Philosophy in Chile

First published Thu Apr 2, 2015; substantive revision Tue Mar 31, 2020

Philosophy in Chile, as in the rest of Latin America, has been an academic pursuit ever since the conquest and settlement of the New World by Spain and Portugal in the early sixteenth century. Very few philosophers ventured beyond the walls of academic or religious institutions (usually one and the same) during the entire colonial period, which ended in most Spanish American countries (the exceptions being Cuba and Puerto Rico) in the early nineteenth century. Even after Independence, philosophy remained a fundamentally academic endeavor. Chile, in contrast to other nations in the region, has shown remarkable institutional continuity, with the exception of the years of military rule in the last quarter of the twentieth century.

The academic context in which the discipline developed, however, has not prevented philosophers from engaging in social and political activities, and, especially, in debates concerning the history, culture and direction of the emerging nations. Philosophers have been important political figures since the early republic as well as leaders in the university reform processes that have taken place during the country’s modern history. During the period of military rule (1973–1990) several became important opponents of the regime. A concern for politics, in fact, has dominated the agenda of philosophers, including those who have denounced the encroachment of politics in the discipline.

The centrality of politics, even in cases of direct involvement in it, has not distracted philosophers from their essential commitment to exploring different philosophical (predominantly European) schools, some specific fields within the discipline, such as logic and metaphysics, and some thematic concerns like the role of religion in a secular state, the impact of modernity on self and society, and the role of universities in the development of nationhood. Chilean philosophy is characterized by a constant tension between academic pursuits solely informed by developments within the discipline, and critical outlooks that demand a closer philosophical engagement with politics and society.

1. Colonial Background

While one cannot speak properly of a “Chilean philosophy” until the former colony declared its independence from Spain in February 1818, it would not be appropriate to ignore the activities of several philosophers during the Spanish colonial period. Philosophical activity made a first appearance with the teachings of Cristóbal de Valdespino in the Dominican convent in Santiago in 1595, spread quickly to other secondary schools in the seventeenth century, and picked up momentum with the creation of the Royal University of San Felipe in 1758. Prominent scholars during this time, and up to the early nineteenth century include clergymen Alonso Briseño, Miguel de Viñas, Manuel Ovalle, and Manuel Antonio Talavera, all of whom wrote significant philosophical treatises mostly within the scholastic tradition. The expulsion of the Jesuits in 1767 meant that several talented authors, including Miguel de Olivares, Felipe Gómez de Vidaurre, Juan Ignacio Molina and Manuel Lacunza, published their works elsewhere. The main difference between the two traditions resides in that the former cultivated philosophy as an instrument to address theological questions whereas the latter were more oriented to practical concerns, such as understanding the conditions of the New World, and were therefore less interested in theological questions. Lay authors who covered some philosophical themes reflecting the concerns of the Enlightenment during the late colonial period included Manuel de Salas and Juan Egaña, who served as bridges to the post-independence period.

But it is with the foundation of Chile as an independent republic that Chilean philosophy began to be cultivated in a systematic manner within institutions of higher education entrusted with a deliberate national purpose. Five major periods characterize the history of the discipline: the formative years from Independence through 1865; the ascendancy and decline of Positivism from 1865 through 1920; the anti-positivist reaction from 1920 to 1950; the rise and critique of professionalization from 1950 to 1973, and the fate of philosophy under military rule, from 1973 to 1990. These periods coincide roughly with the major stages in the development of philosophy in other countries in the region. The period since 1990, when Chile returned to democratic rule, is much more difficult to trace and define. And yet, the main foundations of the discipline have not changed in any substantial way.

2. Independence and Nationhood: The Formative Years

Philosophers in the immediate post-independence period, and up to the arrival of Positivism in the 1860s, had to confront the complexities of the changing relations between Church and State. The independence struggle which pitted Chileans against Chileans had been a struggle against arbitrary and unstable colonial rule, not against the Catholic Church. On the contrary, the Church was seen as an indispensable ally in the building of new republican institutions. Hence, all Chilean constitutional documents in the nineteenth century proclaimed Catholicism as the official religion of the State. As a result, public institutions, including educational institutions, had to conform to Catholic doctrine. Because most philosophers were believers this limitation did not necessarily mean a problem. But as philosophers they were compelled to examine doctrines and schools that were secular or even antagonistic to Catholicism. In such cases they discussed the doctrines but suppressed that which could be seen as beyond the pale of the Catholic Church. As a result, a thinker like David Hume could be commented upon but in the end heavily criticized because of his skepticism. A school such a French Idéologie could be discussed, but again deprived of its most materialistic edges. The outlet for philosophical production was by and large the secondary school textbook, which had to be approved by the appropriate governmental mechanisms, and this usually meant applying Catholic Church criteria for the philosophically permissible and the theologically acceptable. There was no room for openly anti-Catholic tracts such as Francisco Bilbao’s Sociabilidad chilena (1844, collected in 1866), which ended up burnt for blasphemy and immorality.

Philosophers still found ways to be true to their discipline, and yet recognize the constraints imposed by Catholicism as the official religion of the State. Perhaps the best example is the work of Andrés Bello (1781–1865), who explored a wide range of philosophical sources, especially those of the Scottish Enlightenment. However, he never questioned the importance of religion in general, and Catholicism in particular. His Filosofía del entendimiento was published posthumously in 1881, but substantial parts of this work appeared in the 1840s.

Bello’s Filosofía shows an important acquaintance, and much agreement, with the work of Thomas Reid, Thomas Brown, and Dugald Stewart. Bello’s main emphasis in this work was the acquisition of ideas, which he considered the central endeavor of the discipline. His work was divided in two parts, namely, psychology and logic. For Bello, philosophy’s task was the appropriate understanding of the origin of ideas, and the guiding of human actions. In the process, Bello engaged the thought of John Locke and George Berkeley seriously, although by no means uncritically. The impact of Bello’s philosophical work was limited at first, but it spread rapidly to other countries in the region in the twentieth century, and became one of the few works by a Latin American philosopher to be fully translated into English (1984).

And yet, perhaps the most important, in the sense of the most widely used philosophical text in Chile was the Curso de filosofía moderna by Ramón Briseño (1814–1910), published in two volumes in 1845–46. Compared to Bello’s contribution, Briseño’s work was far more partial to Catholicism, and thus had an easy entry into the curricula of public and private schools. Multiple editions appeared during the remainder of the nineteenth century. Briseño’s partiality to an idea of philosophy closely linked to religion is evident in his coverage of ethics and natural law, where he argued that the practice of religion was the most important duty of a human being, and concluded that “any philosophy that does not lead to the conclusions of Christianity is dangerous and false” (1846: 216). While Andrés Bello did not entirely disagree with the religious emphasis of the work, he objected to the poor coverage of logic, which in Briseño’s treatment was limited to deductive logic. Hence it can be observed that the larger polemic concerning the role of religion was manifest in the choice of subfields for the teaching of the discipline.

Although philosophy developed in an academic context in the post independence period, and helped define the mission of the University of Chile when it was founded in 1842 (Andrés Bello crafted the statutes of the institution and became its Rector for the next 23 years), other philosophers brought the discipline closer to political action. The most important example is José Victorino Lastarria (1817–1888) who advocated the elimination of the colonial legacies still embedded in the Church, and in authoritarian practices that prevented free individual initiative and expression. Be it through his congressional seat, his role as founder of the Liberal Party (1849), or his copious writings, Lastarria promoted the main tenets of liberalism and articulated a coherent philosophy of history firmly based on Enlightenment thought. Other thinkers who contributed to the development of liberal views in Chile included the Argentine exiles Domingo Faustino Sarmiento (1811–1888) and Juan Bautista Alberdi (1819–1884), who presented their ideas in various widely circulated writings, some of them of a philosophical nature, and through vigorous polemics in the press.

3. The Era of Positivism

As elsewhere in Latin America, Positivism in Chile had a significant impact in a number of areas, including philosophy. The arrival of Positivism coincided with the rising tide of anticlericalism in Chile from the 1860s and the 1880s, but its influence was not restricted to attacks against the Church. Indeed, it had a profound influence in education, contributing to a substantial transformation of the curriculum at the secondary and higher education levels. Initially, however, it was a timely weapon against the influence of the Church in Chilean society.

The fundamental appeal of Positivism was through its notion of “progress”. Based on Auguste Comte’s work, Positivism allowed anticlerical thinkers to dismiss the “theological” stage as a primitive state in the evolution of humanity, one that would inevitably be superseded by the “metaphysic” and “scientific” stages. The political implications and uses of this evolutionary view were obvious: to advance to the highest level, Chileans needed to leave behind the religious influence of the Catholic Church. As articulated by the leading early proponent of Positivism, José Victorino Lastarria, who abandoned his liberal commitments (for being based on abstract, or “metaphysical”, principles), science could address the problems of Chilean society in the most effective way. Others heeded the call, and concentrated on such important priorities as education. The liberal historian Diego Barros Arana had done much in this regard through reforms of the curriculum at the Instituto Nacional, as did Miguel Luis Amunátegui, who, in his role as Minister of Education, in 1879 formally introduced the teaching of science in public schools. But the most significant positivist figure was Valentín Letelier (1852–1919), whose Filosofía de la educación (1927 [1891]) served as the basis for a profound reorientation of philosophical studies in Chile. In his view, the theological and metaphysical emphases that had dominated Chilean education since independence had done little to unify the country around a core of shared beliefs. In his view, only the certainties of science could do that. The instrument for achieving this higher stage was logic, which he successfully introduced in the educational plan of 1893, at the expense of ethics and theodicy. Consistent with this emphasis, Juan Serapio Lois (1844–1913) published the most complete treatment of logic from a Comtean perspective, the Elementos de filosofía positiva (1906–1908), applying logical analysis to the methodology of a range of sciences.

Philosophy under the influence of Letelier acquired a scientific character, with a special emphasis on experimental psychology that would ultimately provoke a reaction among thinkers dissatisfied with the local unresponsiveness to new currents of thought emerging in Europe and the United States. Positivism, however, did help in consolidating the study of philosophy at both the higher level (through the Instituto Pedagógico at the Universidad de Chile), and at secondary schools, where it was an obligatory subject of study.

Although it was less influential, it is important to point out that there was another branch of Positivism represented by the brothers Juan Enrique (1852–1927) and Jorge Lagarrigue (1854–1894), who embraced the religious ideas of the late Auguste Comte and brought the Religion of Humanity to Chile. Although this variety of Positivism survived well into the twentieth century, it left little influence in the field of philosophy. Politically, it was aligned with the presidentialist and allegedly authoritarian administration of José Manuel Balmaceda, who was defeated in the Civil War of 1891. As in the case of Comte’s support of Louis Bonaparte, the Lagarrigue brothers’ brand of positivism came to be associated with authoritarianism.

4. The Reaction Against Positivism.

The revolt against Positivism in Chile was led by Enrique Molina (1871–1964), a graduate of the Positivist-inspired Pedagogical Institute at the University of Chile. Molina found the study of philosophy stagnant, and considered the emphasis on science stifling. He initially shared the school’s emphasis on a scientific approach to the teaching of several disciplines, including philosophy. However, after encountering the work of William James and, especially, Henri Bergson, Molina launched a philosophical campaign to establish metaphysics as the most important field within the discipline. In his view, the positivist concept of “progress” had come to mean material, and specifically technological, progress. In his most important philosophical work, De lo espiritual en la vida humana (1937), Molina argued that science and technology had done little to advance human happiness. Therefore, an emphasis on the life of the spirit (though not in a religious sense) deserved to become the central endeavor of the discipline as well as its main contribution to society. He developed a hierarchy of values where those of a spiritual nature reigned over crass materialistic concerns.

Molina’s argument was by no means devoid of a political edge. He argued that after Positivism Marxism had become the main conduit for the spread of materialistic concerns. In the Chile of the middle decades of the twentieth century, Marxism had indeed made major inroads into the country, and Molina was part of a generation of philosophers who were alarmed by the threat represented by Marxist ideology. His response was the advancement of philosophical views that placed metaphysics at the top of a hierarchy of fields. He then set out to reorient the study of philosophy in the country through his writings and institutional activities, including the rectorship of the University of Concepción, which he founded in 1919.

In disciplinary terms, Molina’s arguments found resonance among Catholic thinkers like Clarence Finlayson (1913–1954), and the more secularly inclined Jorge Millas (1917–1982), whose Idea de la individualidad (1943) was entirely free of any ties to Positivism, emphasizing instead individual liberty as the principal concern of the discipline. Although Millas retained a high level of political engagement throughout his career, he viewed individual liberty as a higher stage of human existence beyond the externalities of society and politics.

The institutional expression of such views was a succession of changes in the philosophy curriculum that incorporated new authors and new schools of thought such as phenomenology, existentialism, and neo-Thomism. In 1929, Pedro León Loyola created a Center for Philosophical Studies at the University of Chile, and in 1931 a major university reform placed the Pedagogical Institute, the home of philosophical studies, at the more academically oriented Faculty of Philosophy. Philosophy was also taught at the Universidad de Concepción and at the Catholic University of Chile (founded in 1888). The latter institution created an Academy of Philosophy in 1923, and a Pedagogical School in 1943 where courses on ontology, theodicy and ethics were offered. By 1950, it added courses on epistemology, metaphysics and aesthetics. Increased philosophical activity translated into the creation of the Chilean Society of Philosophy (Sociedad Chilena de Filosofía) in 1948, and the launching of the Revista de Filosofía the next year. The outbreak of the Spanish Civil War and the Second World War meant that several philosophers arrived in Chile as refugees in the 1940s, adding to the increased variety of philosophical concerns.

Despite the diversity, the main consensus among Chilean philosophers was that the discipline was autonomous, especially from politics. Individual philosophers could and did have political commitments, but they all agreed that the field was a highly specialized academic endeavor. They entered the phase that Argentine philosopher Francisco Romero named “philosophical normalcy”, which was characterized by university-level positions, publications in specialized journals, international conferences, teaching stints in foreign institutions and, above all, a strong divide separating academic philosophical activity from social and political concerns.

5. The Reception and Critique of Philosophical Professionalism

The philosophical model established in reaction to Positivism blossomed in the 1950s as a result of the activities of the Chilean Society of Philosophy, the regular publication of the Revista de Filosofía, and the internationalization of the philosophical community. The society was recognized by the Inter-American Federation of Philosophical Societies, the Institut International de Philosophie, and the Fedération International des Sociétés de Philosophie. Foreign faculty taught regularly at the major philosophy departments in the country, and in 1956 the first international congress of the Inter-American Society of Philosophy took place in Santiago, featuring such prominent figures as Miguel Reale, Eduardo Nicol, Risieri Frondizi, Francisco Romero, José Gaos and José Ferrater Mora. Presenters in the fields of logic, philosophy of science and theory of knowledge included Willard Van Orman Quine, Roderick Chisholm, Mario Bunge, Francisco Miró Quesada, and Juan David García Bacca. The local philosophical community could celebrate with pride the effectiveness with which the discipline had become a recognized professional endeavor both nationally and internationally.

Initially, a new generation of philosophers embraced the high international standards of philosophical work proclaimed by the Chilean philosophical community. In addition to Jorge Millas, new names appeared steadily in publications and other professional venues: Félix Schwartzmann (1913–2014), Marco Antonio Allendes (1925–2000), Humberto Giannini (1927–2014), Juan de Dios Vial Larraín (1924–2019), Gastón Gómez Lasa (1926–2019), and Juan Rivano (1926–2015). However, not all thought that the professional model was the only, or indeed the most appropriate for the conditions of Chile at the time. Some had come from diverse disciplinary backgrounds or interests, and therefore became skeptical of a model of philosophical activity that appeared to be excessively subservient to international (mainly European) currents, and perhaps even irrelevant for the country. Juan Rivano, in particular, developed a devastating critique of the levels of abstraction he found in the philosophical community, and questioned the distance of his colleagues from the concerns of the nation. Coming from the field of logic, he questioned the lack of consistency in the usage by his colleagues of several key philosophical concepts. He also introduced the work of British neo-Hegelians such as Francis H. Bradley and Harold Joachim, but soon moved to the study of Hegel and Marx in such works as Entre Hegel y Marx (1962) and Desde la religión al humanismo (1965). He advocated a type of philosophical work that was both critical of social and economic conditions, and more responsive to the complex changes taking place in Chile and Latin America.

The wider philosophical community rejected the claims of Rivano and dismissed his call for bringing the discipline in line with the needs of the nation. They not only reinforced the foundations of philosophical professionalism but also proceeded to develop a spirited defense of a university model that sheltered the work of professionals from the demands of the larger society. The rapid expansion of the electorate, the emergence of strong parties of the Left, and the expansion of higher education enrollments all introduced pressures for university reform which the defenders of philosophical professionalism resisted. In terms of philosophical schools, they continued to engage phenomenological themes, and particularly the work of Martin Heidegger. The critique of modernity was the dominant theme among philosophers in their specialized work.

The most articulate voice from the professionalist camp came from Jorge Millas who, following the Spanish philosopher José Ortega y Gasset, was a strong critic of mass society. In such works as Ensayos sobre la historia espiritual de Occidente (1960) and El desafío espiritual de la sociedad de masas (1962), Millas reiterated the claim that spirituality occupied a higher place than materialism, and especially Marxism, in the concerns of the discipline. What was new in the context of the 1960s was the connection he made between the aims of the discipline and those of the university: both had the obligation to resist the pressures of mass society. Others who followed this line of argument, like Félix Martínez Bonati (1929), and Juan de Dios Vial Larraín, emphasized the role of the university in forming an intellectual elite inspired by the higher aims of philosophy. They anticipated, in many ways, the arguments of Allan Bloom in The Closing of the American Mind (1987).

Such debates on the nature of higher education and the responsibility of philosophers merged with political competition inside the most important universities of the country. Philosophers who claimed to be apolitical or who opposed the encroachment of politics in university campuses paradoxically became a part of openly political debates. Significant university reforms were introduced in the latter half of the 1960s but the debates on the nature of higher education and the aims of philosophy did not diminish. What did diminish was the level of philosophical production, which dropped consistently through the years of the Salvador Allende administration (1970–1973). The Revista de Filosofía ceased publication in 1970, classes were frequently interrupted, and books of a philosophical nature were reduced to a trickle. Perhaps the most important exceptions are to be found in a handful of philosophers, especially Jorge Millas, whose two-volume Idea de la filosofía was published in 1970. The philosophical community was deeply divided as a result of political turmoil and disputes over the aims of the university.

6. The Period of Military Rule

The military coup of September 11, 1973 led by General Augusto Pinochet was followed by sixteen and a half years of dictatorship. The proclaimed intent of the coup was to reestablish order after the chaotic years of the Allende administration. Within a few years, however, it was obvious that the regime intended to transform Chilean society and politics, closing the Congress, banning political parties, especially those of the Left, and introducing a new Constitution in 1980. In the area of higher education, the military regime reversed years of university autonomy and intervened directly in the administration of the principal universities of the country: it appointed as Rectors military officers on active duty, closed several schools and faculties, and purged academics and students perceived to be dissidents or potential opponents. The military as an institution did not act alone, as it counted on a significant number of civilian supporters.

The Department of Philosophy at the University of Chile was perhaps the hardest hit among philosophy departments in the nation. As the flagship public university, with a history going back to 1842, the University of Chile was from the start of the military regime the target of severe and continuous repression. Critics like Juan Rivano were arrested and sent into exile while others, like Edison Otero (1946), were dismissed without charges. The military placed the University of Chile first under the aegis of the Air Force and subsequently (1976) the Army. But instead of relying on those professionals who had opposed university reform, like Jorge Millas, Humberto Giannini, or Gastón Gómez Lasa, it placed largely unknown though sympathetic philosophers in key academic and administrative positions. As a result, professional philosophers became increasingly alienated from the regime and some turned into vocal opponents.

Perhaps the most important example is that of Jorge Millas. Initially he was hopeful that the military would indeed seek to realize his ideal view of the university as a home of reflection and reason. By 1976, however, his hopes had turned into disillusion: Millas attacked the military intervention of the universities, declaring that there was no improvement from the politicization of higher education in the 1960s and early 1970s; the university had become an institution “under surveillance” (1981: 84). His own philosophical work paid increasing attention to the theme of violence, as he demonstrated in La violencia y sus máscaras (1978), co-authored with critical philosopher Edison Otero, a collaboration that signaled a rapprochement between the two historical philosophical traditions in the country. Isolated and increasingly alienated by government censorship, Millas retreated to the southern Universidad Austral in Valdivia, where he was initially welcomed but soon removed (1980) for his increasingly public and vocal criticisms of the regime. In one of his last works, Idea de la Universidad (1981), he renewed his life-long commitment to the university as the site of scholarship and reflection, and reiterated his critique of military intervention. Silenced, isolated and ill, he died at the age of 65 in 1982.

Other philosophers were not as vocal as Millas, but were clearly unhappy with the military handling of both the universities and the nation. Established philosophers like Humberto Giannini and Gastón Gómez Lasa concentrated on their philosophical work, and on occasion made pronouncements that could be seen as critical. But the environment of repression was not conducive to the dialogue and free inquiry that they felt the field required. Exiled philosophers like Juan Rivano were even less able to find national outlets for their opinions. He was banned from the country and unable to return until after the plebiscite of 1988. That was the turning point that unleashed the transition to democracy that culminated with the presidential elections of 1989, and the inauguration of the Patricio Aylwin administration in 1990.

The balance of the period is negative for the philosophers involved except for those who occupied the positions of those persecuted under military rule and who remained in their posts even after the restoration of democracy. Still, an important change took place as a result of the years of dictatorship: those philosophers who were hostile to politics now fully embraced the value of democracy with all its implications for accommodating different points of view. As a result of the hostile climate present at the universities, many migrated to independent research centers and thus entered into dialogue with scholars from other disciplines. Philosophers were thus able to break away from the separation of philosophy and politics that characterized the foundations of the field in the twentieth century.

Another important element to emerge from the period of military rule, and perhaps even before, is the number of philosophers who moved abroad in response to political turmoil, like Roberto Torretti (1930) and Carla Cordua (1925), or because of outright persecution as in the case of Juan Rivano and Renato Cristi (1941). There is a significant philosophical production that must be included in a longer-term examination of the history of the field in Chile. There are others of a younger generation who were trained abroad and whose work upon returning to the country started to have an impact in the field.

Since the return to civilian rule in 1990, the field of philosophy has confronted numerous challenges, such as new national priorities (human rights, economic growth, constitutional reforms, erosion of institutional legitimacy), the fragmentation of the field due to the proliferation of new private universities, and an unsuccessful attempt by the National Council of Education to remove philosophy from the secondary school curriculum (2018). At the same time, philosophy has flourished in other respects, thanks to the continued production of the previous generation (Roberto Torretti, Carla Cordua, Renato Cristi and Marcos García de la Huerta) or the posthumous publications of Jorge Millas, Juan Rivano and Humberto Giannini. Until his death in 2017 Jorge Eduardo Rivera (born 1927) remained as the most important specialist on Heidegger. Pablo Oyarzún (1950) has made significant contributions to aesthetics and literary criticism, Recently, Andrés Claro (1968) has emerged as a powerful new philosophical voice, concerned with the poetical dimensions of language, in such works as Las vasijas quebradas (2012), and Tiempos sin fin (2018). A new trend has emerged on the examination of the philosophical bases of modern economics, best exemplified in Leonidas Montes’ (1966) Adam Smith en contexto (2017).


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Acknowledgments: The author wishes to thank Andrés Estefane, Francisco Gallegos, Susana Gazmuri, Sergio Missana, Juan Luis Ossa for their helpful comments.

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Ivan Jaksic <>

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