carneades that Philo held at the start of his Academic career (Numenius fr. 28).

Clitomachus defended the consistency of a radical skepticism of this sort by denying that assent is necessary for action or belief, as the Stoics had claimed in their inactivity objection to the Academic corollary argument (section 3.1 above). His defense came in two stages, both appealing to arguments Carneades had used in response to the Stoic objection. The first stage identified a way to discriminate between our thoughts without appealing to their objective status as true or as “cognitive” impressions (see Cicero Ac. 2.98–99, cf. 2.32). Here Clitomachus drew on Carneades’ “theory of probable [or, better, ‘persuasive’ (pithanon)] impressions”—i.e., the description of ordinary epistemic procedures that Carneades promoted as an alternative to the Stoic theory of cognitive impressions (see Sextus M 7. 166–89 and Allen 1994). In ordinary life, Carneades argued, we proceed without assuming that a set of what the Stoics call impressions is “cognitive” or immediately warranted to be true. Rather, some “impressions” leave us with no immediate inclination to accept them, while some strike us as subjectively “persuasive”, at least initially, owing to their internal characteristics (e.g., the richness of their representation). We can increase or diminish the initial persuasiveness of our impressions by considering the perceptual conditions under which we experience them (e.g., normal perceptual conditions for perceiving the state of affairs they represent), and their fit with our other impressions (e.g., normal coherence conditions). And we accept and act on impressions when they reach the level of persuasiveness we find appropriate to the situation we are in. But, Clitomachus insisted, none of these procedures is sufficient to establish that an impression is true or “cognitive”, since, as the Academics have argued, the representational features of any true impression can always be replicated by a false one. (See Cicero Ac. 2.98–99.) And there is no reason to think that in ordinary life we assume that the procedures are sufficient (see Plutarch Common Conceptions ch. 36).

This first stage gives the Academic a procedure that allows for discrimination between impressions while preserving the Academic thesis that nothing can be known. The second stage of Clitomachus’ defense drew on Carneades’ criticisms of the Stoic unitary notion of assent as simply a matter of taking an impression (or its content) to be true. Carneades had argued that this fails to account for the complexity of our cognitive life: many of our actions are not the product of distinct acts of assent, but are rather unconscious, or habitual, like animal action; and we sometimes deliberately act without assent, for instance, when we follow unendorsed hypotheses or act in conditions of uncertainty (see Bett 1990). On the basis of considerations of this sort, Clitomachus argued that we should distinguish “assenting” to an impression, in the Stoic sense of taking it to be true, from “approving” an impression, in the sense of acting on it or accepting it as if it were true. (See Cicero Ac. 2.104.)

This second stage gives the Academics a way of accepting impressions and acting on them that preserves the thesis that rationality demands that one should always suspend assent. Thus, by combining both stages, Clitomachus was able to argue that the Academic is free to “follow” or “approve” persuasive impressions without assenting to them: the Academic has a “practical criterion” that allows for action without presupposing the cognitive access to objective truth required for rational assent (Sextus M 7. 166; cf. Cicero Ac. 2.108). Clitomachus, however, did not restrict the application of this “practical” criterion to cases of ordinary action (pace Görler 1994). He also explicitly claimed that it gave the radical skeptics a means to explain their philosophical activities, i.e., their arguments and views (Cicero Ac. 2.104; cf. 2.32). He was thus in a position to explain the Academics’ apparent commitment to the theses that assent is irrational and knowledge is unattainable. These are views that the radical skeptic finds “persuasive”; but they are not “beliefs”, at least not in the Stoic sense, because the Academic does not take them to be true.

One might plausibly question whether Carneades’ resistance to (straightforward Stoic) assent was the “heroic” defense of rationality against opinion and error Clitomachus took it to be (Cicero Ac. 2.108). It remains very controversial whether there is a coherent distinction to be made between approving a view and assenting to its truth (see the wider discussion in Burnyeat & Frede [ed.] 1998). But a case can be made that acts of pretense, imagination, and supposition require taking on views in a manner distinct from that of belief and that the rational activities of the radical skeptic are founded on supposition (see Striker 1980 [1996]; Bett 1990; Reinhardt 2018). Another way to support the distinction is to note that the process of arguing for and against a thesis, in the way Carneades did, can leave one stuck with a view one way or the other, but without being aware of any rational ground for preferring this view. After constant repetition of this process, one can see how the Academics might have come to have the view that their views or “beliefs” are all non-rational in the specific sense that they were not actively formed in accordance with the explicit criteria of rationality advocated by the dogmatic philosophers. And if they remained committed—in the same attenuated or “non-rational” sense—to the Socratic ideal of inerrant knowledge, one can see why they might try to preserve their rationality by not giving their assent to the views they found themselves holding. A case along these lines is made in Brittain 2005 [2008]. Philo, at any rate, initially agreed with Clitomachus that Carneades’ ability to maintain something like these critical stances towards all beliefs—his own as well as the theories of his philosophical opponents—represented a paradigm of self-conscious rationality (see Numenius fr. 28).

3.3 Mitigated Skepticism

Clitomachus’ interpretation of Carneades’ skepticism was the dominant view in the Academy in the period c. 130–100 BCE. But it was always contested, initially by Metrodorus, and later by Philo himself. The basis for the alternative interpretation was a second response Carneades had given to the Stoic inactivity objection (position [2] in section 3.1 above), arguing that it is sometimes rational to assent to non-cognitive impressions (see Cicero Ac. 2.78, cf. 2.53). Clitomachus had taken this as just an ad hominem argument, designed to challenge the Stoic defense of the view that the overriding principle of rationality is avoidance of any possibility of error (see Cicero Ac. 2.67–8). Metrodorus and his followers, however, thought that this was a statement of Carneades’ own view, and adopted it themselves.

There is no direct evidence to explain Philo’s shift from radical to mitigated skepticism. But we can learn something about the general motivations he may have had for adopting his new position from the ways in which some mitigated skeptics understood the Carneadean notion of “persuasive impressions”. In the case of perceptual impressions, the difference between their view and the Clitomachian position is clarified by a criticism from Philo’s former student Antiochus that some Academics took persuasive impressions to be a criterion of truth, rather than just of action and philosophical criticism (see Sextus M 7.435–8 and Cicero Ac. 2.32–6). This shows that these Academics understood the mechanisms Carneades had outlined for increasing the persuasiveness of impressions to provide a means of confirming or disconfirming—in various degrees, though never ones that warranted them conclusively—whether they were likely to be true or not. These mitigated skeptics thus believed that the persuasiveness of perceptual impressions under the right perceptual and coherence conditions as defeasible, but rational, evidence for their truth. We find a similar move in the case of non-perceptual impressions: some mitigated skeptics formed tentative beliefs as to which positions are more likely to be true (see, e.g., Cicero Ac. 2.148), after using the standard Academic practice of arguing on either side of philosophical questions as a means of rationally evaluating arguments (see Cicero Ac. 2.7, 2.60 & On the Nature of the Gods 1.11, Galen On the Best Method of Teaching ch. 1, and Plutarch Stoic Contradictions ch. 10). These mitigated skeptics thus changed the status of argument on either side from a critical practice ending in suspension of assent into a positive method for rationally confirming and, indirectly, teaching philosophical beliefs.

It is not difficult to see how this shift in the understanding of persuasive impressions might lead to a re-evaluation of the conception of rationality shared by Stoics and, at least in part, by the radical skeptics. Clitomachus had agreed with the Stoics that avoiding error is a necessary condition for rationality, and consequently, given the apparent unavailability of knowledge, advocated suspending assent universally. But once Philo had begun to use persuasiveness as a rational method for evaluating impressions, the radically skeptical position started to look more like an abdication of rationality than its paradigm. Granted that nothing can be known—a view the mitigated skeptics continued to find extremely persuasive (see Cicero Ac. 2.148)—it still seems that we are rationally obliged to form the best beliefs we can, given the evidence available to us. And while this will involve the possibility of error, the refusal to use the evidence we have seems absurd when it is generalized to every case—and immoral in the case of ethics, since without some regulatory beliefs, it is unlikely that our lives could be virtuous or happy (see section 4).

These reasons, then, or something like them, led Philo, along with other mitigated skeptics, to the formal position that, while nothing could be known (as shown by the Academic arguments against the possibility of cognitive impressions), it is nevertheless rational to assent under certain conditions, i.e., to hold beliefs based on reasons (Cicero Ac. 2.78). The mitigated skeptics retained the Stoic characterization of such beliefs as “opinions” to mark the fact that, despite the rational grounds they had for holding them, they were just rational beliefs—i.e., they did not amount to “cognitions” or knowledge (Cicero Ac. 2.148). But they also distinguished rational opinions of this sort from the general Stoic category of opinion as any assent to a non-cognitive impression (and hence as always bad), by qualifying their assent to them as “measured”—that is, as provisional on their avowedly inconclusive evidence, rather than as a straightforward commitment to their truth. (See the anonymous Introduction to Plato ch. 7 and Gellius Attic Nights 11.5.8. Sextus mis-ascribes this view to Clitomachus in PH 1.226 & 1.229–30.)

The significant difference between this position and radical skepticism is clear from the principal example of a mitigatedly skeptical “opinion” that we have: the thesis that nothing can be known (see, e.g., Cicero Ac. 2.148, Gellius Attic Nights 11.5.8, Galen On the Best Method for Teaching ch. 1). The mitigated skeptics evidently believed this thesis on the basis of the Academic arguments considered in section 3.1 above. But this means that, despite their rejection of the existence of cognitive impressions and their new principle of rationality, their skepticism was heavily parasitic on Stoic epistemology: they accepted a dogmatic epistemological framework, such that they believed the Stoic theory of impressions, Stoic empiricism, the Stoic conception of knowledge, and so on. One does not need to see this as a weakness to notice that the ties between mitigated skepticism and its dogmatic framework render it liable to redundancy, in a way radical skepticism is not, if the philosophical conception of knowledge itself changes.

3.4 Fallibilism

Philo’s motivation for his final shift away from skepticism in the Roman Books can be seen, at least in part, from the criticisms directed at him by his ex-student Antiochus before their publication in 88/7 BCE. These criticisms point to a kind of instability inherent in mitigated skepticism: it seems to waver unhealthily between a dogmatic position allowing for something approaching certainty about some questions and a radical skepticism about our ability to make any epistemic progress. More specifically, it suggests that we can take persuasive impressions as evidence for the truth that is firm enough to warrant assent—thus allowing for a life guided by reasoned belief, and even ethical teaching—while simultaneously maintaining that even the most perfect rational consideration of the evidence is compatible with wholesale error. (See the argument in Cicero Ac. 2.111, addressed explicitly to Philo prior to his Roman view, and its elaboration in Ac. 2.34–6 & 2.43–44. These Antiochian criticisms are echoed almost verbatim by Aenesidemus in Photius Library 212 170a 14–38.)

The outlines of Philo’s response to this problem in the Roman Books are fairly clear from the direct evidence we have for their epistemological innovations (Cicero Ac. 2.18 and Sextus PH 1.235). He argued, first, that the Stoic definition of the cognitive impression ruled out the possibility of anything being known—i.e., he restated the standard Academic arguments to this effect—and, secondly, that this definition was therefore misconceived, since at least some things could be known. His elucidation of the second claim is unfortunately not explicit in the surviving evidence. But its criticism by Antiochus (the context for Cicero’s report) very strongly suggests that Philo offered an alternative and weaker definition of knowledge of single propositions. For Antiochus both characterizes Philo’s innovations as an attempt to redefine “cognition” (Ac. 2.17 & 2.18 fin.) and attempts to refute them by arguing that an impression that does not meet the condition given in the third clause of the Stoic definition (see section 3.1 above) cannot be “cognitive”. Philo’s new definition thus amounted to something like the Stoic definition minus its third clause (the clause the Academics had always disputed). If so, Philo claimed that an impression is cognitive if it is both [a] true and [b] caused in the appropriate way for correctly representing its object—without adding the disputed Stoic rider [c], that its truth is warranted by the inimitable richness and detail of representation guaranteed by its causal history.

This bare outline of Philo’s final position is sufficient to show its novelty, and thus explain its poor reception by Antiochus and the Academics alike (see Ac. 2.11–12, 2.18). His new conception of knowledge was a radical innovation in three respects. First, given his acceptance of the standard Academic arguments against self-warranting cognitive impressions, it offered a fallibilist theory, which allows for unqualified assent to knowledge claims on the basis of impressions that might nonetheless be false. Antiochus’ criticism suggests that he defended this view by pointing out that the theoretical or counterfactual possibility of error was epistemically irrelevant in cases where the impression is in fact true and our positive evidence for it is, in practice, conclusive (see Barnes 1989). But however he justified it, Philo’s new conception of knowledge challenged the fundamental epistemological principle of the Hellenistic period that knowledge must be certain. Secondly, Philo’s new theory implied that there is in fact a good deal of knowledge. It thus constituted an apparently radical rejection of the basic thesis that all the skeptical Academics had shared, that nothing can be known. And, thirdly, Philo’s theory implied a revised principle of rationality. The mitigated skeptics had responded to the Stoic inactivity objection by identifying rationality with forming defeasible beliefs on the basis of the available evidence. But, by qualifying the assent of the rational agent as “measured” or provisional, they insulated rationality itself from practical error: whether or not the belief is false, an agent who forms it on the appropriate grounds is never mistaken in holding it provisionally. On Philo’s new position, however, rationality is compatible with outright error because it is rational to give straightforward, unqualified assent to impressions that might nonetheless be false. The Roman Books thus marked Philo’s final rejection of the joint Stoic and Academic thesis that the avoidance of error is an overriding principle of rationality.

This sketch of their implications explains why Philo’s innovations were decisive enough to startle his contemporaries and, eventually, to lead to the doxographical classification of his version of Academicism as a distinct “Fourth Academy” (see, e.g., Sextus PH 1.220 & 1.235). But two facts imply that his further elucidation in the Roman Books included some significant limitations on the range of knowledge Philo came to accept, and hence the sense in which he rejected the skepticism of his Academic predecessors. The first is just that his contemporaries (and later historians) continued to regard him, even at the end of his career, as an Academic, i.e., in some way a follower of Arcesilaus and Carneades, rather than a defector like Antiochus or Aenesidemus. The second is that Philo asserted “the unity of the Academy” in the Roman Books (see Cicero Ac. 1.13), i.e., claimed that his new view was in fact the underlying view of all the Academics from Socrates and Plato to himself. Exactly what he meant by this claim is controversial, but the tenuous and complex evidence does not suggest that it involved either accepting an anti-skeptical reading of Plato or denying that the skeptical Academics were skeptical about the possibility of achieving theoretical knowledge in philosophy (see Brittain 2001: chs. 4–5 and Tarrant 2018: 86–87).

By combining these external constraints on our understanding of the epistemological innovations of the Roman Books with their philosophical context—Philo’s prior position of mitigated skepticism and the criticisms it faced—we can see, at least roughly, how Philo may have given flesh to the basic outline above. Taken together, these considerations suggest three constraints on the range of the knowledge that Philo accepted. They suggest, first, that Philo supplemented the externalist bones of his new definition of cognition with the internalist constraints on assent that the mitigated skeptics had already identified: assent to a Philonian cognitive impression would only be warranted when the representational “richness” guaranteed by its causal history (condition [b] above) was confirmed by meeting the additional perceptual and coherence conditions Carneades had identified for persuasive impressions. Secondly, that Philo took Philonian cognition to apply primarily to experiential knowledge, i.e., the kind that we ascribe to ourselves in virtue of perception and to experts with practical skills, or something like “ordinary knowledge”. And thirdly, that Philo accordingly did not assume that the results of philosophical inquiry would often, or even usually, or perhaps ever, amount to knowledge when subjected to rational criticism through argument on either side. (The evidence that might support these three claims is collected in Brittain 2001: ch. 3.)

The hypothesis that Philo’s fleshed-out final theory of knowledge was roughly along these lines makes sense of both the context and the reception of his innovations. It also allows us to offer a more philosophically satisfying explanation of his eventual acceptance of the possibility of knowledge than Antiochus’ suggestion that he was unable to endure the criticisms he and other Academics had dealt with for thirty years (Cicero Ac. 2.18). By allowing for the existence of ordinary, fallible knowledge, Philo challenged the epistemological framework of his era; but by limiting knowledge so that it did not include most of the results of philosophical inquiry, and by ascribing the acceptance of this view to the entire Academic tradition, he sought to redefine the skeptical Academy in terms of its original Socratic function as the non-dogmatic critic of philosophical pretensions to theoretical knowledge. On this view, Academic philosophy is not defined by an epistemological position (as even Clitomachus’ radical skepticism appears to have been), but by the critical method of argument on either side.

4. Philosophy of Education

In defining the Academy only by its critical method, rather than also by its acceptance of any epistemological positions, Philo recognized a value in argument on either side that was independent of the conclusions or acts of suspension it yielded: its ability to cultivate in others autonomy in dialectical reasoning. In the periods of both his mitigated skepticism and his fallibilism, Philo argued on either side in order to judge whether some philosophical view merited his assent (see sections 3.3–3.4). To this end he accepted rational norms of criticism (cf. D. Frede 1996), so that he was obliged to disregard illicit sources of persuasion: e.g., performative aspects of a speaker’s presentation of arguments, or a speaker’s reputation (unless their reputation is cited as a reason for belief). Thus we find in Philonian sources an analysis of the sources of authority and arguments against epistemic deference (see Cicero Ac. 2.9, 2.115 and Topica 72–8; cf. Sextus PH 2.37–46 & M 7.314–42). The evidence suggests that Philo sought to protect auditors from his own authority, by concealing his judgments about arguments on either side. At any rate, Academics who are associated with Philo or the mitigated skepticism he popularized (e.g., Charmadas, Cicero, and Favorinus) concealed their evaluations of arguments, on the grounds that their auditors would be better situated to follow the rational norms of criticism (see Cicero On the Orator 1.84, Ac. 2.60, On the Nature of the Gods 1.10–11, On Divination 2.150, Tusculan Disputations 5.11 & 5.83, On Fate 1, and Galen On the Best Method of Teaching).

Philo’s interest in students’ autonomy in dialectical criticism is most often related to his mitigated skepticism (Long & Sedley 1987, 1:449: Ioppolo 1993: 210; Brittain 2001: 111–4; Tarrant 2018). As mentioned above, Philo’s educational interests are shared by the Academics Charmadas (Cicero On the Orator 1.84) and Favorinus (Galen On the Best Method of Teaching), whom some identify as mitigated skeptics (see Brittain 2001: 213–4; Tarrant 1985: ch. 2 & 2018: 83; Brittain 2007: 302; Ioppolo 1993). And since the same concerns about rational norms carry over from Philo’s mitigated skepticism to his reconstructed fallibilism (see section 3.4), it is likely Philo retained this pedagogical view in his Roman Books (see also section 5).

Although Philo’s philosophy of education is identified most closely with mitigated skepticism, its origin may also be tied to Clitomachean radical skepticism. Scholarship on Cicero, our best source for the defense of argument on either side on educational grounds, has increasingly defended radically skeptical interpretations of some of his dialogues (Brittain 2016: Cappello 2019; Wynne 2018 & 2021), and Cicero himself associates it with Arcesilaus and Carneades (see On Divination 2.150, Tusculan Disputations 5.11 & 5.83). It may seem that radical skeptics would not have justified argument on either side for educational reasons because they argue for purely destructive ends. But one may think that radical skepticism can ground a Socratic interest in others’ training in dialectic out of a hypothetical acceptance of rational norms (see Brittain 2005 [2008]). If this is right, then Philo in the Roman Books had further cause for identifying its critical method as the defining mark of the Academy.

5. Ethics and Rhetoric

Our knowledge of Philo’s work in ethics comes almost entirely from an extended summary of an introductory book or lecture preserved without any context in an anthology (Stobaeus Anthology 2.7). The summary is puzzling because it presents a picture of Philonian ethics that seems too dogmatic, and too ordinary, for an Academic, even at the time of the Roman Books. The work presents a method for teaching ethics in terms of an analogy between philosophy and medicine. This yields a division of ethical teaching into three parts: a protreptic stage (showing the need for philosophical guidance), a therapeutic stage (adjusting the student’s evaluative concepts), and a preservative stage (outlining the life-styles and political arrangements that promote or maintain happiness by reinforcing these adjusted concepts). This is intriguing as an example of the way in which late Hellenistic philosophers approached the teaching of practical ethics (see Annas 1993: 95–96. But it does not look innovative. The analogy between medicine and philosophy is a standard one in Plato and in Hellenistic ethics. The focus on practical rules and the application of technical divisions and sub-divisions is derived from the Stoic tradition. And its theoretical claims—for instance, that wisdom or knowledge is necessary for virtue, and that virtue promotes the goal of happiness—do not identify it as an exception to the mainstream tradition of weaker or stronger “intellectualist” and “eudaemonist” virtue ethics. In these respects, the summary suggests that Philo’s ethics was largely unaffected by the wide-ranging and penetrating criticisms of Hellenistic ethics by his Academic predecessors, and especially by Carneades (examined in Algra 1997).

But there is reason to think that the summary—which was probably written five hundred years after Philo’s work—gives a misleading picture of Philonian ethics by not informing us directly of the methods it used to enable and secure the possession of happiness. It is perhaps natural to assume that his methods were the standard dogmatic ones. Two aspects of the wider context omitted by the excerptor, however, suggest that Philo’s ethics were in fact based on the Academic method of argument on either side. First, we know that the mitigated skeptics had already come to see their method of arguing for and against ethical theses as a way of teaching ethics that allowed students to evaluate which views were more persuasive, i.e., had better rational grounds (see section 4). This is clearest in the case of Philo’s colleague Charmadas in Cicero On the Orator 1.83–93. It is confirmed by the criticisms of mitigated skepticism from Aenesidemus in Photius Library 212 170a and Sextus PH 1.226. Secondly, we know that Philo had developed a way to popularize the Academic method by incorporating it into a technical system of rhetoric (see Cicero On the Orator 3.110–118 and Tusculan Disputations 2.9). But since the function of this system was to provide students with forensic techniques for arguing about moral issues, and given that teaching rhetoric in any form was a significant departure for an Academic philosopher, this development must have had some connection to Philo’s ethical views (see Reinhardt 2000 and Brittain 2001).

When the summary is read with this wider context in mind, three apparently minor points stand out. First, the therapeutic stage, dealing with the students’ fundamental conceptions of value, is described as the effort to replace “falsely acquired beliefs” with ones “in a healthy state”, rather than just false with true beliefs (Stobaeus Anthology 2.7 p. 40.18–20). Secondly, the preservative stage, concerned with the lifestyles that promote or secure happiness, is framed as an investigation of a set of questions that correspond precisely with the questions dealt with by argument on either side in Philo’s rhetoric (ibid. p. 41.7–14). And, thirdly, that kind of general investigation is explicitly distinguished from the provision of straightforwardly prescriptive advice about how to behave, which is regarded as a temporary fix for busy people (ibid. p. 41.16–25). These points can be explained in various ways. But given the wider context, they suggest that the summary has obscured the central point about Philo’s ethics: its method of teaching was not dogmatic, but the Academic one of argument on either side.

If this is right, the summary’s apparent ordinariness and dogmatic structure reflect only Philo’s systematic approach to ethical topics, not its methods or results: Philo did not propose a dogmatic ethics, but rather a systematic technique for structuring students’ moral values into a coherent way of life through their rational evaluation of arguments on either side. A philosophical approach to ethics of this kind allows students to use their ethical intuitions—the knowledge provided by their own experience—to revise and structure their conceptions of value, and, on that basis, critically evaluate their general social and political roles, and select the appropriate actions in a particular situation. An approach of this sort perhaps no longer seems striking or innovative, but if Philo adopted it in the early 80s BCE, it presented no less a challenge to Hellenistic ethics than his Roman Books did to epistemology. Two reasons to think that Philo did adopt this approach are, first, that it yields a conception of ethical knowledge that fits the epistemology of the Roman Books—a Philonian rational agent will have the sort of wisdom and happiness that is available to ordinary people, i.e., something quite unlike the illusory promise of inerrant knowledge and moral perfection promised by the Stoics. And, secondly, Philo’s student Cicero may have adopted something like a mitigatedly skeptical version of this approach both in his personal life (see Griffin 1989) and in his philosophical works on ethics (see Schofield 2002).

6. Conclusion

On this reconstruction of his work, Philo eventually abandoned both radical and mitigated skepticism for a form of fallibilism that he described as the basis of the Academic tradition. His promotion of Academic philosophy as open-ended critical inquiry had some impact on the work of Cicero, Plutarch, Favorinus and Augustine, but his radical innovations in epistemology and ethics sank almost without trace. The skeptical tradition survived in the form of Pyrrhonism, but the Academy did not. Like any interpretation of Philo’s philosophical development, this reconstruction is speculative in some respects. But much of it can be confirmed or disconfirmed by further work on ancient skepticism, and especially its Latin tradition, which remains an open field for research.



Collections of Philo’s fragments

  • Brittain, Charles, 2001, Philo of Larissa: The Last of the Academic Sceptics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 345–370.

    [The evidence on Philo in Greek and Latin, with English translations.]

  • Inwood, Brad and Lloyd P. Gerson (eds.), 1997, Hellenistic Philosophy: Introductory Readings, second edition, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Long, A. A. and D. N. Sedley (eds.), 1987, The Hellenistic Philosophers, Volume 1: Translations of the Principal Sources with Philosophical Commentary, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511808050

    [Both Inwood & Gerson and Long & Sedley have useful Academic texts, but are limited on Philo himself.]

  • Mette, Hans Joachim, 1986–7, “Philon von Larisa und Antiochus von Askalon”, Lustrum, 28–9: 9–63.

    [The evidence on Philo in Greek and Latin, with German translations.]

Primary sources

  • Anonymous, Prolégomènes à la Philosophie de Platon, Leendert Gerrit Westerink (ed.), Jean Trouillard & Alain Philippe Segonds (trans.), Paris: Collection des Universités de France, 1990.

    [Greek text with French translation of the Introduction to Plato.]

  • Augustine, Aurelius Augustinus: Contra Academicos, De beata vita, De ordine, Therese Fuhrer and Simone Adam (eds), Berlin: De Gruyter, 2017. doi:10.1515/9783110445244
  • –––, Contra Academicos Libri Tres (Corpus Christianorum SL 29), W. M. Green (ed.), Turnholt: Brepols, 1970.
  • –––, Augustine Against the Academicians and The Teacher, Peter King (trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett, 1995.
  • Cicero, [Ac] On Academic Scepticism, Charles Brittain (trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett, 2006.
  • –––, Tusculan Disputations (Loeb Classical Library 141/Cicero XVIII), John Edward King (trans.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1927.

    [Loeb edition with English translation.]

  • –––, On the Nature of the Gods, Academics (Loeb Classical Library 268/Cicero XIX), H. Rackham (trans.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1933.

    [Loeb edition with English translation.]

  • –––, On Ends (De finibus bonorum et malorum), (Loeb Classical Library 40/Cicero XVII), H. Rackham (trans.) Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1914.

    [Loeb edition with English translation.]

  • –––, De Oratore [= On the Orator] Book III, in On the Orator: Book 3. On Fate. Stoic Paradoxes. Divisions of Oratory (Loeb Classical Library 349/Cicero IV), H. Rackham (trans), Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1942.

    [Loeb edition with English translation.]

  • –––, On Moral Ends, Raphael Woolf (trans.), Julia Annas (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511803659

    [A translation of De finibus.]

  • Galen, Favorino di Arelate, A. Barigazzi (ed.), Florence: le Monnier, 1966.

    [Greek text with Italian translation of Galen’s On the Best Method of Teaching.]

  • Gellius, Attic Nights, Volume III: Books 14–20 (Loeb Classical Library 212), J. C. Rolfe (trans.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1927.

    [Loeb edition with English translation.]

  • Numenius, Eusebii Pamphili Evangelicae Praeparationis Libri XV, 4 vols., E. H. Gifford, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1903.

    [Greek text with English translation of Eusebius; book 14.4–9 contains Numenius’ fragments.]

  • ––– Numenius, E. Des Places (ed.), Paris: Belles Lettres, 1973.

    [Greek text with French translation.]

  • Philodemus, Storia dei filosofi [.] Platone e l’Academia, Tiziano Dorandi (ed.), Naples: Bibliopolis, 1991.

    [Greek text with Italian translation of Philodemus’ Catalogue of Academic Philosophers.]

  • Photius, Photius: Bibliothèque, R. Henry (ed.), Paris: Belles Lettres, 1959–67.

    [Greek text with French translation.]

  • –––, Photius: The Bibliotheca, N. G. Wilson (trans.), London: Bristol Classical Press, 1994.

    [A selection in English.]

  • Plutarch, Plutarch Moralia XIII Part 2: Stoic Essays (Loeb Classical Library 470), Harold Cherniss (trans.), Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1976.

    [Loeb edition with English translation of Plutarch’s Stoic Contradictions and Common Conceptions]

  • Sextus Empiricus, [PH] Sextus Empiricus: Outlines of Scepticism [Pyrrhōneioi hypotypōseis] (Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy), Julia Annas and Jonathan Barnes (trans.), New York: Cambridge University Press, 1994, second edition 2000.
  • –––, [M] Sextus Empiricus: Against the Logicians, Richard Bett (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511815232
  • –––, Outlines of Pyrrhonism (Loeb Classical Library 273/Sextus Empiricus I), R. G. Bury (trans.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1933.

    [Loeb edition of PH.]

  • –––, Against the Logicians [Adversus Mathematicos 7–8] (Loeb Classical Library 291/Sextus Empiricus II), R. G. Bury (trans.), Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1935.

    [Loeb edition of M.]

  • Stobaeus, Joannis Stobaei Anthologium, Wachsmuth, Curt and Otto Hense (ed.), Berlin: Weidmannsche, 1884–1909.

    [The excerpt about Philo’s ethics is translated in Brittain 2001 and Schofield 2002.]

Edited volumes and monographs

  • Algra, Keimpe, Jonathan Barnes, Jaap Mansfeld, and Malcolm Schofield (eds.), 1999, The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521250283
  • Brittain, Charles, 2001a, Philo of Larissa: The Last of the Academic Sceptics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Dorandi, Tiziano, 1991a, Storia dei filosofi [.] Platone e l’Academia, Naples: Bibliopolis.
  • Griffin, Miriam and Jonathan Barnes (eds), 1989, Philosophia Togata: Essays on Philosophy and Roman Society, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Inwood, Brad and Jaap Mansfeld (eds.), 1997, Assent and Argument: Studies in Cicero’s Academic Books. Proceedings of the 7th Symposium Hellenisticum (Utrecht, August 21–25, 1995), Leiden: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004321014
  • Machuca, Diego E. and Baron Reed (eds.), 2018, Skepticism: From Antiquity to the Present, London: Bloomsbury.
  • Popkin, Richard H. (ed.), 1996, Scepticism in the History of Philosophy, Dordrecht: Kluwer. doi:10.1007/978-94-017-2942-0

Philo’s life and philosophical activity

  • Barnes, Jonathan, 1989, “Antiochus of Ascalon”, in Griffin and Barnes 1989: 51–96.
  • Brittain, Charles, 2001b, “Philo’s Life”, in Brittain 2001a: 38–72.
  • Cappello, Orazio, 2019, The School of Doubt: Skepticism, History and Politics in Cicero’s “Academica”, Leiden: Brill.
  • Dorandi, Tiziano, 1991b, “Introduzione”, in Dorandi 1991a: 23–99.
  • Fleischer, Kilian, 2017a, “New Evidence on the Death of Philo of Larissa (PHerc. 1021, Cols. 33.42–34.7)”, The Cambridge Classical Journal, 63: 69–81. doi:10.1017/S175027051700001X
  • –––, 2017b, “Starb Philo von Larisa im Alter von 63 Jahren?”, Archiv für Papyrusforschung und verwandte Gebiete, 63: 335–66.
  • –––, 2017c, “The Pupils of Philo of Larissa and Philodemus’ Stay in Sicily (PHerc. 1021, col. XXXIV 6–19)”, Cronache ercolanesi, 47: 73–85.
  • Fleischer, Kilian, 2018, “Philon of Larissa”, in The Encyclopedia of Ancient History, Roger S Bagnall, Kai Brodersen, Craige B Champion, Andrew Erskine, and Sabine R Huebner (eds.), Hoboken: John Wiley & Sons, 2 pages. doi:10.1002/9781444338386.wbeah30445
  • Görler, Woldemar, 1994, “Älterer Pyrrhonismus—Jüngere Akademie, Antiochos aus Askalon”, in Die Philosophie der Antike 4: Die Hellenistische Philosophie, Helmut Flashar (ed.), Basel: Schwabe & Co., pp. 915–937.
  • Glucker, John, 1978, Antiochus and the Late Academy, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, pp. 13–31, 64–90.
  • Goulet, Richard, 2012, “Philon de Larissa”, in Dictionnaire des philosophes antiques, vol. v.1, Richard Goulet (ed.), Paris: Centre National de la Recherche Scientifique, pp. 404–24.
  • Mette, Hans Joachim, 1985, “Weitere Akademiker heute: von Lakydes bis zu Kleitomachos”, Lustrum, 27: 39–148.
  • –––, 1986–7, “Philon von Larisa und Antiochus von Askalon”, Lustrum, 28–9: 9–63.
  • Puglia, Enzo, 2000, “Le biografie di Filone e di Antioco nella Storia dell’Academia di Filodemo”, Zeitschrift für Papyrologie und Epigraphik, 130: 17–28.
  • Striker, Gisela, 2012, “Philon (3), of Larissa, last undisputed head of the Academy, 159/158–84/83 BCE”, in The Oxford Classical Dictionary, fourth edition, Simon Hornblower and Antony Spawforth (gen. eds), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 1133–34. doi:10.1093/acrefore/9780199381135.013.5005

Philo’s epistemological positions

  • Allen, James, 1994, “Academic Probabilism and Stoic Epistemology”, The Classical Quarterly, 44(1): 85–113. doi:10.1017/S0009838800017249
  • –––, 1997, “Carneadean Argument in Cicero’s Academic Books”, in Inwood and Mansfeld 1997: 217–256. doi:10.1163/9789004321014_009
  • –––, 2004 [2020], “Carneades”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2020 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Barnes, Jonathan, 1989, “Antiochus of Ascalon”, in Griffin and Barnes 1989: 51–96.
  • Bett, Richard, 1989, “Carneades’ Pithanon: A Reappraisal of its Role and Status”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 7: 59–94.
  • –––, 1990, “Carneades’ Distinction Between Assent and Approval”, Monist, 73(1): 3–20. doi:10.5840/monist199073114
  • Brittain, Charles, 2001c, “Epistemology: Philonian/Metrodorian Scepticism”, in Brittain 2001a: 73–168.
  • –––, 2005 [2008], “Arcesilaus”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2008 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.) URL = <>.
  • –––, 2006, “Introduction”, in Ac: viii–liii.
  • Burnyeat, Myles F., 1997, “Antipater and Self-Refutation: Elusive Arguments in Cicero’s Academica”, in Inwood and Mansfeld 1997: 277–310. doi:10.1163/9789004321014_011
  • Burnyeat, Myles F. and Michael Frede (eds.), 1998, The Original Sceptics: A Controversy, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Couissin, Pierre, 1929, “Le Stoicisme de la Nouvelle Académie”, Revue d’histoire de la philosophie, 3: 241–276. Translated as “The Stoicism of the New Academy”, J. Barnes and M. Burnyeat (trans.), in Myles Burnyeat (ed.), 1983, The Skeptical Tradition, Berkeley: University of California Press, pp. 31–63].
  • Frede, Michael, 1979, “Des Skeptikers Meinungen”, Neue Hefte für Philosophie, Aktualität der Antike, 15/16: 102–129. Translated as “The Skeptic’s Beliefs”, in his 1987, Essays in Ancient Philosophy, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 179–200; reprinted as “The Sceptic’s Beliefs” in Burnyeat and Frede 1997: 1–24.
  • –––, 1987, “The Skeptic’s Two Kinds of Assent”, in Michael Frede, Essays in Ancient Philosophy, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 201–22; reprinted in Burnyeat and Frede 1997: 127–151.
  • Glidden, David, 1996, “Philo of Larissa and Platonism”, in Popkin 1996: 219–234. doi:10.1007/978-94-017-2942-0_16
  • Glucker, John, 2004, “The Philonian/Metrodorians: Problems of Method in Ancient Philosophy”, Elenchos, 25: 99–153.

    [A review of Brittain’s Philo of Larissa.]

  • Lévy, Carlos, 1992, Cicero Academicus: Recherches sur les Académiques et sur la Philosophie Cicéronienne, Rome: École Française de Rome.
  • –––, 2010, “The Sceptical Academy: Decline and Afterlife”, in The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Scepticism, Richard Bett (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 81–104. doi:10.1017/CCOL9780521874762.005
  • Machuca, Diego, 2011, “Ancient Skepticism: The Skeptical Academy”, Philosophy Compass, 6(4): 259–266. doi:10.1111/j.1747-9991.2011.00390.x
  • Reinhardt, Tobias, 2018, “Pithana and probabilia”, in Thomas Bénatouïl and Katerina Ierodiakonou (eds.), Dialectic after Plato and Aristotle, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 218–253.
  • Schofield, Malcolm, 1999, “Academic Epistemology”, in Algra et al. 1999: 323–352. doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521250283.011
  • Sedley, David, 1981, “The End of the Academy”, Phronesis, 26(1): 67–75. doi:10.1163/156852881X00141
  • Striker, Gisela, 1980 [1996], “Sceptical Strategies”, in Doubt and Dogmatism, Malcolm Schofield, Mylese Burnyeat, and Jonathan Barnes (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 54–83. Reprinted in Gisela Striker, 1996, Essays on Hellenistic Epistemology and Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 92–115.
  • –––, 1997, “Academics Fighting Academics”, in Inwood and Mansfeld 1997: 257–276. doi:10.1163/9789004321014_010
  • Tarrant, Harold, 1981, “Agreement and the Self-Evident in Philo of Larissa”, Dionysus, 5: 66–97.
  • –––, 1985, Scepticism or Platonism. The Philosophy of the Fourth Academy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 1–66.
  • –––, 2018, “Philo of Larissa”, in Machuca and Reed 2018: 81–92.
  • Thorsrud, Harald, 2009, Ancient Scepticism, Stocksfield: Acumen, pp. 84–87.
  • Vezzoli, Simone, 2011, “L’ esistenza di un criterio di verità nella filosofia di Filone di Larissa”, Acme: Annali della Facoltà di Lettere e Filosofia dell’Università degli Studi di Milano, 64: 247–263.

Philo’s relation to other philosophers

  • Annas, Julia, 1990, “Stoic Epistemology”, in Epistemology, Stephen Everson (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 184–203
  • Barnes, Jonathan, 1989, “Antiochus of Ascalon”, in Griffin and Barnes 1989: 51–96.
  • Bonazzi, Mauro, 2003, Academici e Platonici. Il dibattito antico sullo scetticismo di Platone, Milan: LED.
  • Brittain, Charles, 2001d, “The Unity of the Academy: Philo’s Roman Books”, in Brittain 2001a: 169–254.
  • –––, 2007, “Middle Platonists on Academic scepticism”, in Richard Sorabji and R. W. Sharples (eds.), Greek and Roman Philosophy, 100 BC–200 AD (BICS Supplement 94), London: Institute of Classical Studies, vol. 2, pp. 297–315.
  • –––, 2016, “Cicero’s Sceptical Methods: The Example of the De Finibus”, in Cicero’s “De Finibus”: Philosophical Approaches, Julia Annas and Gábor Betegh (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 12–40. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139871396.002
  • Decleva Caizzi, Fernanda, 1992, “Aenesidemus and the Academy”, The Classical Quarterly, 42(1): 176–189. doi:10.1017/S0009838800042671
  • Frede, Dorothea, 1996, “How Sceptical Were the Academic Sceptics?”, in Popkin 1996: 1–25. doi:10.1007/978-94-017-2942-0_1
  • Frede, Michael, 1999, “Stoic Epistemology”, in Algra et al. 1999: 295–322. doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521250283.010
  • Hankinson, R. J., 1995, The Sceptics (Arguments of the Philosophers), London: Routledge.
  • Ioppolo, Anna Maria, 1993, “The Academic Position of Favorinus of Arelate”, Phronesis, 38(2): 183–213. doi:10.1163/156852893321052389
  • Lévy, Carlos, 2005, “Les Petits Académiciens: Lacyde, Charmadas, Métrodore de Stratonice”, in Mauro Bonazzi and Vincenza Celluprica (eds.), L’eredita platonica, Naples: Bibliopolis, pp. 55–77.
  • Mansfeld, J., 1995, “Aenesidemus and the Academics”, in Lewis Ayres (ed.), The Passionate Intellect: Essays on the Transformation of Classical Traditions presented to Professor I.G. Kidd, London: Routledge, pp. 235–248.
  • Opsomer, Jan, 1998, In search of the truth: Academic tendencies in Middle Platonism, Brussels: Paleis der Academiën.
  • Sedley, David, 1996, “Three Platonist Interpretations of theTheaetetus”, in Christopher Gill and Mary Margaret McCabe (eds.), Form and Argument in Late Plato, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 79–103.
  • Tarrant, Harold, 1985, Scepticism or Platonism. The Philosophy of the Fourth Academy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wynne, J. P. F., 2018, “Cicero”, in Machuca and Reed 2018: 93–101.
  • –––, 2021, “Cicero’s Tusculan Disputations: A Sceptical Reading”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 58: 205–238.

Philo’s ethics

  • Alesse, F., 2013, “L’etica prescrittiva nel tardo ellenismo e il caso di Filone di Larissa”, Méthexis 26: 187–204.
  • Algra, Keimpe A., 1997, “Chrysippus, Carneades, Cicero: The Ethical Divisiones in Cicero’s Lucullus”, in Inwood and Mansfeld 1997: 107–139. doi:10.1163/9789004321014_006
  • Annas, Julia, 1993, The Morality of Happiness, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 95–6. doi:10.1093/0195096525.001.0001

    [A discussion of Stobaeus’ excerpt about Philo’s ethics from ch. 2.4, “The Structure of Moral Reasoning: Rules and Insight”.]

  • Brittain, Charles, 2001e, “Ethics”, in Brittain 2001a: 255–95.
  • Griffin, Miriam, 1989, “Philosophy, Politics, and Politicians at Rome”, in Griffin and Barnes 1989: 1–37.
  • Koch, Bernhard, 2006, Philosophie als Medizin für die Seele: Untersuchungen zu Ciceros “Tusculanae Disputationes”, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner, pp. 29–60.
  • Schofield, Malcolm, 2002, “Academic Therapy: Philo of Larissa and Cicero’s Project in the Tusculans”, in Gillian Clark and Tessa Rajak (eds.), Philosophy and Power in the Graeco-Roman World: Essays in Honour of Miriam Griffin, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 91–109.

Philo’s rhetoric

  • Brittain, Charles, 2001f, “Rhetoric”, in Brittain 2001a: 296–342.
  • Lévy, Carlos, 2010, “La rhétorique et son contexte: quelques remarques sur l’enseignement rhétorique de Philon de Larissa”, in Luc Brisson and Pierre Chiron (eds), Rhetorica philosophans: Melanges offerts a Michel Patillon, Paris: Vrin, pp. 95–106.
  • Reinhardt, Tobias, 2000, “Rhetoric in the Fourth Academy”, The Classical Quarterly, 50(2): 531–547. doi:10.1093/cq/50.2.531
  • –––, 2003, Cicero’s “Topica”, Oxford: Oxford University Press, especially pp. 3–17.
  • Wisse Jakob, 2002, “The Intellectual Background of Cicero’s Rhetorical Works”, in James M. May (ed.), Brill’s Companion to Cicero: Oratory and Rhetoric, Leiden: Brill, pp. 331–74. doi:10.1163/9789047400936_012

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