Supplement to Propositional Attitude Reports

Ignorance of identities

Lois is, in some intuitive sense, ignorant of something concerning who Superman is, and this ignorance both explains and justifies Lois’s believing of Superman that he is strong and that he is not strong. (For more on the notion of believing of, see the supplementary document on The De Re/De Dicto Distinction.) But what does this ignorance consist in; just what is it that Lois doesn’t know? Some want to say that she doesn’t realize that Clark Kent is Superman. She believes of Superman that he is strong because she believes that Superman is strong (and she doesn’t believe that Superman is not strong) and she believes of Superman that he is not strong because she believes that Clark Kent is not strong (and she doesn’t believe that Clark Kent is strong). This only makes sense, however, if Lois doesn’t believe that Clark Kent is Superman and if the sentence ‘Superman is strong’ expresses a different proposition from the sentence ‘Clark Kent is strong’. But this is contentious and some participants in the debate – in particular, Naive Russellians – deny it. (See section 4 on The Naive Russellian theory.) Why is this, you might ask? Well, according to Naive Russellians, Lois’s believing that Superman is Clark Kent just is her believing that Superman is Superman, and surely she believes that.

We seek a description of Lois’s ignorance that all parties of the debate can accept. In the main body of the text, we claimed that Lois is ignorant that the person she calls ‘Superman’ is identical to the person she calls ‘Clark Kent’. While this does not presuppose Naive Russellianism is false, we can see that this unduly meta-linguistic way of stating what Lois is ignorant of is inadequate. This is because there are ways of failing to have this bit of meta-linguistic knowledge that intuitively do not constitute an identity ignorance. For example, a two-year old doesn’t possess the meta-linguistic concepts needed to even entertain that thought. But the child may not be confused about who Superman is. So, not knowing that ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ co-refer is not sufficient for being ignorant of an identity.

One might be tempted to say that we should restate the meta-linguistic ignorance in the positive. Instead of failing to realize the co-reference, perhaps Lois’s identity ignorance should be said to consist in her positively disbelieving that the person she calls ‘Superman’ is identical to the person she calls ‘Clark Kent’. (In general, it seems that we should explicate identity confusions in terms of the active disbelieving of a proposition as opposed to the mere absence of a positive belief, as confusion is not to be identified with a mere absence of knowledge.) But this too can be seen to be inadequate, and for much the same reason. Agents without the sophistication to disbelieve meta-linguistic propositions can nonetheless be ignorant of an identity. For example, a dog may bark at the person walking up from a distance and then suddenly change its behavior, wagging its tail and jumping around excitedly as it realizes that that person is its owner. The dog suffered an identity confusion. But it is highly dubious that it disbelieved some meta-linguistic proposition. So, identity confusions cannot be accounted for meta-linguistically.

Perhaps we can account for identity confusions not in terms of disbelieving meta-linguistic propositions but instead in terms of disbelieving great deeds propositions concerning general traits and doings of the objects the beliefs concern. So, we might say that Lois’s identity confusion consists in her disbelieving that the person she works with is the same as the person who saves her from falling buildings. This, however, should not be conceived as a canonical way of being ignorant of who Superman is. Paul may also be confused about who Superman is but, not having thought of Clark Kent as the person I work with, not disbelieve that the person he works with is the person that saves him from falling buildings. If the great deeds strategy is to be employed, we should say that, for each agent suffering an identity confusion, there is some pair (or more) of sets of traits and doings such that the agent disbelieves that the object satisfying the one is the same as the object satisfying the other.

Those who reject Naive Russellianism and who are not concerned to formulate an account of identity confusions that is neutral between competing theories have an easier time. They can simply say that the explanation and justification of Lois’s believing of Superman that he is strong and that he is not strong is due ultimately to her disbelieving that Superman is Clark Kent.

Copyright © 2019 by
Michael Nelson <>

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