Relational Quantum Mechanics

First published Mon Feb 4, 2002; substantive revision Tue Oct 8, 2019

Relational Quantum Mechanics (RQM) is the most recent among the interpretations of quantum mechanics which are most discussed today. It was introduced in 1996, with quantum gravity as a remote motivation (Rovelli 1996); interests in it has slowly but steadily grown only in the last decades. RQM is essentially a refinement of the textbook “Copenhagen” interpretation, where the role of the Copenhagen observer is not limited to the classical world, but can instead be assumed by any physical system. RQM rejects an ontic construal of the wave function (more in general, of the quantum state): the wave function or the quantum state play only an auxiliary role, akin to the Hamilton-Jacobi function of classical mechanics. This does not imply the rejection of an ontological commitment: RQM is based on an ontology given by physical systems described by physical variables, as in classical mechanics. The difference with classical mechanics is that (a) variables take value only at interactions and (b) the values they take are only relative to the (other) system affected by the interaction. Here “relative” is in the same sense in which velocity is a property of a system relative to another system in classical mechanics. The world is therefore described by RQM as an evolving network of sparse relative events, described by punctual relative values of physical variables.

The physical assumption at the basis of RQM is the following postulate: The probability distribution for (future) values of variables relative to \(S'\) depend on (past) values of variables relative to \(S'\) but not on (past) values of variables relative to another system \(S''.\)

The interpretation does not require to assume the existence of a classical world to be formulated, nor special observer systems; it does not give any special role to measurement. Instead, it assumes that any physical system can play the role of the Copenhagen’s observer and any interaction counts as a measurement. This is possible without changing the predictions of quantum theory thanks to the postulate above, because the interference observed by a system \(S'\) is not erased by the actualisation of variables relative to a different system \(S''\) (it can of course be suppressed by decoherence). In this way, RQM can make sense of a fully quantum world without requiring hidden variables, many worlds, physical collapse mechanisms, or a special role for mind, consciousness, subjectivity, agents, or similar.

The price to pay for this parsimony is a weakening of the conventional (“strong”) realism of classical mechanics where physical variables are assumed to have values which are non-relational and exist at every time. The fact that variables take value only at interactions gives a sparse event (or “flash”) ontology; the fact that they are labeled by the system to which they refer, adds a level of indexicality to the representation of the world.

RQM is metaphysically neutral, but it has a strong relational stance that questions strong realism (Laudisa 2019), in a sense detailed below. Because of this tingling with realism, RQM has been framed, in turn, in the context of various philosophical perspectives, including constructive empiricism (van Fraassen 2010), neo-Kantism (Bitbol 2007 [Other Internet Resources/OIR], Bitbol 2010), more recently anti-monism (Dorato 2016) and structural realism (Candiotto 2017). (See also Brown 2009, Wood 2010 [OIR].) The interpretation has aspects in common with QBism (Fuchs 2001, 2002 [OIR]), with Healey’s pragmatist approach (Healey 1989) and especially with the view of quantum theory discussed by Zeilinger and Bruckner (Zeilinger 1999, Brukner & Zeilinger 2003).

1. Main Ideas

1.1 Values of physical variables

The starting point of RQM is that quantum mechanics is not about a wave function (or a quantum state) \(\psi\); it is about values of physical variables. The ontology assumed by RQM, accordingly, includes only physical systems and variables that take values, as in classical mechanics. For instance, a real fact is the position of a particle having a certain value \(x\) at a certain time \(t\). Facts as this one (“the particle is at \(x\) at time \(t\)”) are called “events”, or “quantum events”. Quantum theory is about events. However, in classical mechanics there are two general assumptions that are abandoned in quantum theory.

(a) In classical mechanics it is assumed that all variables of a system have always a value at every time. RQM, on the contrary, assumes that this is in not the case in nature in general (Heisenberg 1925; Kochen & Specker 1967). Rather, this is only an approximation that holds when disregarding quantum phenomena. Physical variables acquire values only at some times, and have no value at the other times. Events, in other words, are discrete. This is the basic intuition that led Heisenberg to find the key to quantum mechanics in 1925; that is, there are questions that make sense in classical mechanics, but have no significance in nature. For instance, the question “What is the \(y\)-component of the spin of an electron when its \(z\)-component is \(\frac{1}{2} \hslash\)?” is meaningless: neither it admits an operational definition, nor is it needed for a realistic understanding of nature (see below, about realism). When does then a generic variable \(A\) of a system \(S\) acquire a value? When does an event happen? The RQM answer is: when and only when the system \(S\) interacts with a second system \(S'\) and the effect of the interaction on \(S'\) depends on the variable \(A\). In RQM, this is what it means for a variable to have a value.

(b) The second assumption of classical mechanics which is dropped in RQM is that there are variables that take absolute values, namely values independent from any other systems. Instead, RQM assumes that all (contingent) physical variables are relational. (The contingent variables are those with in classical theory are represented by phase space functions.) Any value these variables take is always (implicitly or explicitly) labelled by a second physical system. If the variable \(A\) of a system \(S\) takes a value in the interaction with a second systems \(S'\), the value it takes is only relative to \(S'\). The actualisation of an event is always relative to a system. The concrete meaning of this is the postulate above, according to which future ways the system \(S\) affects \(S'\) depend (probabilistically) on the values that variables of \(S\) have taken with respect to \(S'\), but future ways the system \(S\) affect a third system \(S''\) do not. The ensemble of all events relative to an arbitrary system \(S'\), together with the probabilistic predictions these entail, is called the “perspective” of the “observer” \(S'\).

The central claim at the basis of RQM is therefore that: “different observers can give different accounts of the same set of events” (Rovelli 1996: 1643). Textbook quantum mechanics is a complete description of the perspective of a single observer, but it disregards the effect of this observer system on the perspective of other systems. RQM emphasises the fact that the observer itself behaves as a quantum system, when acting on other systems. The relation between perspectives is discussed below.

1.2 Relative variables: “Different observers can give different accounts of the same set of events”

Relative variables are variables whose value does not depend on a single system, but rather on two systems. A well known example is the velocity of an object in classical mechanics. The velocity is always implicitly or explicitly relative to a second object. There is no “velocity of a single object”, irrespectively on any other object, in classical mechanics. Other well-known examples are the electric potential (only the potential of a conductor with respect to another conductor has physical meaning) and position (only position with respect to some other object has physical meaning). Relational quantum mechanics takes a further long step in this direction, assuming that we can make sense of quantum mechanics by assuming that all physical variables are relational in this sense.

RQM is sometimes wrongly assumed to be an interpretation where subjects, or agents, play a role. The source of the misunderstanding is the confusion between relative and subjective. When we say that the our speed is 11km/second with respect to the sun, we are not assuming that the sun has subjectivity. When we say that the distance between a signpost and a road intersection is 100 meters, we are not thinking that a road’s intersection is an agent. In a naturalistic perspective, a person, an agent, a subject, are physical systems. On the other hand, the world this person, agent, or subject, relates to is described by the value of the variables with respect to the physical system she is. This is like saying that a subject dwelling on the Earth sees the Cosmos rotating because the Earth is spinning. To say that RQM requires subjects or agents is the same mistake as saying that our explanation of the daily rotation of sun moon and stars around the Earth requires to take agency or subjectivity into account: an obvious nonsense. There is nothing subjective, idealistic, or mentalistic, in RQM.

1.3 Observer and measurement

In textbook presentations, quantum mechanics is about measurement outcomes performed when an “observer” makes a “measurement” on a quantum system. What is an observer, if all physical systems are quantum? What counts as a measurement? Common answers invoke the observer being macroscopic, onset of decoherence, irreversibility, registration of information, or similar. RQM does not utilise anything of the sort. Any system, irrespectively of its size, complexity or else, can play the role of the textbook’s quantum mechanical observer. The “measurement outcomes” of a given observer, however, refer only to values of the variables of the quantum system relative to that system. In particular, they do not affect events relative to other systems. In the same spirit, textbook presentations of quantum mechanics refer to “measurement outcomes”. In the relational interpretation, any interaction counts as a measurement, to the extent one system affects the other and this influence depends on a variable of the first system. Every physical object can be taken as defining a perspective, to which all values of physical quantities can be referred.

According to RQM, therefore, quantum mechanics is not a theory of the dynamics of an entity \(\psi\), from which the world of our experience somehow emerges. It is instead a theory about the standard world of our experience, described by values that conventional physical variables take at interactions, and about the transition probabilities that determine which values are likely to be realized, given that others were.

1.4 The wave function

The wave function, and more in general the quantum state \(\psi\), are interpreted realistically in several presentations of quantum theory. From the perspective of RQM, this is precisely what generates the confusion about quantum theory (Rovelli 2018). RQM circumvents the theorems for the reality of the wave function (Leifer 2014; Pusey, Barrett, & Rudolph 2012) because it is not a strongly realist theory—in the sense defined below—which is an implicit assumption of these theorems. The interpretation of the wave function in the context of RQM is akin the interpretation of the Hamilton-Jacobi functional in classical mechanics: a theoretical tool to facilitate the computation of the probabilities of future events on the basis of certain given knowledge.

The relation between the wave function \(\psi\) and the Hamilton-Jacobi functional \(S\) is more than an analogy, because in the semiclassical approximation the later approximates the first \((\psi \sim \exp iS/\hslash)\). This fact can be taken as an argument against a realistic interpretation of \(\psi\) for the following reason. A way to clarify the interpretation of a quantity in the mathematical apparatus of a physical theory is to study what this quantity reduces to in an approximation where the interpretation is clear. The Hamilton-Jacobi functions of, say, a classical particle has no realistic interpretation. Notice that if we gave it a realistic interpretation, we would generate mysterious collapses and jumps as we have for the wave function. Voiding the quantum states of a realistic interpretation avoids jumps and collapses. (Another argument against the realistic interpretation of \(\psi\) is given in Rovelli 2016.)

In classical mechanics we can dispense of the Hamilton-Jacobi functional. This testifies for its lack of ontological weight. We can equally dispense with \(\psi\) in quantum theory. Evidence of this is that the full early development of the quantum mechanical formalisms (Heisenberg 1925; Born & Jordan 1925; Dirac 1925; Born, Heisenberg, & Jordan 1926) predates the work where \(\psi\) was introduced (Schroedinger 1926)! Quantum mechanics can be formulated without reference to the quantum state, as a theory of probabilities for sequences of events. For instance, quantum theory can be formulated by giving the non-commutative algebra of observables and a one-parameter group of automorphisms of the algebra representing time evolution, and a single positive linear function on the algebra. Equivalently, it can be formulated in terms of transition probabilities between ensembles of values of variables; these can be directly computed, for instance with path integral methods. The state \(\psi\) is a convenient, not a necessary tool.

What is then the quantum state in the relational interpretation? It is a mathematical device that refers to two systems, not a single one. It codes the values of the variables of the first that have been actualised in interacting with the second (Groenewold 1957); it therefore codes anything we can predict regarding the future values of these variables, relative to the second system. The state \(\psi\) , in other words, can be interpreted as nothing more than a compendium of information assumed, known, or gathered through measurements, determined entirely by a specific history of interactions: the interactions between the system and a second ‘observing’ system. Understood in this manner the quantum state is always and only a relative state in the sense of Everett (1957). In this sense RQM is “Everettian”; it is so in a different sense than the Many Worlds interpretations, which are based on a realistic interpretation of the universal wave function, rejected in RQM.

1.5. Quantum superposition: can a cat be half dead, half alive?

If \(\psi'\) and \(\psi''\) are two (orthogonal) quantum states of a system, quantum mechanics predicts that the system can also be in the state \(\psi = (\psi' +\psi'')/\sqrt{2}\) . This is the superposition principle, a cornerstone of the theory. For instance, if \(\psi'\) is the state of a live cat and \(\psi''\) the state of a dead cat, then \(\psi\) is a state which the cat is in a quantum superposition of dead and alive; the theory predicts that this is a possible state of a cat. Why then don’t we ever see cats that are half alive and half dead? That is: why don’t we see macroscopic objects in quantum superpositions?

The answer is that the existence of states like \(\psi =(\psi' +\psi'')/\sqrt{2}\) does not mean that we should “see superpositions”: what we “see”, namely what we measure, according to textbook quantum theory, are eigenvalues of self-adjoint operators, not quantum states. Measured eigenvalues are always univocal, never “superimposed”.

What does it mean then for a state to be a superposition? First, it means that if an observable has value \(a'\) in \(\psi'\) and value \(a''\) in \(\psi''\) then any observation of the system will give either \(a'\) or \(a''\), each with probability 1/2. Second, the probability distribution of the outcomes of the measurement of any observable that is not diagonal in the \((\psi'\), \(\psi''\)) basis will be affected by interference: that is, it will not be the mean of the average values of the observable in \(\psi'\) and \(\psi''\). This and nothing else is the meaning of being in a quantum superposition. Hence, the answer to the question “Why don’t we ever see cats that are half alive and half dead?” is: because quantum theory predicts that we never see this sort of things. It predicts that we see cats either alive or dead. It also predicts that in principle we should be able to predict interference effect between the two states. These interference effects are strongly suppressed by decoherence in the case of macroscopic systems (like cats), hence the theory actually predicts that they are extremely hard to observe, in agreement with our experience.

A problem, however, appears in quantum mechanics if we ask what the cat itself would perceive. Say the brain of the cat measures whether its heart is beating or not. The theory predicts that the brain will find either that it does or that it does not. In textbook quantum mechanics, this implies a collapse of \(\psi\) to either \(\psi'\) or \(\psi''\). In turns, this implies that no further effects of interference between these two states will happen. And this contradicts the conclusion that interference effects, although small due to decoherence, are nevertheless real. This problem is resolved by RQM by the postulate above: the way the cat, as a quantum system, affects an external system, is not affected by the specific way the heart of the cat has affected its brain. That is, the state of the cat with respect to the external world does not collapse when a part of the cat interact with another.

2. Related Issues

2.1 Information

The early presentations of RQM were formulated in the language of information theory (Rovelli 1996). The quantum state is a way of coding the information that an observing system \(S'\) may have about a quantum system \(S\), relevant for predicting future ways \(S\) can affect \(S'\). This information is determined by the ways \(S\) has affected \(S'\) in the past. The hope was raised in Rovelli (1996) that a full reconstruction of the quantum formalism on the basis of simple informational postulates was possible. Two main postulates were proposed:

  • (i) relevant information is finite for a system with compact phase space,
  • (ii) new information can always be acquired.

The two postulates are not in contradiction with each other because when new information is gathered some previous relevant information becomes irrelevant. “Relevant” here means that it affects future probabilities. A moment of reflection shows that first postulate implies the characteristic discreteness of quantum theory, the second implies Heisenberg’s uncertainties. Very similar postulates were independently proposed by Zeilinger and Bruckner (Zeilinger 1999; Brukner & Zeilinger 2003).

As later emphasized in Dorato (2017), information is best not understood as a primary notion. It must be defined physically in terms of something else; as such, it can play an important notion in “theories of principle” in the sense of Einstein (1919). In RQM, the information is defined relationally as relative information (in the sense of Shannon) that a physical system has about another system. Relative information is physical correlation between two systems (see Rovelli 1996), namely a measure of the difference between the possible number of states of the combined system and the product of the number of states of the two systems, due to the existence of physical constraints. Thus, we say that a variable \(O_A\) of a system has information about a variable \(A\) of another system if the values that \(A\) and \(O_A\) can take are correlated. In the spirit of Shannon, this is a very weak definition of information that has no mentalistic, semantic, or cognitive aspects. The strong informational perspective of the early work in RQM has influenced several later development of information theoretical approaches to the foundations of quantum theory (see below).

2.2 Discreteness

Discreteness is not an accessory aspect of quantum theory: it is its most characteristic feature (and it gives the theory its name).

Discreteness appears in two related ways in quantum theory. First, the amount of information that can be gathered regarding the state of a system which is in a finite region R of its phase space is finite. It is given by the Liouville measure of R divided by the Planck constant, per degree of freedom. This is what causes discrete spectra. Continuous spectra require infinite phase spaces, and can be seen as effects of idealisations. The discreteness of quantum mechanics is captured by the first of the two informational postulates.

Second, quantum mechanics describes the world in terms of values of variables at specific discrete times. This second aspect of discreteness is directly accounted for by the sparse (or “flash”) ontology of RQM. The history of a quantum particle, for instance, is neither a continuous line is spacetime (as in classical mechanics), nor a continuous wave function on spacetime. Rather, with respect to any other system it is a discrete set of interactions, each localized in spacetime.

The flash ontology of RQM seems to raise a difficulty: what determines the timing for the events to happen? The problem is the difficulty of establishing a specific moment when, say, a measurement happens. The question is addressed in Rovelli (1998), observing that quantum mechanics itself does give a (probabilistic) prediction on when a measurement happens. This is because the meaning of the question whether or not a measurement has happened is to ascertain whether of not a pointer variable \(O_A\) in the observing system \(S\) has become properly correlated with the measured variable \(A\) of the system \(A\). In turn, this is a physical question that makes sense because it can be posed empirically by measuring \(A\) and \(O_A\) and checking if they are consistent.

2.3 Comparison with other interpretations

A way to clarify an interpretation of quantum mechanic is to compare it with the most discussed alternatives.

Textbook Copenhagen: To a good extent RQM is a completion of the standard textbook interpretation. The difference is that the latter assumes the existence of a classical world, or a classical observer, and describes the way quantum systems affect it in an interaction. The relational interpretation, on the contrary, assumes that this description is valid with respect to any physical system. Thus, RQM is a sort of “democratised” Copenhagen, where the role of the single observer can be assumed by any physical system.

Many Worlds: Both RQM and the Many Worlds interpretation (see Vaidman 2002 [2018]) are rooted in the work of Everett (1957). Both attempt to solve the mystery of quantum theory by adding a level of indexicality. In RQM, variables have values with respect to other physical systems. In Many Worlds, variables have values with respect to branches of the universal wave function. In neither interpretations there is an a priori special role for measurement, or observers. The difference is the profoundly distinct ontological commitment: the Many Worlds interpretation is based on a realist interpretation of the universal wave function, which obeys a deterministic evolution law. This implies that the Many Worlds interpretation must then work hard to recover Heisenberg uncertainty (via branch indexicality), probabilities (via subjective interpretation of probability), and discreteness. RQM has all this easily in its foundation. On the other hand, the Many Worlds interpretation is based on a (according to some, inflated, but) no-nonsense realist metaphysics, which is precluded to RQM. The two can perhaps made closer by the simple observation that modality can always be transformed into multiple world realism à la Lewis (1986), trading actuality for indexicality.

Hidden variables (Bohm): Hidden variable theories, of which Bohm theory (Bohm 1952) is the best available example, provide a realistic and deterministic interpretation of quantum mechanics. The similarity between RQM and Bohm theory is in the realistic interpretation of some variables, such as the position of a particle. A difference is in the sparse ontology of RQM, compared to the assumption of quantities unobservable in principle which is implicit in Bohm theory.

Physical collapse: Physical collapse theories like Ghirardi, Rimini, and Weber (1986) and Penrose (1996) are physically distinguishable from standard QM, which is instead assumed correct up to contrary empirical indications in RQM.

There are also current interpretation of quantum mechanics that are close to the relational interpretation:

Zeilinger Bruckner: The Relational Interpretation is very close to the view of quantum theory held developed by Zeilinger and Bruckner; in particular, almost identical postulates to the original ones of RQM were independently proposed in (Zeilinger 1999, Brukner & Zeilinger 2003). These ideas generated some of the interesting mathematical work aiming at making the derivation of the formalism of quantum theory from information theoretical postulates precise. For versions of this program strictly related to RQM see (Grinbaum 2005; Höhn 2017; Höhn & Wever 2017).

QBism: The emphasis on information in Rovelli (1996) influenced the birth of QBism (see Fuchs 1998: 3). There are similarities between RQM and QBism (Fuchs 2001, 2002 [OIR]). One similarity is the emphasis on dropping questions considered meaningless. The second is the use of the language of information theory (Spekkens 2014). The difference is mostly in the way the subject holding information is treated. In RQM, this subject is fully naturalised: it is itself considered a physical system that can be described by quantum theory. This leads to a definitely stronger version of realism that QBism, and to the emphasis on the relational aspect of all variables. In QBism, instead, the emphasis is in the information about the world held by a single subject, taken as primary. In RQM, the information is relative information (in the sense of Shannon) that a physical system has about another system; it is not primary (see Dorato 2017): it is can be simply understood physically as a correlation between the two systems that can be observed by a third system (Rovelli 1996).

Richard Healey: Healey’s pragmatist approach (Healey 1989) has in common with RQM the idea that the quantum state is not a description of physical reality, not even incompletely. Its main function is to be a (dispensable) tool for generating quantum probabilities. The main difference is the emphasis on what quantum states are relative to. For Healey’s pragmatist view, a quantum state ascription is relative only to the perspective of an actual or potential agent (Healey 2012). In RQM, values are objective and relative to any physical system. Restricting quantum theory to its use by agents is not a concern for Healey’s pragmatist philosophy; it is more so in a naturalistic perspective searching for an understanding of Nature that remains significative also where no agents are around. This is the same difference as between RQM and QBism, but Healey’s position is closer to RQM than QBism because while the QBism’s quantum state ascriptions depend on the epistemic state of the agent, for Healey the quantum state ascribed to a system depends only on the physical circumstances defining the perspective of the agent.

2.4 Representation

The issue of the interpretation of quantum mechanics is strictly related to the issue of the possibility of offering a representation: a description of what happens in the world. It can be useful to give a simple-minded pictorial representation of the images sustaining different interpretations. Imagine at time \(t_1\) a radioactive atom is surrounded by Geiger counters and at time \(t_2\) one of the counters clicks, having detected a product of the decay. What has happened around the \(t_1\)-\(t_2\) interval?

  • According to textbook quantum theory, the wave function of a particle classically trapped in the nucleus leaks out of the nucleus symmetrically, filling the space surrounding the nucleus. At the moment of the detection this wave function magically disappears everywhere except at the particular detector that clicks.
  • According to the Many Worlds interpretation, all detectors click. In fact, each detector clicks at every moment of time, but the wave function of the universe branches continuously into innumerable branches: we, ourselves, happen to be in one particular branch in which one particular detector clicks at one particular time.
  • According to the Bohmiam interpretation, the wave function equally leaks uniformly in space, but at the same time the associated particle, guided by this wave function, zigzags around, until hitting a particular detector.
  • According to Physical Collapse interpretations, the wave function also leaks out uniformly, but when it effect on the heavy Geiger detectors begins to displace too much matter, the wave function collapses as in the textbook interpretation, but driven by a hypothetical dynamical process which has not yet been explicitly observed (Ghirardi 2002 [2018]).
  • What about RQM? In the spirit of Heisenberg, there is no actual wave function in nature, nor there is any fact of the matter about the position of the particle respect to the Geiger counter at any moment between t1 and t2. However, there may be other facts of the matter. For instance, the position of the particle respect to some air molecule along the way. These, on the other hand, have no bearing on the position of the particle respect to the Geiger counter, which actualises at time t2 and whose probabilistic distribution does not depend on the position of the particle with respect to the air molecules.

2.5 Frauchiger-Renner experiment and locality

The Frauchiger-Renner thought-experiment (Frauchiger & Renner 2018) can be viewed as an indirect support to RQM, since it makes concrete the idea that “different observers can give different accounts of the same set of events”, as in the original RQM slogan (Rovelli 1996: 1463). The experiment is discussed in the conceptual framework of RQM by Waaijer and van Neerven (2019 [OIR]).

The application of RQM to the EPR context and the problem of quantum non locality has been initially discussed in Smerlak and Rovelli (2007) and (Laudisa 2001). Some of the claims of the earlier discussion about RQM being “local” have been questioned, pointing out that RQM should in any case be “forced to accept some form of non-locality in quantum phenomena” (Laudisa 2019: 227). A more recent discussion is in Martin-Dussaud, Rovelli, and Zalamea (2019), where a specific sense in which quantum theory is non-local from the RQM perspective is specified, and downplayed. See also Pienaar (2018 [OIR]) for comments.

2.6 Solipsism?

Prima facie, RQM may seem to imply a form of perspective solipsism, as the values of variables realized in the perspective of some system \(S'\) are not necessarily the same as those realized with respect to another system \(S''\). This is however not the case, as follows directly from quantum theory itself. The key is to observe that any physical comparison is itself a quantum interaction. Suppose the variable \(A\) of \(S\) is measured by \(S'\) and stored into the variable \(A'\) of \(S'\). This means that the interaction has created a correlation between \(A\) and \(A'\). In turn, this means that a third system measuring \(A\) and \(A'\) will certainly find consistent values. That is: the perspectives of \(S'\) and \(S''\) agree on this regard, and this can be checked in a physical interaction.

For instance: imagine experimenter \(S'\) measures the spin of the electron \(S\), and writes the value of this spin on a piece of paper. In principle, experimenter \(S''\) can devise an experiment where she can detect an effect due to interference between the two branches where the spin of the electron (and the text) have one or the other value. But if \(S''\) measures the spin and reads the piece of paper, she will find that experimenter \(S'\) has seen the same spin as herself.

Why? Because quantum theory predicts so, as can be seen from the following: with respect to \(S''\), the first interaction yields a quantum state of the form

\[ \begin{align} & \ket{\text{spin up}} \times \ket{\text{paper with text } \lsq\text{spin up}\rsq} \\ & + \ket{\text{spin down}} \times \ket{\text{paper with text } \lsq\text{spin down}\rsq} \end{align} \]

Measuring the spin projects the state on one single branch of the two, and both branches lead to consistency. Therefore, as long as we do not chase subtle interference phenomena hidden behind decoherence, RQM implies that we all ‘see the same world’.

3. General Comments

3.1 Realism and Relationality

The central move of RQM is to interpret all physical variables as relational, namely as referring to two systems, not a single one, and to view them as realised only in interactions. Relationality has been playing an ever dominant role as our knowledge of the natural world has increased. Examples are the relational nature of velocity in classical mechanics, of locality in general relativity, of the potential in electromagnetism, of the gauge invariant observables in non-abelian gauge theories, and many others. RQM is a step further in this direction. Taken seriously, the philosophical implications of this overreaching relationally can be heavy. The main one is a weakening of a strong version of realism.

If by realism we mean the assumption that the world is “out there”, irrespectively of our mental states, or perceptions, there is nothing in RQM that contradicts realism. But if by realism we mean the stronger assumption that each variables of each subsystem of the world has a single value at each and every time, then this strong version of realism is weakened by RQM. The ontology of RQM is a sparse (“flash”) ontology of relational quantum events, taken as primitive, and not derived from any “underlying” representation.

This weakening of realism is in a direction similar to what happened with Galilean or Einstein’s relativity, which have shown that there is no fact of the matter in the velocity of a single object, or in the simultaneity of two space like separated events alone. But is a more radical step in this direction. In Laudisa (2019) it is pointed out that RQM gives no deeper justification or underlying dynamical representation of the main process: the actualisation of quantum events at interactions. This is the process which in textbook quantum theory is called measurement and is accompanied by state reduction. Quantum mechanics gives probabilities for quantum events to happen, not a story representing how they happen. This core aspect of quantum theory is not resolved in RQM: it is taken as a fact of the world. What RQM does resolve is the question of when this happens: any time one system affects another one, it happens relative to this other system. What RQM does, is to show that this is not in contradiction with the existence of interference effects. But the core discreteness of the quantum event actualisation is not “explained” in RQM: it is understood as the picture of how nature works according to quantum theory.

The weakening of realism is the “price to pay” for the relational interpretation of quantum mechanics. It can be compared with the “price to pay” in other interpretations, such as the inflated ontology and the distance between the ontology and the world as we see it of the Many Worlds interpretation, the existence of variables unobservables in principle and the loss of Lorentz invariance of Bohm theory, and so on.

The other side of the coin of each “price to pay” is the lesson we might gather from the empirical success of quantum theory: for the Many Worlds interpretation, for instance, the lesson is the real existence of other branches, for Bohm theory is the real existence of unobservable variables that pick a preferred reference frame, and so on. For RQM, the lesson of quantum theory is that the description of the way distinct physical systems affect each other when they interact (and not the way physical systems ‘are’) exhausts all that can be said about the physical world. The physical world must be described as a net of interacting components, where there is no meaning to ‘the state of an isolated system’, or the value of the variables of an isolated system. The state of a physical system is the net of the relations it entertains with the surrounding systems. The physical structure of the world is identified as this net of relationships. The notion of substance that plays a major role in western philosophy might be inappropriate to account for this science; perhaps the idea of a “mutual dependency” [Nāgārjuna 1995] may offer a relevant philosophical cadre.

3.2 Reactions and criticisms

In van Fraassen (2010), Bas van Fraassen explores “the world of quantum mechanics as RQM depicts it” (2010: 390), clarifying what is and what is not relative to observers. He concentrates on the apparently paradoxical aspects of RQM. The limits on information that observers can have, which can only be acquired through physical interaction, have surprising consequences for complex situations in which an observer makes a measurement, a second observer makes measurements on the first and its target, and even a third observer comes in and observes a process involving the first two observers. Van Fraassen concludes that all the consistency questions can be laid to rest, when the situation’s representation in RQM is properly understood. On the other hand, he also observes that if in RQM what the state of a system relative to an observer is, is not itself relative to anything, then the question can be raised what relationships there are between the state of a specific entangled system or its components relative to different observers. He proposes and additional postulate, weakly relating the description of the same system as given by different observers, which forbids the possibility of disturbing inconsistencies allowed by the multiplication of perspectives.

Laura Candiotto (2017) argues that the best philosophical framework for RQM is Ontic Structural Realism (OSR) (Ladyman& Ross 2007; French & Ladyman 2011). Ontic structural realism is meant to be a defensible form of scientific realism (Ladyman 2007 [2019]); it argues for the priority of relations over substances, as self-subsistent individual objects (Morganti 2011). For Candiotto, RQM is a realistic theory that assumes the notion of relation (the physical interaction between systems and instruments) as primitive; objects emerge as relational “nodes” (French 2006), or intersections of processes. The lack of observer-independence is not inability of providing an account of the structure of matter, because there are no intrinsic properties that can be assigned to systems independently of their interactions, therefore this structure is itself relational, hence in particular observer dependent. Relations via dynamical processes of information exchange can be taken as the building blocks of the universe.

The relation between RQM and ontic structural realism has been emphasized also by Mauro Dorato (2016). Dorato gives an extensive evaluation of RQM, pointing out its main characteristics. He emphasises then two aspects that characterise RQM. The first is a revisionary rather than a descriptive metaphysical account of quantum theory; that is: central assumptions of common sense must go, if they contradict contemporary physical theories. Here, what is abandoned is the presupposition that quantum systems have a non-relational, intrinsic nature. RQM’s metaphysics is revisionary also for a second reason. Analogously to the many-worlds interpretation, RQM does not suggest changing the formalism of quantum theory—as alternative formulations of the theory do—but rather, modifies the conceptual schemes with which we can interpret the formalism, and consequently, our metaphysics. Dorato observes that the relativisation of values implies a relativisation of the very notion of object or entity, if (i) having some intrinsic, non-purely dispositional properties is essential to the identity of an object, and (ii) no entity can exist if it does not have an intrinsic identity (see Nāgārjuna c. 2nd century CE [1995]). The only reality in RQM is given by events, which are the result of interactions between distinct quantum systems, but even these events can be described in a different way by different physical systems. The interaction cannot be described in a more precise way by a constructive theory in Einstein’s sense (Einstein 1919) that can explain the coming into being of a definite outcome without just assuming it as a fundamental fact. Dorato concludes that there is no measurement problem in RQM because RQM is implicitly formulated as a theory of principle. He also considers the issue of priority monism as defined in Schaffer (2010): Shaffer claims that quantum mechanics’ entanglement is evidence that the whole universe has ontological priority with respect to its parts. Dorato point out that the firm advocacy of relationalism of RQM has instead radical anti-holistic consequences.

The second characteristic aspect of RQM pointed out by Dorato is that, consequently, the best way to capture the nature of not-yet interacting quantum systems is to call into play a form of dispositionalism: the only way to attribute some sort of intrinsicness to the state-dependent properties of quantum systems is to attribute them dispositions to manifest in a certain way according to the interactions they are subject to. Dispositionalism is present in many other views of quantum mechanics (Dorato 2006) but fits particularly well in the context of RQM. Unlike Qbists interpretations of quantum theory, which are agents-centered, in RQM the relation “\(S\) manifest \(q\) relative to \(S'\)” is symmetric, and this is a simple consequence of the hypothesis that in RQM quantum systems and “observers” are on the same level. As a consequence of its relational and dispositional aspect, Dorato stresses the fact that in RQM there cannot be a universal flow of becoming, but only a local, worldline-dependent and relational one. This still counts as a relational form of becoming: no universal tide of coming into being, but a crisscross of ripples. Since a physical system can exemplify a given succession of events only relatively to another system and not absolutely, in RQM there cannot be cosmic time, so that also in general relativity temporal succession of events cannot be regarded as a total order. In a sense, in RQM there is no quantum state of the universe, or a God’s eye point of view, since the cosmos can only be described “from within a given perspective”.


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