Structuralism in Physics

First published Sun Nov 24, 2002; substantive revision Wed Jan 31, 2024

Under the heading of “structuralism in physics” there are three different but closely related research programs in philosophy of science and, in particular, in philosophy of physics. These programs were initiated by the work of Joseph Sneed, Günther Ludwig, and Erhard Scheibe, respectively, since the begin of the 1970s. For the sake of simplicity we will use these names in order to refer to the three programs, without the intention of ignoring or minimizing the contributions of other scholars. (See the Bibliography.) The term “structuralism” was originally claimed by the Sneed school, see e.g., Balzer and Moulines (1996), but it also appears appropriate to subsume Ludwig’s and Scheibe’s programs under this title because of the striking similarities of the three approaches. The activities of the structuralists have been mainly confined to Europe, especially Germany, and, for whatever reasons, largely ignored in the Anglo-American discussion.

1. Other structuralisms

The term ‘structuralism’ is used with different meanings and therefore it seems appropriate to mention other ‘structuralisms’ and to explain how ‘structuralism in physics’ is related to them. If you check the entry ‘structuralism (disambiguation)’ in Wikipedia, you will be informed that there is a spectrum of ‘structuralisms’ in 11 different areas, including:

  • linguistics [F. de Saussure (1857–1913)],
  • anthropology [C. Lévi-Strauss (1908–2009)],
  • mathematics [N. Bourbaki (1935–), collective pseudonym],
  • philosophy of science [J. D. Sneed (1938–), W. Stegmüller (1923–1991)].

Here we have mentioned some prominent representatives in brackets. All types of structuralism share a common conviction about the rôle of structures in their respective disciplines, but at first glance they show little similarity. Nevertheless, there are connections and mutual influences between the different structuralisms. It goes beyond the scope of this entry to examine these influences in more detail. For the relations between anthropologic and mathematical structuralism see Aubin (1997). As mentioned, we will understand ‘structuralism in physics’ as a special case of ‘structuralism in philosophy of science’. There are close connections with mathematical structuralism, which we will discuss in more detail in the main part of this entry. To illustrate these connections here we only mention the full title of Stegmüller (1979a): The structuralist view of theories, A possible analogue of the Bourbaki programme in physical science.

There is a famous statement of Heinrich Hertz (1857–1894) that can be regarded as an early manifesto of structuralism in the philosophy of physics:

We form ourselves images or symbols of external objects; and the form which we give them is such that the necessary consequents of the images in thought are always the images of the necessary consequents in natureof the things depicted … The images we here speak of are our conceptions of things. With the things themselves they are in conformity in one important respect, namely, in satisfying the above-mentioned requirement. For our purpose it is not necessary that they should be in conformity with the things in any other respect whatever. As a matter of fact, we do not know, nor have we any means of knowing, whether our conception of things are in conformity with them in any other than in this one fundamental respect …Various images of the same objects are possible, and these images may differ in various respects. (Hertz [1894] (1956), 1 ff.)

There is no doubt that Hertz’s picture conception had an influence on many contemporary and subsequent scholars, such as Ludwig Boltzmann (see Hüttemann 2009), David Hilbert (see Majer 1998), Ludwig Wittgenstein, and the Vienna Circle (see Majer 1985). For echoes of the pictorial metaphor in G. Ludwig, see Section 5.4 below.

Right now, we are taking the interim balance that ‘Structuralism in Physics’ is part of an intellectual movement mainly in the 20th century and, compared to other structuralisms, represents a rather late contribution.

2. Common traits

The three programs mentioned in the preamble share the following characteristics and convictions:

  • A metatheory of science requires a kind of formalization different from that already employed by scientific theories themselves.
  • The structuralistic program yields a framework for the rational reconstruction of particular theories.
  • A central tool of formalization is Bourbaki’s concept of “species of structures”, as described in Bourbaki (1986).
  • Among the significant features of theories to be described are:
    • Mathematical structure
    • Empirical claims of a theory
    • Function of theoretical terms
    • Rôle of approximation
    • Evolution of theories
    • Intertheoretic relations

3. The problem of theoretical terms

A physical theory \(T\) consists, among other things, of a group of laws which are formulated in terms of certain concepts. But an apparent circularity arises when one considers how the laws of \(T\) and the concepts acquire their content, because each seems to acquire content from the other — the laws of \(T\) acquire their content from the concepts used in the formulation of the laws, while the concepts are often “introduced” or “defined” by the group of laws as a whole. To be sure, if the concepts can be introduced independently of the theory \(T\), the circularity does not appear. But typically every physical theory \(T\) requires some new concepts which cannot be defined without using \(T\) (we call the latter “\(T\)-theoretical concepts”). Is the apparent circularity concerning the laws and the T-theoretical concepts a problem? Some examples will help us assess the threat.

3.1 An example

As an example, consider the theory \(T\) of classical particle mechanics. For simplicity we will assume that kinematical concepts, such as the positions of particles, their velocities and accelerations are given independently of the theory as functions of time. A central statement of \(T\) is Newton’s second law, \(\bF= m\ba\), which asserts that the sum \(\bF\) of the forces exerted upon a particle equals its mass \(m\) multiplied by its acceleration \(\ba\).

While we customarily think of \(\bF=m\ba\) as an empirical assertion, there is a real risk that it turns out merely to be a definition or largely conventional in character. If we think of a force merely as “that which generates acceleration” then the force \(\bF\) is actually defined by the equation \(\bF=m\ba\). We have a particle undergoing some given acceleration \(\ba\), then \(\bF=m\ba\) just defines what \(\bF\) is. The law is not an empirically testable assertation at all, since a force so defined cannot fail to satisfy \(\bF=m\ba\). The problem gets worse if we define the (inertial) mass \(m\) in the usual manner as the ratio \(|\bF|/|\ba\)|. For now we are using the one equation \(\bF=m\ba\) to define two quantities \(\bF\) and \(m\). A given acceleration \(\ba\) at best specifies the ratio \(\bF/m\) but does not specify unique values for \(\bF\) and \(m\) individually.

In more formal terms, the problem arises because we introduced force \(\bF\) and mass \(m\) as \(T\)-theoretical terms that are not given by other theories. That fact also supplies an escape from the problem. We can add extra laws to the simple dynamics. For example, we might require that all forces are gravitational and that the net force on the mass \(m\) be given by the sum \(\bF=\Sigma_i \bF_i\) of all gravitational forces \(\bF_i\) acting on the mass due to the other masses of the universe, in accord with Newton’s inverse square law of gravity. (The law asserts that the force \(\bF_i\) due to attracting mass \(i\) with gravitational mass \(m_{gi}\) is \(Gm_g m_{gi} \boldsymbol{r}_i / r_{i}^3\), where \(m_g\) is the gravitational mass of the original body, \(\boldsymbol{r}_i\) the position vector of mass \(i\) originating from the original body, and \(G\) the universal constant of gravitation.) That gives us an independent definition for \(\bF\). Similarly we can require that the inertial mass \(m\) be equal to the gravitational mass \(m_g\). Since we now have independent access to each of the terms \(\bF\), \(m\) and \(\ba\) appearing in \(\bF=m\ba\), whether the law obtains is contingent and no longer a matter of definition.

Further problems can arise, however, because of another \(T\)-theoretical term that is invoked implicitly when \(\bF=m\ba\) is asserted. The accelerations \(\ba\) are tacitly assumed to be measured in relation to an inertial system. If the acceleration is measured in relation to a different reference system, a different result is obtained. For example, if it is measured in relation to a system moving with uniform acceleration \(\ba\), then the measured acceleration will be \(\ba' = (\ba - \ba)\). A body not acted on by gravitational forces in an inertial frame will obey \(0=m\ba\) so that \(\ba=0\). The same body in the accelerated frame will have acceleration \(\ba' = -\ba\) and be governed by \(-m\ba = m\ba'\). The problem is that the term \(-m\ba\) behaves just like a gravitational force; its magnitude is directly proportional to the mass \(m\) of the body. So the case of a gravitation free body in a uniformly accelerated reference system is indistinguishable from a body in free fall in a homogeneous gravitational field. A theoretical underdetermination threatens once again. Given just the motions how are we to know which case is presented to us?[1] Resolving these problems requires a systematic study of the relations between the various \(T\)-theoretical concepts, inertial mass, gravitational mass, inertial force, gravitational force, inertial systems and accelerated systems and how they figure in the relevant laws of the theory \(T\).

Similar problems arise in the formulation of almost all fundamental physical theories.

3.2 Structuralistic solutions of the problem of theoretical terms

There are various ways to cope with this problem. One could try to unmask it as a pseudo-problem. Or one could try to accept the problem as part of the usual way science works, albeit not in the clean manner philosophers would like it. The structuralistic programs, however, agree that this is a non-trivial problem to be solved and devise meta-theoretical machinery to enable its solution. They further agree on dividing the vocabulary of the theory \(T\) into \(T\)-theoretical and \(T\)-non-theoretical terms, the latter being provided from outside the theory.

3.2.1 Sneed’s solution

In the Sneedean approach the “empirical claim” of the theory is formulated by using an existential quantifier for the \(T\)-theoretical terms (i.e., in terms of the “Ramsey sentence” for \(T)\). In our above example, Newton’s law for gravitational forces would be reformulated as: “There exist an inertial system and constants \(G, m_i, m_{gi}\) such that for each particle the product of its mass times its acceleration equals the sum of the gravitational forces as given above.” This removes the circularity but leaves open the question of content. Here the structuralists à la Sneed would argue that the empirical claim of the theory \(T'\) has to contain all the laws of the theory as well as higher-order laws, called “constraints”. In our example, the constraints would be statements such as “all particles have the same inertial and gravitational masses and the gravitational constant assumes the same value in all models of the theory.” The theory would thereby acquire more content and become non-vacuous.

3.2.2 Ludwig’s solution

Although Ludwig’s meta-theoretical framework is slightly different, the first part of his solution is essentially equivalent to the above one. On the other hand, he proposes a stronger program (“axiomatic basis of a physical theory”) which proceeds by considering an equivalent form \(T\)* of a theory \(T\) in which all \(T\)-theoretical concepts are eliminated by explicit definitions. This seems to be at variance with older results about the non-definability of theoretical terms, but a closer inspection removes the apparent contradiction. For example, the concept of “mass” may be non-definable in a theory dealing only with single orbits of a mechanical system, but definable in a theory containing all possible orbits of that system.

However, to formulate the axiomatic basis of a real theory, not just a toy model, is a non-trivial task and typically requires one or two books; see the examples Ludwig (1985, 1987) and Schmidt (1979).

3.3 The measurement problem

Both programs address the further problem of how to determine the extension, e.g., the numerical values, of a theoretical term from a given set of observational data. We will call this the “measurement problem”, not to be confounded with the well-known measurement problem in quantum theory. Typically the measurement problem has no unique solution. Rather the values of the theoretical quantities can only be measured within a certain degree of imprecision and using auxiliary assumptions which, although plausible, are not confirmed with certainty. In the above Newton example one would have to use the auxiliary assumption that the trajectories of the particles are twice differentiable and that other forces except the gravitational forces can be neglected. For a recent critical examination of the solution to the measurement problem within Sneed’s approach with detailed examples from astronomy see Gähde (2014).

3.4 Measurement and approximation

The feature of imprecision and approximation plays a prominent rôle in the structuralistic programs. In the context of the measurement problem, imprecision seems to be a defect of the theory which impedes the exact determination of the theoretical quantities. However, imprecision and non-uniqueness is crucial in the context of evolution of theories and the transition to new and “better” theories. Otherwise the new theory could in general not encompass the successful applications of the old theory. Consider for example the transition of Kepler’s theory of planetary motion to Newton’s and Einstein’s theories: Newtonian gravitation theory and general relativity replace the Kepler ellipses with more complicated curves. But these should still be consistent with the old astronomical observations, which is only possible if they don’t fit exactly into Kepler’s theory .

4. Problems of reduction

4.1 Reduction relation between theories

Part of the structuralistic program is the definition of various intertheoretic relations. Here we will concentrate on the relation(s) of “reduction”, which play an important rôle in the philosophical discourse as well as in the work of the physicists, albeit not under this name. Consider a theory \(T\) which is superseded by a better theory \(T'\). One could use \(T'\) in order to understand some of the successes and failures of \(T\). If there is some systematic way of deriving \(T\) as an approximation within \(T'\), then \(T\) is “reduced” to or by \(T'\). In this case, \(T\) is successful where it is a good approximation to \(T'\) and \(T'\) is successful. On the other hand, in situations where \(T'\) is still successful but \(T\) is a poor approximation to \(T'\), \(T\) will fail. For example, classical mechanics should be obtained as the limiting case of relativistic mechanics for velocities small compared with the velocity of light. This would explain why classical mechanics was, and is still, successfully applied in the case of small velocities but fails for large (relative) velocities.

As mentioned, the investigation of such reduction relations between different theories is part of the every-day work of theoretical physicists, but usually they do not adopt a general concept of reduction. Rather they intuitively decide what has to be shown or to be calculated, depending on the case under consideration. Here the work of the structuralists could lead to a more systematic approach within physics, although there does not yet exist a generally accepted, unique concept of reduction.

4.2 Reduction and incommensurability

Another aspect is the rôle of reduction within the global picture of the development of physics. Most physicists, but not all, tend to view their science as an enterprise which accumulates knowledge in a continuous manner. For example, they would not say that classical mechanics has been disproved by relativistic mechanics, but that relativistic mechanics has partly clarified where classical mechanics could be safely applied and where not. This view of the development of physics has been challenged by some philosophers and historians of science, especially by the writings of T. Kuhn and P. Feyerabend. These scholars emphasize the conceptual discontinuity or “incommensurability” between reduced theory \(T\) and reducing theory \(T'\). The structuralistic accounts of reduction now opens the possibility of discussing these matters on a less informal level. The preliminary results of this discussion are different depending on the particular program.

4.3 Ludwig’s account

In the writings of Ludwig there is no direct reference to the incommensurability thesis and the corresponding discussion. But obviously his approach implies the most radical denial of this thesis. His reduction relation is composed of two simpler intertheoretic relations called “restriction” and “embedding”. They come in two versions, exact and approximate. Part of their definitions are detailed rules of translation of the non-theoretic vocabulary of \(T'\) into that of \(T\). Hence commensurability, at least on the non-theoretical level, is insured by definition. The problem is then shifted to the task of showing that some of the interesting cases of reduction, which are discussed in the context of incommensurability, fit into Ludwig’s definition. Unfortunately, he gives only one extensively worked-out example of reduction, namely thermodynamics vs. quantum statistical mechanics, in Ludwig (1987). Incommensurability of theoretical terms could probably be more easily incorporated in Ludwig’s approach since it could be traced back to the difference between the laws of \(T\) and \(T'\).

4.4 Sneed’s account

The relation between incommensurability and the Sneedean reduction relation is to some extent discussed in Balzer et al. (1987, chapter VI.7). The authors consider an exact reduction relation as a certain relation between potential models of the respective theories. More interesting for physical real-life examples is the approximate version which is obtained as a “blurred exact reduction” by means of a subclass of an empirical uniformity on the classes of potential models. The Kepler-Newton case is discussed as an example of approximate reduction. The discussion of incommensurability suffers from the notorious difficulties of explicating such notions as “meaning preserving translation”. There is an interesting application of the interpolation theorem of meta-mathematics which yields the result that, roughly speaking, (exact) reduction implies translation. However, the relevance of this result is questioned in Balzer et al. (1987, 312 ff). Thus the discussion eventually ends up as inconclusive, but the authors admit the possibility of a spectrum of incommensurabilities of different degrees in cases of pairs of reduced/reducing theories.

4.5 Scheibe’s account

Scheibe in his (1999) also explicitly refers to the theses of Kuhn and Feyerabend and gives a detailed discussion. Unlike the other two structuralistic programs, he does not propose a fixed concept of reduction. Rather he suggests a lot of special reduction relations which can be combined appropriately to connect two theories \(T\) and \(T'\). Moreover, he proceeds by means of extensive real-life case studies and considers new types of reduction relations if the case under consideration cannot be described by the relations considered so far. Scheibe concedes that there are instances of incommensurability which make it difficult to find a reduction relation in certain cases. As a significant example he mentions the notions of an “observable” in quantum mechanics on the one hand, and in classical statistical mechanics on the other hand. Although there are maps between the respective sets of observables, Scheibe considers this as a case of incommensurability, since these maps are not Lie algebra homomorphisms, see Scheibe (1999, 174).

Summarizing, the structuralistic approaches are capable of discussing the issues of reduction and incommensurability and the underlying problems on an advanced level. Thereby these approaches have a chance of mediating between disparate camps of physicists and philosophers.

5. Three structuralist programs

In this section we will describe more closely the particular programs, their roots and some of the differences between them.

5.1 Sneed’s program

5.1.1 History and general traits

This program has been the most successful with respect to the formation of a “school” attracting scholars and students who adopt the approach and work on its specific problems. Hence most of the structuralistic literature concerns the Sneedean variant. Perhaps this is partly also due to the circumstance that only Sneed’s approach is intended to apply (and has been applied) to other sciences and not only physics.

A more comprehensive account of the historical roots of structuralism in philosophy of science can be found in Bolinger (2016), although this book is not yet translated into English. The seminal book was Sneed (1971) which presented a meta-theory of physics in the model-theoretical tradition connected with P. Suppes, B. C. van Fraassen, and F. Suppe. This approach was adopted and popularized by the German philosopher W. Stegmüller (1923–1991), see e.g., Stegmüller (1979b) and further developed mainly by his disciples. In its early days the approach was called the “non-statement view” of theories, emphasizing the rôle of set-theoretical tools as opposed to linguistic analyses. Later this aspect was considered to be more of practical importance than a matter of principle, see Balzer et al. (1987, 306 ff). Recently, H. Andreas (2014) and G. Schurz (2014) have proposed two slightly different frameworks that reconcile semantical and syntactical formulations of Sneed’s program. Nevertheless, the almost exclusive use of set-theoretic tools remains one of the characteristic stylistic features of this program and one that distinguishes it conspicuously from the other programs.

5.1.2 Central notions of Sneed’s program

According to Moulines, in Balzer and Moulines (1996, 12–13), the specific notions of the Sneedean program are the following. We illustrate these notions by simplified examples, inspired by Balzer et al. (1987), which are based on a system of \(N\) classical point particles coupled by springs satisfying Hooke’s law. For a recent introduction into the basic concepts see also H. Andreas and F. Zenker (2014).

  • \(M_p\): A class of potential models (the theory’s conceptual framework.
    [One potential model contains a set of particles, a set of springs together with their spring constants, the masses of the particles, as well as their positions and mutual forces as functions of time.]
  • \(M\): A class of actual models (the theory’s empirical laws).
    [\(M\) is the subclass of potential models satisfying the system’s equation of motion. ]
  • \(\langle M_p,M\rangle\): A model-element (the absolutely necessary portion of a theory)
  • \(M_{pp}\): A class of partial potential models (the theory’s relative non-theoretical basis).
    [One partial potential model contains only the particles’ positions as functions of time, since the masses and forces are considered as \(T\)-theoretical.]
  • \(C\): A class of constraints (conditions connecting different models of one and the same theory).
    [The constraints say that the same particles have the same masses and the same springs have the same spring constants.]
  • \(L\): A class of links (conditions connecting models of different theories).
    [Among the conceivable links are:
    • Links to the theory of classical spacetime
    • Links to the theory of weights and balances, where mass ratios can be measured
    • Links to theories of elasticity, where spring constants can be calculated]
  • \(A\): A class of admissible blurs (degrees of approximation admitted between different models).
    [The functions occurring in the potential models are complemented by suitable error bars. These may depend on the intended applications, see below.]
  • \(K = \langle M_p,M,M_{pp}, C,L,A\rangle\): A core (the formal-theoretical part of a theory)
  • \(I\): The domain of intended applications (“pieces of the world” to be explained, predicted or technologically manipulated).
    [This class is open and contains, for example
    • systems of small rigid bodies, connected by coil springs or rubber bands
    • any vibrating mechanical system in the case of small amplitudes, including almost rigid bodies consisting of \(N\) molecules]
  • \(T = \langle K,I\rangle\): A theory-element (the smallest unit to be regarded as a theory).
  • \(\sigma\): The specialization relation between theory-elements.
    [\(T\) could be a specialization of similar theory-elements with more general force laws, e.g., including friction and/or time-dependent external forces. One could also imagine more abstract force laws which fix only some general properties such as “action=reaction”. \(T\) in turn could be specialized to theory-elements of systems with equal masses and/or equal spring constants. ]
  • \(N\): A theory-net (a set of theory-elements ordered by \(\sigma\) — the “typical” notion of a theory).
    [An obvious theory-net containing our example of a theory-element is CPM = “classical particle mechanics”, conceived as a network of theory-elements essentially ordered by the degree of generality of its force laws.]
  • \(E\): A theory-evolution (a theory-net “moving” through historical time).
    [Special interesting new force laws could be discovered in the course of time, e.g., the Toda chain in 1967, as well as new applications of known laws.]
  • \(H\): A theory-holon (a complex of theory-nets tied by “essential” links).
    [It is difficult to think of examples which are smaller than \(H =\) all physical theory-nets.]

5.2 Ludwig’s program

5.2.1 History and general traits

Günther Ludwig (1918–2007) was a German physicist mainly known for his work on the foundations of quantum theory. In Ludwig (1970, 1985, 1987), he published an axiomatic account of quantum mechanics, which was based on the statistical interpretation of quantum theory. As a prerequisite for this work he found it necessary to ask “What is a physical theory?” and developed a general concept of a theory on the first 80 pages of his (1970). Later this general theory was expanded into the book Ludwig (1978). A recent elaboration of Ludwig’s program can be found in Schröter (1996).

His underlying “philosophy” is the view that there are real structures in the world which are “pictured” or represented, in an approximate fashion, by mathematical structures, symbolically \(\boldsymbol{PT} = \boldsymbol{W} (-) \boldsymbol{MT}\). The mathematical theory \(\boldsymbol{MT}\) used in a physical theory \(\boldsymbol{PT}\) contains as its core a “species of structure” \(\Sigma\). This is a meta-mathematical concept of Bourbaki which Ludwig introduced into the structuralistic approach. The contact between \(\boldsymbol{MT}\) to some “domain of reality” \(\boldsymbol{W}\) is achieved by a set of correspondence principles \((-)\), which give rules for translating physical facts into certain mathematical statements called “observational reports”. These facts are either directly observable or given by means of other physical theories, called “pre-theories” of \(\boldsymbol{PT}\). In this way a part \(\boldsymbol{G}\) of \(\boldsymbol{W}\), called “basic domain” is constructed. But it remains a task of the theory to construct the full domain of reality \(\boldsymbol{W}\), that is, the more complete description of the basic domain that also uses \(\boldsymbol{PT}\)-theoretical terms.

5.2.2 Typical features of Ludwig’s program

Superficially considered, this concept of theory shows some similarity to neo-positivistic ideas and would be subject to similar criticism. For example, the discussion of the so-called ‘theory-laden’ character of observation sentences casts doubts on such notions as “directly observable facts”. Nevertheless, the adherents of the Ludwig approach would probably argue for a moderate form of observationalism and would point out that, within Ludwig’s approach, the theory-laden character of observation sentences could be analyzed in detail.

Another central idea of Ludwig’s program is the description of intra- and inter-theoretical approximations by means of “uniform structures”, a mathematical concept lying between topological and metrical structures. Although this idea was later adopted by the other structuralistic programs, it plays a unique rôle within Ludwig’s meta-theory in connection with his finitism. He believes that the mathematical structures of the infinitely large or small, a priori, have no physical meaning at all; they are preliminary tools to approximate finite physical reality. Uniform structures are vehicles for expressing this particular kind of approximation.

5.2.3 Ludwig’s interpretation of quantum mechanics

We have already explained that for Ludwig the framework for the reconstruction of physical theories was actually only a tool to develop his interpretation of quantum mechanics.

It is no surprise that there are close relationships between the two enterprises. We only mention the fact that the reconstruction of theoretical terms by other terms that are more easily accessible is particularly urgent when the theoretical terms refer to the microscopic domain. This explains in particular why Ludwig is a supporter of a statistical interpretation of quantum mechanics, because more advanced interpretations such as the single-particle-state interpretation of the wave function, in his opinion, have no axiomatic basis. In the current debate on the interpretation of quantum mechanics, the statistical interpretation (or ensemble interpretation) plays only a marginal role and is, moreover, usually attributed to L. E. Ballentine (1970). The Wikipedia entry on the ‘ensemble interpretation’ does not mention Ludwig at all.

It would be premature, however, to deny Ludwig any influence on the development of quantum theory. There are some achievements, like the generalization of observables to POV measures, see Busch et al (2016), which are well known, e.g., in the community practicing quantum information theory, and which finally go back to Ludwig. Usually, the standard reference for these generalizations is not Ludwig but his pupil K. Kraus, see Kraus (1983). Finally it should be mentioned that Ludwig’s axiomatics of quantum mechanics has been revived by new mathematical results, see Casinelli and Lahti (2016).

5.2.4 Ludwig’s late work

One year before his death Ludwig, together with Gérald Thurler, published a revised and simplified edition of Ludwig (1990) with the title “A new foundation of physical theories”. This work cannot be used as a textbook but it is a remarkable document of the central themes of his approach and his general views on physics. The book clearly shows that Ludwig’s main concern is about scientific realism, i.e., about the question of how hypothetical objects and relations occurring within a successful theory acquire the status of physical reality. Entities which cannot claim this status are dubbed as “fairy tales” throughout the book. Examples of fairy tales in quantum theory are hidden variables and, perhaps surprising for some readers, also the single-particle-state interpretation (in contrast to the ensemble interpretation fostered by Ludwig).

Among the new concepts and tools developed in Ludwig/Thurler (2006) are the following:

  • Physical observations are first translated into sentences of an auxiliary mathematical theory containing only finite sets, and, in a second step, approximately embedded into an idealized theory. By this maneuver the authors accentuate the contrast between finite physical operations and mathematical assumptions involving infinite sets.
  • Inaccuracy sets and unsharp measurements are always considered right from the start and not introduced later as in previous versions of the Ludwig program.
  • The “basic domain” of a theory is now that part of the “application domain” where the theory is successfully applied, up to a certain degree of inaccuracy.
  • The complicated terminology concerning various kinds of hypotheses in Ludwig (1990) is radically reduced to a small number of cases including fuzzy hypotheses.
  • The problem of unsharp indirect measurements is reformulated in an elegant way which yet should be scrutinized by means of case studies.

5.2.5 Summary

Generally speaking, Ludwig’s program is, in comparison to those of Sneed and Scheibe, less descriptive and more normative with respect to physics. He developed an ideal of how physical theories should be formulated rather than reconstructing the actual practice. The principal worked-out example that comes close to this ideal is still the axiomatic account of quantum mechanics, as described in Ludwig (1985, 1987).

5.3 Scheibe’s program

The German philosopher Erhard Scheibe (1927–2010) has published several books and numerous essays on various topics of philosophy of science; see, for example, Scheibe (2001). He has often commented on the programs of Sneed and Ludwig, such as in his “Comparison of two recent views on theories”, reprinted in Scheibe (2001, 175–194). Moreover, he published one of the earliest case studies of approximate theory reduction; see Scheibe 2001 (306–323) for the 1973 case study.

In his books on “reduction of physical theories,” Scheibe (1997, 1999) developed his own concept of theory, which to some extent can be considered an intermediate position between those of Ludwig and Sneed. For example, he conveniently combines the model-theoretical and syntactical styles of Sneed and Ludwig, respectively. Since his main concern is reduction, he does not need to cover all the aspects of physical theories that are treated in the other approaches. As already mentioned, he proposes a more flexible concept of reduction that is open to extensions arising from new case studies.

A unique feature of Scheibe’s approach is the thorough discussion of almost all the important cases of reduction considered in the physical literature. These include classical vs. special-relativistic spacetime, Newtonian gravitation vs. general relativity, thermodynamics vs. kinetic theory, and classical vs. quantum mechanics. He essentially arrives at the conclusion of a double incompleteness: the attempts of the physicists to prove reduction relations in the above cases are largely incomplete according to their own standards, as well as according to the requirements of a structuralistic concept of reduction. But this concept is also not complete, Scheibe argues, since, for example, a satisfactory understanding of “counter-factual” limiting processes such as \(\hslash \rightarrow 0\) or \(c\rightarrow \infty\) has not yet been developed. Bolinger in his (2016) gives a fairly general account of the structuralistic programme with special emphasis on Scheibe’s work.

5.4 Interactions between the three structuralist programs

As already noted, the programs of Ludwig and Sneed have been independently developed in the 1970s, whereas Scheibe’s program, at least partially, originated from a critical review of these two programs. But this is only a coarse description. Additionally, there have been numerous mutual interactions between the three programs that influenced their later elaborations. Evidence for this interaction is provided, besides various pertinent acknowledgements in books and articles, by the following observations.

  • Balzer, Moulines and Sneed in their (1987) introduce the concepts of “species of structures” and “uniform structures” that play a central rôle in Ludwig (1970, 1978) and are not yet contained in Sneed (1971).
  • Vice versa, Ludwig in his (1990) added a section 9.3 on theory nets (Theorienetze) citing respective works of Balzer and Moulines.
  • In his late (2006) Ludwig on p.3 refers to the work of Scheibe “because of the many similarities”. Later on p.107 he mentions a “discussion through letters” with Scheibe. This correspondence has been secured by B. Falkenburg and is waiting for a scientific edition.

In Scheibe 2006 (p. 331), there is also an account of Ludwig’s structuralist approach, in which he says, among other things, in connection with Hertz’s picture concept:

Without question, Ludwig is very explicitly part of the pictorial tradition of physical thinking. His reconstruction of physics is interspersed with pictorial ideas and pictorial concepts, and the main supplier of all pictures is mathematics. Its structures are linked to reality through mappings. [Author’s translation].

In the following, Scheibe explains that Ludwig, however, distances himself from the idea of the existence of an isomorphism between the objects of mathematical theory and the objects of the real world. Rather, he created the concept of a “fuzzy mapping” to describe the way physics works in an appropriate way. In this context, it is worth mentioning that the German root word “Bild” (picture, image) is also contained in the mathematical term “Abbildung” (mapping).

For current evidence of the interaction between the various structuralist approaches, we refer to the textbook of Balzer and Brendel (2019) on the philosophy of science, which also deals with applications in the social sciences, that continues Sneed’s structuralist approach, but also emphasizes Ludwig’s legacy. We cite from the preface: “The approach pursued in this book developed mainly from the two works by Sneed (1971) and Ludwig (1978), whose central messages we believe will endure in the long term” [author’s translation].

6. Summary

We have sketched three structuralistic programs which have been developed since the 1970s in order to tackle problems in philosophy of physics, some of which are relevant also for physics itself. Any program which employs a weighty formal apparatus in order to describe a domain and to solve specific problems has to be scrutinized with respect to the economy of its tools: to what extent is this apparatus really necessary to achieve its goals? Or is it concerned mainly with self-generated problems? We have tried to provide some arguments and material for the reader who ultimately has to answer these questions for him- or herself.


This bibliography is mainly restricted to a selection of a few books which are of some importance for the three structuralistic programs. An extended ‘Bibliography of Structuralism’ connected to Sneed’s program appeared in Erkenntnis, Volume 44 (1994). Another recent volume of Erkenntnis (79(8), 2014) is devoted to new perspectives on structuralism. We will cite below a few articles of this volume and other articles that are of relevance for the present entry. Unfortunately, the central books of Ludwig (1978) and Scheibe (1997, 1999) are not yet translated into English, but see Ludwig and Thurler (2006). For an introduction into the respective theories, English readers could consult chapter XIII of Ludwig (1987) and chapter V of Scheibe (2001).

  • Andreas, H., 2014, “Carnapian Structuralism”, Erkenntnis, 79(8): 1373–1391.
  • Andreas, H., and F. Zenker, 2014, “Basic Concepts of Structuralism”, Erkenntnis, 79(8): 1367–1372.
  • Aubin, D., 1997, “The Withering Immortality of Nicolas Bourbaki: A Cultural Connector at the Confluence of Mathematics, Structuralism, and the Oulipo in France”, Science in Context, 10(02): 297–342.
  • Ballentine, L.E., 1970, “The statistical interpretation of quantum mechanics”, Rev. Mod. Phys., 42(4): 358–381.
  • Balzer, W., and K. R. Brendel, 2019, Theorie der Wissenschaften, Wiesbaden: Springer VS.
  • Balzer, W., and C. U. Moulines, 1996, (eds.), Structuralist theory of science, Focal Issues, New Results, Berlin: de Gruyter.
  • Balzer, W., C. U. Moulines, and J. D. Sneed, 1987, An Architectonic for Science, Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Balzer, W., J. D. Sneed, and C. U. Moulines, 2000, (eds.), Structuralist Knowledge Representation. Paradigmatic Examples (Poznan Studies in the Philosophy of the Sciences and the Humanities), Amsterdam, Atlanta: Rodopi.
  • Bolinger, R., 2015, Rekonstruktion und Reduktion physikalischer Theorien, Epistemische Studien, Band 32, Berlin/Boston: De Gruyter.
  • Bourbaki, N., 1986, Theory of Sets (Elements of Mathematics), Paris: Hermann.
  • Busch, P., P. Lahti, J. P. Pellonpää, and K. Ylinen, 2016, Quantum Measurement, Berlin Heidelberg New York: Springer.
  • Cassinelli G. and P. Lahti, 2016, “An Axiomatic Basis for Quantum Mechanics”, Foundations of Physics, 46: 1341–1373.
  • Gähde, U., 2014, “Theory-dependent determination of Base Sets: Implications for the Structuralist Approach”, Erkenntnis, 79(8): 1459–1473.
  • Hertz, H. 1894, Die Prinzipien der Mechanik, Leipzig: Johann Ambrosius Barth; English translation by D. E. Jones and J. T. Walley, The Principles of Mechanics, New York: Dover, 1956.
  • Hüttemann, A., 2009, Pluralism and the Hypothetical in Heinrich Hertz’s Philosophy of Science, in M. Heidelberger, and G. Schiemann (eds.), The Significance of the Hypothetical in the Natural Sciences, Berlin: de Gruyter.
  • Kraus K., 1983, States, Effects and Operations: Fundamental Notions of Quantum Theory, (Lecture Notes in Physics Volume 190), Berlin Heidelberg New York: Springer.
  • Ludwig, G., 1970, Deutung des Begriffs “physikalische Theorie” und axiomatische Grundlegung der Hilbertraumstruktur der Quantenmechanik durch Hauptsätze des Messens (Lecture Notes in Physics, Volume 4),Berlin Heidelberg New York: Springer.
  • –––, 1978, Die Grundstrukturen einer physikalischen Theorie, Berlin: Springer; 2nd edition, 1990; French translation by G. Thurler: Les structures de base d’une théorie physique.
  • –––, 1985, An Axiomatic Basis for Quantum Mechanics, Vol. 1, Derivation of Hilbert Space Structure, Berlin Heidelberg New York: Springer.
  • –––, 1987, An Axiomatic Basis for Quantum Mechanics (Volume 2: Quantum Mechanics and Macrosystems), Berlin Heidelberg New York: Springer.
  • Ludwig, G. and G. Thurler, 2006, A new foundation of physical theories, Berlin: Springer.
  • Majer, U., 1985, Hertz, Wittgenstein und der Wiener Kreis, in H. J. Dahms (ed.), Philosophie, Wissenschaft, Aufklärung: Beiträge zur Geschichte und Wirkung des Wiener Kreises, Berlin, Boston: De Gruyter, pp. 40–66.
  • –––, 1989, Heinrich Hertz’s picture-conception of theories: Its laboration by Hilbert, Weyl, and Ramsey, in D. Baird, et al. (eds.), Heinrich Hertz: Classical Physicist, Modem Philosopher, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, pp. 225–242.
  • Scheibe, E., 1997, Die Reduktion physikalischer Theorien, Teil I, Grundlagen und elementare Theorie, Berlin: Springer.
  • –––, 1999, Die Reduktion physikalischer Theorien, Teil II, Inkommensurabilität und Grenzfallreduktion, Berlin: Springer.
  • –––, 2001, Between Rationalism and Empiricism, Selected Papers in the Philosophy of Physics, B. Falkenburg (ed.), Berlin Heidelberg New York: Springer.
  • –––, 2006, Die Philosophie der Physiker, München: C.H. Beck.
  • Schmidt, H.-J., 1979, Axiomatic Characterization of Physical Geometry (Lecture Notes in Physics, Volume 111), Berlin Heidelberg New York: Springer.
  • Schröter, J., 1996, Zur Meta-Theorie der Physik, Berlin: de Gruyter.
  • Schurz, G., 2014, “Criteria of Theoreticity: Bridging Statement and Non-Statement View”, Erkenntnis, 79(8): 1521–1545.
  • Sneed, J. D., 1971, The Logical Structure of Mathematical Physics, Dordrecht: Reidel; 2nd edition, 1979.
  • Stegmüller, W., 1979a, The Structuralist View of Theories, Berlin Heidelberg New York: Springer.
  • –––1979b, ‘The Structuralist View: Survey, Recent Developments and Answers to Some Criticisms’, in The Logic and Epistemology of Scientific Change, I. Niiniluoto and R. Tuomela (eds.), Amsterdam: North Holland.

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The author is indebted to John D. Norton, Edward N. Zalta, and Susanne Z. Riehemann for helpful suggestions concerning the content and the language of this entry.


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