Henri Poincaré

First published Tue Sep 3, 2013; substantive revision Mon Nov 22, 2021

Henri Poincaré was a mathematician, theoretical physicist and a philosopher of science famous for discoveries in several fields and referred to as the last polymath, one who could make significant contributions in multiple areas of mathematics and the physical sciences. This survey will focus on Poincaré’s philosophy. Concerning Poincaré’s scientific legacy, see Browder (1983) and Charpentier, Ghys, Lesne (2010).

Poincaré’s philosophy is primarily that of a scientist originating in his own daily practice of science and in the scientific debates of his time. As such, it is strongly influenced by the reflections of Ernst Mach, James Maxwell and Hermann von Helmholtz. However, his thinking is also strongly influenced by the philosophical doctrines of his time (those of Emile Boutroux, who was his brother-in-law, but also of Jules Lachelier, William James, etc.), and is imbued with the neokantism that was very much in vogue. Nevertheless, one must not assume that Poincaré’s “Kantian” vocabulary is exactly that of the German philosopher, given that Poincaré often radically changes the meaning of Kant’s terms.

In 1880, he collaborated with Émile Boutroux on the edition of Leibniz’ Monadology, providing an article comparing the physics of Descartes and Leibniz. It was not until the 1890s, however, that he became a central actor in the French philosophical scene, notably through his continuous involvement in the Revue de métaphysique et de morale (in which he published some twenty articles) and his participation in the organization of a large number of events: the celebration of the centenary of the birth of Descartes, the International Congress of Philosophy of 1900, and the international edition of the works of Leibniz.

Poincaré is best known for his critique of logicism and for his geometric conventionalism. The two traditions interpreting Poincaré’s work thus reflect, on the one hand, a philosophy of mathematics that endorses his intuitionist tendency and his polemics against logicism or formalism, and, on the other hand, his conventionalism both in the philosophy of science and in a broad linguistic sense. In reality, these intuitionistic and formal aspects are two sides of the same coin, given that Poincaré always supports a single position aimed at a reconstruction of the process of understanding scientific theories (see Heinzmann 2010). Neither formalistic nor intuitionist nor empiricist, Poincare opens a path lying between a realist and an anti-realist theory of mathematical knowledge.

After providing a short biographical sketch, we will present Poincaré’s views organized as follows:

1. Biography

Jules Henri Poincaré was born on April 29, 1854 in Nancy in the Lorraine region of France. His father was professor of Hygiene in the School of Medicine at the University of Nancy. His cousin Raymond was to become the President of the Republic of France during the period 1913–1920 and his younger sister Aline married the philosopher Emile Boutroux. Henri was a precocious student who rose immediately to the top of his class, excelling in both science and letters. At age 13, his teacher told his mother that “Henri will become a mathematician … I would say a great mathematician” (Bellivier 1956: 78). During the Franco-Prussian war in 1870 the Germans occupied Nancy and the Poincaré family was obliged to billet the secretary of the civil commissar of Nancy, with whom Henri would have a round of conversation each night after dinner in order to improve his German (see Rollet 2012).

In 1871 Poincaré passed the exams in letters with the grade “good” and that in science with the grade “fair.” He received a zero in mathematics for answering a different question from the one that was asked, apparently having misunderstood the question. He then took the preparatory classes in mathematics and was first in his class, also first in the academic competition and first in the national competition (concours général) in elementary mathematics. In Paris, he entered the École Polytechnique in 1873 and after graduating in 1875 (second in his class having apparently lost points for his inability to draw), entered the École des Mines. An extensive correspondence with his mother has been preserved from this period of study in Paris (Rollet 2017). After brief service as a mine inspector, he submitted a dissertation on partial differential equations and was then hired to teach the course on differential and integral calculus at the University of Caen. In 1880 he submitted a paper solving a problem in the theory of differential equations to the competition for the grand prize in mathematics of the Academy of Sciences in Paris. For the first time he made use of non-Euclidean geometry, which was seen by most of his contemporaries as purely speculative.

Poincaré married Louise Poulain d’Andecy on April 20, 1881 and soon thereafter joined the faculty of sciences at the University of Paris. In 1886 he succeeded G. Lippmann in the chair of mathematical physics and probability. In 1896 he was given the chair of mathematical astronomy and celestial mechanics, in 1902 he was named professor of theoretical electricity at the Bureau de Poste et Télégraph and in 1904 professor of general astronomy at the École Polytechnique. Poincaré also worked at the French Bureau des Longitudes from 1893 (Galison 2003).

In 1889 Poincaré won a prize from the King of Sweden for a question posed by Weierstrass on the stability of the solar system, that is, the three-body (or \(n\)-body) problem in classical mechanics. Despite a mathematical error that he discovered at the last moment (after questions raised by the Swedish mathematician Lars Edvard Phragmén) and frantically corrected, the work was important for its use of topology and as a founding document in chaos theory, for Poincaré showed that in general, the stability of such systems cannot be demonstrated. It is also in this context that he proved his famous recurrence theorem.

Poincaré joined the French Academy of Sciences in 1887 and became its president in 1906. He was elected to the Académie Française in 1908 on the basis of his three books on philosophical and general problems in science. He also became a corresponding member of many international scientific organizations. His travel included a trip to America to give a lecture at the St. Louis World’s Fair in 1904. Poincaré’s extensive correspondence demonstrates the extent of his connection to the scientific community of his time (Nabonnand 1999; Walter 2007, 2016). He also co-signed a report that played an important role in the rehabilitation of Dreyfus (Rollet 1999).

Poincaré is also famous for his 1904 conjecture concerning the topology of three-dimensional spheres which remained one of the major unsolved problems in mathematics until the Russian mathematician Grigori Perelman succeeded in demonstrating it nearly one hundred years later. Poincaré lectured on contemporary mathematical physics for years and was very much abreast of current developments. Popularizer of science, pedagogue, man of letters, he became an icon of the popular press (see Rollet 2017, XLVI). In all he published over five hundred scientific papers and over thirty books. He died July 17, 1912 in Paris from a blood clot to the brain which was a complication of surgery, survived by his wife and their four children (see Rollet 2000, Boutroux 2012, Ginoux and Gerini 2012).

2. The Structure of Science

Poincaré sets out a hierarchical view of the sciences in Science and Hypothesis (1902), although he does not explicitly use this terminology. In his view the special sciences presuppose physics, which presupposes geometry, which in turn presupposes arithmetic. Poincaré treats topics in a serial order—first arithmetic, then geometry, then physics, etc. In the introduction, Poincaré says that “Such is the conclusion we will reach, but to get there, we must first review the sequence of sciences, from arithmetic and geometry to mechanics and experimental physics” (Poincaré 1902, 2017, 2). The hierarchy interpretation has recently come under criticism in an important pair of articles (Dunlop 2016 and 2017). We believe that clarifying what is meant by hierarchy will resolve this debate (see Stump 2017 and Folina 2019 for further discussion). What is the relationship between arithmetic, geometry and the rest of the sciences? Michael Friedman originated the claim that Poincaré presents the sciences in a hierarchy, and in doing so makes clear that what he means by hierarchy is that each lower level must first be in place in order to be able to proceed to the next level:

But the point perhaps can be made even more clearly if we consider Newton’s theory of universal gravitation. For Newton’s Principia had already shown clearly how we can empirically discover the law of universal gravitation—on the presupposition, that is, of the Newtonian laws of motion and Euclidean geometry. Without these presuppositions, however, we certainly would not have been able to discover the law of gravitation. And the same example also shows clearly how each level in the hierarchy of sciences presupposes all of the preceding levels: we would have no laws of motion if we did not presuppose spatial geometry, no geometry if we did not presuppose the theory of mathematical magnitude, and of course no mathematics at all if we did not presuppose arithmetic (Friedman 1999, 76).

Note that Friedman mentions the theory of mathematical magnitude as well. There is a step between arithmetic and geometry, namely the theory of mathematical magnitude, which is precisely the topic of Chapter 2 of Science and Hypothesis. The theory of mathematical magnitude presupposes the possibility of indefinite repetition, and therefore something like mathematical induction, which Poincaré presents as central to arithmetic in Chapter 1 of Science and Hypothesis.

There is direct evidence that Poincaré thought that mathematics must be in place before we can do any empirical science. For example, in the opening of Chapter 12 of Science and Hypothesis, he remarks that: “The purpose of mathematical theories is not to reveal the true nature of things. Such a claim would be unreasonable. Their only goal is to coordinate the physical laws that experiment reveals to us, but that we could not even state without the help of mathematics” (Poincaré 1902, 2017, 143). Dunlop, by contrast, seems to have something much stronger in mind with the idea of the hierarchy, which is perhaps why she calls the thesis the dependency hierarchy interpretation. She seems to take the interpretation to be a thesis of reductionism, that geometry reduces to arithmetic, or at least, the intuitive reasoning used in arithmetic is all that we need in geometry.

Commentators have suggested that the intuition that grounds the use of induction in arithmetic also underlies the conception of a continuum, that the consistency of geometrical axioms must be proved through arithmetical induction, and that arithmetical induction licenses the supposition that certain operations form a group (Dunlop 2016, 274).

Dunlop is absolutely correct in saying that this is not Poincaré’s view. Rather, he says that we need arithmetic and further things in order to work in geometry. All that we take Poincaré to be saying is that we still need to add, subtract, multiply, and divide when we are doing geometry, but we will be doing more than what we do in arithmetic. The reason that we need a theory of magnitude before we can do geometry is because we measure things. The reason we need geometry in classical mechanics is because we are doing things like tracking the elliptical orbits of the planets. Thus, we also agree with Dunlop when she says that “Poincaré’s views of arithmetic and geometry cannot be reconciled by supposing geometry to be founded on arithmetical operations or principles” (Dunlop 2016, 306). We need arithmetic, plus group theory, plus the conventions in order to have metric geometry. There may be some authors who made reductionist claims, but it is not what we take from Friedman’s original presentation. Furthermore, the reductionist interpretation cannot be right when we get to the physical sciences, where there is clearly more content in the higher-level sciences—empirical content that could not possibly be reduced to mathematics.

Poincaré discusses the sciences in a sequence, starting with arithmetic. Mathematical induction is essential in arithmetic, because only by using it can we make assertions about all numbers. Poincaré considers mathematical induction to be a genuine synthetic a priori. He next considers magnitude, which requires arithmetic, but goes further. Likewise, geometry extends our knowledge still further, but requires the theory of magnitude to make measurements, and arithmetic to combine numbers. Poincaré then considers classical mechanics, which again extends our knowledge while relying on the mathematics that came before it. Finally, he considers theories of physics, where we have genuine empirical results, but based on the mathematics, hypotheses and conventions that came before. Thus the sciences are laid out like expanding concentric circles, with new content being added to the base at each level. The lower levels are necessary preconditions for higher levels, but they are not sufficient.

Poincaré makes hypotheses central to his analysis of science, distinguishing four kinds, which are actually given in two lists of three each (Poincaré 1902: 24 and 166–167; 2017: 1 and 109–110). Combining the two lists, these are:

  1. Verifiable hypotheses
  2. Indifferent (or neutral) hypotheses
  3. Natural hypotheses
  4. Apparent hypotheses

By verifiable hypotheses, Poincaré means general statements that have been confirmed by experiment. These are the backbone of natural science and can be seen non-controversially to be compatible with standard accounts of, say, the Hypothetical-Deductive method. However, it is important for Poincaré that this is not all of science, as he is arguing for a view of science that is between empiricism and rationalism.

Indifferent hypotheses are ontological in nature and are, for example, mechanical models of underlying mechanism. As Poincaré emphasizes, these can frequently be exchanged without sacrificing empirical accuracy. Take, for example, the propagation of heat, where “through the effects of the averages and thanks to the medium’s symmetry, all the differences even out” and we need not inquire how each molecule radiates. Such hypotheses are mere tools useful for thought but “unverifiable” and “useless” as such (Poincaré 1902: 169; 2017: 111).

Natural hypotheses are necessary conditions for science but are experimentally inaccessible:

It is difficult not to suppose that the influence of very distant bodies is altogether negligible, that small motions obey a linear law, that the effect is a continuous function of its cause. I would say the same of the conditions imposed by symmetry. All these hypotheses form, so to speak, the foundation common to all the theories of mathematical physics. (Poincaré 1902: 166; 2017: 109)

Finally, apparent hypotheses are definitions or conventions rather than actual claims about the world. They therefore may not be considered to be hypotheses at all, although they are, however, often mistaken for hypotheses. Poincaré argues that (metric) geometry is the hypothesis most prone to such confusion. Although he presents arithmetic in Science and Hypothesis without mentioning hypotheses explicitly, we can see a role for them in his analysis here as well, which we will present in the order that he follows.

Central to Poincaré’s analysis of arithmetic is the principle of recurrence, or mathematical induction, which he considered to be a synthetic a priori principle that “would then seem so self-evident that we would not be able to conceive of the opposite proposition” (Poincaré 1902: 74; 2017: 42). The principle of mathematical induction is necessary to prove general statements about numbers and is thus a necessary tool in mathematics. Therefore the principle of mathematical induction is similar to a natural hypothesis or at least plays a similar role to that of a natural hypothesis, i. e. a mathematical structure, which is presupposed and “more fundamental than any particular systems of natural numbers” (Folina 2020: 293). Of course, there are important differences between mathematical induction and the principle of induction used in the natural sciences. The principle of mathematical induction gives certainty, while the inductive generalizations in the natural sciences give only probability (1902: 27; 2017: 3). The principle of mathematical induction is based on “the affirmation of the power of a mind that knows itself capable of conceiving the indefinite repetition of a particular action as soon as this action is possible” (1902: 41–42; 2017: 15), so that there can be no uncertainty. It can be argued that Poincaré is justified in including his analysis of arithmetic in Science and Hypothesis, that is, in his analysis of empirical science, given that there is a striking similarity between the role played by the principle of mathematical induction and the principle of induction in natural science, which “is as difficult to justify […] as it is to get along without it” (1905b: 176; 1913b: 345).

Poincaré argues that (metric) geometry is neither a priori nor empirical, but rather conventional. It is important to note, however, that these conventions are guided by experience according to Poincaré, rather than being totally arbitrary, as some later writers take conventions to be. This connotation of the word ‘convention’ has led to many misrepresentations of Poincaré’s views. The existence of consistent alternative geometries shows that the geometry of space cannot be determined a priori. The fact that we experience material bodies and their relations, rather than space, leads Poincaré to argue that the geometry of space cannot be determined empirically either. Thus, statements about the geometry of space are apparent hypotheses or conventions that appear to be making descriptive claims, however they are actually closer to definitions, though they cannot be reduced to being merely linguistic.

Poincaré conceives of our perception of objects as a combination of motor and visual impressions that are at first non-spatial. In order to classify these sensations, which only appear because of the movement of our bodies, Poincaré says we introduce “sensible space” as a category “of our understanding” that is not physical space and does not even have a metric, meaning that “it involves no idea of measurement” (Poincaré 1898). Sensible space is a necessary condition for our understanding of our place in the world, that is, for our understanding of the objects around us, their relations and how they move, but it is not a form of our sensibility, since individual sensations can exist without it (Poincaré 1898: 3). Thus sensible space can be seen as an example of a natural hypothesis. We introduce a metric to this space in order to measure distance by using the language of group theory, that is, the mathematical study of abstract algebraic structures. Groups serve as a tool of reasoning about representations of muscular sensations. We can choose a group (or sub-group) which corresponds to the geometry of Euclid, Lobachevskii or Riemann to describe space. Poincaré proposes a criterion of choice between the three possible geometries, positing

the existence of an invariant sub-group, of which all the displacements are interchangeable and which is formed of all translations. (1898: 21)

Only Euclidean geometry meets this criterion, so the conventional choice of Euclidean geometry is determined by the simplicity of interchangeability that “translated into analytical language […] means that there are fewer terms in the equations” (Poincaré 1898: 43). The empirical underdetermination of the groups has a purely contrastive (arbitrary) character if the groups are isolated from the background beliefs furnished by our mind (Stanford 2009). “Holistic” considerations (commodity, simplicity) overcome the empirical equivalence between different geometries and give more evidence for Euclidean geometry. In contrast to geometry, no choices between alternatives are given in arithmetic.

We have thus far discussed arithmetic and geometry and examined a priori principles, natural hypotheses, and apparent hypotheses. In discussion of natural science Poincaré presents his views on verifiable hypotheses, which are characterized by mechanical laws that are arrived at through experiment:

What then is a good experiment? It is one that informs us of something besides an isolated fact, one that allows us to make predictions; that is, that allows us to generalize. For without generalization, we cannot make predictions. (Poincaré 1902: 158; 2017: 104)

The hypotheses that arise from experiment are verifiable hypotheses. The process of generalization presupposes a belief in the unity and simplicity of nature (see 1902: 161 ff.; 2017: 105 ff.), although it is important to remember that for Poincaré experience is always a complex phenomenon that is theory laden. Any good experiment in physics can be generalized in an infinite number of ways, depending on our preconceived ideas, and every generalization results in a hypothesis. While he emphasizes the creative role of the scientist, Poincaré does not go so far as to say that natural laws are simple definitions, as Le Roy proposed (1901: 143).

Not all laws are directly accessible to experiment. Generalization in physical science has to take the mathematical form of a differential equation in order to grasp complexity and to unify science:

It is not sufficient for each elementary phenomenon to obey simple laws, all those to be combined must obey the same law as well. (Poincaré 1902: 171; 2017: 113).

The law of inertia, for example, obtains only with respect to the pre-existing category of differential equations. These differential equations are, in the final analysis, the physical laws:

Newton has shown that a law is only a necessary relation between the present state of the world and its immediately subsequent state. All the laws discovered since are nothing else; they are in sum, differential equations. (Poincaré 1905b: 119; 1913b: 292)

In geometry, Poincaré supposes the pre-existent category of a group. In mechanics, the categorical tools are the principle of (empirical) induction and differential equations. So, Poincaré’s position represents a hierarchy of elements that, as in Kant, are presupposed as necessary conditions of the possibility of the science on the next level. The scheme of generalization in mechanics appears as follows: Experience provides complex phenomena, i.e., “a confused mass of facts” which we reduce into a number of elementary phenomena by means of experiment. From these elementary phenomena, we generalize (e.g., via the empirical induction principle) to elementary facts and move, by means of differential equations, to laws and verifiable hypotheses whose number should be kept as small as possible (Poincaré 1902: 168–171; 2017: 110–113). Finally, laws can be elevated by decree to the status of principles, thus allowing the basic principles of mechanics to become conventions; not arbitrary conventions however, since “They would be arbitrary [only] if we were to lose sight of the experiments that led the founders of mechanics to adopt the laws and which, as imperfect as these experiments may be, suffice to justify them” (1902: 128; 2017: 82). For Poincaré the principles of mechanics (principle of inertia, law of acceleration, principle of relative motion, etc.) are not hypotheses but rather conventions (Poincaré 1902: 151; 2017: 99), although they are of course of experimental origin. These conventions do not constitute a choice between physical alternatives, but rather must be interpreted as defining the basic terms of a theory. Immune to experimental disconfirmation without being a priori in the classical sense, they are necessary preconditions to the sciences further up in the hierarchy (Poincaré 1902: chap. VI and VII).

In the physical sciences proper, such as optics and electrodynamics, the scene changes entirely and principles seem no longer to share the conventional character of the geometrical postulates. Poincaré’s “indifferent hypotheses” are those that the analyst assumes at the beginning of calculations and that are neither true nor false, but rather play roles as occupants in a structure. Indifferent hypotheses differ from geometrical conventions in one very important sense. While geometry rests on a conventional decree, the structures of physics (mechanics included) do not systematically rest on indifferent hypotheses; rather, these hypotheses have only a psychological and pedagogic function as mental constructs that are in a sense superfluous, since they can change while leaving the experimental results intact. The basis of Poincaré’s structural realism can be seen in his idea that the content is superfluous and that it is the relations expressed in natural laws that remain through time that are essential to science.

Here then is the methodological analogy and link between the principle of induction, conventions in the sense of apparent hypotheses and verifiable hypotheses. All are guided by experience without being (entirely) experimental, and all involve presupposed categories, natural hypotheses or a given structure (Folina 2020). Verifiable hypotheses employ conventional elements in the generalization process and may presuppose the (empirical) principle of induction. Geometrical conventions are apparent hypotheses guided by the experience of muscular sensations and involve the category of groups. Both these sorts of hypotheses, verifiable and apparent, employed in physics and geometry, are in Poincaré’s hierarchy of sciences framed on the one hand by a priori principles and natural hypotheses that are tools both for mathematicians and experimenters, and on the other hand, by indifferent hypotheses and physical principles. The indifferent hypotheses are conventional (in the ordinary sense) stipulations of ontological entities—mechanical models that increase our theoretical insight, while the physical principles are either verifiable hypotheses elevated by decree beyond the crucible of experiment or well-founded with respect to the network of actual science.

3. Philosophy of mathematics

3.1 Logic and foundations: intuition and predicativity

Concerning logic and foundations of mathematics, Poincaré’s position is governed by two theses:

  1. Logical inferences alone are epistemically inadequate to express the essential structure of a genuine mathematical reasoning in view of its understandability (see Poincaré 1908: 159; 1913b: 452).
  2. As a consequence of the logical antinomies, one should avoid any impredicative concept formation.

Historically, both theses are directed broadly against the founders of modern logic and set theory such as Cantor, Peano, Frege, Russell, Zermelo, and Hilbert. On closer inspection, the historical situation is more complicated. With respect to Georg Cantor, for example, we must distinguish his work as a logical-set theoretical method useful in treating mathematical problems especially in the theory of functions on the one hand, and on the other hand, set theory as a tool for foundations or for considerations on infinite cardinality. Through Gösta Mittag-Leffler, Poincaré was familiar with Cantor’s work of the first type and uses it in his theory of Fuchsian functions in 1882 (Poincaré 1882: 1167), even having personal contact with Cantor (see Gray 1991: 22; Cantor 1991: 188; and Décaillot 2008: 281). However, Poincaré rejected the later foundational work of Cantor, saying that

There is no actual infinity, the Cantorians have forgotten that, and they have fallen into contradiction. It is true that Cantorism rendered services, but that was when it was applied to a real problem whose terms were clearly defined, and we could walk safely. Logisticians as Cantorians have forgotten. (Poincaré 1908: 212–213; 1913b: 484)

While it has been stressed by all commentators that Poincaré’s concerns with the foundations of mathematics are very different from those of the logicians, there is no unanimity on the focus of the dispute. Emile Boutroux and Warren Goldfarb claim that Poincaré is condemning the “logical” point of view for not providing psychological conviction (Boutroux 1914; Goldfarb 1985), while Detlefsen and Heinzmann argue for a difference at the epistemological level rather than a psychological one (Detlefsen 1992, 1993; Heinzmann 1995). In a famous response to Russell, Poincaré refuses to consider logic or epistemology independently from psychology (Poincaré 1909: 482). It would be false, however, to believe that he thus conflates logic and psychology. Indeed, Poincaré does not use the term psychology in the modern sense, but rather in all situations where he wants to emphasize the dimension of understanding, in particular its historical elements, which he contrasts with the mere correct logical exposition of the result. It is therefore not surprising that, according to Poincaré, mathematics requires intuition, interpreted as an element of understanding, not only in the context of discovery, but equally in the context of justification. As we have already seen, in arithmetic pure intuition is necessary to justify the complete (or mathematical) induction principle. It should also be noted that the term “intuition” is quite ambiguous, a fact that is well known and explicitly discussed by Poincaré himself. In The Value of Science, he distinguished three kinds of intuition: an appeal to sense and to imagination, generalization by induction, and intuition of pure number—whence comes the axiom of induction in mathematics. The first two kinds cannot give us certainty, but, he says, “who would seriously doubt the third, who would doubt arithmetic?” (Poincaré 1905b: 33; 1913b: 216).

From 1905, Poincaré therefore opposed the logicist thesis that claims to be able to prove all mathematical truths without recourse to intuition, once the principles of logic are admitted. Poincaré suspected that the logicians were actually making an equivocal use of the term logic and that they no longer sought the former kind, but rather a “new logic” containing principles of synthetic proof or formations of non-logical concept. He was evidently right given that not only is the modern logic of predicates richer than the traditional (syllogistic) logic, but in order to carry out the logicist project, one is even led to expand logic again by certain set-theoretic postulates of existence.

As Detlefsen points out, Poincaré’s most interesting argument does not concern the status of the basic laws of the logical systems, but rather the “place of logical inference in mathematical proof” (Detlefsen 1992: 349). According to Poincaré, today’s admitted validity of a logical, i.e., topic-neutral, inference from a proposition \(p\) to a proposition \(q\) (in Tarski’s conception: every model of \(p\) is a model of \(q)\) is not enough to sustain epistemic growth of mathematical knowledge, which requires rather that “\(p\) be seen mathematically to imply \(q\) (i.e., that \(p\) and \(q\) be seen as united by a common mathematical structure)” (Detlefsen 1993: 272). Poincaré insists on the non-invariance of mathematical reasoning with respect to its content and advances, so to speak, a local conception of reasoning (for example, the mathematical induction principle for arithmetical reasoning). According to this view, a gap in a proof is no longer a logical gap, but a gap in the mathematical understanding (Detlefsen 1992: 360, 366). If “formalization” and a universal calculus are, then, no longer the criterion of mathematical rigor, how shall rigor be maintained? Poincaré’s response mentions in particular the condensing of the content of the premises to the content of the conclusion by means of intuition. Rigor is obtained by combining Ernst Mach’s principle of the economy of thought with the concept of harmony, that is, thanks to “the fortunate inventions of language” that introduce an order-structure, the complexity of a domain of objects is made more harmonious by the introduction of an invariance (see Poincaré 1908: 23–30; 1913b: 371–375). Thus, in mathematical reasoning, rigor is placed in the context of a “mathematical architecture” whose simplest expression is found in mathematical induction.

Regarding the antinomies discovered at the turn of the century— such as Richard’s or Russell’s paradoxes—they are, according to Poincaré, the consequence of an abusive use of intuition with respect to abstract entities that arises from the adoption of conceptual realism (Platonism). In a definition of the form \(\exists y \forall x ((x \in y) \leftrightarrow D[x])\), the existence of the set \(y\) is intuitively postulated without any restriction for the predicate \(D[x]\). For an anti-Platonist like Poincaré was from 1906 on, intuition is not a mode for representing an object, but rather concerns our capacity to follow a rule. We see this quite clearly in Poincaré’s discussion of mathematical induction.

We know that Poincaré hoped to avoid the known antinomies by limiting himself to predicative definitions (see Heinzmann 1985). It was Russell who introduced the terms “predicative” and “non-predicative” to highlight the difference between two kinds of propositional functions, those that determine and those that do not determine a class. He called the first “predicative” and the second “non-predicative.” Poincaré attributed the mistake of non-predicative definitions to a vicious circle: a definition is “non-predicative” if the definiens contains or relates to a totality of which the definiendum is a part. He formulated a principle to avoid circularity, which leads directly to Russell’s famous vicious circle principle:

I recognize further this element of truth in Poincaré’s objection to totality, that whatever in any way concerns all of any or some (undetermined) of the members of a class must not be itself one of the members of a class. (Russell 1973 [1906]: 198)

Russell succeeded in developing a theory that respects his principle, the ramified type theory. In Poincaré, we find nothing that is comparable, for he believed that the principle guarded against the definitional mistakes that he denounced. He did not seriously take up the question and only formulated successively different variants of the principle when he learned from Ernst Zermelo that the proof, proposed by Argand and Cauchy, of the fundamental theorem of algebra makes an appeal precisely to the rejected, non-predicative definitions. Hence, only when the measures taken against the logical antinomies affected “real mathematics” did he try to modify the principle. The discussion between Poincaré, Russell, Peano, and Zermelo on the measures to take lasted for six years. The difficulty consisted in the obligation to formulate a principle that is neither too restrictive for the important results in analysis, nor too liberal with respect to the formations of concept to be excluded by reason of Poincaré’s philosophical position. The absence of a truly convincing solution shows that the analysis of the concept of predicativity with the help of informal methods appeared to have reached its limits.

In 1912, the year of Poincaré’s death, Luitzen Egbertus Jan Brouwer in his inaugural lecture at Amsterdam characterized two opposing orientations in mathematics: intuitionism (in large part French) and formalism (in large part German). The two orientations were represented by the greatest mathematicians of the antagonistic Franco-German pairing: Henri Poincaré and David Hilbert (Brouwer 1912: 124–125). According to the historians, the modernists are thos eat the beginning of the 20th century who supported an algebraization of the contents up to and including the language of signs, while the conservative tendency finds the justification of mathematical knowledge before language, that is, in the intellect. The polemics of the period persist today, even though its political metaphor (conservatism/modernism) has been reversed. Since the death of Bourbaki, it is fashionable to emphasize the intuitive aspects of mathematics. Yet, it is remarkable that Brouwer himself criticizes Poincaré’s conflation of “the language of mathematics [and] the true mathematical construction” (Brouwer 1907: 176). Brouwer is quite right to emphasize that Poincaré does not separate language and mathematics. Poincaré ascribes to language—but not to logic—an essential role in mathematical reasoning. In this sense, we may say that Poincaré is, with respect to Brouwer, a semi-intuitionist who is located squarely between the two fronts of the dispute. For him, mathematical reasoning possesses and must conserve an intuitive content that defies the formal contents. In summary, the similarities and differences between Poincaré and Brouwer can be shown as follows:

  • Poincaré and Brouwer share the conviction that intuition is a guarantee of the certainty inherent in mathematics.
  • They share the conviction that complete induction is the “mathematical reasoning par excellence.”
  • In contrast with Poincaré, Brouwer considers intuition as the unique basis of mathematical construction.
  • Their positions differ with respect to the relation that binds intuition and language.
  • The involvement of paradoxes is attributed by Brouwer to the application of logical laws to a linguistic structure that can never be transformed into proper mathematics. According to Brouwer, formalism is useless; according to Poincaré, the Platonistic philosophy that 
accompanies it must be corrected.
  • Poincaré rejects an actual infinity; Brouwer accepts it provided that it can be confined to an intuitive construction.

3.2 Geometry: conventions, intuition and aesthetics

Poincaré was strongly influenced by and attuned to the French philosophical scene, which refers to the Kantian tradition to show the limits of methodological positivism. Members of the so-called Critique de la science movement (Benrubi 1928), which includes members of the “Boutroux Circle” (Nye 1979) advocate a mixture of positivism and Neo-Kantianism. They criticize both Comte’s determinism and Kant’s static view of the mind’s structure. According to Poincaré, mathematics requires intuition not only in the context of discovery but also in the context of justification, especially in arithmetic and logic. So it is not surprising that Poincaré was discussed in German philosophical circles in the Kantian tradition, for example by Ernst Cassirer (1910), Ilse Rosenthal-Schneider (1914), who is a disciple of Alois Rhiel, and Moritz Schlick (1918). Thus, Poincaré was taken to be one of the Neo-Kantian precursors of logical positivism. However, unlike Kant, the arithmetical “pure intuition” Poincaré introduces is intellectual in character and Poincaré does not in the least solve the problem of the unity of spontaneity and receptivity by the introduction of a pure sensibility. Rather, he changes the terms of the Kantian contrast, emphasizing the balance between exactness, that which is common to many minds and is transmissible by discourse, and subjective acquaintance, which is intransmissible sensation. He expresses this difficult balance in a formula well known due to its popularization by Einstein:

what they [mathematics] have gained in rigor, they have lost in objectivity. It is by distancing themselves from reality that they acquired this perfect purity. (Poincaré 1908: 131; 1913b: 435)

Because of his concern for the application of mathematics, Poincaré did not confine himself to the perfect purity of mathematics.

The existence of relatively consistent non-Euclidean geometries leads him to the view that geometric propositions cannot be determined by a priori intuitions and that it is necessary to study “the structural relations between Euclidean and non-Euclidean geometry” (Nye 1979: 111). Poincaré established a famous dictionary translating concepts and propositions of Lobachevskii’s geometry into Euclidean geometry in order to create a model to show the relative consistency of Lobachevskii’s geometry (Poincaré 1891: 771; cf. 1902: 68; 2017: 37). Concerning pure and applied geometry, Poincaré holds the modernist-sounding views that we have no pre-axiomatic understanding of geometric primitives, that rigor demands that we eliminate appeals to intuition in geometry, and that (metric) geometry is neither true nor false, not only because we cannot verify which one is true, but also because we cannot empirically determine the metric geometry of space ‘in principle.’ When we speak of space, all we can talk about is the relations of physical bodies:

[B]ecause of the relativity and passivity of space, they will not depend on the absolute position and orientation of the system. In other words, the state of the bodies and their mutual distances at a given instant will depend only on the state of these same bodies and their mutual distances at the initial instant, but will in no way depend on the initial absolute position and initial absolute orientation of the system. For brevity’s sake, this is what I might call the law of relativity. […] [S]uch a statement is independent of any interpretation of the experiments. If the law is true in the Euclidean interpretation, it will also be true in the non-Euclidean interpretation (Poincaré 1902: 98–99; 2017: 61–62).

Although distinguishing in 1903 the n-dimensional “representative space”, which is a physical continuum, from the geometrical space, which is a mathematical continuum (Poincaré 1905b: chap. IV), Poincaré always held a relationalist view of space that goes further than current space-time theories allow (Stump 1989; Walter 2010).

Since Poincaré so profoundly modifies the traditional view of geometry as the a priori science of space, authors such as Schlick, Carnap, and Ernest Nagel (1939, 1979) attribute to him a leading role in the development of the formal conception of mathematics. Alberto Coffa extends Nagel’s analysis by claiming that there was a crisis in the interpretation of primitive geometrical terms in the nineteenth century that led to the development of formal axiomatic systems (Coffa 1986). References to a central role played by Poincaré can also be found in Joan Richards’ survey (Richards 1994) and in Jeremy Gray’s account of the development of modernism (Gray 2008). The modernist character of Poincaré’s approach is also shown by the fact that he must be ranked with Duhem among those forerunners of logical empiricism who survive Quine’s criticism of the movement, not primarily for his holistic thesis concerning theory-confirmation, more so for his conception of geometrical conventions as a kind of hybrid analytic-synthetic expressions “guided” by experience and for his ontological “relationalism” which in certain aspects comes close to Quine’s doctrine. Both attempt to account philosophically for the incompleteness of (scientific) objects.

Poincaré argues that

contrary to the naive dogmatists’ view, that which science captures are not the things themselves, but simply relationships between them. Beyond these relations, there is no knowable reality (1902: 25; 2017: 2).

Thus, he rejects metaphysical realism:

No, beyond doubt a reality completely independent of the mind which conceives it, sees or feels it, is an impossibility. A world as exterior as that, even if it existed, would for us be forever inaccessible (Poincaré 1905b: 23; 1913b: 209)

Although Quine’s argument (“no entity without identity”) finds a different motivation in a logical context quite distant from that of Poincaré’s, the result is similar. For Quine, mathematical objects are “known only by their laws” and any other properties that they may have are irrelevant (Quine 1969: 44).

Poincaré’s geometrical conventions and his ontological relationalism are nothing more than two different aspects of his structural approach, as can be seen by considering two parallel debates at the turn of the 20th century on the nature of geometry—one between Henri Poincaré and Bertrand Russell and the other between David Hilbert and Gottlob Frege. Poincaré and Hilbert argue for a new conception of geometrical systems, while Frege and Russell defend a traditional way of looking at these systems. The debate takes up the questions: Which geometry is true? What is the nature of definitions and axioms? To deal with the multiplicity of geometries, questions about their truth, and the meaning of their primitive terms, Poincaré and Hilbert propose a radically new view of geometry. They hold that all that we can say about the meaning of ‘point’, ‘straight line’, ‘distance’, etc. is that which we have stated in the axioms or principles of the system, and that geometry is not a set of truths about some previously known objects. Thus Poincaré formulates a new view of geometric theories, that geometry does not express true or false propositions and that there are no special objects which geometry studies. Rather, geometry is just a system of relations that can be applied to many kinds of objects.

Poincaré argues against Russell’s view of definition, claiming that the meaning of primitive terms can be fixed by the geometrical system in which we are working. Fixing the meaning of primitive terms by the system is the only way to proceed, Poincaré argues, because, if we were to take a primitive term out of the context of a system, it would lose all meaning:

If one wants to isolate a term and exclude its relations with other terms, nothing will remain. This term will not only become indefinable, it will become devoid of meaning. (Poincaré 1900: 78, Poincaré’s emphasis)

As Poincaré explains in a section entitled “Form and Matter” of his Monist article of 1898, the idea is that in geometry the properties of the primitives or of the objects to which geometrical relations are applied are not important at all, as far as geometry is concerned. The set of relations that hold between the primitives constitute the form, not the matter, of geometric objects, and these relations are what are studied. The form constitutes the relational aspect of Poincaré’s structuralism.

By recognizing Poincaré’s heritage as a structural point of view, Schlick insists on the conventional aspect of his structuralism. He sees in Poincaré’s conventions a third type of definition between the implicit definitions of the axiomatic method and the concrete or ostensive definitions of physical objects. These conventions are, as Friedman observes “crucial for an understanding of how we achieve a coordination between concepts and empirical reality in the mathematical exact sciences” (2007: 100). As Schlick explains:

To define a concept implicitly is to determine it by means of its relations to other concepts. But to apply such a concept to reality is to choose, out of the infinite wealth of relations in the world, a certain group or complex and to embrace as a unit by designating it with a name. By suitable choice it is always possible under certain circumstances to obtain an unambiguous designation of the real by means of the concept. Conceptual definitions and coordinations that come into being in this fashion we call conventions (using this term in the narrower sense, because in the broader sense, of course, all definitions are agreements). It was Henri Poincaré who introduced the term convention in this narrower sense into natural philosophy; and one of the most important tasks of that discipline is to investigate the nature and meaning of the various conventions found in natural science (Schlick 1925, 91–92).

According to Schlick, Poincaré’s conventions combine conceptual definitions and coordinations. Given the fact that both expressions are completely foreign to Poincaré’s style, how should one understand Schlick’s claim? In fact, Schlick’s expressions designate two different aspects of Poincaré’s structural approach, which pay attention to the fact that Poincaré is not an ante rem structuralist (the ante rem structuralist takes the pattern to exist independently of any systems that exemplify it). At first glance he seems to be an ontological realist with respect to relational universals (but not with respect to individuals (relata)), despite his predicativist attitude. As Elie Zahar emphasizes, such a position is not naturally compatible with classical semantics (logic) because this latter “seems unable to interpret relations except through their relata”: one cannot confirm \(R(a,b)\) without determining

the referents of both, ‘\(a\)’ and ‘\(b\)’ in order then to ascertain whether \(\lt a,b\gt\) belongs to the referent of ‘\(R\)’. (Zahar 2001: 38)

An answer to this difficulty can be found by examining four steps of Poincaré’s psycho-physiological reconstruction of the genesis of geometry. In his early articles, Poincaré argues that geometry concerns only the relations expressed in the axioms, not some inherent features of the primitives:

What we call geometry is nothing but the study of formal properties of a certain continuous group; so we may say, space is a group. (Poincaré 1898: 41)

The first step of Poincaré’s construction of geometrical space via groups proceeds from the observable fact that a set of impressions can be modified in two distinct ways: on the one hand without our feeling muscular sensations, and on the other, by a voluntary motor action accompanied by muscular sensations. So, as in Carnap’s Aufbau, the starting point here is the definition (guided by experience) of two two-place relations: an external change \(a\) (with ‘\(x a y\)’ for ‘\(x\) changes in \(y\) without muscular sensation’) and an internal change \(S\) (with ‘\(x S y\)’ for ‘\(x\) changes in \(y\) accompanied by muscular sensations’). In the second step, he introduces a classification of external changes, some of which can be brought back to the starting point by an internal change (changes of position), while others (changes of state) cannot. One presupposes “by convention” or better by decision, that the internal compensation for external changes is exact and not approximate. In the third step, Poincaré defines the equivalence class of changes of position through an identity condition with respect to the compensation by internal changes and calls it a displacement:

  1. Two internal changes have to be considered identical iff they have induced the same muscular sensations. (Poincaré 1905b: 79; 1913b: 258 ff.).
  2. \( \dfrac{\alpha, \beta \text{ external}}{S \text{ internal}} \Bigg\} \text{ changes}\)
    \(\alpha \sim \beta\) iff \(\exists S (S\alpha \doteq S\beta \doteq I)\)
    This means that two external changes are equivalent iff they possess a common character (i.e., to be canceled by \(S\)).
  3. \(S = S'\) iff \(\exists \alpha(\alpha S \doteq \alpha S \doteq I)\)
  4. If “\(\sim\)” and “\(\approx\)” are equivalent relations, then each equivalence class of the changes of position is a displacement, so we can recognize that two displacements are identical.

The fourth step and Poincaré’s main result is that each set of displacement classes (external & internal) forms a group in the mathematical sense. The general concept of a group is a form of our understanding that “pre-exists in our mind” (1902:107; 2017: 56 and 68; 1898: 42–43) or is an ante rem structure, which the specific displacement-structure \((=\) transformation group) exemplifies. Thus, the genesis of geometry is based on an epistemological process founded on previous classifications, carried out as a relationship between a structure as norm of invariance and conventionally adapted systems as instantiations or exemplifications of these norms.

Where there is a choice between different possibilities, conventions only become involved at a further step of the mathematical construction where the properties of the transformation group are studied and choices are made concerning distance (a metric). It follows that the Euclidean axiom of distance is not exclusively the result of a conventional (decisional) choice in the linguistic sense, rather, it is a “disguised definition” or an “apparent hypothesis.” Poincaré uses the term “disguised definition” before 1899, the year of Hilbert’s famous Foundations of Geometry, to express the fact that language apparently used descriptively is not descriptive in actuality. Certain axioms appear descriptive, but instead define the objectivity of a fact (Poincaré 1899: 274). Such a fact is found to be defined only up to structure, although it clearly reflects the truth of certain relations between sensations whose qualities remain unknowable, as shown by Helmholtz and others (Poincaré 1905b: 174.

Poincaré’s often quoted structuralist Credo that in mathematics an entity “exists” means “that its defintion does not imply a contradiction” (1902: 70; 2017: 38–39; 1905c: 819), must be seen in a non-Hilbertian light. Poincaré’s geometric propositions (conventions), which are neither true nor false, are not propositional schemata that can be satisfied by a model. For reasons concerning in particular the involvement of a vicious circle with respect to the principle of complete induction, Poincaré rejects the idea of ensuring mathematical reliability with a Hilbert-style consistency proof (Poincaré 1906: 301; cf. Detlefsen 1986: 59 ff. for a critical assessment). Even with respect to geometry, he takes a structural position without, however, disengaging meaning and knowledge completely from ostension. Nevertheless, Poincaré begins his alternative reliability construction only apparently with sensations as ostensive contacts with the given, since he is not an empiricist. Instead, in a move similar to Helmholtz’s conception of intuition as imagined sensible impressions, Poincaré introduces a representation of a two-place sensation relation, based on the imagination of single sensations. The representation of an object in sensible space means nothing other than the deliberate and conscious representation of muscular sensations thought necessary to reach the object (Poincaré 1902: 82; 2017: 48–49). The sensation relations are then the place-holder of the categories (forms) of sensible space and of groups. Poincaré’s conventions in geometry are first of all the tool that he uses to close (by decision) the gap between the exactness of a structure and the objectivity of sensation-relations based on an imagined ostensive contact (reflecting on sensations). If this interpretation is right, then Poincaré’s concept of structure is not the new Hilbertian one that derives from the axiomatization of Euclidean geometry, but rather constitutes a development of the traditional algebraic concept of structure and concerns continuous groups on the one hand and the type of iteration and complete induction on the other hand. His epistemological stance has a strong affinity with Schlick’s General Theory of Knowledge. Given, on the one hand, that “pure quality is impenetrable” and, on the other hand, that knowledge is public—“no discourse, no objectivity” (Poincaré 1905b: 179; 1913b: 347–48)—how is it possible that although we cannot be sure that our experience is the same, we can intersubjectively know the same thing? The answer is found in the thesis that “science is a system of relations” (Poincaré 1905b: 181; 1913b: 349).

Contrary to in re structuralists, Poincaré’s structures are not ontologically but rather epistemically dependent on their instances. The faculty capable of creating the general concept of a group or of indefinite iteration is the expression of a form of our understanding “prior to all experience” (Poincaré 1898: 41). He defends a kind of constructive epistemological Platonism or anti-nominalism (Linnebo 2011), in which intuition is a cognitive faculty used to grasp from series of imagined sensations or concrete iterations the general structure. This is the solution that explains Folina’s characterization of Poincaré, which at first sight seems inconsistent, as an ante-rem structuralist and as an anti-realist with respect to mathematical objects (Folina 2020). The structure is not itself a position in a meta-structure, but the psycho-physiological procedure is the way in which we know of its existence in our mind. Poincaré uses it as a metamathematical “instrument which serves not to represents things to ourselves, but to reason” upon the psycho-physiological genesis of real actions with imagined sensations (Poincaré 1898: 41). The genesis of geometry is based on an epistemological process founded on previous classifications, carried out as a relationship between a structure as norm of invariance and “conventionally” adapted systems as instantiations and exemplifications of these norms.

The exemplification of the structure by a large variety of systems (imagined sensations, mathematical and physical facts, objects) having some characters in common is an aesthetic operation, not a logical one. The general group structure is given by intuition rather than by an explicit identity criterion and the determination of its formal properties expressed by the means of sub-groups is the result of a mastery occasioned by concrete systems (samples). The mathematician creates structural harmony as does an artist. In art, the structure can be implicit, while in mathematics it is normally explicit, even if it is qualitative. The number of their exemplifications, i.e., of their applications, is the aesthetic element “uniting” both, mathematical and artistic structures (Poincaré 1905b: 104; 1913b: 280). There is for example nearly no mathematical theory where the notion of group does not intervene by giving the same name to different “things” (Poincaré 1921: 137). Poincaré’s geometric or algebraic conventions form a conceptual construction that is irreducible to a combination of clearly distinguished parts of structural elements and aesthetic exemplifications. In this sense the result of the psycho-physiological genesis of geometry is as a whole a system understood as a pragmatic procedure.

The insight that geometry is the result of a genesis where the description and the construction of objects are two aspects of the same procedure leads to an alternative interpretation of Quine’s thesis of the incompleteness of mathematical objects and the ideas to which they belong. The freedom that we have to choose a geometric distance function is due neither to a general skepticism nor to a purely verbal accommodation with respect to a set theoretic development of the foundations of mathematics that itself possesses ontological commitment, but rather to an ontological peculiarity of a new sort (Quine 1986: 401). Structures (groups) are not patterns whose positions are given entities. The genesis of the geometrical metric structure is as the advent of relations linked to the concrete in an aesthetic analysis of the general idea, rather than either the creation of the concrete material from the general idea (a group) or as the creation of the category (a group) from the concrete. What Poincaré calls “objective reality common to many thinking beings” is exactly the “harmony expressed by mathematical laws” (Poincaré 1905b: 23; 1913b: 209). To move along this predefined track of a reconciliation of aesthetic sensitivity and cognition leads directly to Nelson Goodman (1969).

As Philippe Nabonnand has remarked, Poincaré’s early presentation of geometrical space is as a whole in fact circular:

in his 1898 paper, [Poincaré] put forward a (mathematical) explanation of the three dimensions of space. He observed that the Euclidean group, selected after many conventions, can be seen as acting on a space of three, four or five dimensions. The choice of a three-dimensional space is justified by considerations of commodity. Unfortunately, Poincaré’s argument is viciously circular because the choice of the Euclidean group was grounded on Lie’s classification of transformation-groups operating on \(\mathrm{R}^3\) (Heinzmann and Nabonnand 2008: 171).

Nevertheless, Poincaré noted his mistake and introduced in 1905b “representative space” — a physical continuum to which experience proves that it is more convenient to attribute three dimensions — and which may also imply the matching three-dimensionality of “geometric space,” which is a mathematical continuum, for convenience (Poincaré 1905b: 94; 1913b: 272 — in order to justify his utilization of Lie’s classification. The consequence is that geometry is not independent of any further mathematical space, the structure of which must be presupposed as a primitive notion, contrary to the pragmatically suggested group notion existing in our mind.

4. Philosophy of Physics

Concerning the epistemological status of mechanics, Poincaré positions himself, as in his discussion of geometry, as holding a position between empiricism and a priorism (Poincaré 1902: 111; 2017: 71). The principles of mechanics certainly have, according to Poincaré, an empirical origin, but they nonetheless surpass the bounds of strict empiricism since the experience that leads us to an experimental result rests on the repetition of a phenomenon and therefore requires physical or empirical induction (Poincaré 1902: 26; 2017: 3). Generalizations are either a hypothesis, a law, or a confirmable thesis obtained by the fact that each result of empirical physics can be generalized in different ways. Indeed, we are obligated to simplify the experimental data and the criterion of simplicity is relative to the analytical apparatus we employ, so consequently, simplicity may be only be “apparent.” Such analysis of experimental data may even force us to adjust the experiment. Reflecting on the generalization process shows that it presupposes a belief in the unity and simplicity of nature (Poincaré 1902: 159–165; 2017: 105–108). However, this is only the most general kind of presupposition that is required. The hypothesis of the law of inertia, for example, cannot be obtained except with respect to the preexisting category of the differential equation, which thus replaces the physical induction that leads to a simple experimental fact.

Poincaré distinguished empirical laws from conventional principles. How does one move from “simple” empirical laws, understood as confirmable hypotheses, to principles as the result of a conventional decision to withdraw a confirmable hypothesis from the judgment of experience? In mechanics he employs the same methodological procedure as in geometry with regard to classes of displacements and groups:

When a law has received a sufficient confirmation from experiment, we may adopt two attitudes: Either we may leave this law in the fray; it will then remain subject to incessant revision, which without any doubt will end by demonstrating that it is only approximate. Or else we may elevate it into a principle by adopting conventions. (Poincaré 1905b: 165–166; 1913b: 335)

Thus, in outline, a generalization scheme in physics is presented as follows: From the phenomenon we move by physical induction to the experimental result and, thanks to differential equations, to the laws and the general hypotheses which, by a common decision of the scientific community, can be elevated finally to a principle. Certainly this is only a general scheme and the concrete process of a generalization could include many variations. The difference between the geometric axiom as a “disguised definition” and the physical law as a principle seems to define Poincaré’s epistemological criterion that distinguishes geometry from mechanics from the ontological point of view. In geometry, the convenient conventions (or definitions) are chosen as a function of objects (solid bodies, rays) which are not the objects of the geometry. Furthermore, in geometry we presuppose the category of group, so geometry requires a double conventional abstraction. In mechanics, the conventions are useful and apply to physical objects (Poincaré 1902: 152; 2017: 100). In this context we presuppose the categories of empirical or physical induction and of differential equations as necessary preconditions for doing science. Poincaré’s approach therefore integrates specifically Kantian elements, the idea that there are preconditions, while still completely eliminating the transcendental basis of these components that we find in Kant’s thought.

Poincaré’s argument in favor of the necessary transmission of the conventional character of geometry to physics is based on an analogy, which shows another important relationship between geometry and physics. The methodological function of transformation groups with respect to the representative space corresponds to the function of geometry with respect to physics. The analogy runs as follows: Just as the law of displacements may correspond only approximately to the law of groups and is consequently considered to be the result of two component changes, the first being a displacement, and the second a qualitative alteration, so Poincaré regards the physical “complex” relation between two bodies \(A\) and \(B\) as the result of two components. The first is regarded as a “simple” geometrical principle, while the second is itself composed of two “epistemological laws.” The bodies \(A\) and \(B\) are related to figures \(A'\); and \(B'\) of the geometrical space so that

\[ R(A,B) \leftrightarrow R'(A',B') \wedge r_A (A,A') \wedge r_B (B,B') \]

\(R'\) being a “properly” geometrical proposition, and the \(r_i\) expressing the relationships between objects of the representative space and the geometrical space, such as the relation between solid bodies and motion invariants. Poincaré declares that by changing the relations \(r_i\), the geometrical proposition \(R'(A', B')\) could even serve to describe the relationship between two different physical bodies (see Poincaré 1905b: 166–67; 1913b: 336). Poincaré thereby rules out any application of geometry to physics based on a structural isomorphism with a presupposed reality (Mette 1986: 75–80).

The conventional elements in physical theories were often misunderstood by Poincaré’s contemporaries. So, for example, his affirmation that neither of the two propositions ‘The earth turns round’ and ‘The earth does not turn round’ is “more true than the other in the kinematic sense,” is not a rehabilitation of Ptolemy’s system, but the consequence of the fact that in physics, the empirical systematic (not epistemic) under-determination of theories is limited by unifying considerations: “A physical theory is by so much the more true, as it puts in evidence more true relations.” So, ‘The earth turns round’ has a richer content expressed by the “flattening of the earth, the rotation of Foucault’s pendulum, the gyration of cyclones, the trade-winds, and who knows what else?” (Poincaré 1905b: 184–85; 1913b: 353). However, in physics proper—that is, in optics and in electrodynamics—the conventional elements seem to be further weakened:

We come across a different kind of hypothesis and fully perceive its productivity. Undoubtedly, the theories seem at first sight fragile and the history of science shows us how fleeting they are. However, they do not entirely die out and something remains of each of them. It is this something that we must try to sort out, for there and only there is true reality (Poincaré 1902: 26; 2017: 3–30).

In fact, Poincaré’s model of explanation, founded on a minimum of well-confirmed hypotheses erected into principles and from which any meaningful propositions can be deduced, is called into question by Maxwell’s approach. In view of the crisis in physics that was brewing toward the end of the 19th century, Poincaré’s general position will not work without posing problems with respect to concrete principles. We will briefly mention the most interesting case, that of the application of the principle of relativity to electrodynamics, which is one of the most discussed subjects by historians (e.g., Goldberg 1967; Paty 1993; Miller 1996a; Zahar 2001; Darrigol 2004; Rouché 2008; Walter 2011, DiSalle 2014)—not least because Poincaré and Einstein did not cite each other on relativity despite the fact that Einstein read Poincaré’s Science and Hypothesis before 1905 and Poincaré wrote Einstein a recommendation letter sometime after their only meeting at the first Solvay Congress in 1911 (Walter 2007: chap. 59.3). What is uncontroversial is that Poincaré discovered salient points of the special theory of relativity, such as an operational definition of clock-synchronization to the first order in \(v/c\), and a relativistic formula of the composition of speed, the determination of the structure of the Lorentz-group.

Since the Maxwell-Lorentz equations for electromagnetics are not Galileo-covariant, the classical principle of relativity according to which measurement in one inertial reference frame can be converted to another by Galilean transformation is called into question. Using in his famous St. Louis lecture of 1904 the designation (physical) “principle of relativity” (Poincaré 1905a: 607), which does not apply “to finite equations that are directly observed, but to differential equations” (Poincaré 1913a: 103; 1963: 19), Poincaré reports that Lorentz introduces the conjectures (i.e., the ad hoc hypotheses) of “local time” and of “uniform contraction in the direction of motion” in an attempt to save the principle in its application to the electromagnetic domain (see Poincaré 1905b: 132 ff.; 1913b: 305 ff.). It was indeed Poincaré (1906) who made Lorentz’s theory fully compatible with the relativity principle. We are thus naturally inclined, remarks Poincaré, to admit the postulate of relativity in every domain. In postulating the principle as a “general law of Nature” (Poincaré 1906: 495), its extended form finds its origin in the Galilean principle, and its motivation in its compatibility with a theory explaining why no experiment is able to inform us of the earth’s motion relative to the ether. So, the principle is an element of a work in progress containing several conjectures and there is the possibility that it will lose its soundness (Poincaré 1905b: 146; 1913b: 319).

In fact, there are now two principles: the old one, which was made immune to revision by considering it as a conventional principle and which serves to construct geometrical space via the transformation group that is the mathematical expression of the psychological principle of the free mobility of “rigid” bodies, and the new one, where the invariance concerns differential equations and where the geometry could now be rooted in the Lorentz group at the price of accepting a four-dimensional spacetime with indefinite metric (see Gray 2012: 111; Walter 2009). So, it seems that Poincaré’s old conventional construction of space where he prefers Euclidean geometry on the basis of considerations of simplicity and commodity must be subsumed to a new convention on space-time. Indeed, Poincaré never abandons Galilean spacetime but it is not even clear if before 1912 the principle of special relativity with Lorentz covariance (instead of with Galilean covariance) was confirmed well enough to be unassailable by experiment and to make the principle with Galilean covariance unfruitful (Walter 2009). This situation is what Larry Sklar has called “transient” underdetermination,

that is, theories which are not empirically equivalent but are equally (or at least reasonably) well confirmed by all the evidence we happen to have in hand at the moment (see Stanford 2009 and Sklar 1975: 380)

while waiting to make a decision in face of new results.

5. The Influence of Poincaré

There is no doubt that Poincaré’s work has been very influential both in the sciences and in philosophy. It was already widely discussed at the time it was first presented — not only in France but also in Germany (e.g. Ferdinand von Lindemann (1904) and Emil Meunier (1919))— and his geometric conventionalism also greatly influenced the logical empiricists, who were linked to Poincaré’s follower Louis Rougier (Rougier 1920), one of the organizers of the 1935 Paris congress on scientific philosophy. Poincaré’s conventionalism was widely discussed again in the post-WWII literature on spacetime and relativity theory in the philosophy of science. His intervention in the philosophy of mathematics has been a source of great inspiration to critics of logicism and others. In the tradition of Kant and Mach, who excluded “metaphysical” speculations from philosophy of science, Poincaré is also considered to be one of the founders of this field as a discipline (Brenner 2003; Moulines 2006). Poincaré is considered the founder of structural realism and is thought to have held a productive middle of the road position on scientific realism (Worrall 1989). His discussion of scientific creativity has spawned a literature of its own and became a standard account of how scientific creativity works. His work on the stability of the solar system influenced the development of chaos theory and the classical concept of causality based on the fact that similar causes produce similar effects. Poincaré is one of the starting points for arguments showing the compatibility of ontological determinism and epistemological indeterminism. His famous recurrence theorem raised questions for statistical mechanics and his work on probability theory influenced the early work of Hans Reichenbach (Glymour and Eberhardt 2012).

Insofar as Poincaré’s philosophical views focus on the comprehension and explanation of the activities and practice of mathematicians and scientists, his approach seems more current today than the approach of the logical empiricists, given that the contemporary “practical turn” in the philosophy of science pays less tribute to logic and the foundations of mathematics by formal representation than did the canonical tradition of the 20th century philosophy of science. His approach restores the depth to some of the critical discussions that the Vienna Circle undertook in the spirit of Poincaré from the 1930s onward (Heinzmann 2016). Though they are missing from standard histories in philosophy of science, the Swiss philosopher Ferdinand Gonseth, the French philosophers Jean Cavaillès and Albert Lautman, the Italian epistemologist Federico Enriques and, finally, Jean Piaget, all have in common a focus on mathematical practice that rejects the logical empiricists’ strict distinction of analytic and synthetic propositions.

Poincaré is often invoked in the philosophy of mathematics because of his discussions of the paradoxes and his diagnosis, which became the vicious circle principle. According to Poincaré’s pragmatic and anti-Platonist standpoint, mathematical definitions and proof-procedures should be limited to predicative ones. Herman Weyl (1918) was the first to propose a predicative continuum, while later Lorenzen (1955, 1965) and, especially, Kreisel (1960) and Feferman (1964) each tried to find predicatively definable sets following Poincaré’s rough sketch. Hintikka (2012) argues that logicians and mathematicians did not know how to implement Poincaré’s insight because they did not pay enough attention to the quantifier dependence and independence and proposes a solution with IF-logic. Poincaré’s critical remarks about the logicist project and about the new logic in general have been evaluated many times and continue to be discussed in the literature and to inspire those with sympathy towards intuitionistic or Kantian points of view (Cassirer 1910; Dingler 1931; Folina 1992; Goldfarb 1988; Heinzmann 1995). Although the influences on Wittgenstein’s work are notoriously difficult to interpret, there are clearly evident similarities to Poincaré’s fundamental views (Rodych 2011).

Moritz Schlick is mainly responsible for bringing an interpretation of Poincaré’s conventionalism to the Logical Empiricists. In particular, he advocated Poincaré’s conventionalism (or at least what he thought of as Poincaré’s conventionalism) in letters to Hans Reichenbach in regards to Reichenbach’s 1920 book The Theory of Relativity and A Priori Knowledge (Coffa 1991, Parrini 1998, Friedman 1999; Oberdan 2009). Later, however, Schlick criticized generalized conventionalism in his reprinted and widely-read article of 1935 “Are Natural Laws Conventions?” Reichenbach took up geometric conventionalism in his Philosophy of Space and Time (1928) and Carnap generalized conventions, taking them to be the adoption of a formal language of science. Poincaré was widely cited and discussed in the heyday of the Logical Empiricists, though the meaning of his conventionalism is often distorted, for example, when Popper characterizes Poincaré’s conventions as analytic judgments (Popper 2007: chap. VIII). Einstein’s interpretation of Poincaré in his important article “Geometry and Experience” is emblematic of the fate of his geometric conventionalism in the philosophical literature. Einstein says there that although current physics (i.e., the General Theory of Relativity) is not in accord with Poincaré’s views, he is correct “sub specie aeterni,” that is in principle in an ideal physics (Einstein 1921). Thus the specific geometric conventionalism that Poincaré advocated was opposed, but a generalized form of conventionalism was frequently embraced.

Although Poincaré’s ideas are not the central focus of the discussion of spacetime theories that blossomed in the 1960s and 1970s, his views are always in the background. Adolf Grünbaum (1968) defended geometric conventionalism, albeit with his own unique arguments rather than Poincaré’s, and critics of Grünbaum and of conventionalism generally could not help but direct some of their attention to Poincaré who was rightly seen as the preeminent precursor to all further work on geometric conventionalism. Some of this literature does directly engage with Poincaré, notably Torretti (1978).

In 1989 John Worrall published a paper defending structural realism as “the best of both worlds” in the debate over scientific realism, drawing his inspiration from Poincaré. The view came to be widely discussed in the philosophy of science and spawned further elaborations and differentiations into different types, such as ontic and epistemic structural realism (Worrall 1989; Ladyman 2009). Poincaré’s epistemological thesis that all statements depend, at least partially, on a conventional conceptual framework is generalized in Kasimir Ajdukiewicz’s radical conventionalism (Ajdukiewicz 1978) and is related to the Quinean notion that there are logically incompatible but empirically equivalent theories (Quine 1990: chap. 41). (See Poincaré 1905b: chap. X.3, which is embedded in the discussion about nominalism with his former pupil Édouard Le Roy for the limits that Poincaré places on these ideas, and (de Paz 2021) for more on the relation of Le Roy and Poincaré.))

Poincaré also spawned a large literature on scientific creativity with his brief account of his discovery while stepping onto an omnibus during an outing of the relation between Fuchsian (or automorphic) functions and non-Euclidean geometries:

At the moment when I put my foot on the step the idea came to me, without anything in my former thoughts seeming to have paved the way for it, that the transformation that I had used to define the Fuchsian functions were identical with those of non-Euclidean geometry. (1908: 49; 1913b: 387–388)

The story has been very widely cited and his four-step account of how one arrives at novel ideas has been adopted by those presenting the development of creative ideas in analogy with Darwinian blind variation, such as Donald Campbell (1987 [1960]: 99–100) and Dean K. Simonton (1988: 27–33; 1995: 468–86; 1999: 32–4); see Kronfeldner for a critical survey of the literature (2011: esp. 64–65). Poincaré’s creativity has also been analyzed and compared to that of other scientists, especially Einstein, by Arthur Miller (1984, 1992, 1996b, 1997).

Poincaré’s writings influenced artists (Henderson 1983), especially the cubist movement which associated their artistic approach to that occupied by non-Euclidean geometries in the history of geometry. In “the mathematician of Cubism” Maurice Princet closely studied the work of Poincaré (Décimo 2006) and how he influenced Picasso among others, and Albert Gleizes and Jean Metzinger (1912), the authors of the famous treatise “Du Cubisme” that provides theory to the artistic movement. Poincaré’s work combines the sensations produced by movement with the sense of touch (as in Science and Hypothesis) to create the fourth dimension. Maurits Cornelis Escher uses a paving motif of the Poincaré disk of the hyperbolic plane in order to represent an infinite structure in a finite space (see Dunham 2010 (Other Internet Resources), Figure 3, p. 3). Poincaré also directly influenced James Joyce, who experimented with non-linearity and topology in his depiction of events in his literature (McMorran 2020).


Selected Works of Poincaré Referenced Above

  • 1882, “Sur les Fonctions Fuchsiennes.” Comptes rendus hebdomadaires de l’Académie des sciences de Paris, 94: 1166–1167.
  • 1898, “On the Foundations of Geometry.” The Monist, 9: 1–43.
  • 1899, “Des Fondements de la Géométrie: A propos d’un Livre de M. Russell.” Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale, 7: 251–279.
  • 1900, “Sur les Principles de Géométrie: réponse à M. Russell.” Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale, 8: 73–86.
  • 1902, La Science et L’Hypothése, Paris: Flammarion, 1968. Translation in 1913b.
  • 1905a, “The Principles of Mathematical Physics.” in The Congress of Arts and Science, Universal Exposition St. Louis, Volume 1, Boston and New York: Houghton, Mifflin, 604–622.
  • 1905b, La Valeur de la Science, Paris: Flammarion, 1970. Translation in 1913b.
  • 1905c, “Les Mathématiques et la Logique.” Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale 13: 815–835.
  • 1906, “Sur la Dynamique de l’électron.” Rendiconti del Circolo Matematico di Palermo 21: 129–176. Cited according to the reprinting in: &Oelig;uvres, IX (1956): 494–550.
  • 1908, Science et Methode, Paris: Flammarion, 1920, rpt. Paris: Kimé, 1999. Translation in 1913b.
  • 1909, “La Logique de l’infini.” Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale, 17: 461–482.
  • 1913a, Dernières Pensées, Paris: Flammarion, 1963 (translated in Poincaré 1963).
  • 1913b, The Foundations of Science: Science and Hypothesis, The Value of Science, Science and Method, translations of Poincaré 1902, 1905b & 1908, University Press of America, 1982.
  • 1921, “Rapport sur les Travaux de M. Cartan (fait à la Faculté des sciences de l’Université de Paris).” Acta Mathematica, 38(1): 137–145.
  • 1956, Oeuvres, 11 Volumes. Paris: Gauthier-Villars.
  • 1963, Mathematics and Science: Last Essays, translation of Poincaré 1913a, New York: Dover.
  • 2017, Science and Hypothesis: The Complete Text (translation of Poincaré 1902), Mélanie Frappier, Andrea Smith, and David J. Stump (trans.), London and New York: Bloomsbury.

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Thanks go to Scott A. Walter and to an anonymous referee for helpful comments on a draft of this article.

Copyright © 2021 by
Gerhard Heinzmann <Gerhard.Heinzmann@univ-lorraine.fr>
David Stump <stumpd@usfca.edu>

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