Few moral judgments are more intuitively obvious and more widely shared than that promises ought to be kept. It is in part this fixed place in our intuitive judgments that makes promises of particular interest to philosophers, as well as a host of social scientists and other theorists.
Another feature of promises that make them a topic of philosophical concern is their role in producing trust, and by so doing facilitating social coordination and cooperation. Because of this promises and related phenomena, such as vows, oaths, pledges, contracts, treaties and agreements more generally are important elements of justice and the law, and, at least in the Social Contract tradition, of the political order as well.
Promises are of special interest to ethical theorists, as they are generally taken to impose moral obligations. Thus an explanation of how such promissory obligations come about and how they function is necessary for a complete moral theory.
And if indeed promises produce moral obligations, they are of a peculiar sort. Unlike paradigmatic moral duties, the duty not to harm for example, promissory obligations are not owed equally to everyone, but rather only those we have promised. Further, promissory obligations are voluntary; we don’t have to make promises, but we must keep them when we do.
And promissory obligations aren’t just contingent upon acts of the will, like the obligations we might incur by deliberately damaging someone’s property, but (at least it seems on first reflection) they are immediately created by acts of the will. When I promise to do something, it seems that by so doing I have created the obligation to do it.
This last feature makes promissory obligations a special puzzle for ethical theories. The idea that we simply manufacture promissory obligations by speaking them, like an incantation, is decidedly mysterious. As Hume acidly remarked in the Treatise (1739–40):
I shall further observe, that, since every new promise imposes a new obligation of morality on the person who promises, and since this new obligation arises from his will; it is one of the most mysterious and incomprehensible operations that can possibly be imagined, and may even be compared to transubstantiation or holy orders, where a certain form of words, along with a certain intention, changes entirely the nature of an external object, and even of a human creature. (Treatise, 3.2.5; emphasis in the original)
The philosophical work on these topics is body of literature that spans the ages. Although promising as a phenomenon is rarely the sole subject of a major work, it is a subject treated by many major figures. From the ancients to the medievals to the moderns and beyond, theorists have sought to explain the normative force of promises. While the bulk of the corpus is in ethical and political theory and the related fields of legal theory and applied ethics, work on promises has also been done in the philosophy of language, action theory, rationality theory, game theory and other areas.
There are a variety of methods of classifying promissory theories in the literature. Atiyah (1981), Downie (1985), Vitek (1993), Shiffrin (2008), Owens (2012), van Roojen (2013), Liberto (2016b), and many others have given the matter some attention, and while there is significant overlap, there are some differences as well. Typically theorists sort theories by reference to the way in which promissory obligations are generated. On this standard taxonomy the main types of promissory theory are: Normative power views, Conventionalist views, Expectation views, and Joint Commitment views
- 1. Normative Power Theory
- 2. Conventionalism
- 3. Expectation Theory
- 4. Interpersonal Commitments
- 5. Issues in Promissory Theory
- 6. Promises and Other Fields
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1. Normative Power Theory
On these theories promising is a special sort of power we have over our normative circumstances, the power to invoke obligations by promissory utterance. What separates this approach from the others is the self-contained nature of promises: promisors obligate themselves directly, by their own powers, rather than indirectly, either by appeal to a convention or by engendering expectations or commitments in the promisee.
Traditional normative power views, like the one Hume is mocking in the quote above, ground such a power in one of the various traditions that go under the general title “Natural Law”, like the virtue-based views of the ancients and the divinity-based views of the medieval theologians. Modern (in the philosophical sense) normative power views generally ground the power in the rights or interests of promisors.
1.1 Ancient Views
Representative of the ancient view, for Aristotle promise-keeping is directly mandated by the virtues, in particular those of justice, as well as liberality in cases of purely gratuitous promises:
Let us discuss them both, but first of all the truthful man. We are not speaking of the man who keeps faith in his agreements, i.e., in the things that pertain to justice or injustice (for this would belong to another excellence[this would be the virtue of justice]), but the man who in the matters in which nothing of this sort is at stake is true both in word and in life because his character is such. But such a man would seem to be as a matter of fact equitable. For the man who loves truth, and is truthful where nothing is at stake, will still more be truthful where something is at stake; he will avoid falsehood as something base, seeing that he avoided it even for its own sake; and such a man is worthy of praise. He inclines rather to understate the truth; for this seems in better taste because exaggerations are wearisome. (Nicomachean Ethics, iv. vii, 1127a–1127b)
The Roman Jurists like Cicero and Gaius developed this sort of view further, crucially conceiving of a specific moral duty to keep promises, and a specific (and for Cicero particularly Roman) virtue of fidelity to promises (see Cicero, De Officiis 1.8) as well as formalizing promissory obligations, by reference to a specific procedure called the stipulatio or stipulating:
A verbal obligation is created by question and answer in such form as: “Do you solemnly promise conveyance? I solemnly promise conveyance”; “Will you convey? I will convey”; “Do you promise? I promise”; “Do you promise on your honour? I promise on my honour”; “Do you guarantee on your honour? I guarantee on my honour”; “Will you do? I will do” (Gaius, Inst. 3.92, cited in Swain 2013)
1.2 Natural Law Views
And the tradition is also later enlarged by Scholastic theorists, most importantly Aquinas (Aquinas, Summa Theologica II, q.88 & q.110). Aquinas used Aristotelian assumptions and techniques to expand and detail the theory, deriving the duty to keep a promise from the intentions of the promisor and the underpinning virtues (see Gordley 1991: 10ff).
Aquinas discusses promises indirectly, in his treatment of vows, which he takes are promises made to God. His adaptation of Aristotelian virtue theory to the precepts of the natural law made for some important changes in the theory—principally a shift in focus to the will of the promisor as the agent of obligation. For Aquinas, a promise is essentially the agent “binding” himself (i.e., generating an obligation) by act of will:
A vow denotes a binding to do or omit some particular thing. Now one man binds himself to another by means of a promise, which is an act of the reason to which faculty it belongs to direct. For just as a man by commanding or praying, directs, in a fashion, what others are to do for him, so by promising he directs what he himself is to do for another. […] Now a promise is the outcome from a purpose of doing something: and a purpose presupposes deliberation, since it is the act of a deliberate will. Accordingly three things are essential to a vow: the first is deliberation; the second is a purpose of the will; and the third is a promise, wherein is completed the nature of a vow. Sometimes, however, two other things are added as a sort of confirmation of the vow, namely, pronouncement by word of mouth, according to Psalm 65:13, “I will pay Thee my vows which my lips have uttered”; and the witnessing of others. Hence the Master says (Sent. iv, D, 38) that a vow is “the witnessing of a spontaneous promise and ought to be made to God and about things relating to God”: although the “witnessing” may strictly refer to the inward protestation. (Summa, II-II, q.88)
Still later on, important early modern commentators on promising in the Natural Law tradition such as Locke (1689, Two Treatises On Government, II-II:14), Reid (1788, Essay on the Active Powers of Man, 2), Grotius (1625, De iure naturae, ii. xi.), Pufendorf (1672, De iure naturae et gentium, iii. v. 9), Stair (1681/93, Institutions of the Laws of Scotland, I. X.1), and others developed the doctrine in new directions.
This natural law tradition waned in popularity among philosophers during the modern period, with influential early theorists like Hobbes and Hume adopting conventionalist sorts of views. This is of a piece with the turn to more naturalistic views in many different areas of western philosophy, but the tradition never disappeared. Through the works of later natural lawyers in Spain and elsewhere, (Suarez, Molina), the tradition greatly influenced the development of European private law doctrine—the doctrine underlying things like contract and tort law. See the section below on the relationship between promissory theory and contract law for more. For an excellent overview of these issues, see chapter 1 of James Gordley’s The Philosophical Origins of Modern Contract Doctrine (1991).
1.3 Contemporary Views
By the twentieth century newer versions of normative power views began to appear. Unsurprisingly, these neo-normative power views were initially most popular among theorists with a significant legal theory bent, e.g., H. L. A. Hart (1955) and Joseph Raz (1972, 1977, 1984, 2012). But philosophers without any such link have also adopted them, some examples being Gary Watson (2004) and David Owens (2006, 2008, 2012).
The new normative power views generally ground the power the same way other elements of Hohfeldian (1919) systems (e.g., rights and privileges) have been grounded, by appeal to our interests (see Feinberg 1970). Perhaps the paradigm of such a view is HLA Hart’s appeal in his seminal “Are There Any Natural Rights?” (Hart 1955), where he makes promissory obligations out to rest on “special rights” generated by the parties, in the interests of “freedom of choice”:
When rights arise out of special transactions between individuals or out of some special relationship in which they stand to each other, both the persons who have the right and those who have the corresponding obligation are limited to the parties to the special transaction or relationship. […]
(i) The most obvious cases of special rights are those that arise from promises. By promising to do or not to do something, we voluntarily incur obligations and create or confer rights on those to whom we promise; we alter the existing moral independence of the parties’ freedom of choice in relation to some action and create a new moral relationship between them, so that it becomes morally legitimate for the person to whom the promise is given to determine how the promisor shall act. That which corresponds very well to the distinction between a right, which an individual has, and what it is right to do. The promisee has a temporary authority or sovereignty in relation to some specific matter over the other’s will which we express by saying that the promisor is under an obligation to the promisee to do what he has promised. To some philosophers the notion that moral phenomena—rights and duties or obligations—can be brought into existence by the voluntary action of individuals has appeared utterly mysterious; but this I think has been so because they have not clearly seen how special the moral notions of a right and an obligation are, nor how peculiarly they are connected with the distribution of freedom of choice […] (Hart 1955: 183–184)
Hart’s proposal was the harbinger of a revival of these sorts of theories, first among legal theorists and then to moral philosophers more generally. One of the earliest and most influential authors to take up Hart’s idea is Joseph Raz. First appearing in his 1977 essay “Promises and Obligations” (Raz 1977) and later in his book The Morality of Freedom (1986) and elsewhere (see Raz 1982, 2014) Raz advances a normative power view that explicitly grounds the promissory power in our interests in self-binding for cooperation and coordination:
Normative powers are the abilities of people (or institutions) to change normative situations or conditions (i.e., to impose or repeal duties, to confer or revoke rights, to change status etc.) by acts intended to achieve these changes, where the ability depends on (namely is based on, grounded on, justified by) the desirability (the value) of those people (or institutions) having them.
In the case of promises the value of the power is that it expands people’s ability to fashion their lives, or aspects of their lives, by their actions. Through their promises they commit themselves to others. Up to a point, promises are analogous to decisions that constitute reasons for the deciders to perform the act they decided to perform. Both are ways of opening up options through closing other options, normatively speaking. Decisions, as well as having goals, facilitate undertaking complex activities (giving a ball, writing a symphony, etc.) that require concerted actions. Promises, being commitments to others, facilitate co-operation, the forging of relations that presuppose dependence, trust and joint actions, and more. For the sake of brevity I will refer to the value of having these powers as the value of enhanced control (of one’s life), though a somewhat different explanation of their value is required when the powers are held by institutions. (Raz 2014: 61)
David Owens (2006, 2008, 2011, 2012), in a recent and widely influential approach, proposes a power based in what he calls our “authority interest”, or the interest we have in having a certain practical authority over others, the authority that being the recipient of a promise gives us. This power is one of a family of such powers, whose purpose is to serve our interest in being able to shape the normative landscape by declaration, an interest that takes at least two forms: the authority interest, which underwrites promissory obligation and the permissive interest that underwrites the power of consent:
I shall argue that promising exists because, at least when it comes to each other’s actions, human beings often have what might be called an authority interest: I often want it to be the case that I, rather than you, have the authority to determine what you do. If you promise me a lift home, this promise gives me the right to require you to drive me home; in that sense, it puts me in authority over you. So much is obvious. What I claim is that human beings often want such authority for its own sake (not just to facilitate prediction or coordination). I often have an interest in having the right to determine whether you’ll give me a lift, over and above any interest I have in knowing what you (or we) will actually do. And I claim that promising exists because it serves this authority interest. (Owens, 2006: 51)
Seana Shiffrin (2008, 2012b) has also recently proposed a novel normative power view, one that grounds the power in our interests in forming and maintaining relationships with others, rather than authority or coordination. On Shiffrin’s view promises are of a piece with other commitments that are integral to the structure of intimate relations between persons:
[…]The power to make binding promises, as well as to forge a variety of other related forms of commitment, is an integral part of the ability to engage in special relationships in a morally good way, under conditions of equal respect. (Shiffrin 2008: 485)
These recent developments have spawned a burgeoning literature, with a focus on the issue of normative powers themselves, e.g., Chang (2013, 2020), Westlund (2013, 2018), Nieswandt (2017), as well as their propriety for explaining promissory obligation, e.g., E. Taylor (2013), Fruh (2014, 2019), Molina (2019), Melenovsky (2017) and others.
Conventionalism about promises refers, in the vaguest sense, to views that invoke the promising convention (or the promising “practice”, “institution”, “system”, or “game” to mention some of the other names that it goes by in the literature) as central to their explanation of the provenance of promises and promissory obligations.
There are a number of different ways of making this idea more precise in the literature (E. Taylor 2013, Neiwenstadt 2019a, van Roojen 2020, Cohon 2021, inter alia). My survey of this literature leads to me to propose a distinction between two sorts of conventionalism, ontological and normative.
2.1 Ontological and Normative Conventionalism
The first of these, ontological conventionalism, is the idea that promises are ontologically dependent upon the convention, so that promises could not exist, or could not be properly understood as promises, without the promising convention. One way of understanding this is via the framework found in Rawls’ 1955 article Two Concepts of Rules.
Rawls distinguished between what he called the “summary” conception of rules, in which rules are merely “rules of thumb”, i.e., guides to established actions—like the rules of effective writing, and the “practice” view of rules, where the rules define a practice, which in turn defines the actions regulated by the rules. Rawls calls these latter sort “constitutive” rules.
Constitutive rules, like the rules of baseball, are necessary for us to perform (and even understand) game-based actions like “striking out” or “hitting a home run” (Rawls 1955). So on views that are ontologically conventionalist, promises are like home runs, i.e., they are only intelligible within the bounds of the convention—they are artefacts of it.
The second thing meant by the term “conventionalist” is what I call Normative Conventionalism. This is the idea that the convention explains the normative force of the promissory obligation, in a particular way. On these views individual promises are obligatory because of some prior obligation to the convention or its members as such.
This appeal can be made in different ways, by pointing to different elements of the convention and the ways in which reneging might affect it. One standard way is to argue for a duty to uphold the convention, on some basis, as well as an appeal to the damage one might do to the convention by reneging.
The two qualities go naturally together, and many contemporary theories make both claims, although they are sometimes not careful to distinguish them. But they are independent qualities, and they can and do come apart. This can be seen by considering two early conventionalist theories, those of Hobbes and Hume.
Hobbes thinks that keeping promises is only rational (and thus promises are obligatory) due to the fear of punishment for reneging, punishment that only follows from the establishment of the civil state and a system of promissory exchange backed by the power of that state:
Covenants Of Mutuall Trust, When Invalid
If a Covenant be made, wherein neither of the parties performe presently, but trust one another; in the condition of meer Nature, (which is a condition of Warre of every man against every man,) upon any reasonable suspition, it is Voyd; But if there be a common Power set over them bothe, with right and force sufficient to compell performance; it is not Voyd. For he that performeth first, has no assurance the other will performe after; because the bonds of words are too weak to bridle mens ambition, avarice, anger, and other Passions, without the feare of some coerceive Power; which in the condition of meer Nature, where all men are equall, and judges of the justnesse of their own fears cannot possibly be supposed. And therefore he which performeth first, does but betray himselfe to his enemy; contrary to the Right (he can never abandon) of defending his life, and means of living.
But in a civill estate, where there is a Power set up to constrain those that would otherwise violate their faith, that feare is no more reasonable; and for that cause, he which by the Covenant is to perform first, is obliged so to do.
The cause of Feare, which maketh such a Covenant invalid, must be alwayes something arising after the Covenant made; as some new fact, or other signe of the Will not to performe; else it cannot make the Covenant Voyd. For that which could not hinder a man from promising, ought not to be admitted as a hindrance of performing.
But Hobbes also thinks that promises, and their cognates, exchanges, agreements and covenants and contracts, arise not from any convention, but rather from our power to transfer innate rights we have to each other:
Renouncing (or) Transferring Right What; Obligation Duty Injustice
Right is layd aside, either by simply Renouncing it; or by Transferring it to another. By Simply RENOUNCING; when he cares not to whom the benefit thereof redoundeth. By TRANSFERRING; when he intendeth the benefit thereof to some certain person, or persons. And when a man hath in either manner abandoned, or granted away his Right; then is he said to be OBLIGED, or BOUND, not to hinder those, to whom such Right is granted, or abandoned, from the benefit of it: and that he Ought, and it his DUTY, not to make voyd that voluntary act of his own: and that such hindrance is INJUSTICE, and INJURY, as being Sine Jure; the Right being before renounced, or transferred. So that Injury, or Injustice, in the controversies of the world, is somewhat like to that, which in the disputations of Scholers is called Absurdity. For as it is there called an Absurdity, to contradict what one maintained in the Beginning: so in the world, it is called Injustice, and Injury, voluntarily to undo that, which from the beginning he had voluntarily done. The way by which a man either simply Renounceth, or Transferreth his Right, is a Declaration, or Signification, by some voluntary and sufficient signe, or signes, that he doth so Renounce, or Transferre; or hath so Renounced, or Transferred the same, to him that accepteth it. And these Signes are either Words onely, or Actions onely; or (as it happeneth most often) both Words and Actions. And the same are the BONDS, by which men are bound, and obliged: Bonds, that have their strength, not from their own Nature, (for nothing is more easily broken then a mans word,) but from Feare of some evill consequence upon the rupture.
The distinction helps us perhaps understand a bit better the obvious tension between these two claims on Hobbes’ part. How is it that Hobbes can say that promises and contracts are matters of the will, in one section, but then null and void in the state of nature in the subsequent? Because in the first gloss Hobbes is saying what a promise is, ontologically speaking, and in the second he is speaking of what generates its normative force.
So Hobbes’ theory is normatively, but not ontologically, conventionalist. He takes it that the normative force of a promise flows from the convention, while the promise itself is created by an act of the will in transfer of rights.
For Hume, the reverse is true. Hume thinks that promises are conventional in the ontological sense—they are artefacts of a human convention, and fidelity, the virtue of justice that attend them, is also artificial for this reason. This he contrasts with other, natural virtues, like caring for offspring, which are innate.
I say, first, that a promise is not intelligible naturally, nor antecedent to human conventions; and that a man, unacquainted with society, could never enter into any engagements with another, even though they could perceive each other’s thoughts by intuition. […]
Now it is evident we have no motive leading us to the performance of promises, distinct from a sense of duty. If we thought, that promises had no moral obligation, we never should feel any inclination to observe them. This is not the case with the natural virtues. Though there was no obligation to relieve the miserable, our humanity would lead us to it; and when we omit that duty, the immorality of the omission arises from its being a proof, that we want the natural sentiments of humanity. A father knows it to be his duty to take care of his children: But he has also a natural inclination to it. And if no human creature had that indication, no one could lie under any such obligation. (Treatise, 3.2.5)
But Hume also thinks that the primary role of the convention in producing individual promissory obligations is indirect. Hume takes it that the appreciation of the convention produces in people both the sentiments themselves that are, for Hume, the mark of the moral, as well as the dispositions to foster and encourage those sentiments in themselves and others:
There needs but a very little practice of the world, to make us perceive all these consequences and advantages. The shortest experience of society discovers them to every mortal; and when each individual perceives the same sense of interest in all his fellows, he immediately performs his part of any contract, as being assured, that they will not be wanting in theirs. All of them, by concert, enter into a scheme of actions, calculated for common benefit, and agree to be true to their word; nor is there any thing requisite to form this concert or convention, but that every one have a sense of interest in the faithful fulfilling of engagements, and express that sense to other members of the society. This immediately causes that interest to operate upon them; and interest is the first obligation to the performance of promises.
Afterwards a sentiment of morals concurs with interest, and becomes a new obligation upon mankind. This sentiment of morality, in the performance of promises, arises from the same principles as that in the abstinence from the property of others. Public interest, education, and the artifices of politicians, have the same effect in both cases. The difficulties, that occur to us, in supposing a moral obligation to attend promises, we either surmount or elude. (Treatise, 3.2.5)
So Hume’s promissory theory is ontologically conventionalist, but not normatively so. Rather promises are obligatory by way of the moral sentiments, like all other moral obligations. This point is elegantly made in a recent piece, “Hume’s Practice Theory and its Dissimilar Descendants” (Cohon 2021)
2.2 Paradigmatic Conventionalism
Perhaps a better way of understanding contemporary conventionalist theories is that they are paradigmatically both normatively and ontologically conventional about promises. Such a theory is offered by John Rawls, in his seminal A Theory of Justice (1971).
Rawls conceives of promises not as sui generis moral actions, but as essentially institutional artifacts, and thus promissory obligations as institutional obligations, grounded in the same manner as all such obligations. These institutions are comprised of sets of rules that prescribe and proscribe certain sorts of behavior for the participants in the institution. The dicta of the rules are the contents of moral obligations. Rawls in turn grounds institutional obligations in what he calls the principle of fairness.
The principle of fairness is a basic moral principle, chosen by contractors in the OP. But unlike its more famous Rawlsian cognate the difference principle, the principle of fairness is an individual principle, one that applies directly to individuals in the society, as opposed to the basic institutions of the society themselves. Rawls lays out the principle of fairness in the following way:
…[A] person is required to do his part as defined by the rules of an institution when two conditions are met: first the institution is just (or fair)…and second, one has voluntarily accepted the benefits of the arrangement or taken advantage of the opportunities it offers to further their own interests. (1971: 111–112)
So there are two conditions on an action’s being an institutional obligation in the Rawlsian sense: (1) The institution whose rule calls for the action is just, and (2) The person has “voluntarily accepted the benefits” of the institution.
Rawls then introduces three theoretical elements to explain promissory obligations in particular. The first is what he calls the rule of promising, or the central rule that constitutes the promising convention:
[I]f one says the words “I promise to do X” in the appropriate circumstances, one is to do X, unless certain excusing conditions obtain. (Rawls, 1971: 345)
Rawls doesn’t go into the circumstance and conditions mentioned in the rule in any great detail, but he does note that a promise must be voluntary and deliberate. He also notes that a proper rendition of such clauses is necessary to evaluate whether the institution of promising the rule defines is just (1971: 346). The second piece of theory Rawls employs is the notion of a bona fide promise. A bona fide promise is a promise that arises in accordance with the rule of promising, when the practice [of promising] it represents is just.
And the third piece of theory is a moral principle targeted to promises directly, what Rawls call the Principle of Fidelity. The principle of fidelity is merely a derivative of the principle of fairness, fashioned specifically for the institution of promising. And it says simply that “[B]ona fide promises are to be kept” (1971: 347).
Thus Rawls’ explanation for the obligatory force of promises is roughly: If you make a promise under a just promising institution, then you are obligated to uphold that institution (and obey its rules) because to do otherwise would be to “free-ride” on the institution in a manner forbidden by the principle of fairness.
So, unlike Hobbes and Hume, for Rawls the convention is both source of promises as a phenomenon and the source of the moral justification for promissory obligation. Individual promises are “moves” in the promising game, as home runs are moves in baseball, and promissory obligations are grounded in the value of the convention directly.
Another important contemporary branch of conventionalist theory is propounded by John Searle (1965, inter alia) Like Rawls, Searle takes promises to be essentially institutional actions, made possible by the very rules of the promising convention. Similarly, promissory obligations are a kind of institutional obligation, one that attends those already bound by the institution. And ultimately, the normative force of the individual promises is grounded in the value of the convention as a whole. See the Promises and Speech acts (section 6.1) below for further information.
2.3 Hybrid Theories
By the late twentieth century, outside of the legal academy, this sort of dual conventionalism was the dominant view among theorists who took up these issues. Thomas Scanlon’s influential work propounding an expectational view of promises, takes this tradition as its target.
In “Promises and Practices” (1990), Scanlon argued that (among other things) the conventional view gets the harm of breaking a promise wrong. On the conventional view, when someone breaks a promise, they harm the convention of promising as a whole, and by extension, all those who rely on it. But this clashes with our firm intuition that a broken promise harms primarily the jilted promisee.
One possible response to this open to a conventionalist is to move towards a “hybrid” theory, one that invokes the convention to explain the source of the trust of the promisee, but explains the harm done in breaking a promise (and thus the ground of the obligation to keep one) as one of betraying that trust as per the expectational view
This is roughly the route that Kolodny and Wallace take in their proposal for an expectational/conventional hybrid sort of theory in response to Scanlon, in a piece called “Promises and Practices Revisited” (2003). They argue there that the two different sorts of principles would satisfy two different demands—the appeal to the convention would explain the moral obligation, while the appeal to expectations would account for the directed wrongness of promise-breaking.
We can understand this move as a conscious return to the bifurcated conventionalism of Hobbes and Hume, save in this case the view is ontologically conventional, but normatively expectational, as opposed to a natural law/normative power hybrid of Hobbes.
This hybrid proposal, and the criticisms that prompted it, have also spawned a growing discussion among theorists (see Cureton 2015; Shockley 2008; Roth 2016; van Roojen 2013; and Melenovsky 2017, among others).
3. Expectation Theory
As just mentioned, another approach to promissory obligations is an appeal to the expectations that promises create in their promisees. Theories of this sort claim that promises are designed to invoke expectations of performance in the promisee, and that the betrayal of those expectations is the wrong in breaking a promise, and thus the source of the promissory obligation.
Expectational approaches were initially adopted by consequentialists like Bentham (A Comment on the Commentaries, 1-1-6), Sidgwick (The Methods of Ethics, 3–6), Narveson (1967, 1971), Singer (1972), and Árdal (1968, 1976). But in the past 50 years many theorists with other normative frameworks have also put forward such views, e.g., McNeilly (1972), MacCormick (1972), Anscombe (1981: Ch. 1), Thomson (1990: Ch. 12), T. M. Scanlon (1990, 1999: Ch. 7), Foot (2001: Ch. 1), and Friederich and Southwood (2011).
We can distinguish (along with Friederich & Southwood [2009, 2011], among others) between three sorts of expectational theories on the basis of what they propose is required on the part of the promisee to incur the obligation. The three candidates are assurance, reliance and trust.
Assurance views require that the promisee seek and care for the promisor’s assurance of performance. In other words, the promisee must want to be assured of the fact of the promisor’s promissory fulfillment. The paradigm of this sort of view is Scanlon’s (1990, 1998)
Scanlon claims that promissory obligations derive from another sort of more basic moral obligations, specifically obligations not to “unfairly manipulate” others. One has a moral duty to keep one’s promises because making a promise will lead others to believe that you will do what you promise. Breaking the promise is then tantamount to deceiving those one promised, and since one has a moral duty not to do this, one has a moral duty to keep one’s promises.
Scanlon’s principle governing a promise’s generation of an obligation (the Principle of Fidelity, or Principle F) is:
Principle F: If (1) A voluntarily and intentionally leads B to expect that A will do X (unless B consents to A’s not doing so); (2) A knows that B wants to be assured of this; (3) A acts with the aim of providing this assurance, and has good reason to believe that he or she has done so; (4) B knows that A has the intentions and beliefs just described; (5) A intends for B to know this, and knows that B does know it; (6) B knows that A has this knowledge and intent, then, in the absence of special justification, A must do X unless B consents to X’s not being done. (Scanlon 1998: 304)
Principle F is reasonable (i.e., a real moral principle with normative force) because the reasons potential promisees have not to be deceived outweigh the reasons potential promisors have to deceive.
On Scanlon’s view, it is enough that the promisee come to reasonably believe in the promisor’s fulfillment for a breach to be a wrong. The promisee need not suffer a loss, other than by epistemic disappointment, to be wronged.
A more demanding requirement is that a promisee must in fact suffer from some loss or harm in order for a wrong to have occurred, and this is what another expectational tradition, reliance views, propose. The paradigm of a contemporary reliance view is Thomson’s (1990).
For Thomson, a promise is an invitation to rely on the promisor’s performance, where that means expect and plan around that future performance, and not merely come to believe or expect it.
Something like a reliance understanding of promises plausibly underlies the private law doctrine of “consideration”, which indemnifies promisees for costs incurred as a result of such reliance (see Promise and Contract section 6.2 below).
The third sort of expectational view, trust views, explain promises as invitations to trust, where that concept is subtly different and somewhat more demanding than expectation or reliance. Friederich and Southwood (2011) pioneer this approach:
At the heart of the Trust View is the idea of inviting someone to trust one to do something. To explicate this idea, consider first what it means for someone to trust one to do something. or someone to trust one to do something she must have a certain faith or optimism in one’s character insofar as one’s doing it is concerned. (Friederich & Southwood 2011: 278)
Further, the trusting relation requires that the promised act typically be important to and desired by the promisee. So on the trust view, promises are simultaneously invitations to trust in the promisor’s execution and acknowledgments of the importance and value of the promised act, as well as the other moral characteristics integral to the trusting relation. Promissory obligations are formed on the basis of the acceptance, or “uptake”, in the jargon, of these invitations to trust.
All three sorts of expectation theory employ a condition of promissory uptake, as mentioned above. This has led to a separate set of discussions among scholars as to the nature of this condition.
There are a number of criticisms and objections in the literature to the expectational approach to promissory obligations. One group of problems revolves around the claim that by making promises out to be merely expectation-producing mechanisms, expectationalists collapse the distinction between promising and other things, like advising, warning and threatening (see Raz 1972; Peetz 1977; see also Árdal 1979, in response).
Adjunct to these problems is the charge that the expectationalist can’t explain why promissory expectations produce obligations, in a way that other expectations don’t (see Raz 1972; Owens 2006). Elinor Mason, in a recent article on Scanlon’s theory argues in favor of the collapse, claiming that promises are just one sort of inducement to trust, and the harm of breaking a promise is exactly the harm of misleading that might be performed by lying or otherwise deceiving (Mason 2005).
Another traditional problem for expectational views is a charge of circularity (see Robins 1976; Prichard 1949; Warnock 1971). The problem is this: When I promise someone to do something then, if all goes well, as a result of my promise they come to trust that I will do that thing. But this trust, on the expectational view, is the source of my obligation to do what I promise. So it seems that the trust of my promisee is both the cause and the effect of my promise, and this seems an unacceptable circle. The problem is best framed in epistemic terms, as one of the reason that a promisee has to trust a promisor. The intuitively obvious reason for the trust a promisee has is that the promisor has promised, and as such has placed herself under a moral obligation to do the deed. This belief, combined with beliefs about the moral rectitude of the promisor, give the promisee a sound reason to believe that the promisor will keep her promise. The problem for the expectational view is that the promisee, on such a view, can’t rely on the fact of the promissory obligation as a reason to trust, since on this view that obligation rests on the prior fact of the trust itself. If the trust of the promisor is the ground of the moral obligation to keep a promise, then prior to the promisee coming to trust the promisor, no such obligation exists. So when the promisee goes searching for a reason to trust, the standard one is barred from consideration.
Moreover, if an expectationalist aims to offer a theory that explains promissory obligation without the invocation of a convention or practice of promising (like Scanlon does), then the other standard route to explaining promise trust is blocked. If there is a convention in place that governs promises, and if that convention is such as to inspire confidence in promisees that promisors will keep their promises, then promises can be said to generate the necessary expectations. But such a view is incompatible with the claim that conventions aren’t necessary to explain promissory obligations. These objections are pressed against Scanlon’s theory by N. Kolodny and R. J. Wallace (2003).
Another traditional set of problems with the expectational approach is their difficulty in handling cases where the expectations that normally attend a promise are lacking. The Desert Island/Deathbed cases are one such problem, where the expectations are lacking because the promisee is dead. Scanlon discusses another sort of case, the Profligate Pal (Scanlon 1998: 312) where the promisee fails to have the standard expectations because the promisor (the profligate pal) has made and broken too many promises in the past. In such cases expectationalists must either admit that there is no obligation to keep the promise, which seems very counterintuitive, or come up with some reason for the obligation apart from the fact that the promise created expectations in the promisee. See the section covering promises to the dead [§5.1], for more information.
4. Interpersonal Commitments
In the last twenty years a new sort of theory of promissory obligations has emerged. This approach makes promissory obligations out to be one of a number of Sui Generis obligations (and other normative phenomena) that arise from interpersonal exchange. The two pre-eminent views are those of Stephen Darwall (2006, 2009, 2011) and Margaret Gilbert (1993, 2011, 2013).
4.1 Joint Commitment
Gilbert’s theory, sketched in her “Three Dogmas about Promising” (2011) makes promissory obligations a matter of “joint commitment”, jointly made by two or more parties. Whereas a personal decision is a personal commitment, a promise is a joint commitment of promisor and promisee. More fully a promise is a joint commitment to endorse as a body a plan such that one person (the promisor) do such and such, where a joint commitment is not composed of two or more personal commitment (in Gilbert's sense) though each of the parties is committed through it:
A joint commitment is not a composite of two or more personal commitments. It is a commitment of two or more persons by two or more persons. [. . . .] In order to create a new joint commitment each of the would-be parties must openly express to the others his readiness together with the others to commit them all in the pertinent way. Once these expressions are common knowledge between the parties, the joint commitment is in place—as they understand. Each is therefore now committed to do what he can to promote satisfaction of the joint commitment in conjunction with the actions of the rest. (Gilbert 2011: 92–3)
Gilbert’s work has spurred a number of commentators, and there is a vibrant sub-literature on her theories and related matters, see Sheehy (2002), Carassa & Colombetti, (2014), Melenovsky (2017), Helmreich (2018), Kenessey (2020, among others
4.2 Second Personal
Stephen Darwall’s view makes promissory obligations out to be a species of what he has called “second-personal” normative phenomena. Second-personal phenomena are many and varied, and Darwall places promises in the category of “transactions”, which are a group, including contracts and other mutual arrangements, in which the basic second-personal authority (i.e., the power we have to “make claims and demands on one another”) generates obligations to perform what is outlined in the transaction. This second-personal authority is in turn a normative basic, and Darwall argues that this sort of authority is necessarily assumed in all cases of agreed-upon arrangement.
Darwall assumes that transactions can engender obligations without an explicit “agreement”. As an example of this he cites accepting an invitation. As well Darwall’s second-personal authority story gives rise to explicitly moral obligations, through the mechanism of contractualism: roughly, the sort of authority we have to enter agreements is the sort necessary to ground a hypothetical contractualism of the Scanlonian sort.
To begin with the most obvious point, promises are always to some person or persons. There must be a promisee who is given by virtue of the promise an ensemble of rights and prerogatives she would otherwise not have had. But it is also important, as I shall be arguing presently is true of all transactions, that it is part of the very idea of a promise that the promisee already has some rights and prerogatives (hence some (second-personal) authority to make claims and demands) with respect to the promisor, as indeed with respect to every other person, independently of the promise. In particular, the (would be) promisee has the authority to refuse to accept a promise. A promise’s existence is conditional on its acceptance (or at least not being rejected) by the promisee. I simply cannot make a promise to you if you refuse to accept it.
In this way, a promise is like a gift; it must be accepted or not rejected to be given at all. Otherwise, I will have no more than tried to promise (or give a gift). Various other rights and prerogatives derive from the would-be promisee’s authority to reject the promise. Just as it is part of the very idea of a gift that it cannot be forced on someone, so also does a would-be promisee have standing to demand that he be genuinely free to reject it—that his acceptance not be forced, manipulated, extracted by deception, and so on. (Darwall, 2011: 269–70)
Darwall’s work has also led to a new sub-section of the literature, see Watson (2007), Korsgaard (2007), Carassa & Colombetti (2014), Zylberman (2014), Schofield (2014), Dougherty (2015), Kenessey (2020), Roth (2021) among others.
5. Issues in Promissory Theory
There are also a number of theoretical issues in promissory theory that have garnered significant attention from philosophers of late. A partial list of these below, along with some pointers to the relevant literature:
5.1 Problematic Promisees and the Uptake Condition
One source of discussion are the issues surrounding promisees that are somehow different from the paradigm promisee. The paradigm promisee is aware of the promise, acknowledges and confirms the promissory arrangement, welcomes or at least doesn’t spurn the promised act and expects and/or relies on its execution or the subsequent state of affairs. In the literature these are called “uptake” conditions (the term was coined by Thomson [1990: 301]).
Most promissory theories employ some sort of uptake condition, for different reason (see Liberto 2018) with expectational theories generally having the more demanding ones. But not all plausible promisees can satisfy these conditions. These are problematic promisees, cases where a promise to them seems intuitively valid, but the promisee fails to satisfy the uptake condition.
A paradigm example of such problematic cases are promises to the dead or dying, since those promisees can’t be disappointed or harmed. That is, unless one subscribes to the view that the dead can be harmed, and whether or not this is even possible is a question that thinkers have also spent some time on (see Boonin 2019, for a survey of the philosophical literature here). Like promises to the self, promises to the dead are a commonplace in both prose and poetry take Jane Austen’s Pride and Prejudice, or J Stafford’s The Cremation of Sam McGee
One such sort of case that arose in the mid-twentieth century is the so-called “Desert Island” case, where a promise is made in isolation (on a desert island) to someone who then dies. The case was wielded against act utilitarians, as an example of a sort of case that the expectationalist sort of views they espouse can’t answer (see Nowell-Smith 1956; Narveson 1963: 210; Cargile 1964; Narveson 1967: 196–7).
But recently scholars have widened the criticism. Nick Leonard (forthcoming) argues that, like the dead and dying, promisees who fail to have the standard cognitive capacity to rely on promises would certainly fail the uptake condition for expectational theories. He imagines in this role small children, or people with severe cognitive limitations. Such promisees are intuitively owed fidelity, but expectational promissory theories can’t accommodate this judgment, since the promisees don’t have the required uptake, i.e., they fail to form expectations or reliance. Further Leonard argues that joint commitment views are similarly cognitively demanding, requiring as they do complex and sophisticated mental states like mutual intentions.
Similarly James S. Taylor (2021) argues that authority views like Owens’, that appeal to the possible exercise of power over the promisor by the promisee, can’t accommodate dead or absent promisees. And Hallie Liberto (2018) through a set of subtle and clever cases, argues that uptake conditions in both authority and joint commitment views might be violated even by perfectly paradigmatic promisees. The cases involve promisees that are either delayed, absent or not yet specified at the time of the creation of the promissory obligation. Liberto argues that uptake has what she call a “backward reach”, meaning that it must be able to be satisfied after the promissory obligation has attached.
Albrecht (2018), argues that these sorts of promises to the dead or missing, to young children, to oneself, give rise to “asymmetrical” promises. On what Albrecht calls “transactional” sorts of promissory theories a promise is an exchange of rights (or authority, or whatever the specific mechanism is) which transaction occurs between independent agents. But in certain cases, where the promisee is unable to fulfil their pat of the transaction, the promisor can stand in for her as a proxy. But this only occurs, says Albrecht, in cases where the promisor is in some way already responsible for the promisee. So, when we promise our young children t, say, get them a good education, we act to accept the promise on their part, as a proxy for them, in our role as parent, in the same way we might receive money or other things on their behalf.
In another vein, A. S. Roth (2016) argues that the uptake condition must be understood as the promisee intending that the promisor perform, as opposed to “expecting” or “trusting” such. This construal allows him to respond to the circularity worry inherent in expectational views. (see the section covering expectationalism [§3.3]).
Following Scanlon, Roth analyses the circularity worry in epistemic terms, as a lack of justification for the belief in performance on the part of the promisee. But, argues Roth, intentional beliefs, of the sort we form when we form an intention to do some act don’t typically require epistemic justification. If I intend to take a walk, I come to believe that I will, and that belief is reasonable (ceteris paribus) without any other evidence that I will do so.
So (argues Roth) if we construe the promisee as intending that the promisor perform the promised act, and if we take intentions as cognitive, i.e., as partly constituted by beliefs, then we can avoid the need for justification, and thus the circularity, since beliefs of this sort don’t typically require justification:
By offering a sufficiently attractive invitation (which most promises are), the promisor leads the promisee to accept. And the promisee accepts by intending the promisor’s action. So we have a case of the promisor leading the promisee to a belief (as required by Principle F), but not in a way that requires evidence. For, if Cognitivism is true, the expectation that comes with the intention to ϕ is normally not based on evidence. […] Notice, also, that the process described is entirely compatible with the expectation (hence acceptance) being voluntary. An attractive invitation was made and voluntarily accepted: the promisee voluntarily intends the promisor’s action, and given Cognitivism, thereby forms the expectation. (Roth 2016: 111)
This turn has also sparked some recent discussion, see Sharadin (2018), Shaver (2019), Dannenberg (2019), Kenessey (2020) and Lichter (2021)
5.2 Promises to the Self and the Promisee Release Condition
Another sort of problematic case that has come in for some recent attention is the case of promising oneself. The idea of the self promises is a commonplace, in the vernacular as well as in poetry and prose (see Migotti 2003). But how self promises might produce obligations is a difficult question to answer for many promissory theories.
Traditionally self promises (and their counterparts, pledges, resolutions and similar commitments) have been discounted as proper promises, but there have been a number of recent attempts to vindicate self promises in the literature, and provide some positive explanation for their normative force.
Connie Rosati, in her influential piece “The Importance of Self Promises” (2011) argues that self promises are, rather than a peripheral phenomena, the paradigmatic instance of promising—as they are exercises of our authority over ourselves. This idea is not without antecedent—R.S. Downie says something similar in his 1985 “Three Accounts of Promising”, as Rosati acknowledges. But Rosati’s account is more developed—appealing to Owens-style authority and Darwall’s second-personal normative framework.
Jorah Dannenberg (2015), in a Neitszchean vein, argues that self promises are a way of solidifying our wills, protecting our valued choices from deterioration in the face of time and trials. And Janis Schaab (2021) argues against what she calls the “incoherence” argument against the possibility of one releasing oneself from a promise.
A central issue in this sub-literature is this last—the problem of promisee release. This problem goes all the way back to Hobbes, who says of self promises:
Nor is it possible for any person to be bound to himselfe ; because he that can bind, can release; and therefore he that is bound to himselfe onely, is not bound. (Leviathan part II, ch. 26)
In cases of self promise, since the promisor is also the promisee, and so can release herself, then we are faced with Hobbes’ challenge. Many authors have grappled with this puzzle—some, like Liberman (2019) move to drop the promisee release condition, and claim that some sorts of self promise, like vows, cannot be revoked. Others, like Habib (2009) and Schaab (2021), look to accept promisee release and explain Hobbes’ difficulty away.
5.3 Vows, Oaths and Related Phenomena
Another set of promissory issues that has received some recent attention from scholars concerns other phenomena of what we might call “self-binding”, things like vows, oaths, pledges and resolutions. In promissory theory proper, there has been some focus on these with the end of informing a comprehensive promissory theory, one that might go some distance to explain these related phenomena.
Work on vows has occurred in different contexts, and between different voices, within and outside of philosophy. Wedding vows and religious vows in particular have been the object of some recent work.
Kyle Fruh (2019) surveys the difficulties some promissory theories, and in particular expectational theories have in accommodating these notions, and offers that any reasonably successful theory of promises would likely have to explain these phenomena as well. He calls this the “breadth” requirement:
Oaths and vows partially fill out what I call the “breadth criterion”: Theories of promising should cover not only customary, interpersonal promises but also sibling phenomena, including oaths and vows. Promises, oaths, and vows are all forms of voluntary binding commitments; indeed, the terms are often used interchangeably. They should be taken up into theory together. The familiar and powerful grounds for this intuitive idea are at least twofold: It is more parsimonious to have a single theory that covers the entire family rather than developing distinct theories for each of the phenomena, and if there is such a theory, its explanatory power will compare favorably to theories that fail to cover some of the phenomena in question. A theory of promising that is silent about oaths and vows is one we have less reason to accept than one that can illuminate the capacity of oaths and vows to produce moral obligations. Provisionally at least, the breadth criterion should be applied to competing theories of promising. (Fruh 2019: 859)
On vows per se, in addition to Fruh’s work, novel theories of the obligation of vows have been advanced by Alida Liberman (2019), who makes vows out to be a species of resolution.
In another vein, Elizabeth Brake, in her widely read 2011 piece “Is Divorce Promise Breaking” argues that wedding vows can’t be construed as promises, on pain of saying that divorce is promise breaking. Brake argues for this and other reasons, wedding vows shouldn’t be taken as promises at all.
Brake’s work has in turn spurred further dialogue on wedding vows as promises, see Gheaus (2017), Cowley (2020), and Liberman (2021).
Like promises, oaths play a part in many different human undertakings. In politics, at least among democracies, oaths of office for those in positions of power are the norm. In the professions oaths like the Hippocratic oath sworn by doctors, are also very common. In cases of testimony in court, testimonial oaths are standard, and witnesses are asked to swear oaths of veracity for their affidavits or other testimony.
Traditionally oaths were understood as a separate species of obligation-producing commitment, a “calling to witness” of God to bolster a claim to veracity on the part of the swearer. Aquinas, for example divides them into four types: Calls to witness truths of the past or present, which he calls declaratory oaths, and claims of some future conduct, which are promissory oaths. Further, oaths can be either simple invitations to witnessings, which are simply oaths, or they can be invitations to punish the swearer for default, which are curses:
[O]aths are taken for the purpose of confirmation. Now speculative propositions receive confirmation from reason, which proceeds from principles known naturally and infallibly true. But particular contingent facts regarding man cannot be confirmed by a necessary reason, wherefore propositions regarding such things are wont to be confirmed by witnesses. Now a human witness does not suffice to confirm such matters for two reasons. First, on account of man’s lack of truth, for many give way to lying, according to Ps. 16:10, “Their mouth hath spoken lies [Vulg.: ‘proudly’]”. Secondly, on account of [his] lack of knowledge, since he can know neither the future, nor secret thoughts, nor distant things: and yet men speak about such things, and our everyday life requires that we should have some certitude about them. Hence the need to have recourse to a Divine witness, for neither can God lie, nor is anything hidden from Him. Now to call God to witness is named jurare (to swear) because it is established as though it were a principle of law (jure) that what a man asserts under the invocation of God as His witness should be accepted as true. Now sometimes God is called to witness when we assert present or past events, and this is termed a “declaratory oath”; while sometimes God is called to witness in confirmation of something future, and this is termed a “promissory oath”. But oaths are not employed in order to substantiate necessary matters, and such as come under the investigation of reason; for it would seem absurd in a scientific discussion to wish to prove one’s point by an oath. (Summa II-II q.89-Art. i)
A person is called to give witness, in order that he may make known the truth about what is alleged. Now there are two ways in which God makes known whether the alleged facts are true or not. In one way He reveals the truth simply, either by inward inspiration, or by unveiling the facts, namely, by making public what was hitherto secret: in another way by punishing the lying witness, and then He is at once judge and witness, since by punishing the liar He makes known his lie. Hence oaths are of two kinds: one is a simple contestation of God, as when a man says “God is my witness”, or, “I speak before God”, or, “By God”, which has the same meaning, as Augustine states [*See argument On the contrary]; the other is by cursing, and consists in a man binding himself or something of his to punishment if what is alleged be not true. (ibid., Reply Obj. 3)
So oaths are ways of bolstering one’s claim to veracity by calling on God to witness your claim. If your claim is about your future conduct, then the oath can be understood as a promise, with God as the promisee. You can invite god to witness alone, on the tacit understanding that he sees and knows all and will take account, or you can invite him to punish you for falsity directly, e.g “May God strike me down” or “God blind me” (“blimey”).
Recent philosophical work has tended to recapitulate this analysis, absent the divine promisee. This broadens the appeal, certainly, but it means a substantial change in the nature of the grounding of the obligation.
Thomas Scanlon, in his influential 1990 piece “Promises and Practices”, is an example of this. Scanlon offers roughly the same meaning of the term, and rehearses the Thomistic distinctions between testamentary and promissory oaths, but he makes oaths out to be not invitations to witness or punish, but rather invocations of important or sacred objects or ideas:
In an oath a person says, in support of a claim to be telling the truth or to have a sincere and reliable intention to do a certain thing, “I swear to you by …”, naming here something to which he or she is assumed to attach great value, such as God, the Bible, or the memory of a loved one. It is not necessary that the value appealed to involve a code of honor or convention of truth-telling. What is claimed is simply that the speaker’s sincerity in making the present claim is comparable to the sincerity of his or her devotion to the value named. It would cheapen such a value, and hence be incompatible with true devotion to it, to invoke it for personal advantage in support of an insincere claim. Of course, some think that it is incompatible with holding something sacred to invoke it in sup port of any claim, which is why some religions forbid the use of holy texts or the name of God in this way. (Scanlon 1990: 223)
This move allows the analysis to survive the removal of God as a promisee, but subtly substitutes the receiver of the vow (“I swear to you…”) in its place.
Fruh (2019) resists this move, and disputes the understanding of oaths as “directed” toward a counterparty. He argues at some length against the plausibility of various candidate counterparties (promisees) for standard oaths. Rather, for Fruh oaths should be understood as a sui generis form of voluntary obligation, different from promises and vows in that it is without a “counterparty”. Liberman (2021) instead argues that oath and vows should be understood as “exceptionless resolutions”, both without counterparty, and both different than traditional promise.
5.4 Promissory Reasons
Another set of issues that have been discussed in the literature we might call issues of promissory psychology. These are issues concerning the mental states of promisors and promisees, and the role these play in producing, explaining or justifying promissory obligations. The main focus is on promissory reasons.
What reasons do promisors have to keep promises? How do these promissory come about and how do they function? How strong are they, and what, if any, reasons may override them? These are just some of the most common questions in this area, and the literature on them is quite large, too large to adequately survey here, so I will just note some important foci. Of particular interest are the answers to these questions provided by Joseph Raz (1975, 1982, 1986, 2012).
Raz proposes a system of practical rationality with two sorts of reasons, of first and second order. First order reasons are reason for or against courses of action, while second order reasons are reasons about reasons themselves. Exclusionary reasons are second order reasons that exclude other, first order reasons. Promises, says Raz, produce (in the promisor) both first order reasons to perform the promised act as well as second order exclusionary reasons to bar from considerations most first order reasons that counsel against keeping the promise.
Let us say that a person does A for the reason that p if and only if he does A because he believes that p is a reason for him to do A. A person refrains from doing A for the reason that p if and only if it is not the case that he does A for the reason that p. In other words a person refrains from acting for a reason if he does not do the act or does it but not for this reason. “Refrains” is used here in an extended sense which does not imply that the agent intentionally avoids acting for the reason. A second order reason is any reason to act for a reason or to refrain from acting for a reason. An exclusionary reason is a second order reason to refrain from acting for some reason. (Raz 1975: 487)
Moreover, on the Razian picture exclusionary reasons are “content independent” reasons. This is the notion (original with Hart [1958, 1982] cited in Sciaraffa 2009) that a reason for action is independent of the “content” or “nature” of the action they implicate:
There is a vibrant literature, spanning many decades, engaging with Raz’s intriguing suggestions. see Sciaraffa (2009) for a survey of some of the earlier literature on this. More recent work can be found in McBride (2015), MacMahon (2018), Molina (2019), Murphy (2020), Kimel (forthcoming), and others. Much of this work is in legal theory, on the philosophical underpinnings of private law.
6. Promises and Other Fields
In addition to the various positive theories of promising, there are also several other issues of philosophical interest concerning the intersection of promissory theory and other fields or theoretical frameworks. In the following sections I try and outline some of these, and provide some guides to the literature.
6.1 Promises and Speech Acts
Promises have often been cast as speech acts, or actions that we perform by speaking. The locus classicus for this issue is J. L. Austin’s 1962 book How to Do Things with Words. In it Austin defines two sorts of speech acts, or “performatives”: illocutions and perlocutions. Illocutions are those actions that we perform by uttering the words alone. Austin lists requesting, warning and announcing as examples. Alternatively, perlocutions are actions performed by speaking which require some particular effect of the speech in order to be successful. Austin cites persuading, explaining and alarming as examples of the latter sort of locution.
Austin takes promising to be an illocutionary act, that is, he takes it that promising is merely a matter of a certain form of utterance, under certain conditions. Moreover the reason he takes this to be is that he thinks that promising is a conventional act, one that invokes a certain practice to formalize the action. Austin thinks that in this way promises are just of a piece with many sorts of obligation-producing actions, such as betting, buying and contracting (Austin 1962 [1975: 19])
Austin’s linguistic distinction mirrors the crucial difference between the expectational and conventional theories of promising. On the conventionalist view that Austin adopts, promises are “conventional” moves in the game, and as such one promises by “making the right moves”, i.e., saying the right sorts of things and otherwise obeying the rules of the game.
Searle, taking up the speech-act framework pioneered by J. L. Austin—similarly makes promises out to be a particular form of speech act—(see Searle 1963, 1965, 1965, 1979) a non-verbal action affected by speech, of a piece with “ordering” and “agreeing”. Searle, like Austin, is a paradigmatic conventionalist his work has been widely influential, and has helped to grow the literature on both promises and speech act theory (cf. Searle et al. 1980, inter alia)
The investigation of promises as speech acts is furthered in the work of Rawls (1955), William Alston (1964, 1994), John Searle (1963, 1965, 1979, 1980, 1985), David Jones (1966), Otto Hanfling (1975), and Michael Pratt (2003, 2007), Christina Corredor (2001), and Vincent Blok (2013) among others. See Harris and McKinney (2021) for a contemporary survey
6.2 Promise, Contracts and the Law
The relationship between the law, contracts and promises is a long and tangled one. From its ancient origins promissory theory has been intertwined with issues of contracts and agreements more generally. And since at least the time of Aquinas and especially with the works of the later Natural Lawyers like Grotius and Pufendorf, scholarly work on promising has been done at least in part with an eye towards informing the law of contract. This in turn gave rise to a tradition on the part of legal theorists of surveying such scholarship in their work on both historical and contemporary issues in the law of contract. Finally, the law itself has methods for dealing with promises (as they are obviously the sorts of things that might lead to legal wrangling). Thus the legal practice regarding promises has some interest to theorists of promising as well. The result is two interlinked scholarly traditions and bodies of work.
Perhaps the first question on the mind of legal and philosophical historians is the issue of the degree to which, if any, contractual obligations are grounded in promissory obligations in contemporary legal regimes. This question is complicated by the different traditions and cultures involved in the long path to contemporary law, i.e., natural law theory, virtue theory, rights theory, the (anglo) common law, the continental civilian law, canon law and other theoretical approaches, which are in turn variously situated in the UK, on the European continent, and in the anglo territories (Scotland, Australia, Canada the US, etc.). The answer to the question is different in different traditions and places, and the contemporary law is the result of some complicated amalgamation of these different traditions over time. For an overview of these issues, see, e.g., Gordley (1991), Ibbetson (1999), Markovits (2011), Swain (2013), or Fried (1981, 2015).
One central dialectic within this corpus has the “normative power” tradition of the natural lawyers pitted against the more expectational views of the English common law. As Atiyah notes (1981: ch. 6), there is a tension between the Natural Law promissory theory and the actual law of contract and promise plainly evident in the British common law. One source of the tension is the common law doctrine of “consideration”, which mandates that only promises given with “consideration”, i.e., given in exchange for something of value, are enforceable in the law. In other words, mere promises, given without consideration, are traditionally not indemnified by the law.
Further, as Lon Fuller and William Perdue pointed out in an influential 1936/37 article “The Reliance Interest in Contract Damages”, the damages awarded by courts to those who have had a promise or contract broken is best understood as being proportional to the harm the plaintiff suffered in relying on the promise. These and other considerations argue for a theory of promises based on expectations and reliance, i.e., an expectational theory, as opposed to one based on conventions or natural duties, and this is what a number of philosophers and legal theorists have done. This debate has spawned a sizable literature (see Swain 2013 for a good overview of this work).
Charles Fried’s widely influential book Contract as Promise (1981) re-kindled this debate in American legal circles. Fried argued that the traditional approach, which made contractual obligation out to be grounded in promissory obligation, was slowly being usurped by the consequentialist-flavored approaches of the English common law, and he aimed his book as a polemic against this movement.
Fried took on these arguments directly, and the corpus of work that sprang from the book greatly enlarged the debate. In 2012 a special conference and subsequent issue of the Suffolk University Law Review revisited Fried’s work, 30 years on. This new corpus of work provides us with some interesting new explorations. As an example of this, see Brian Bix’s assessment in his essay (2012). Subsequent to this Fried released an updated version of the book in 2015, which in turn has spawned a more recent literature (see Markovits 2020; Saprai 2013; Bix 2017; Encarnacion 2018)
And the legal academy continues to work on the relation between the concepts and the theoretical foundations of contract law, with scholars like Markovits (2011), Shiffrin (2006, 2012), Pratt (2007, 2014) Encarnacion (2018), Saprai (2017) and many others contributing. For an excellent overview of the theoretical work see the SEP entry on contract law.
6.3 Promises and Consequentialism
Consequentialism has always had a fraught relationship with promises and promissory obligation. It has been a traditional challenge to consequentialist views, particularly earlier, act-based forms, to explain promissory obligations, as they aren’t necessarily “felicific”, or productive of the most good. Of course, not all consequentialist views are of this sort.
Consequentialist theories of promissory obligation fall into two broad camps: Act utilitarians are expectationalists—generally explain promissory obligations as arising from the negative consequences of breaking the promise. Rule utilitarians are conventionalists, and defend promissory obligations on the grounds that the rule of promise-keeping is productive of the best consequences.
6.3.1 Act Utilitarianism
Act utilitarians evaluate individual actions in light of the net utility produced by that action as compared to alternative actions. The right action is that which promotes the maximum net utility. On the face of it, this entirely general and comprehensive maxim leaves no room for considerations of prior promise. The fact that an agent promised someone something has no direct relevance to an act consequentialist appraisal of that agent’s action at the time the promise is meant to be kept. If breaking the promise would promote more utility than keeping it, then the theory seems to mandate breaking the promise.
This counter-intuitive result has been offered as a criticism of act utilitarianism since its inception. That act utilitarians have difficulty in accounting for the force of promises is a touchstone for critics (see Prichard 1949; Ross 1930; Hodgson 1967).
But act utilitarians do have some resources to accommodate our moral intuitions about promises, and the sort of theory they employ is held by more than just utilitarians .The act utilitarian explanation for promissory obligations is that these obligations arise from the negative consequences that attend the breaking of promises, where these negative consequences are, at least in part, created by the effects of the promise on the promisee, specifically, the creation in the promisee of the expectation that the promisor will keep her promise. A sample list of utilitarianism that have either offered or defended such a view: Bentham (A Comment on the Commentaries, 1-1-6), Sidgwick (The Methods of Ethics, 1874 [1962: 3–6]), Narveson (1967, 1971), Singer (1972), and Árdal (1968, 1976).
In support of this picture utilitarians argue that promises are the sorts of things which are generally made because the promisee wants the thing promised, and so wants to be assured of getting it. Since a promise is designed to secure his trust, and that trust is then likely to be the source of much pain if it’s disappointed, it’s reasonable to assume that in most cases keeping one’s promise will be productive of better consequences than breaking them, given the expectations of the promisee. And there are other potential negative consequences of breaking a promise (e.g., the loss of trust by one’s familiars, the general erosion of trust in the practice of promises) that utilitarians can add to the negative side of the ledger. For an astute philosophical survey of Act Utilitarian approaches to promising see Atiyah (1981: 30–79), also Robins (1984: 140–143) and Vitek (1993: 61–70).
As mentioned above, the standard critique of the act utilitarian theory of promissory obligations is that it doesn’t accord with our intuitive judgment that at least some promises that don’t produce the maximum utility still ought to be kept. In claiming that utilitarianism has unacceptably counter-intuitive results in certain cases, this argument it is of a piece with most arguments against the view. One sort of counter-intuitive case that has received some attention is the so-called “Desert Island” case, where a promise is made in isolation (on a desert island) to someone who then dies. The question is whether there is any obligation to keep the promise, given that the promisee can’t have any expectations of its fulfillment (being dead) and that no-one else can know of the promise (see Nowell-Smith 1956; Narveson 1963: 210; Cargile 1964; Narveson 1967: 196–7). See the section on Problematic Promisees and the Uptake Condition (§5.1] above for more information.
A more sophisticated problem outlined by Hodgson (1967: 38) and others is that a promising convention is broadly speaking incompatible with an act utilitarian society. This is so because such a convention couldn’t get established (or couldn’t be sustained) if people were aware that everyone was a consistent utility maximizer of the act utilitarian sort. If this were the case people would put no stock in promises, knowing that when the time came to keep the promise, the promisor would simply apply the utilitarian calculus, without regard to the fact that he had previously “promised”, as this is what being an act utilitarian means.
Note that the utilitarian cannot reply that we have failed to take into account the expectations of the promisee in our case, because the claim is that the promisee has no reason to generate any special expectations that the promisor will do what she promises, precisely because he knows the promisor to be an act utilitarian, and consequently knows that she will do what the utility calculus tells her is best, without thought of her promise. Of course, the promisee is free to generate some expectations that the promisor will keep her promise on the assumption that her promise is indicative of her at least having the (present) intention to perform the promised act. But, as Raz (1972), Kolodny and Wallace (2003) and others point out, the advising of the promisee of one’s mere intention to do the promised act is insufficient ground for the sorts of expectations that are meant to attend promises.
More recently there have been some efforts to rehabilitate act utilitarianism with regards to promissory obligations. Some theorists, like Michael Smith (1994, 2011), propose that sophisticating the theory with the addition of other values might allow it to accommodate “agent-relative” values like promise keeping (M. Smith 2011: 208–215).
Others, like Alastair Norcross, offer a negative defense, arguing that the sorts of counter-examples generally adduced to demonstrate the problem don’t survive scrutiny (Norcross 2011). Norcross also proposes an indirect form of consequentialism, one where the decision procedure consciously adopted by agents isn’t the same as theory itself. This sort of approach is outlined by Peter Railton (1984).
6.3.2 Rule Utilitarianism
The sorts of difficulties that promises pose for act utilitarian theories discussed above are at least in part the motivation for rule utilitarianism (see Rawls 1955 and Brandt 1979: 286–305). Rule utilitarians change the context of moral evaluation from individual acts to rules governing actions. The principle of utility is applied to rules and practices, rather than individual acts, and the best rule or practice is that produces the best over-all consequences. Some notable rule utilitarians are Urmson (1953), Brandt (1959, 1979), and Hooker (2000, 2011).
Of special note here is Rawls’ 1955 paper we discussed above in the context of conventionalism, “Two Concepts of Rules”, which advanced a rule-utilitarian defense of promissory obligations and helped to focus the debate on promising By changing the focus from act to rule, rule utilitarians are better able to explain our moral intuitions regarding individual cases of promise-keeping. But in particular, rule utilitarians claim that their theory can make sense of the origin and maintenance of the practice of promising itself. Unlike an act utilitarian society, promising and trusting in promises makes sense in a rule utilitarian society, because promisees can rest assured that promisors won’t do the local utility calculation to determine whether or not to keep their promises, but rather will obey the rule of promising.
One problem for the rule utilitarian theory of promissory obligations is that it seems that utilitarian society couldn’t establish a practice of promising, because prior to the establishment of the rule, people could have no expectations that promises would be kept. As such, those receiving the first promises would not be able to form the expectations necessary to make the rule actually productive of the best consequences. This is so because the consequential value of the rule of promise keeping depends on the expectations of promisees. Such expectations are the grounds of trust, and trust is how promising generates its benefits (see Robins 1984: 142–3). In response, Brandt argues for what he calls ideal rule utilitarianism, which makes the frame of reference for rule consideration not the actual rules available, but the ideal rule, i.e., the rule that would be optimific (productive of the best possible consequences), were it employed. There is substantial criticism of this move (see Diggs 1970). Again, an excellent (although now dated) survey of the rule-utilitarian approach to promising is found in Atiyah (1981: 79–86).
Since the turn of the century Brad Hooker has offered newer versions of Brandt-style rule-utilitarianism (he calls it rule-consequentialism) (2000, 2011) with an eye towards solving these sorts of problems. This work has in turn spawned another chapter in this literature (see Eggleston 2007; Arneson 2005; Wall 2009; Cureton 2015).
And work continues on these issues, see Sinnott-Armstrong (2009), Gill (2012), Melenovsky (2017). For an excellent contemporary survey of this issue, see Alida Liberman’s “Consequentialism and Promises” in the Oxford Handbook of Consequentialism (2020).
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