First published Thu Feb 17, 2011

Philosophical proponents of progress assert that the human condition has improved over the course of history and will continue to improve. Doctrines of progress first appeared in 18th-century Europe and epitomize the optimism of that time and place. Belief in progress flourished in the 19th century. While skeptics of progress did exist alongside its supporters from the beginning, it was not until the 20th century that theorists backed away en masse from the notion. Many 20th-century thinkers rejected the notion of progress after horrendous events such as the two World Wars, the Holocaust, and the use of nuclear weaponry.

In general, writings on progress tend to bear a close relationship to the environment in which they were produced. Because of the strong connection between doctrines of progress and historical events, this article is organized by time and place. However, that principle of organization does not mean that each doctrine should not be assessed on its own merits. To help the reader, the next section briefly summarizes the conceptual framework that is used throughout the rest of the article.

1. Overview of Conceptual Issues

The problem of progress can be approached from many directions. Three questions will provide the starting points for this particular analysis. These are: (1) Does the theory under consideration rigorously define a conception of human well-being and, if so, what is it? (2) What causes of long-term improvement and, especially, what laws of historical development does the theorist propose? (3) What evidence or reasons does the theorist provide for the aforementioned causal account? Note that the first question is normative, the second belongs to social science, and the third is methodological and epistemological.

To argue successfully that human well-being is increasing over the long term, theorists of progress must offer an interpretation of well-being compatible with that claim. They are committed either to interpret human well-being as a single value, or as a set of incommensurable values that are empirically connected. In the first case, value monism, the list of compelling alternatives is not long. It includes freedom, happiness or utility, and the realization of human capabilities. In the second case, theorists can draw on a wider range of values, but will have to show that the incommensurable components of human well-being reinforce each other causally or at least do not clash. As we will see, faced with the difficulties of the task, some theorists do not define well-being rigorously. They may, however, formulate a conception of improvement for a circumscribed domain of social life, the description of which is a part of their overall account.

Next, each theorist of progress offers a causal story to explain the improvement in the human condition that he thinks has occurred. The notion of a universal history, a historical narrative taking all of humanity as its subject, came to prominence during the Enlightenment. Universal historians aspired to surpass ordinary historians in breadth and depth and aimed to penetrate the surface play of events to discover fundamental laws of historical development. These laws would not only explain the past, but could be used to predict the future. Although a universal history need not be an account of improvement, all accounts of progress rest explicitly or implicitly on a universal history.

The content of the laws of progress, however, is an object of contention. Many thinkers, including Hegel and Auguste Comte, view the development of ideas over time as the fundamental change that causes overall improvement. Marx, in contrast, regards the growth of the means of production as primary. Kant represents a third category, arguing that a tension within human nature itself is the source of change. We will also see theorists who offer more eclectic causal stories and, because their accounts of change are more complicated, are less inclined to formalize their conclusions. Next to content, thinkers differ in their treatment of episodes of devastation and conflict and periods of decline. It is hard for anyone to sustain the argument that improvement is perfectly linear, but some theorists more than others emphasize that such episodes and eras can be part of a pattern of long-term improvement. Furthermore, the extent to which the laws are deterministic varies. Some authors leave little room for choice and contingency, while others frame their generalizations as loose trends that constrain rather than determine the course of events. Authors in the latter category often present their writings as political interventions that can shape the future as well as predict it.

Finally, the question of method arises. Most of the authors treated in this study wrote before quantitative and statistical methods in the social sciences became widespread. Nevertheless, they do remark on method, in some cases in detail. The most striking distinction is between those who rely on a priori reasoning and those who generalize from empirical facts in a social scientific fashion. While this study will not concentrate on method, a priori reasoning and problematic empirical assumptions will be attended to.

2. Pre-Enlightenment Thought

Whether any ancient philosophers proposed a doctrine of progress is a matter of scholarly contention (Bury 1932, 11; Nesbit 1994, xi). However, it is clear that the figures of antiquity who exerted the most influence on later thinkers did not believe in progress in the robust sense used in this article.

Plato and Aristotle hold a cyclical view of human affairs. They allow that certain developments occur spontaneously, but also see disaster and decline as inevitable. In the Laws, Plato proposes that human society begins with the family, then moves through intermediate forms, and finally arrives at the city-state (680a-682d). In the Politics, Aristotle also presents this progression of forms (1252a24–1253a4). Not only is man a political animal as a matter of fact (Politics, 1253a2), it is also true that human excellence is only possible within a city-state with a good constitution. But unhappily there is no tendency for the city-state, once achieved, to realize or maintain such a constitution. For instance, while Aristotle cautiously admits that laws can and should improve (1269a12–14), Book V of the Politics shows that all constitutional forms—bad and good—are unstable.

Large-scale natural events also play an important role in Plato and Aristotle's presentation of human affairs. In the Statesman, Plato adopts the traditional Greek story of a golden age and a subsequent decline, written down by Hesiod in Works and Days. Hesiod tells the story of five races of men: the golden race (Lines 109–120), the silver race (121–139), the bronze race (140–155), the demi-gods (156–169b), and the iron race (170–201). The golden race is the best of all, and the present race, the iron race, is the worst. According to Plato's story, the ages described by Hesiod correspond to parts of a cycle during which the earth rotates first in one direction and then in another. While the earth moves in the first direction, the gods oversee the affairs of mankind. As a herdsman looks after his flock, the gods tend to the needs of human beings. Because they are under the perfect care of the gods, humans do not need to govern themselves (Statesman, 271e-272a). Plato suggests that the golden age, the era of the golden race, occurred during such a period. When the earth changes course, a period of chaos ensues, which corresponds to the end of the golden age. Finally, when the earth moves in the second direction, people are left on their own, which explains the other ages described by Hesiod. In the Laws, Plato does not return to this elaborate myth, but endorses the view that “the human race has been repeatedly annihilated by floods and plagues and many other causes, so that only a fraction of it survived” (Laws, 677a). Aristotle also entertains the possibility of periodic flooding (Meteorology, 352a29–32) and suggests that myths may contain the remnants of the wisdom of destroyed civilizations (Metaphysics, 1074b9–13).

After Plato and Aristotle, the most influential early philosopher is St. Augustine of Hippo (354–430 C.E.). In The City of God against the Pagans, Augustine presents a radically new, Christian vision of human history. Some humans, God's elect, are predestined for heaven. The rest of humanity is predestined for damnation. Those who are saved belong to the “City of God” and those who are damned belong to the “City of man” (426, XV.1). Augustine rejects cyclical accounts of human affairs for a linear one. He is especially concerned to repudiate the doctrine of eternal recurrence, which says that events identical in all respects repeat over and over again. He emphasizes that the birth, death, and resurrection of Christ are unique occurrences (426, XII.14) and compares the history of the elect to an individual life (426, X.14).

Insofar as it is linear, Augustine's narrative of salvation resembles doctrines of progress. But his emphasis on the City of God contrasts with the worldly, inclusive vision of theorists of progress. As we will see, these theorists are concerned with humanity as a whole, rather than with a part of it. And their focus is on earth rather than on heaven.

3. Enlightenment Views on Progress

The writings on progress of the 18th century drew inspiration from the intellectual achievements of the 16th and 17th centuries. During this time, Europe witnessed an explosion of scientific and mathematical activity. In the natural sciences, the main fields of investigation were physics and astronomy. Major figures included Copernicus (1473–1543), Galileo (1564–1642), Kepler (1571–1630), and Newton (1642–1727). Newton synthesized the work of the previous thinkers to bring the behavior of bodies on earth and bodies in space under a single scientific law, the law of universal gravitation. This law states that two bodies attract each other in proportion to their masses and in inverse proportion to the square of the distance between them (Palmer 1965, 265–271).

The discoveries of these scientists had broad implications. First of all, the success of the new physics in unifying distinct phenomena and predicting behavior vindicated an underlying paradigm of scientific investigation and explanation. Second, the rapid gains encouraged an optimistic view of humans' capability to understand and shape their world. Here was a clear example of a communal activity in which one human built on and improved the work of his predecessor. The activity resulted in the discovery of a scientific law, the law of universal gravitation, of unprecedented power (Palmer 1965, 271–273).

Two thinkers of the French Enlightenment, Anne-Robert-Jacques Turgot, Baron de Laume (1727-81), and Marie Jean Caritat, Marquis de Condorcet (1743-1794), integrated reflection on scientific discoveries into their writings on progress. Turgot, a minister to Louis XVI, produced two influential works, A Philosophical Review of the Successive Advances of the Human Mind and On Universal History. Condorcet was inspired by Turgot to write Outlines of an historical view of the Progress of the human mind, a piece that echoes many of Turgot's convictions. Although Condorcet wrote his essay in prison during the Terror, he, like Turgot, evinces optimism about the future of France and of humanity as a whole.

Both authors suggest that philosophical progress is the deepest condition of scientific progress. Influenced by British empiricism, Turgot and Condorcet assert that all human knowledge is grounded in experience. According to Turgot, the renaissance of science first required an empiricist turn, the abandoning of explanations appealing to faculties and essences. The scientific experiment then found its place as the centerpiece of the scientific method and the vehicle of further progress (Turgot 1750, 45; 1751, 100–01). Condorcet reiterates these points and also provides a wealth of examples of recent scientific discoveries (1795, 168–170). Turgot and Condorcet agree that scientific progress is dependent on mathematical and technological progress, and vice versa (Turgot 1750, 45; Condorcet 1795, 231).

Although neither author rigorously defines human well-being, both believe that, over the long term, scientific discoveries and political freedom reinforce each other and together further it. Turgot considers the role that political institutions play in advancing science. He thinks that individual genius moves science forward. Political institutions are important to scientific progress insofar as they allow geniuses to flourish. Variation in scientific achievement is to be explained not by the concentration of genius but by the institutions that either suppress or encourage it (1751, 88). Despotic government is bad for genius, while republics nurture it. Condorcet also remarks that free institutions are the native environment of scientific discovery (1795, 129). In turn, the growth of scientific knowledge will advance political freedom (Turgot 1750, 43).

Turgot and Condorcet also hold that short-term decline can be part of a pattern of long-term improvement. In the intellectual realm, the path to truth is rocky, and errors are frequently the first result of reflection (Turgot 1750, 44; Condorcet 1795, 37–38). For instance, the false scientific philosophy of faculties and essences is born of reflection on phenomena. In the realm of action, devastating events like war and conquest can ultimately unite scattered groups of people and ameliorate political organization (Turgot 1751, 71–2; Condorcet 1795, 51). Moreover, Turgot argues that individuals and groups that contribute to progress are often motivated by emotion or personal interest (1751, 69–70). The second observation is related to the first, since Turgot thinks that the agents of creative destruction are usually narrowly self-interested or emotion-driven.

Despite their many common convictions, Condorcet and Turgot part ways on the question of religion. Turgot is generally positive about Christianity, while a significant part of Condorcet's essay consists of polemics against religion and especially priests (1795, 123–124). Condorcet states that as scientific knowledge spreads, an enlightened population will throw off the shackles of religion and its priests and demand greater freedom.

The Scottish and French Enlightenment were roughly contemporaneous and grappled with the same social phenomena. It is difficult to draw hard and fast contrasts between the two bodies of thought, and better to consider individual authors. So we turn to writings of David Hume (1711–1776), which are characterized by both naturalism and skepticism. Hume's essays on political questions reflect his general philosophical orientation. Although he is less likely than Condorcet and Turgot to make sweeping comments about progress, he explores the topic of social development in various interesting ways.

In “Of the Rise and Progress of the Arts and Sciences,” Hume connects political and intellectual development. He begins with the presumption that scientific and artistic progress requires a background of political security. From this claim, he argues that the arts and sciences cannot arise in a society without the rule of law. Hume also asserts that no monarchy can develop the rule of law on its own, while republics must develop the rule of law if they are to survive at all. He concludes that the arts and sciences first emerge in republics, not monarchies (1777, 59–62).

Although the arts and sciences have their rise in republics, they may be transplanted into “civilized monarchies” (67) and continue to improve in that environment. Civilized monarchies are those that have learned the rule of law from neighboring republics. Hume even says that the arts progress more quickly in civilized monarchies than in republics, because they are useful for flattering monarchs. On the other hand, according to Hume, the general population is more impressed by scientific discoveries with obvious technological applications than by artistic creations. Therefore the sciences progress more quickly in republics, in which the general public holds power, than in monarchies (68–69).

Hume thinks that countries can affect each other's progress. For instance, competition can spur greater progress, and isolation can cause a country to stall (64–5). On the other hand, countries can intimidate each other into inactivity (76). Hume also asserts that the arts and sciences cannot progress indefinitely in a single country. Once they reach a certain height, members of the next generation are too intimidated by their predecessors to strike out on their own (75–76).

A second Scottish Enlightenment figure, Adam Smith (1723–1790), is often regarded as an economist, but in fact he began his career as a philosopher. His first work, The Theory of the Moral Sentiments, addressed the philosophy of moral judgment and action. It is therefore not surprising that the Wealth of Nations, the work on economic growth for which he is best known, has a deeper philosophical resonance.

Smith's central observation is that, in economic life, it often happens that individuals in pursuit of their self-interest nevertheless contribute to the common good (1776, 484–485). It is as though they are “led by an invisible hand” (485) to take socially beneficial actions. For instance, Smith argues that the division of labor is the spontaneous outcome of the human “propensity to truck, barter, and exchange one thing for another” (14). Humans engage in this activity for self-interested reasons. But growth in the productivity of labor in a society is largely due to a greater division of labor (3). It is because of a greater division of labor, Smith contends, that the poorest members of European countries are richer than the richest members of societies in other parts of the world (13).

Failure to see the work of the invisible hand will lead to unwise policies. Smith says that, in the absence of government intervention, self-interest leads each nation to produce only the goods in which it has a comparative advantage. Self-interested behavior in the presence of government attempts to support domestic industries actually results in a worse outcome. One goal of the book is admittedly practical: to attack mercantilism, the doctrine that dominated economic policy in Europe from the 16th century onward. Mercantilism holds that aggressive government intervention is the key to increasing national wealth. Accordingly, during this time, the governments of Europe attempted to steer and promote domestic industries, most notably by placing high tariffs on foreign imports (Palmer 1965, 102). Smith argues against these policies. He writes that tariffs on imports harm the nation as a whole, by misdirecting its resources (1776, 485–487). In general, he says, the government should play a circumscribed role in the economic life of a country, confining itself to the protection of property rights, the support of a national defense force, and the provision of a few other key public goods (745).

Smith's emphasis on spontaneous improvement in economic life warrants treating him as a theorist of progress. But, given his worries about mercantilism, it is clear he thinks that this type of development is fragile. Nations will not maximize their wealth unless they have the wisdom to allow spontaneous growth to occur. Smith intends the Wealth of Nations to help policy makers recognize the phenomena that he believes to have correctly identified.

The thinkers of the Scottish and French Enlightenment authors are empiricists. Unlike them, the German Enlightenment figure Immanuel Kant (1724–1804) reasons in an a priori manner to the conclusion that humanity is progressing. Kant's writings on progress consist of a series of short pieces from the 1780s and 90s, including “Ideas toward a Universal History with Cosmopolitan Intent,” and “Perpetual Peace.” In addition to its reliance on a priori reasoning, Kant's work is noteworthy for its emphasis on world peace and its detailed description of the domestic and international institutions needed for peaceful conditions.

Kant remarks that certain trends are compatible with progress, but cautions that no trajectory can be inferred with certainty from the facts (1784, 50). His a priori argument begins with the premise that all animals have natural faculties. If nature is not to be in vain, we must assume that the faculties of an animal can be developed. Unlike other animals, the human being cannot develop all of its faculties in a lifetime. If the faculties given to humans are not to be considered useless, then the only other possibility is that the human race as a whole, over time, will develop all the human faculties (1784, 42–44). The progress from one era to another is measured by the development of human faculties during that time.

Kant thinks that human faculties can reach their fullest expression only in free and peaceful circumstances (1784, 50), which in turn require a particular set of institutions. A federation of republics will mark the final stage of human development. A republic is a state based on the rule of law whose members are free and equal citizens (1795, 99). A federation is a group of nations who have agreed to observe rules of peaceful conduct in their mutual relations (1795, 98ff). Kant argues that the domestic and international features of this institutional constellation will reinforce each other. Republics will not go to war with each other because a declaration of war requires the consent of the public, who are reluctant to pay a war's price (1795, 100). In turn, domestic conditions will be improved in the absence of a state's constant involvement in wars (1784, 49).

The details of the development toward the peaceful federation are given by Kant's universal history. This narrative is presented as, at best, consistent with empirical evidence. Kant argues that, for the most part, human psychology and the natural environment, rather than human reason, could have driven the human race forward. First, he attributes progress to the “unsocial sociability” (1784, 44) of human beings. Humans are social because they cannot develop their capabilities in isolation. Yet they are unsocial because they always want to get their own way. These characteristics lead them to form associations in which all vie for “status” (1784, 44). These associations are the seeds of republics. But progressive human activity need not be lacking in awareness. Kant maintains that a philosophy of progress can accelerate progress (1784, 51).

4. 19th-Century Views on Progress

The 19th-century writers on progress took up and elaborated the notion that conflict is an essential part of a progressive narrative. G.W.F. Hegel (1770–1831) is an example of such a writer. Hegel does not give a straightforward account of human progress. But he puts a version of universal history at the center of his metaphysics, from which a narrative of progress can be derived. According to Hegel, the world as a whole is in the process of development through conflict. Part of the world's development is the self-realization of its spiritual aspect, known simply as Geist, or Spirit. The freedom of Spirit is achieved through the achievement of free social institutions and free human beings. So, we look to human history to understand the realization of Spirit. Conversely we recognize that the self-realization of Spirit, an entity not reducible to humanity, is the true meaning of human history.

The state is crucial to Hegel's philosophy of history. For Hegel, the state is the “march of God [Spirit] in the world” (1821, §258Z). At any point in time, a state or group of states represent the highest point achieved by humanity thus far. Hegel thinks that at the time of his writing, the states of Western Europe play this role. In the Philosophy of Right, he argues that these states, however imperfectly, combine individual freedom with social unity into one enduring whole. The political constitution of the society he describes is a constitutional monarchy. It approximates the never-adopted constitution that Prussian reformers drew up in 1819 (Wood 1990, 13).

History, according to Hegel's metaphysical account, is driven by ideological development. Ideological—and therefore historical—change occurs when a new idea is nurtured in the environment of the old one, and eventually overtakes it. Thus development necessarily involves periods of conflict when the old and new ideas clash. A second account of change is contained in the master-slave dialectic of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit (1807, 143–152; 192–198 ). Certain forms of social hierarchy are intrinsically unstable. The human desire for recognition drives social development, which consists of repeated struggles for recognition, until it reaches the liberal solution. In the liberal state, slave and masters are abolished, and all recognize all as free and equal. This arrangement lacks the contradictions inherent in previous social forms.

According to Hegel, conflict occurs within and between states. But “world-historical” (1988, 35) individuals, like Napolean Bonaparte, also have a key part to play in driving history forward. These great men are often motivated by narrow, personal goals. Hegel paints a disturbing picture of the historical tendency of great men to “trample” on and use ordinary ones, but he thinks great men are ultimately tools as well—of Spirit and its self-realization (1988, 35). Hegel's justification of war and destruction in the name of progress reflects his overall philosophy. He holds that we can be reconciled to negative elements by seeing their place within a larger pattern. In the Phenomenology of Spirit, he summarizes his thesis in the following slogan: “The true is the whole” (1807, 11).

Finally, in contrast to Kant, Hegel thinks that war is more than an engine of progress. Hegel argues that, without war, individuals in liberal societies become self-absorbed and weak, unwilling to work for the common good. There is moreover no outlet for human aggression. For these reasons, war is ineliminable. It will be a feature even of the rational system of states that marks the end of historical development.

Karl Marx (1818–1883) adopted Hegel's single-factor model of historical development but “turned [Hegel] right side up” (1873, 302) by replacing his idealism with materialism. According to Marx, the fundamental fact about a society at a given moment is not its ideological orientation but rather its “productive forces” (1845, 150), by which Marx means its material and technological resources. Over the long run, the productive forces determine other aspects of the society, starting with the relations of production, the informal and formal rules that define and regulate property (1845, 151). Marx builds on these assumptions to define capitalism and communism and to predict the former's eventual transformation into the latter.

Like Hegel, Marx asserts that conflict drives historical development. But in Marx's account, conflict occurs when the productive forces outgrow the relations of production (1845, 196). A different class of society represents each side of the conflict. The class that benefits from the outmoded relations of production seeks to maintain them, while the losing class seeks to destroy them and replace them. For instance, capitalism emerged from feudal aristocracy when the merchants, through revolution, rewrote the laws in their favor (1848, 477–8, 484). Capitalism is a system in which land and labor are commodities able to be bought and sold on the free market. Marx predicts that communism will emerge from capitalism because the productive forces developed within a capitalist society will eventually make capitalist property rights unworkable (1848, 477). At this point, the working class, or proletariat, will successfully overthrow the old order (1845, 161–2).

Marx's philosophy of history can seem like a deterministic materialism that ignores ideas and passes no judgment on the change it describes. However, this picture is incomplete. First of all, Marx thinks that consciousness of historical trends will guide at least some of the future revolutionaries (1848, 481). Second, Marx clearly thinks that communism is superior to capitalism because it eliminates barriers to freedom such as alienation and exploitation and replaces them with a community of free producers (1845, 197). Marx's early writings—published after his death—show that the value of freedom was as central a concern for him as it was for Kant or Hegel.

Among 19th-century thinkers, the French sociologist Auguste Comte (1798–1857) puts relatively little emphasis on violence and struggle as a source of change. Comte actually coined the term “Sociology” (1853 v. 2, 201) to describe the scientific treatment of human societies and their development. Comte saw himself as giving sociology its content in addition to its name. But many of his arguments are not particularly original, including his most fundamental claim, that intellectual improvement drives progress (v. 2, 307). His real contribution is to claim that intellectual development should be understood as change in the form of explanation employed by individuals seeking to understand the world. The form of explanation affects social life insofar as it corresponds to a way of predicting and manipulating events. It is true that this argument is implicit in the writings of earlier thinkers such as Turgot and Condorcet. But, unlike his predecessors, Comte works it out systematically.

Comte's main sociological law is that every science goes through three stages, which he terms the theological, the metaphysical, and the positive (1853, v. 1, 2). In the theological stage, scientific explanation is governed by the assumption that natural events are caused by divinities. In turn, humans attempt to affect natural outcomes by appealing directly to the gods or God to take action. The metaphysical stage follows, in which phenomena are explained by referring to the abstract essences that entities are supposed to possess. The third phase, the positive phase, explains phenomena by formulating scientific laws and then subsuming individual phenomena under them (2). Humans cannot change these laws, but they can use their knowledge of them to predict and shape events. The positive stage is the most modest in its epistemological aspirations. Unlike the other two, it organizes appearances rather than looking beyond them (v. 1, 2, 4). However, it is the most successful of the three stages in guiding human intervention into nature. This is no accident, since the same practical concerns that motivate scientific activity drive scientific development. For Comte, the ultimate motivation for scientific activity is practical: “From Science Comes Prevision: From Prevision Comes Action” (1853, v. 1, 21).

While Comte holds that the driving force of human progress is intellectual development, he asserts that progress itself consists in moral improvement. Comte refrains from claiming that humans are becoming subjectively happier (1853, v. 2, 232). Instead, despite his rejection of Aristotelian metaphysics, Comte invokes a form of human flourishing akin to Aristotle's in the Nicomachean Ethics (1097b22–1098a17). Comte claims that human excellence is exercising the uniquely human capacity for reason. The human race is progressing because humans are becoming more rational and less emotional (v. 2, 299).

In the final part of his career, Comte turned his attention to political theory. He had already rejected as “metaphysical” certain building blocks of the theory of liberal democracy, including popular sovereignty (1853, v. 2, 155–6) and liberty of conscience (v. 2, 151). In System of Positive Polity, he envisions a socialist society governed by a few unelected officials, who are in turn educated and advised by an elite priesthood of social scientists (1875 (51), 82). Guided by the principle that the temporal and spiritual powers of society should be separate, Comte emphasizes that the priests of positivism should not exercise political leadership themselves (170). Comte appeals to the same principle to justify the exclusion of women from public life (197). He explains that women wield spiritual power as mothers and wives (260–1), and their spiritual authority would be jeopardized if they were to pursue a vocation outside the family.

John Stuart Mill (1806–1873), Comte's contemporary, admired his progressive philosophy of history (Mill 1865, 106) and shared his respect for scientific expertise (97). But Mill was disappointed by Comte's basic distaste for democratic freedom and individuality (Mill 1865, 181). Unlike Comte, Mill thought that a strong, scientifically oriented society could be a liberal democracy. Such a society would best maintain the gains already achieved and nurture further improvement. Mill articulates his twin commitment to progress and liberal democracy in his major writings, including A System of Logic (1843), Utilitarianism (1861), On Liberty (1859), and On Representative Government (1861).

Mill's writings establish connections among utility, liberty, and political institutions. Like his father, James Mill, and Jeremy Bentham, Mill is a utilitarian. Utility, or aggregate pleasure (1861b, 137), provides the ultimate standard for comparing two historical eras or two contemporaneous societies. The claim that humanity is progressing means that utility is increasing over time. Then, in A System of Logic, Mill, following Comte (606), argues that the development of ideas drives the development of society as a whole (604). Finally, in On Liberty and On Representative Government, Mill considers how a society's institutions can retard or accelerate ideological development.

Mill thinks that it is impossible to find a single set of institutions that is progressive for all times and places. The most that we can do is to specify what institutions are best for societies at a given level of civilization. Mill controversially argues that despotic governments may push “barbarians” to the next level of civilization (1859, 14–15). But Mill argues that in more advanced societies, free institutions promote further progress. They do so by allowing ideological conflict, which is a powerful engine of ideological development. Mill worries about the transition from one set of institutions to another. Civilizations can reach a certain level of development and then stagnate because they do not undergo institutional change (1861a, 234–5).

Despite his reputation as a classic Victorian progressive, Mill is more cautious and less deterministic than the other 19th-century writers treated by this essay. He believes that continued improvement is possible, but not by any means inevitable. Progress in Europe will come to a halt if institutions silence society's creative members (1859, 80–82). Mill's works derive their urgency from the fact that he clearly thinks they can make a real difference. On Liberty focuses on the argument for government non-interference. On Representative Government discusses some of the ways that democratic institutions could be reformed to promote different points of view actively.

A fellow Victorian philosopher, Herbert Spencer (1820–1903) is much more deterministic than Mill. Spencer views human progress as one aspect of a universe in perpetual development. Spencer constructs his explanatory framework from materials from the biological sciences. He is keenly interested in theories of biological evolution, both Lamarckian and then Darwinian.

Understanding Spencer's theoretical orientation requires some background in 19th-century biology. Darwin's theory of evolution was not the first modern attempt to account for diversity of life on the planet without invoking an act of divine creation (Levins and Lewontin, 1985, 27–28). Jean-Baptiste Lamarck (1744–1829) explained the apparent match between each animal species and its environment by positing that individual animals could acquire and pass on adaptive characteristics. This explanation requires, first of all, that animals strive to adapt to their environment. Second, it requires that the animals change physically as a result of their efforts, and third, that they pass on their acquired characteristics to their offspring (Levins and Lewontin, 30). In contrast, Darwin hypothesized that randomly occurring variation among individual organisms could be preserved or destroyed in the population of organisms through differential reproductive success. That is, he conjectured that some characteristics are correlated with the ability to produce a greater number of offspring. These characteristics will tend to increase in a population over time. Darwin called this mechanism natural selection. Natural selection bypasses the problematic assumption that individual organisms could alter themselves through deliberate effort. Yet it can still explain why organisms seem to fit into their natural environment so well (Levins and Lewontin, 1985, 31–34).

In Social Statics, Spencer asserts that evil is never permanent (59). He reasons to this conclusion from two premises. First, he defines evil as the “non-adaptation of constitution to conditions” (1841, 59). Second, he claims that all living beings gradually change to fit into their environment (59–60). He lists a great number of natural phenomena that supposedly illustrate this law (60). At the point of writing, Spencer was a Lamarckian, but he later maintained essentially this argument as a proponent of Darwinism. Evil in the human sense exists because human beings, by virtue of their selfishness, are unsuited to social living. But this variety of evil, like all evil, will pass away as humans adapt to their circumstances. He defines progress as the evolution of humans from selfishness to selflessness (1841, 63).

In “Progress, its Law and Cause,” Spencer makes a different argument. He defines progress as “an advance from homogeneity of structure to heterogeneity of structure” (1857, v. 1, 9). Progress occurs by way of “successive differentiations” (10). The law of progress is simply that “every active force produces more than one change—every cause produces more than one effect” (37). Spencer claims that all phenomena exhibit the same development from the simple to the complex for this same reason. He finds evidence for progress in astronomy (10–11), geology (12–13), and linguistics (23–4).

The modern literature on progress generally argues that European science, culture, and institutions are the best in the world at the time the author is writing. But claims or insinuations that Europeans are biologically superior are rarer. Turgot, as we have seen, states that individual genius occurs as frequently among non-Europeans as among Europeans. Nor do Mill's claims for European superiority rest on biological arguments (1859, 80). In other words, the paradigmatic progress narrative shows Europeans setting the standards and then the rest of the world catching up until everyone is a full participant in an enlightened order.

The introduction of biological evolution into writings on progress enabled a new form of Eurocentrism, one founded on biological racism. Spencer enlists evolutionary theory to claim that different races of human beings exist and form a clear hierarchy: “The civilized man departs more widely from the general type of the placental mammalia than do the lower human races” (1857, 18). This includes mental characteristics: “Judging from the greater extent and variety of faculty he exhibits, we may infer that the civilized man has also a more complex or heterogenous nervous system than the uncivilized man” (1857, 18). Spencer's racism is central to his view of humans as a group and of human potential. Ultimately it calls into question whether he can be said truly to propose an account of progress.

5. Criticisms of the Doctrine of Progress

If the 19th century is the high water mark of progress narratives, the following period is the era of critics. In general, criticisms of the doctrine of progress fall into two categories. The first category contains straightforward denials of the claim that the human condition is improving. The second category consists of condemnations of the doctrine of progress on skeptical grounds.

Consider the first group of criticisms. If the human condition is not improving, either circumstances are getting worse, or they are fluctuating between some upper and lower bound. Each alternative is certainly arguable. Horrific human catastrophes, such as the genocides, wars, and environmental destruction of the 20th century, can bolster the argument that things are getting worse. But less dramatic evidence, like increasing alienation in industrialized societies, could be cited in support of the same claim. Then there are those who emphasize that natural limits will keep the human condition within certain bounds. Either the natural environment or human nature could place limits on improvement and, for that matter, on deterioration.

The previous criticisms take for granted that it makes sense to speak of the human condition as improving or declining. But one can question whether these statements are truly coherent. To vindicate such sweeping claims, it must be possible to construct an ordering of past, present, and future states of affairs. But, in reality, it is sometimes difficult even in the case of individuals to say whether changes have been improvements or not. Consider the person who is forced to reflect and regroup after a mild setback. In the period immediately after the setback, the person is less content but acting with greater autonomy. To evaluate the change in the person's state, we must treat the values of being content and being autonomous as commensurable, and some will argue that they are not. Evaluating a change in an entire society involves the same kinds of difficult comparisons, plus a whole collection of additional ones based on distributive concerns. For instance, if a society becomes wealthier and less egalitarian over time, is this an improvement or not? Finally, even if we think a complete ordering of states of affairs is achievable, we might question the use of dialectical accounts to justify violence and catastrophes. Why should we be reconciled to a violent war just because it set the stage for institutional improvement?

Other skeptical arguments point to the difficulty of inferring broad historical laws from available evidence. In pursuit of a universal history, most theorists refuse to create a priori accounts and instead rely on empirical inferences. It is possible to attack the grounds on which theorists infer trends from past and present social phenomena. For instance, it is a mistake to equate temporal and spatial distance. Theorists sometimes use contemporary reports of America or Africa to draw conclusions about an earlier time in Europe. Or, they take what they know about their own history and make assumptions about “primitive” societies based on that information. Finally, even if one accurately captures a trend, it is difficult to extrapolate into the future. If we view humans as free, as long as institutional arrangements leave room for choice, the future is not entirely predictable.

All these arguments appear in the writings of critics of progress. Providing a comprehensive survey of the critics is beyond the scope of this article. Instead, the next section will treat a few important authors who reject the doctrine of progress, as well as one who attempts to revive it. Not all of the critics considered are pessimists. One may point out the possibility of a bright future while emphasizing that it is up to humans to choose it.

6. The 20th Century and Beyond

Some of the deepest criticisms of progress were produced during and after the catastrophes and upheavals of the 20th century. Theodor Adorno (1903–1969) wrote Minima Moralia, a collection of short pieces, during World War II and its aftermath. This work addresses a variety of interlocking topics relating to fascism, capitalism, and the war. As a German and a Jew in exile, Adorno is concerned to confront Nazism and the Holocaust. Given his intellectual background as a scholar of Hegel and Marx, this confrontation takes the shape of a critique of Hegel's philosophy of history. Recall that Hegel claims that a reflective individual who surveys the course of history will be reconciled to tragedies when he understands their contribution to progress overall. Adorno is viscerally repulsed by this notion. He notes with indignation: “Millions of Jews have been murdered, and this is to be seen as an interlude and not as the catastrophe itself” (1951, 55).

Adorno attacks Hegel from two directions. First Adorno is simply skeptical that fascism and the Holocaust can be part of any upward historical trend (55–6). Second, he points to a tension in Hegel's own thought. He notes that, in the Phenomenology of Spirit, Hegel advises “tarrying with the negative” (1807, §32), which means giving the negative moments in history a full dose of philosophical attention. However, Adorno says, in practice Hegel often moves past human evils and individual fates in a cursory fashion (1951, 16–17), hurrying toward the stage of reconcilation. Adorno proposes a new method of examining history for meaning, exemplified by Minima Moralia, that dwells on individual experience and catastrophe. Theoretically, Adorno reverses Hegel, asserting “the whole is the false” (Adorno 1951, 50).

In Minima Moralia, Adorno mentions that the writings of Walter Benjamin (1892–1940) are an inspiration to him. In the “Theses on History,” Benjamin offers a similar criticism of the Hegelian and Marxian philosophy of history. The ninth thesis perhaps speaks for itself:

A Klee painting named “Angelus Novus” shows an angel looking as though he is about to move away from something he is fixedly contemplating. His eyes are staring, his mouth is open, his wings are spread. This is how one pictures the angel of history. His face is turned toward the past. Where we perceive a chain of events, he sees one single catastrophe which keeps piling wreckage upon wreckage and hurls it in front of his feet. The angel would like to stay, awaken the dead, and make whole what has been smashed. But a storm is blowing from Paradise; it has caught in his wings with such violence that the angel can no longer close them. This storm irresistibly propels him into the future to which his back is turned, while the pile of debris before him grows skyward. This storm is what we call progress. (Benjamin 1941, 257–8)

Benjamin reverses the Hegelian worldview poetically, just as Adorno does so theoretically.

Decolonization presented a second occasion for rethinking the concept of progress. In the twenty years after World War II, the European powers relinquished the vast majority of the non-European colonies still in their possession (Hunt et. al. 1995, 996–99). Scholars from the former European colonies, reflecting on the colonial past, have noted that European apologists for colonialism claimed that it modernized the supposedly backward non-European world. In other words, the apologists situated colonialism in a progress narrative. Implicitly or explicitly, postcolonial critics hold that this use of the concept of progress calls it into question.

Beyond this common core, the criticisms offered vary. For instance, Samir Amin's study Eurocentrism is concerned to criticize a particular conception of progress. This conception, which he terms Eurocentrism, characterizes all major historical innovations as European. It also views capitalist democracy as the ideal social system and colonialism as instrumental in spreading it throughout the world (Amin 1988, 108). Finally, Eurocentricism holds that current global economic inequality is caused by internal features of individual countries (77) and is in principle eliminable (111). Now, Amin does not reject the project of identifying macro-historical movements. His reasoning is, in fact, influenced by Marxism. He seeks only to replace Eurocentrism with a truer account. To do so, he first presents an alternate sketch of historical development that shines light on non-European contributions. He next argues that current global inequality is produced by international capitalism and cannot be eradicated without dismantling that system (112–14). He ends by stating that some form of socialism is the only stable and humane political system, although it is far from inevitable (152).

Postmodern postcolonial theorists offer a more radical critique of European progress narratives than Amin does. Michel Foucault, the French historian of ideas, is a major influence on the school. Foucault holds that discourses are what constitute and empower the subjects that make history. Thus he takes discourses as the fundamental objects of historical study. In Orientalism, Edward Said (1935–2003) applies Foucault's method of discourse analysis to 18th-, 19th-, and 20th-century writings about the Middle East by British and French novelists, travelers, and academics (Said 1978, 201). At the heart of the discourse of Orientalism is the conviction that the countries of the Middle East lag behind those of Europe and can only improve under the tutelage of Europeans (172, 205–06). Said argues that the discourse of Orientalism laid the foundation for the colonial project and supported it once it was underway (210). In addition to Said, the historians of the subaltern studies movement have adapted a Foucauldian view of history, in their case to analyze Indian colonial history (Prakash 1994, 1480). They have drawn attention to historical actors they term “subaltern.” These are non-elite Indians that challenged the discourses of both colonialism and anti-British nationalism by exploiting inconsistencies in those discourses (1482–3). Although at odds in many ways, both discourses drew heavily from progress narratives (1475). In general, postmodern postcolonialists aim to show that the typical universal history is one discourse among many incommensurable discourses, none of which are without inconsistencies.

So far, we have seen how the events of the 20th century provoked criticisms of the typical European progress narrative. In contrast, the collapse of communism inspired a minor revival of the traditional progress narrative. In his 1989 article “The End of History?” Francis Fukuyama proclaims: “What we may be witnessing is not just the end of the Cold War … but the end of history as such: that is, the end point of mankind's ideological development and the universalization of Western liberal democracy as the final form of human government” (1989, 3). This article and its companion book, The End of History and the Last Man, endorse Hegelian social theory as Fukuyama interprets it. For Fukuyama, Hegel at once offers an idealist theory of social change and champions liberal democracy. Fukuyama argues that, according to Hegel, history entered its final phase when the principles of liberal democracy first motivated a world historical event, namely the French Revolution (1992, xvii; 199). After that crucial point, no more major developments were in store, but instead the gradual spread and realization of the liberal democratic ideal.

Of course, this argument was seriously challenged by the rise of fascism and communism in the 20th century and the conflicts that ensued. But Fukuyama in 1989 was maximally situated to defend Hegel and to argue that these ideological alternatives to liberal democracy were essentially deviations from deeper trends. According to Fukuyama, fascism clearly failed by the mid-century (16-17) and now, with the fall of the Soviet Union, it was evident that communism was also a dead end. Fukuyama states that the proximate cause of the Soviet regime's fall was its lack of legitimacy with the governing elite (30–1). The elite lost faith in the regime because they saw that it was ideologically bankrupt (31).

According to Fukuyama, liberalism's great ideological rivals failed in the long term for two reasons. First of all, communism has the wrong theory of economic management (40, 93–95), and could not provide long-term economic prosperity (28–29). Thus Marx's claim that capitalism was materially unstable proved true of communism instead. Second, following Hegel, Fukuyama asserts that only liberalism can satisfy the human desire for recognition in a stable fashion.

Fukuyama ends his book with an intriguing consideration of Hegel's view of war. Fukuyama agrees with Hegel that liberal democracy's greatest weakness is its tendency to produce selfish and effete bourgeois types. But he points out that war—at least modern war—is destructive rather than invigorating (1992, 335). He asserts that World War I was caused partly by widespread restlessness (331–332), but its result was to devastate rather than re-energize Europe (335). It may be that those who wish to abolish war are naive, but Fukuyama argues persuasively that Hegel's view of war is equally naive.

Unlike Fukuyama, John Rawls (1921–2002) never argues that the liberal democratic ideal is the necessary endpoint of historical development. Instead, Rawls's first priority is the justification of a particular conception of liberal justice, one that supports basic political and civil freedoms, and also dictates significant economic redistribution. At the same time, influenced by Kant and Hegel (2000, 330), Rawls is concerned to show that the ideal he describes is possible (1996, xx). By this, he means that it is reachable from the present and, once attained, capable of lasting “in perpetuity” (1971, 131; 1996, 18). He also intends for his demonstration of a just society's possibility to increase its probability: he claims that the Weimar Republic disintegrated into Nazism because its main players lost faith in the idea of a pluralistic society (1996, lxi–lxii).

Rawls defines a “well-ordered society” (1971, 4) as a just society whose members understand, endorse, and act from the principles of justice, and moreover are aware of each other's attitudes. A well-ordered society is “stable” (1971, 455) if its just institutions nurture rather than thwart the appropriate attitudes in its members. Thus a stable well-ordered society is one whose institutions are reproduced over time by informed, morally motivated citizens. Part III of A Theory of Justice argues that a society satisfying Rawlsian liberal principles of justice will be stable.

In Political Liberalism, Rawls yokes the question of the persistence of a liberal society to the question of its emergence. Rawls draws on familiar historical events to illustrate how his ideal society could emerge. He notes that freedom of religion started as a “modus vivendi” (1996, xli), or practical solution, to the wars of religion between Catholics and Protestants. Both groups agreed to the solution because they were exhausted by the fighting, not because they endorsed freedom of religion for its own sake. Yet over time Europeans came to endorse freedom of religion on deeper grounds than their immediate self-interest (xxv-xxvii).

Rawls thinks that political liberalism extends freedom of religion to moral worldviews in general. Thus he hopes that an analogous path could lead to the emergence of a well-ordered society. Individuals could first choose principles of justice as compromises to persistent moral disagreements, and over time come to endorse such principles for their own sake. Respectful public debate—what Rawls calls the use of “public reason” (1996, 213)—will aid the transformation (1996, 165–67). Over time a society of many competing worldviews—or “reasonable comprehensive doctrines”—can come to an “overlapping consensus” on principles of justice governing the public sphere (1996, 134). Other remarks suggest a different path to the same situation. Here Rawls suggests that his theory is an immanent working out of ideas already “embedded in our public life” (1980, 307). This ideological connection to the present should at least facilitate the emergence of a more just society. In this way, Rawls combines optimism and realism, rejecting the doctrine of progress but emphasizing the possibility of lasting improvement.

In contrast to Rawls' basic optimism, environmentalists have recently produced some of the most alarming criticisms of the idea of progress. Jared Diamond and Ronald Wright are examples. The authors share three basic theoretical commitments. First, they point to the natural environment as the most important determinant of long-term social stability and change. Next, they appeal to historical examples to argue that change is non-linear and that environmental variables explain the non-linearity. Then, extrapolating from past collapses, they argue that recent growth rates should not encourage optimism. Instead, global collapse is a real possibility.

Diamond's first book, Guns, Germs, and Steel (1997), begins with the Columbian encounter. Diamond asks why the Europeans conquered the Americans, rather than the other way around. Assuming that the answer lies with Europe's technological advantage over the Americas, Diamond arrives at a second question. Why, in the late 15th and early 16th centuries, did the Europeans have this advantage (1997, 15)? If all pre-historic peoples began roughly at the same starting point, this question implies a third: Why did pre-Columbian rates of development vary so much worldwide (16)? Appealing to recent research in scientific anthropology, Diamond argues that environmental variation satisfactorily accounts for the corresponding social and technological variation. Diamond defends the thesis that features of the natural environment, and the technology they directly enable, are the driving forces of long-run development (1997, 87).

Wright's A Short History of Progress (2004) also argues for the primacy of environmental variables, but shifts the focus away from differential rates of development. Wright states that what is truly surprising is the similarity among developmental paths in areas isolated from one another (2004, 50). In both Europe and the Americas, we see a movement from illiterate, egalitarian hunter-gatherer societies to complex and hierarchical agriculturally-based ones. At the time of their confrontation, the worlds of the Spanish and the Aztecs were more alike than they were different. Wright takes the similarity as strong evidence that universal environmental features and human needs drive development (51).

The trajectory from simplicity to complexity appears linear. But Wright and Diamond argue that appearances are misleading. Looking closely at human history, we see many instances of collapse. Understanding the cause of circumscribed collapses in the past will foster healthy skepticism about where the human race as a whole is headed. Wright looks at failed societies such as the kingdom of Ur, Ancient Maya and Rome, and Easter Island. Diamond's second book, Collapse (2005), considers some of the same failures. Failures occur when societies enter a progress trap (Wright 2004, 5). A progress trap is a practice that drives environmentally unsustainable growth and is difficult to halt once it is in motion. Although this definition of the term ‘progress trap’ is due to Wright, Diamond studies essentially the same phenomenon and traces the process in greater detail than Wright does.

Assume the growth of a society is determined by its ability to exploit the natural resources that it possesses. Assume that it will exploit them to its full potential. As the society grows, its ability to exploit its environment increases, which in turn causes it to develop further. Growth is not constant but accelerating. The society grows exactly up to the point at which its resources are depleted. At that moment, the rate of development and the level of development are at a maximum. Immediately afterwards, with the material foundation of society gone, a dramatic collapse occurs. Not only does past growth not mean future growth, the trajectory is virtually discontinuous at the moment of collapse.

This trajectory presupposes that the society makes no attempt to renew the resources on which it depends. Diamond isolates factors that explain the blindness, one especially important one being the adherence to dysfunctional value systems (432–434). Wright speaks of “sticking to entrenched beliefs and practices [and] robbing the future to pay the present” (2004, 79). For Diamond, the factors are changeable by individual and collective acts of will. Unlike Wright, Diamond documents successes as well as failures: societies that recognized and altered their unsustainable practices before it was too late. Historical examples of these include Tokugawa, Japan (2005, 294–306), and Tikopia, an island in the South Pacific (2005, 286–93). These societies were flexible and farsighted where unsuccessful ones were rigid and focused on the present.

Wright and Diamond see various aspects of the present as dangerous, including the growth of population and pollution (Wright 2002, 128), and the depletion of crucial resources (Diamond 2005, 487–490). These are the features of a civilization immediately before a collapse. Wright (2004, 64) and Diamond (2005, 118–119) suggest that increasing interconnectedness means that the globe will succeed as a whole or fail as a whole. But, ultimately, neither author is a complete environmental determinist or a complete pessimist. Diamond suggests that same kind of collective rationality that has prevented small-scale collapse can prevent global collapse (2005, 522). Unlike Diamond, Wright is not detailed in his recommendations for change and his vision of a truly sustainable globe remains murky. But he too thinks that in the next 100 years, individual and group choices will determine whether or not collapse occurs (2004, 130–132).

The idea of progress is complex enough that it has attracted many types of criticism, and some of them seem especially hard to refute. For one thing, the determinism inherent in the idea of progress is difficult to maintain. It is telling that many of the theorists do not incorporate their act of writing and the reception they hope for into a deterministic framework. Second, whether we agree with the precise claims made by Diamond and Wright, it is now clear that natural limits on growth exist. The exact limits cannot be known for certain unless they are reached. But rather than proceeding as if no environmental limits exist, it is more prudent to estimate the limits and develop policy accordingly. It is better to slow down and come to a halt a few feet before a brick wall than to ignore it and slam into it.

For those who reject the idea of progress for these or other reasons, why care about theories of progress? Not all components of the writings on progress are equally problematic. Three seem especially worthwhile. First, theories of progress draw attention to the power of the Western scientific paradigm. Next, some theorists of progress formulate plausible normative standards for individual domains of human life. Last, the writings on progress contain some of the most powerful statements of the Enlightenment ideals of freedom, equality, and cosmopolitan justice.


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Margaret Meek Lange

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