The Uncertainty Principle

First published Mon Oct 8, 2001; substantive revision Tue Jul 12, 2016

Quantum mechanics is generally regarded as the physical theory that is our best candidate for a fundamental and universal description of the physical world. The conceptual framework employed by this theory differs drastically from that of classical physics. Indeed, the transition from classical to quantum physics marks a genuine revolution in our understanding of the physical world.

One striking aspect of the difference between classical and quantum physics is that whereas classical mechanics presupposes that exact simultaneous values can be assigned to all physical quantities, quantum mechanics denies this possibility, the prime example being the position and momentum of a particle. According to quantum mechanics, the more precisely the position (momentum) of a particle is given, the less precisely can one say what its momentum (position) is. This is (a simplistic and preliminary formulation of) the quantum mechanical uncertainty principle for position and momentum. The uncertainty principle played an important role in many discussions on the philosophical implications of quantum mechanics, in particular in discussions on the consistency of the so-called Copenhagen interpretation, the interpretation endorsed by the founding fathers Heisenberg and Bohr.

This should not suggest that the uncertainty principle is the only aspect of the conceptual difference between classical and quantum physics: the implications of quantum mechanics for notions as (non)-locality, entanglement and identity play no less havoc with classical intuitions.

1. Introduction

The uncertainty principle is certainly one of the most famous aspects of quantum mechanics. It has often been regarded as the most distinctive feature in which quantum mechanics differs from classical theories of the physical world. Roughly speaking, the uncertainty principle (for position and momentum) states that one cannot assign exact simultaneous values to the position and momentum of a physical system. Rather, these quantities can only be determined with some characteristic “uncertainties” that cannot become arbitrarily small simultaneously. But what is the exact meaning of this principle, and indeed, is it really a principle of quantum mechanics? (In his original work, Heisenberg only speaks of uncertainty relations.) And, in particular, what does it mean to say that a quantity is determined only up to some uncertainty? These are the main questions we will explore in the following, focusing on the views of Heisenberg and Bohr.

The notion of “uncertainty” occurs in several different meanings in the physical literature. It may refer to a lack of knowledge of a quantity by an observer, or to the experimental inaccuracy with which a quantity is measured, or to some ambiguity in the definition of a quantity, or to a statistical spread in an ensemble of similarly prepared systems. Also, several different names are used for such uncertainties: inaccuracy, spread, imprecision, indefiniteness, indeterminateness, indeterminacy, latitude, etc. As we shall see, even Heisenberg and Bohr did not decide on a single terminology for quantum mechanical uncertainties. Forestalling a discussion about which name is the most appropriate one in quantum mechanics, we use the name “uncertainty principle” simply because it is the most common one in the literature.

2. Heisenberg

2.1 Heisenberg’s road to the uncertainty relations

Heisenberg introduced his famous relations in an article of 1927, entitled Ueber den anschaulichen Inhalt der quantentheoretischen Kinematik und Mechanik. A (partial) translation of this title is: “On the anschaulich content of quantum theoretical kinematics and mechanics”. Here, the term anschaulich is particularly notable. Apparently, it is one of those German words that defy an unambiguous translation into other languages. Heisenberg’s title is translated as “On the physical content …” by Wheeler and Zurek (1983). His collected works (Heisenberg 1984) translate it as “On the perceptible content …”, while Cassidy’s biography of Heisenberg (Cassidy 1992), refers to the paper as “On the perceptual content …”. Literally, the closest translation of the term anschaulich is “visualizable”. But, as in most languages, words that make reference to vision are not always intended literally. Seeing is widely used as a metaphor for understanding, especially for immediate understanding. Hence, anschaulich also means “intelligible” or “intuitive”.[1]

Why was this issue of the Anschaulichkeit of quantum mechanics such a prominent concern to Heisenberg? This question has already been considered by a number of commentators (Jammer 1974; Miller 1982; de Regt 1997; Beller 1999). For the answer, it turns out, we must go back a little in time. In 1925 Heisenberg had developed the first coherent mathematical formalism for quantum theory (Heisenberg 1925). His leading idea was that only those quantities that are in principle observable should play a role in the theory, and that all attempts to form a picture of what goes on inside the atom should be avoided. In atomic physics the observational data were obtained from spectroscopy and associated with atomic transitions. Thus, Heisenberg was led to consider the “transition quantities” as the basic ingredients of the theory. Max Born, later that year, realized that the transition quantities obeyed the rules of matrix calculus, a branch of mathematics that was not so well-known then as it is now. In a famous series of papers Heisenberg, Born and Jordan developed this idea into the matrix mechanics version of quantum theory.

Formally, matrix mechanics remains close to classical mechanics. The central idea is that all physical quantities must be represented by infinite self-adjoint matrices (later identified with operators on a Hilbert space). It is postulated that the matrices \(\bQ\) and \(\bP\) representing the canonical position and momentum variables of a particle satisfy the so-called canonical commutation rule

\[\tag{1} \bQ\bP - \bP\bQ = i\hslash\]

where \(\hslash = h/2\pi\), \(h\) denotes Planck’s constant, and boldface type is used to represent matrices (or operators). The new theory scored spectacular empirical success by encompassing nearly all spectroscopic data known at the time, especially after the concept of the electron spin was included in the theoretical framework.

It came as a big surprise, therefore, when one year later, Erwin Schrödinger presented an alternative theory, that became known as wave mechanics. Schrödinger assumed that an electron in an atom could be represented as an oscillating charge cloud, evolving continuously in space and time according to a wave equation. The discrete frequencies in the atomic spectra were not due to discontinuous transitions (quantum jumps) as in matrix mechanics, but to a resonance phenomenon. Schrödinger also showed that the two theories were equivalent.[2]

Even so, the two approaches differed greatly in interpretation and spirit. Whereas Heisenberg eschewed the use of visualizable pictures, and accepted discontinuous transitions as a primitive notion, Schrödinger claimed as an advantage of his theory that it was anschaulich. In Schrödinger’s vocabulary, this meant that the theory represented the observational data by means of continuously evolving causal processes in space and time. He considered this condition of Anschaulichkeit to be an essential requirement on any acceptable physical theory. Schrödinger was not alone in appreciating this aspect of his theory. Many other leading physicists were attracted to wave mechanics for the same reason. For a while, in 1926, before it emerged that wave mechanics had serious problems of its own, Schrödinger’s approach seemed to gather more support in the physics community than matrix mechanics.

Understandably, Heisenberg was unhappy about this development. In a letter of 8 June 1926 to Pauli he confessed that “The more I think about the physical part of Schrödinger’s theory, the more disgusting I find it”, and: “What Schrödinger writes about the Anschaulichkeit of his theory, … I consider Mist” (Pauli 1979: 328). Again, this last German term is translated differently by various commentators: as “junk” (Miller 1982) “rubbish” (Beller 1999) “crap” (Cassidy 1992), “poppycock” (Bacciagaluppi & Valentini 2009) and perhaps more literally, as “bullshit” (Moore 1989; de Regt 1997). Nevertheless, in published writings, Heisenberg voiced a more balanced opinion. In a paper in Die Naturwissenschaften (1926) he summarized the peculiar situation that the simultaneous development of two competing theories had brought about. Although he argued that Schrödinger’s interpretation was untenable, he admitted that matrix mechanics did not provide the Anschaulichkeit which made wave mechanics so attractive. He concluded:

to obtain a contradiction-free anschaulich interpretation, we still lack some essential feature in our image of the structure of matter.

The purpose of his 1927 paper was to provide exactly this lacking feature.

2.2 Heisenberg’s argument

Let us now look at the argument that led Heisenberg to his uncertainty relations. He started by redefining the notion of Anschaulichkeit. Whereas Schrödinger associated this term with the provision of a causal space-time picture of the phenomena, Heisenberg, by contrast, declared:

We believe we have gained anschaulich understanding of a physical theory, if in all simple cases, we can grasp the experimental consequences qualitatively and see that the theory does not lead to any contradictions. Heisenberg 1927: 172)

His goal was, of course, to show that, in this new sense of the word, matrix mechanics could lay the same claim to Anschaulichkeit as wave mechanics.

To do this, he adopted an operational assumption: terms like “the position of a particle” have meaning only if one specifies a suitable experiment by which “the position of a particle” can be measured. We will call this assumption the “measurement=meaning principle”. In general, there is no lack of such experiments, even in the domain of atomic physics. However, experiments are never completely accurate. We should be prepared to accept, therefore, that in general the meaning of these quantities is also determined only up to some characteristic inaccuracy.

As an example, he considered the measurement of the position of an electron by a microscope. The accuracy of such a measurement is limited by the wave length of the light illuminating the electron. Thus, it is possible, in principle, to make such a position measurement as accurate as one wishes, by using light of a very short wave length, e.g., \(\gamma\)-rays. But for \(\gamma\)-rays, the Compton effect cannot be ignored: the interaction of the electron and the illuminating light should then be considered as a collision of at least one photon with the electron. In such a collision, the electron suffers a recoil which disturbs its momentum. Moreover, the shorter the wave length, the larger is this change in momentum. Thus, at the moment when the position of the particle is accurately known, Heisenberg argued, its momentum cannot be accurately known:

At the instant of time when the position is determined, that is, at the instant when the photon is scattered by the electron, the electron undergoes a discontinuous change in momentum. This change is the greater the smaller the wavelength of the light employed, i.e., the more exact the determination of the position. At the instant at which the position of the electron is known, its momentum therefore can be known only up to magnitudes which correspond to that discontinuous change; thus, the more precisely the position is determined, the less precisely the momentum is known, and conversely. (Heisenberg 1927: 174–5)

This is the first formulation of the uncertainty principle. In its present form it is an epistemological principle, since it limits what we can know about the electron. From “elementary formulae of the Compton effect” Heisenberg estimated the “imprecisions” to be of the order

\[\tag{2} \delta p\delta q \sim h\]

He continued: “In this circumstance we see the direct anschaulich content of the relation \(\boldsymbol{QP} - \boldsymbol{PQ} = i\hslash\).”

He went on to consider other experiments, designed to measure other physical quantities and obtained analogous relations for time and energy:

\[\tag{3} \delta t \delta E \sim h\]

and action \(J\) and angle \(w\)

\[\tag{4} \delta w \delta J \sim h\]

which he saw as corresponding to the “well-known” relations

\[\tag{5} \boldsymbol{tE} - \boldsymbol{Et} = i\hslash \text{ or } \boldsymbol{wJ} - \boldsymbol{Jw} = i\hslash\]

However, these generalisations are not as straightforward as Heisenberg suggested. In particular, the status of the time variable in his several illustrations of relation (3) is not at all clear (Hilgevoord 2005; see also Section 2.5).

Heisenberg summarized his findings in a general conclusion: all concepts used in classical mechanics are also well-defined in the realm of atomic processes. But, as a pure fact of experience (rein erfahrungsgemäß), experiments that serve to provide such a definition for one quantity are subject to particular indeterminacies, obeying relations (2)(4) which prohibit them from providing a simultaneous definition of two canonically conjugate quantities. Note that in this formulation the emphasis has slightly shifted: he now speaks of a limit on the definition of concepts, i.e., not merely on what we can know, but what we can meaningfully say about a particle. Of course, this stronger formulation follows by application of the above measurement=meaning principle: if there are, as Heisenberg claims, no experiments that allow a simultaneous precise measurement of two conjugate quantities, then these quantities are also not simultaneously well-defined.

Heisenberg’s paper has an interesting “Addition in proof” mentioning critical remarks by Bohr, who saw the paper only after it had been sent to the publisher. Among other things, Bohr pointed out that in the microscope experiment it is not the change of the momentum of the electron that is important, but rather the circumstance that this change cannot be precisely determined in the same experiment. An improved version of the argument, responding to this objection, is given in Heisenberg’s Chicago lectures of 1930.

Here (Heisenberg 1930: 16), it is assumed that the electron is illuminated by light of wavelength \(\lambda\) and that the scattered light enters a microscope with aperture angle \(\varepsilon\). According to the laws of classical optics, the accuracy of the microscope depends on both the wave length and the aperture angle; Abbe’s criterium for its “resolving power”, i.e., the size of the smallest discernable details, gives

\[\tag{6} \delta q \sim \frac{\lambda}{\sin \varepsilon}.\]

On the other hand, the direction of a scattered photon, when it enters the microscope, is unknown within the angle \(\varepsilon\), rendering the momentum change of the electron uncertain by an amount

\[\tag{7} \delta p \sim \frac{h \sin \varepsilon}{\lambda}\]

leading again to the result (2).

Let us now analyse Heisenberg’s argument in more detail. Note that, even in this improved version, Heisenberg’s argument is incomplete. According to Heisenberg’s “measurement=meaning principle”, one must also specify, in the given context, what the meaning is of the phrase “momentum of the electron”, in order to make sense of the claim that this momentum is changed by the position measurement. A solution to this problem can again be found in the Chicago lectures (Heisenberg 1930: 15). Here, he assumes that initially the momentum of the electron is precisely known, e.g., it has been measured in a previous experiment with an inaccuracy \(\delta p_{i}\), which may be arbitrarily small. Then, its position is measured with inaccuracy \(\delta q\), and after this, its final momentum is measured with an inaccuracy \(\delta p_{f}\). All three measurements can be performed with arbitrary precision. Thus, the three quantities \(\delta p_{i}, \delta q\), and \(\delta p_{f}\) can be made as small as one wishes. If we assume further that the initial momentum has not changed until the position measurement, we can speak of a definite momentum until the time of the position measurement. Moreover we can give operational meaning to the idea that the momentum is changed during the position measurement: the outcome of the second momentum measurement (say \(p_{f}\) will generally differ from the initial value \(p_{i}\). In fact, one can also show that this change is discontinuous, by varying the time between the three measurements.

Let us try to see, adopting this more elaborate set-up, if we can complete Heisenberg’s argument. We have now been able to give empirical meaning to the “change of momentum” of the electron, \(p_{f} - p_{i}\). Heisenberg’s argument claims that the order of magnitude of this change is at least inversely proportional to the inaccuracy of the position measurement:

\[\tag{8} \abs{p_{f} - p_{i}} \delta q \sim h\]

However, can we now draw the conclusion that the momentum is only imprecisely defined? Certainly not. Before the position measurement, its value was \(p_{i}\), after the measurement it is \(p_{f}\). One might, perhaps, claim that the value at the very instant of the position measurement is not yet defined, but we could simply settle this by a convention, e.g., we might assign the mean value \((p_{i} + p_{f})/2\) to the momentum at this instant. But then, the momentum is precisely determined at all instants, and Heisenberg’s formulation of the uncertainty principle no longer follows. The above attempt of completing Heisenberg’s argument thus overshoots its mark.

A solution to this problem can again be found in the Chicago Lectures. Heisenberg admits that position and momentum can be known exactly. He writes:

If the velocity of the electron is at first known, and the position then exactly measured, the position of the electron for times previous to the position measurement may be calculated. For these past times, \(\delta p\delta q\) is smaller than the usual bound. (Heisenberg 1930: 15)

Indeed, Heisenberg says: “the uncertainty relation does not hold for the past”.

Apparently, when Heisenberg refers to the uncertainty or imprecision of a quantity, he means that the value of this quantity cannot be given beforehand. In the sequence of measurements we have considered above, the uncertainty in the momentum after the measurement of position has occurred, refers to the idea that the value of the momentum is not fixed just before the final momentum measurement takes place. Once this measurement is performed, and reveals a value \(p_{f}\), the uncertainty relation no longer holds; these values then belong to the past. Clearly, then, Heisenberg is concerned with unpredictability: the point is not that the momentum of a particle changes, due to a position measurement, but rather that it changes by an unpredictable amount. It is, however always possible to measure, and hence define, the size of this change in a subsequent measurement of the final momentum with arbitrary precision.

Although Heisenberg admits that we can consistently attribute values of momentum and position to an electron in the past, he sees little merit in such talk. He points out that these values can never be used as initial conditions in a prediction about the future behavior of the electron, or subjected to experimental verification. Whether or not we grant them physical reality is, as he puts it, a matter of personal taste. Heisenberg’s own taste is, of course, to deny their physical reality. For example, he writes,

I believe that one can formulate the emergence of the classical “path” of a particle succinctly as follows: the “path” comes into being only because we observe it. (Heisenberg 1927: 185)

Apparently, in his view, a measurement does not only serve to give meaning to a quantity, it creates a particular value for this quantity. This may be called the “measurement=creation” principle. It is an ontological principle, for it states what is physically real.

This then leads to the following picture. First we measure the momentum of the electron very accurately. By “measurement= meaning”, this entails that the term “the momentum of the particle” is now well-defined. Moreover, by the “measurement=creation” principle, we may say that this momentum is physically real. Next, the position is measured with inaccuracy \(\delta q\). At this instant, the position of the particle becomes well-defined and, again, one can regard this as a physically real attribute of the particle. However, the momentum has now changed by an amount that is unpredictable by an order of magnitude \(\abs{p_{f} - p_{i}} \sim h/\delta q\). The meaning and validity of this claim can be verified by a subsequent momentum measurement.

The question is then what status we shall assign to the momentum of the electron just before its final measurement. Is it real? According to Heisenberg it is not. Before the final measurement, the best we can attribute to the electron is some unsharp, or fuzzy momentum. These terms are meant here in an ontological sense, characterizing a real attribute of the electron.

2.3 The interpretation of Heisenberg’s uncertainty relations

Heisenberg’s relations were soon considered to be a cornerstone of the Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics. Just a few months later, Kennard (1927) already called them the “essential core” of the new theory. Taken together with Heisenberg’s contention that they provide the intuitive content of the theory and their prominent role in later discussions on the Copenhagen interpretation, a dominant view emerged in which the uncertainty relations were regarded as a fundamental principle of the theory.

The interpretation of these relations has often been debated. Do Heisenberg’s relations express restrictions on the experiments we can perform on quantum systems, and, therefore, restrictions on the information we can gather about such systems; or do they express restrictions on the meaning of the concepts we use to describe quantum systems? Or else, are they restrictions of an ontological nature, i.e., do they assert that a quantum system simply does not possess a definite value for its position and momentum at the same time? The difference between these interpretations is partly reflected in the various names by which the relations are known, e.g., as “inaccuracy relations”, or: “uncertainty”, “indeterminacy” or “unsharpness relations”. The debate between these views has been addressed by many authors, but it has never been settled completely. Let it suffice here to make only two general observations.

First, it is clear that in Heisenberg’s own view all the above questions stand or fall together. Indeed, we have seen that he adopted an operational “measurement=meaning” principle according to which the meaningfulness of a physical quantity was equivalent to the existence of an experiment purporting to measure that quantity. Similarly, his “measurement=creation” principle allowed him to attribute physical reality to such quantities. Hence, Heisenberg’s discussions moved rather freely and quickly from talk about experimental inaccuracies to epistemological or ontological issues and back again.

However, ontological questions seemed to be of somewhat less interest to him. For example, there is a passage (Heisenberg 1927: 197), where he discusses the idea that, behind our observational data, there might still exist a hidden reality in which quantum systems have definite values for position and momentum, unaffected by the uncertainty relations. He emphatically dismisses this conception as an unfruitful and meaningless speculation, because, as he says, the aim of physics is only to describe observable data. Similarly, in the Chicago Lectures, he warns against the fact that the human language permits the utterance of statements which have no empirical content, but nevertheless produce a picture in our imagination. He notes,

One should be especially careful in using the words “reality”, “actually”, etc., since these words very often lead to statements of the type just mentioned. (Heisenberg 1930: 11)

So, Heisenberg also endorsed an interpretation of his relations as rejecting a reality in which particles have simultaneous definite values for position and momentum.

The second observation is that although for Heisenberg experimental, informational, epistemological and ontological formulations of his relations were, so to say, just different sides of the same coin, this is not so for those who do not share his operational principles or his view on the task of physics. Alternative points of view, in which e.g., the ontological reading of the uncertainty relations is denied, are therefore still viable. The statement, often found in the literature of the thirties, that Heisenberg had proved the impossibility of associating a definite position and momentum to a particle is certainly wrong. But the precise meaning one can coherently attach to Heisenberg’s relations depends rather heavily on the interpretation one favors for quantum mechanics as a whole. And because no agreement has been reached on this latter issue, one cannot expect agreement on the meaning of the uncertainty relations either.

2.4 Uncertainty relations or uncertainty principle?

Let us now move to another question about Heisenberg’s relations: do they express a principle of quantum theory? Probably the first influential author to call these relations a “principle” was Eddington, who, in his Gifford Lectures of 1928 referred to them as the “Principle of Indeterminacy”. In the English literature the name uncertainty principle became most common. It is used both by Condon and Robertson in 1929, and also in the English version of Heisenberg’s Chicago Lectures (Heisenberg 1930), although, remarkably, nowhere in the original German version of the same book (see also Cassidy 1998). Indeed, Heisenberg never seems to have endorsed the name “principle” for his relations. His favourite terminology was “inaccuracy relations” (Ungenauigkeitsrelationen) or “indeterminacy relations” (Unbestimmtheitsrelationen). We know only one passage, in Heisenberg’s own Gifford lectures, delivered in 1955–56 (Heisenberg 1958: 43), where he mentioned that his relations “are usually called relations of uncertainty or principle of indeterminacy”. But this can well be read as his yielding to common practice rather than his own preference.

But does the relation (2) qualify as a principle of quantum mechanics? Several authors, foremost Karl Popper (1967), have contested this view. Popper argued that the uncertainty relations cannot be granted the status of a principle on the grounds that they are derivable from the theory, whereas one cannot obtain the theory from the uncertainty relations. (The argument being that one can never derive any equation, say, the Schrödinger equation, or the commutation relation (1), from an inequality.)

Popper’s argument is, of course, correct but we think it misses the point. There are many statements in physical theories which are called principles even though they are in fact derivable from other statements in the theory in question. A more appropriate departing point for this issue is not the question of logical priority but rather Einstein’s distinction between “constructive theories” and “principle theories”.

Einstein proposed this famous classification in Einstein 1919. Constructive theories are theories which postulate the existence of simple entities behind the phenomena. They endeavour to reconstruct the phenomena by framing hypotheses about these entities. Principle theories, on the other hand, start from empirical principles, i.e., general statements of empirical regularities, employing no or only a bare minimum of theoretical terms. The purpose is to build up the theory from such principles. That is, one aims to show how these empirical principles provide sufficient conditions for the introduction of further theoretical concepts and structure.

The prime example of a theory of principle is thermodynamics. Here the role of the empirical principles is played by the statements of the impossibility of various kinds of perpetual motion machines. These are regarded as expressions of brute empirical fact, providing the appropriate conditions for the introduction of the concepts of energy and entropy and their properties. (There is a lot to be said about the tenability of this view, but that is not our topic here.)

Now obviously, once the formal thermodynamic theory is built, one can also derive the impossibility of the various kinds of perpetual motion. (They would violate the laws of energy conservation and entropy increase.) But this derivation should not misguide one into thinking that they were no principles of the theory after all. The point is just that empirical principles are statements that do not rely on the theoretical concepts (in this case entropy and energy) for their meaning. They are interpretable independently of these concepts and, further, their validity on the empirical level still provides the physical content of the theory.

A similar example is provided by special relativity, another theory of principle, which Einstein deliberately designed after the ideal of thermodynamics. Here, the empirical principles are the light postulate and the relativity principle. Again, once we have built up the modern theoretical formalism of the theory (Minkowski space-time), it is straightforward to prove the validity of these principles. But again this does not count as an argument for claiming that they were no principles after all. So the question whether the term “principle” is justified for Heisenberg’s relations, should, in our view, be understood as the question whether they are conceived of as empirical principles.

One can easily show that this idea was never far from Heisenberg’s intentions. We have already seen that Heisenberg presented the relations as the result of a “pure fact of experience”. A few months after his 1927 paper, he wrote a popular paper “Über die Grundprincipien der Quantenmechanik” (“On the fundamental principles of quantum mechanics”) where he made the point even more clearly. Here Heisenberg described his recent break-through in the interpretation of the theory as follows: “It seems to be a general law of nature that we cannot determine position and velocity simultaneously with arbitrary accuracy”. Now actually, and in spite of its title, the paper does not identify or discuss any “fundamental principle” of quantum mechanics. So, it must have seemed obvious to his readers that he intended to claim that the uncertainty relation was a fundamental principle, forced upon us as an empirical law of nature, rather than a result derived from the formalism of the theory.

This reading of Heisenberg’s intentions is corroborated by the fact that, even in his 1927 paper, applications of his relation frequently present the conclusion as a matter of principle. For example, he says “In a stationary state of an atom its phase is in principle indeterminate” (Heisenberg 1927: 177, [emphasis added]). Similarly, in a paper of 1928, he described the content of his relations as:

It has turned out that it is in principle impossible to know, to measure the position and velocity of a piece of matter with arbitrary accuracy. (Heisenberg 1984: 26, [emphasis added])

So, although Heisenberg did not originate the tradition of calling his relations a principle, it is not implausible to attribute the view to him that the uncertainty relations represent an empirical principle that could serve as a foundation of quantum mechanics. In fact, his 1927 paper expressed this desire explicitly:

Surely, one would like to be able to deduce the quantitative laws of quantum mechanics directly from their anschaulich foundations, that is, essentially, relation [(2)]. (ibid: 196)

This is not to say that Heisenberg was successful in reaching this goal, or that he did not express other opinions on other occasions.

Let us conclude this section with three remarks. First, if the uncertainty relation is to serve as an empirical principle, one might well ask what its direct empirical support is. In Heisenberg’s analysis, no such support is mentioned. His arguments concerned thought experiments in which the validity of the theory, at least at a rudimentary level, is implicitly taken for granted. Jammer (1974: 82) conducted a literature search for high precision experiments that could seriously test the uncertainty relations and concluded they were still scarce in 1974. Real experimental support for the uncertainty relations in experiments in which the inaccuracies are close to the quantum limit have come about only more recently (see Kaiser, Werner, and George 1983; Uffink 1985; Nairz, Andt, and Zeilinger 2002).

A second point is the question whether the theoretical structure or the quantitative laws of quantum theory can indeed be derived on the basis of the uncertainty principle, as Heisenberg wished. Serious attempts to build up quantum theory as a full-fledged Theory of Principle on the basis of the uncertainty principle have never been carried out. Indeed, the most Heisenberg could and did claim in this respect was that the uncertainty relations created “room” (Heisenberg 1927: 180) or “freedom” (Heisenberg 1931: 43) for the introduction of some non-classical mode of description of experimental data, not that they uniquely lead to the formalism of quantum mechanics. A serious proposal to approach quantum mechanics as a theory of principle was provided more recently by Bub (2000) and Chiribella & Spekkens (2016). But, remarkably, this proposal does not use the uncertainty relation as one of its fundamental principles. Third, it is remarkable that in his later years Heisenberg put a somewhat different gloss on his relations. In his autobiography Der Teil und das Ganze of 1969 he described how he had found his relations inspired by a remark by Einstein that “it is the theory which decides what one can observe”—thus giving precedence to theory above experience, rather than the other way around. Some years later he even admitted that his famous discussions of thought experiments were actually trivial since

… if the process of observation itself is subject to the laws of quantum theory, it must be possible to represent its result in the mathematical scheme of this theory. (Heisenberg 1975: 6)

2.5 Mathematical elaboration

When Heisenberg introduced his relation, his argument was based only on qualitative examples. He did not provide a general, exact derivation of his relations.[3] Indeed, he did not even give a definition of the uncertainties \(\delta q\), etc., occurring in these relations. Of course, this was consistent with the announced goal of that paper, i.e., to provide some qualitative understanding of quantum mechanics for simple experiments.

The first mathematically exact formulation of the uncertainty relations is due to Kennard. He proved in 1927 the theorem that for all normalized state vectors \(\ket{\psi}\) the following inequality holds:

\[\tag{9} \Delta_{\psi}\bP \Delta_{\psi}\bQ \ge \hslash/2 \]

Here, \(\Delta_{\psi}\bP\) and \(\Delta_{\psi}\bQ\) are standard deviations of position and momentum in the state vector \(\ket{\psi}\), i.e.,

\[\tag{10} \begin{align*} (\Delta_{\psi}\bP)^2 &= \expval{\bP^2}_{\psi} - \expval{\bP}_{\psi}^2 \\ (\Delta_{\psi}\bQ)^2 &= \expval{\bQ^2}_{\psi} - \expval{\bQ}_{\psi}^2 \end{align*}\]

where \(\expval{\cdot}_{\psi} = \expvalexp{\cdot}{\psi}\) denotes the expectation value in state \(\ket{\psi}\). Equivalently we can use the wave function \(\psi(q)\) and its Fourier transform:

\[\begin{align*} \tag{11} \psi(q) &= \braket{q}{\psi} \\ \notag \tilde{\psi}(p) & = \braket{p}{\psi} =\frac{1}{\sqrt{2\pi \hbar} }\int \! \! dq\, e^{-ipq/\hbar} \psi(q) \end{align*}\]

to write

\[\begin{align*} (\Delta_\psi {\bQ})^2 & = \! \int\!\! dq\, \abs{\psi(q)}^2 q^2 - \left(\int \!\!dq \, \abs{\psi(q)}^2 q \right)^2 \\ (\Delta_\psi {\bP})^2 & = \! \int \!\!dp \, \abs{\tilde{\psi}(p)}^2 p^2 - \left(\int\!\!dp \, \abs{\tilde{\psi}(p)}^2 p \right)^2 \end{align*}\]

The inequality (9) was generalized by Robertson (1929) who proved that for all observables (self-adjoint operators) \(\bA\) and \(\bB\):

\[\tag{12} \Delta _{\psi}\bA \Delta_{\psi}\bB \ge \frac{1}{2} \abs{\expval{[\bA,\bB]}_{\psi}} \]

where \([\bA,\bB] := \bA\bB - \bB\bA\) denotes the commutator.

Since the above inequalities (9) and (12) have the virtue of being exact, in contrast to Heisenberg’s original semi-quantitative formulation, it is tempting to regard them as the exact counterpart of Heisenberg’s relations (2)(4). Indeed, such was Heisenberg’s own view. In his Chicago Lectures (Heisenberg 1930: 15–19), he presented Kennard’s derivation of relation (9) and claimed that “this proof does not differ at all in mathematical content” from his semi-quantitative argument, the only difference being that now “the proof is carried through exactly”.

But it may be useful to point out that both in status and intended role there is a difference between Kennard’s inequality and Heisenberg’s previous formulation (2). The inequalities discussed here are not statements of empirical fact, but theorems of the quantum mechanical formalism. As such, they presuppose the validity of this formalism, and in particular the commutation relation (1), rather than elucidating its intuitive content or to create “room” or “freedom” for the validity of this formalism. At best, one should see the above inequalities as showing that the formalism is consistent with Heisenberg’s empirical principle.

This situation is similar to that arising in other theories of principle where, as noted in Section 2.4, one often finds that, next to an empirical principle, the formalism also provides a corresponding theorem. And similarly, this situation should not, by itself, cast doubt on the question whether Heisenberg’s relation can be regarded as a principle of quantum mechanics.

There is a second notable difference between (2) and (9). Heisenberg did not give a general definition for the “uncertainties” \(\delta p\) and \(\delta q\). The most definite remark he made about them was that they could be taken as “something like the mean error”. In the discussions of thought experiments, he and Bohr would always quantify uncertainties on a case-to-case basis by choosing some parameters which happened to be relevant to the experiment at hand. By contrast, the inequalities (9) and (12) employ a single specific expression as a measure for “uncertainty”: the standard deviation. At the time, this choice was not unnatural, given that this expression is well-known and widely used in error theory and the description of statistical fluctuations. However, there was very little or no discussion of whether this choice was appropriate for a general formulation of the uncertainty relations. A standard deviation reflects the spread or expected fluctuations in a series of measurements of an observable in a given state. It is not at all easy to connect this idea with the concept of the “inaccuracy” of a measurement, such as the resolving power of a microscope. In fact, even though Heisenberg had taken Kennard’s inequality as the precise formulation of the uncertainty relation, he and Bohr never relied on standard deviations in their many discussions of thought experiments, and indeed, it has been shown (Uffink and Hilgevoord 1985; Hilgevoord and Uffink 1988) that these discussions cannot be framed in terms of standard deviations.

Another problem with the above elaboration is that the “well-known” relations (5) are actually false if energy \(\boldsymbol{E}\) and action \(\boldsymbol{J}\) are to be positive operators (Jordan 1927). In that case, self-adjoint operators \(\boldsymbol{t}\) and \(\boldsymbol{w}\) do not exist and inequalities analogous to (9) cannot be derived. Also, these inequalities do not hold for angle and angular momentum (Uffink 1990). These obstacles have led to a quite extensive literature on time-energy and angle-action uncertainty relations (Busch 1990; Hilgevoord 1996, 1998, 2005; Muga et al. 2002; Hilgevoord and Atkinson 2011; Pashby 2015).

3. Bohr

In spite of the fact that Heisenberg’s and Bohr’s views on quantum mechanics are often lumped together as (part of) “the Copenhagen interpretation”, there is considerable difference between their views on the uncertainty relations.

3.1 From wave-particle duality to complementarity

Long before the development of modern quantum mechanics, Bohr had been particularly concerned with the problem of particle-wave duality, i.e., the problem that experimental evidence on the behaviour of both light and matter seemed to demand a wave picture in some cases, and a particle picture in others. Yet these pictures are mutually exclusive. Whereas a particle is always localized, the very definition of the notions of wavelength and frequency requires an extension in space and in time. Moreover, the classical particle picture is incompatible with the characteristic phenomenon of interference.

His long struggle with wave-particle duality had prepared him for a radical step when the dispute between matrix and wave mechanics broke out in 1926–27. For the main contestants, Heisenberg and Schrödinger, the issue at stake was which view could claim to provide a single coherent and universal framework for the description of the observational data. The choice was, essentially between a description in terms of continuously evolving waves, or else one of particles undergoing discontinuous quantum jumps. By contrast, Bohr insisted that elements from both views were equally valid and equally needed for an exhaustive description of the data. His way out of the contradiction was to renounce the idea that the pictures refer, in a literal one-to-one correspondence, to physical reality. Instead, the applicability of these pictures was to become dependent on the experimental context. This is the gist of the viewpoint he called “complementarity”.

Bohr first conceived the general outline of his complementarity argument in early 1927, during a skiing holiday in Norway, at the same time when Heisenberg wrote his uncertainty paper. When he returned to Copenhagen and found Heisenberg’s manuscript, they got into an intense discussion. On the one hand, Bohr was quite enthusiastic about Heisenberg’s ideas which seemed to fit wonderfully with his own thinking. Indeed, in his subsequent work, Bohr always presented the uncertainty relations as the symbolic expression of his complementarity viewpoint. On the other hand, he criticized Heisenberg severely for his suggestion that these relations were due to discontinuous changes occurring during a measurement process. Rather, Bohr argued, their proper derivation should start from the indispensability of both particle and wave concepts. He pointed out that the uncertainties in the experiment did not exclusively arise from the discontinuities but also from the fact that in the experiment we need to take into account both the particle theory and the wave theory. It is not so much the unknown disturbance which renders the momentum of the electron uncertain but rather the fact that the position and the momentum of the electron cannot be simultaneously defined in this experiment (see the “Addition in Proof” to Heisenberg’s paper).

We shall not go too deeply into the matter of Bohr’s interpretation of quantum mechanics since we are mostly interested in Bohr’s view on the uncertainty principle. For a more detailed discussion of the former we refer to Scheibe (1973), Folse (1985), Honner (1987) and Murdoch (1987). It may be useful, however, to sketch some of the main points. Central in Bohr’s considerations is the language we use in physics. No matter how abstract and subtle the concepts of modern physics may be, they are essentially an extension of our ordinary language and a means to communicate the results of our experiments. These results, obtained under well-defined experimental circumstances, are what Bohr calls the “phenomena”. A phenomenon is “the comprehension of the effects observed under given experimental conditions” (Bohr 1939: 24), it is the resultant of a physical object, a measuring apparatus and the interaction between them in a concrete experimental situation. The essential difference between classical and quantum physics is that in quantum physics the interaction between the object and the apparatus cannot be made arbitrarily small; the interaction must at least comprise one quantum. This is expressed by Bohr’s quantum postulate:

[… the] essence [of the formulation of the quantum theory] may be expressed in the so-called quantum postulate, which attributes to any atomic process an essential discontinuity or rather individuality, completely foreign to classical theories and symbolized by Planck’s quantum of action. (Bohr 1928: 580)

A phenomenon, therefore, is an indivisible whole and the result of a measurement cannot be considered as an autonomous manifestation of the object itself independently of the measurement context. The quantum postulate forces upon us a new way of describing physical phenomena:

In this situation, we are faced with the necessity of a radical revision of the foundation for the description and explanation of physical phenomena. Here, it must above all be recognized that, however far quantum effects transcend the scope of classical physical analysis, the account of the experimental arrangement and the record of the observations must always be expressed in common language supplemented with the terminology of classical physics. (Bohr 1948: 313)

This is what Scheibe (1973) has called the “buffer postulate” because it prevents the quantum from penetrating into the classical description: A phenomenon must always be described in classical terms; Planck’s constant does not occur in this description.

Together, the two postulates induce the following reasoning. In every phenomenon the interaction between the object and the apparatus comprises at least one quantum. But the description of the phenomenon must use classical notions in which the quantum of action does not occur. Hence, the interaction cannot be analysed in this description. On the other hand, the classical character of the description allows us to speak in terms of the object itself. Instead of saying: “the interaction between a particle and a photographic plate has resulted in a black spot in a certain place on the plate”, we are allowed to forgo mentioning the apparatus and say: “the particle has been found in this place”. The experimental context, rather than changing or disturbing pre-existing properties of the object, defines what can meaningfully be said about the object.

Because the interaction between object and apparatus is left out in our description of the phenomenon, we do not get the whole picture. Yet, any attempt to extend our description by performing the measurement of a different observable quantity of the object, or indeed, on the measurement apparatus, produces a new phenomenon and we are again confronted with the same situation. Because of the unanalyzable interaction in both measurements, the two descriptions cannot, generally, be united into a single picture. They are what Bohr calls complementary descriptions:

[the quantum of action]…forces us to adopt a new mode of description designated as complementary in the sense that any given application of classical concepts precludes the simultaneous use of other classical concepts which in a different connection are equally necessary for the elucidation of the phenomena. (Bohr 1929: 10)

The most important example of complementary descriptions is provided by the measurements of the position and momentum of an object. If one wants to measure the position of the object relative to a given spatial frame of reference, the measuring instrument must be rigidly fixed to the bodies which define the frame of reference. But this implies the impossibility of investigating the exchange of momentum between the object and the instrument and we are cut off from obtaining any information about the momentum of the object. If, on the other hand, one wants to measure the momentum of an object the measuring instrument must be able to move relative to the spatial reference frame. Bohr here assumes that a momentum measurement involves the registration of the recoil of some movable part of the instrument and the use of the law of momentum conservation. The looseness of the part of the instrument with which the object interacts entails that the instrument cannot serve to accurately determine the position of the object. Since a measuring instrument cannot be rigidly fixed to the spatial reference frame and, at the same time, be movable relative to it, the experiments which serve to precisely determine the position and the momentum of an object are mutually exclusive. Of course, in itself, this is not at all typical for quantum mechanics. But, because the interaction between object and instrument during the measurement can neither be neglected nor determined the two measurements cannot be combined. This means that in the description of the object one must choose between the assignment of a precise position or of a precise momentum.

Similar considerations hold with respect to the measurement of time and energy. Just as the spatial coordinate system must be fixed by means of solid bodies so must the time coordinate be fixed by means of unperturbed, synchronised clocks. But it is precisely this requirement which prevents one from taking into account of the exchange of energy with the instrument if this is to serve its purpose. Conversely, any conclusion about the object based on the conservation of energy prevents following its development in time.

The conclusion is that in quantum mechanics we are confronted with a complementarity between two descriptions which are united in the classical mode of description: the space-time description (or coordination) of a process and the description based on the applicability of the dynamical conservation laws. The quantum forces us to give up the classical mode of description (also called the “causal” mode of description by Bohr[4]: it is impossible to form a classical picture of what is going on when radiation interacts with matter as, e.g., in the Compton effect.

Any arrangement suited to study the exchange of energy and momentum between the electron and the photon must involve a latitude in the space-time description sufficient for the definition of wave-number and frequency which enter in the relation [\(E = h\nu\) and \(p = h\sigma\)]. Conversely, any attempt of locating the collision between the photon and the electron more accurately would, on account of the unavoidable interaction with the fixed scales and clocks defining the space-time reference frame, exclude all closer account as regards the balance of momentum and energy. (Bohr 1949: 210)

A causal description of the process cannot be attained; we have to content ourselves with complementary descriptions. “The viewpoint of complementarity may be regarded”, according to Bohr, “as a rational generalization of the very ideal of causality”.

In addition to complementary descriptions Bohr also talks about complementary phenomena and complementary quantities. Position and momentum, as well as time and energy, are complementary quantities.[5]

We have seen that Bohr’s approach to quantum theory puts heavy emphasis on the language used to communicate experimental observations, which, in his opinion, must always remain classical. By comparison, he seemed to put little value on arguments starting from the mathematical formalism of quantum theory. This informal approach is typical of all of Bohr’s discussions on the meaning of quantum mechanics. One might say that for Bohr the conceptual clarification of the situation has primary importance while the formalism is only a symbolic representation of this situation.

This is remarkable since, finally, it is the formalism which needs to be interpreted. This neglect of the formalism is one of the reasons why it is so difficult to get a clear understanding of Bohr’s interpretation of quantum mechanics and why it has aroused so much controversy. We close this section by citing from an article of 1948 to show how Bohr conceived the role of the formalism of quantum mechanics:

The entire formalism is to be considered as a tool for deriving predictions, of definite or statistical character, as regards information obtainable under experimental conditions described in classical terms and specified by means of parameters entering into the algebraic or differential equations of which the matrices or the wave-functions, respectively, are solutions. These symbols themselves, as is indicated already by the use of imaginary numbers, are not susceptible to pictorial interpretation; and even derived real functions like densities and currents are only to be regarded as expressing the probabilities for the occurrence of individual events observable under well-defined experimental conditions. (Bohr 1948: 314)

3.2 Bohr’s view on the uncertainty relations

In his Como lecture, published in 1928, Bohr gave his own version of a derivation of the uncertainty relations between position and momentum and between time and energy. He started from the relations

\[\tag{13} E = h\nu \text{ and } p = h/\lambda\]

which connect the notions of energy \(E\) and momentum \(p\) from the particle picture with those of frequency \(\nu\) and wavelength \(\lambda\) from the wave picture. He noticed that a wave packet of limited extension in space and time can only be built up by the superposition of a number of elementary waves with a large range of wave numbers and frequencies. Denoting the spatial and temporal extensions of the wave packet by \(\Delta x\) and \(\Delta t\), and the extensions in the wave number \(\sigma := 1/\lambda\) and frequency by \(\Delta \sigma\) and \(\Delta \nu\), it follows from Fourier analysis that in the most favorable case \(\Delta x \Delta \sigma \approx \Delta t \Delta \nu \approx 1\), and, using (13), one obtains the relations

\[\tag{14} \Delta t \Delta E \approx \Delta x \Delta p \approx h\]

Note that \(\Delta x, \Delta \sigma\), etc., are not standard deviations but unspecified measures of the size of a wave packet. (The original text has equality signs instead of approximate equality signs, but, since Bohr does not define the spreads exactly the use of approximate equality signs seems more in line with his intentions. Moreover, Bohr himself used approximate equality signs in later presentations.) These equations determine, according to Bohr:

the highest possible accuracy in the definition of the energy and momentum of the individuals associated with the wave field. (Bohr 1928: 571).

He noted,

This circumstance may be regarded as a simple symbolic expression of the complementary nature of the space-time description and the claims of causality. (ibid).[6]

We note a few points about Bohr’s view on the uncertainty relations. First of all, Bohr does not refer to discontinuous changes in the relevant quantities during the measurement process. Rather, he emphasizes the possibility of defining these quantities. This view is markedly different from Heisenberg’s view. A draft version of the Como lecture is even more explicit on the difference between Bohr and Heisenberg:

These reciprocal uncertainty relations were given in a recent paper of Heisenberg as the expression of the statistical element which, due to the feature of discontinuity implied in the quantum postulate, characterizes any interpretation of observations by means of classical concepts. It must be remembered, however, that the uncertainty in question is not simply a consequence of a discontinuous change of energy and momentum say during an interaction between radiation and material particles employed in measuring the space-time coordinates of the individuals. According to the above considerations the question is rather that of the impossibility of defining rigorously such a change when the space-time coordination of the individuals is also considered. (Bohr 1985: 93)

Indeed, Bohr not only rejected Heisenberg’s argument that these relations are due to discontinuous disturbances implied by the act of measuring, but also his view that the measurement process creates a definite result:

The unaccustomed features of the situation with which we are confronted in quantum theory necessitate the greatest caution as regard all questions of terminology. Speaking, as it is often done of disturbing a phenomenon by observation, or even of creating physical attributes to objects by measuring processes is liable to be confusing, since all such sentences imply a departure from conventions of basic language which even though it can be practical for the sake of brevity, can never be unambiguous. (Bohr 1939: 24)

Nor did he approve of an epistemological formulation or one in terms of experimental inaccuracies:

[…] a sentence like “we cannot know both the momentum and the position of an atomic object” raises at once questions as to the physical reality of two such attributes of the object, which can be answered only by referring to the mutual exclusive conditions for an unambiguous use of space-time concepts, on the one hand, and dynamical conservation laws on the other hand. (Bohr 1948: 315; also Bohr 1949: 211)

It would in particular not be out of place in this connection to warn against a misunderstanding likely to arise when one tries to express the content of Heisenberg’s well-known indeterminacy relation by such a statement as “the position and momentum of a particle cannot simultaneously be measured with arbitrary accuracy”. According to such a formulation it would appear as though we had to do with some arbitrary renunciation of the measurement of either the one or the other of two well-defined attributes of the object, which would not preclude the possibility of a future theory taking both attributes into account on the lines of the classical physics. (Bohr 1937: 292)

Instead, Bohr always stressed that the uncertainty relations are first and foremost an expression of complementarity. This may seem odd since complementarity is a dichotomic relation between two types of description whereas the uncertainty relations allow for intermediate situations between two extremes. They “express” the dichotomy in the sense that if we take the energy and momentum to be perfectly well-defined, symbolically \(\Delta E = \Delta p\) = 0, the position and time variables are completely undefined, \(\Delta x = \Delta t = \infty\), and vice versa. But they also allow intermediate situations in which the mentioned uncertainties are all non-zero and finite. This more positive aspect of the uncertainty relation is mentioned in the Como lecture:

At the same time, however, the general character of this relation makes it possible to a certain extent to reconcile the conservation laws with the space-time coordination of observations, the idea of a coincidence of well-defined events in space-time points being replaced by that of unsharply defined individuals within space-time regions. (Bohr 1928: 571)

However, Bohr never followed up on this suggestion that we might be able to strike a compromise between the two mutually exclusive modes of description in terms of unsharply defined quantities. Indeed, an attempt to do so, would take the formalism of quantum theory more seriously than the concepts of classical language, and this step Bohr refused to take. Instead, in his later writings he would be content with stating that the uncertainty relations simply defy an unambiguous interpretation in classical terms:

These so-called indeterminacy relations explicitly bear out the limitation of causal analysis, but it is important to recognize that no unambiguous interpretation of such a relation can be given in words suited to describe a situation in which physical attributes are objectified in a classical way. (Bohr 1948: 315)

Finally, on a more formal level, we note that Bohr’s derivation does not rely on the commutation relations (1) and (5), but on Fourier analysis. These two approaches are equivalent as far as the relationship between position and momentum is concerned, but this is not so for time and energy since most physical systems do not have a time operator. Indeed, in his discussion with Einstein (Bohr 1949), Bohr considered time as a simple classical variable. This even holds for his famous discussion of the “clock-in-the-box” thought-experiment where the time, as defined by the clock in the box, is treated from the point of view of classical general relativity. Thus, in an approach based on commutation relations, the position-momentum and time-energy uncertainty relations are not on equal footing, which is contrary to Bohr’s approach in terms of Fourier analysis. For more details see (Hilgevoord 1996 and 1998).

4. The Minimal Interpretation

In the previous two sections we have seen how both Heisenberg and Bohr attributed a far-reaching status to the uncertainty relations. They both argued that these relations place fundamental limits on the applicability of the usual classical concepts. Moreover, they both believed that these limitations were inevitable and forced upon us. However, we have also seen that they reached such conclusions by starting from radical and controversial assumptions. This entails, of course, that their radical conclusions remain unconvincing for those who reject these assumptions. Indeed, the operationalist-positivist viewpoint adopted by these authors has long since lost its appeal among philosophers of physics.

So the question may be asked what alternative views of the uncertainty relations are still viable. Of course, this problem is intimately connected with that of the interpretation of the wave function, and hence of quantum mechanics as a whole. Since there is no consensus about the latter, one cannot expect consensus about the interpretation of the uncertainty relations either. Here we only describe a point of view, which we call the “minimal interpretation”, that seems to be shared by both the adherents of the Copenhagen interpretation and of other views.

In quantum mechanics a system is supposed to be described by its wave function, also called its quantum state or state vector. Given the state vector \(\ket{\psi}\), one can derive probability distributions for all the physical quantities pertaining to the system, usually called its observables, such as its position, momentum, angular momentum, energy, etc. The operational meaning of these probability distributions is that they correspond to the distribution of the values obtained for these quantities in a long series of repetitions of the measurement. More precisely, one imagines a great number of copies of the system under consideration, all prepared in the same way. On each copy the momentum, say, is measured. Generally, the outcomes of these measurements differ and a distribution of outcomes is obtained. The theoretical momentum distribution derived from the quantum state is supposed to coincide with the hypothetical distribution of outcomes obtained in an infinite series of repetitions of the momentum measurement. The same holds, mutatis mutandis, for all the other physical quantities pertaining to the system. Note that no simultaneous measurements of two or more quantities are required in defining the operational meaning of the probability distributions.

The uncertainty relations discussed above can be considered as statements about the spreads of the probability distributions of the several physical quantities arising from the same state. For example, the uncertainty relation between the position and momentum of a system may be understood as the statement that the position and momentum distributions cannot both be arbitrarily narrow—in some sense of the word “narrow”—in any quantum state. Inequality (9) is an example of such a relation in which the standard deviation is employed as a measure of spread. From this characterization of uncertainty relations follows that a more detailed interpretation of the quantum state than the one given in the previous paragraph is not required to study uncertainty relations as such. In particular, a further ontological or linguistic interpretation of the notion of uncertainty, as limits on the applicability of our concepts given by Heisenberg or Bohr, need not be supposed.

Of course, this minimal interpretation leaves the question open whether it makes sense to attribute precise values of position and momentum to an individual system. Some interpretations of quantum mechanics, e.g., those of Heisenberg and Bohr, deny this; while others, e.g., the interpretation of de Broglie and Bohm insist that each individual system has a definite position and momentum (see the entry on Bohmian mechanics). The only requirement is that, as an empirical fact, it is not possible to prepare pure ensembles in which all systems have the same values for these quantities, or ensembles in which the spreads are smaller than allowed by quantum theory. Although interpretations of quantum mechanics, in which each system has a definite value for its position and momentum are still viable, this is not to say that they are without strange features of their own; they do not imply a return to classical physics.

We end with a few remarks on this minimal interpretation. First, it may be noted that the minimal interpretation of the uncertainty relations is little more than filling in the empirical meaning of inequality (9). As such, this view shares many of the limitations we have noted above about this inequality. Indeed, it is not straightforward to relate the spread in a statistical distribution of measurement results with the inaccuracy of this measurement, such as, e.g., the resolving power of a microscope, or of a disturbance of the system by the measurement. Moreover, the minimal interpretation does not address the question whether one can make simultaneous accurate measurements of position and momentum.

As a matter of fact, one can show that the standard formalism of quantum mechanics does not allow such simultaneous measurements. But this is not a consequence of relation (9). Rather, it follows from the fact that this formalism simply does not contain any observable that would accomplish such a task. The extension of this formalism that allows observables to be represented by positive-operator-valued measures or POVM’s, does allow the formal introduction of observables describing joint measurements (see also section 6.1). But even here, for the case of position and momentum, one finds that such measurements have to be “unsharp”, which entails that they cannot be regarded as simultaneous accurate measurements.

If one feels that statements about inaccuracy of measurement, or the possibility of simultaneous measurements, belong to any satisfactory formulation of the uncertainty principle, one will need to look for other formulations of the uncertainty principle. Some candidates for such formulations will be discussed in Section 6. First, however, we will look at formulations of the uncertainty principle that stay firmly within the minimal interpretation, and differ from (9) only by using measures of uncertainty other than the standard deviation.

5. Alternative measures of uncertainty

While the standard deviation is the most well-known quantitative measure for uncertainty or the spread in the probability distribution, it is not the only one, and indeed it has distinctive drawbacks that other such measures may lack. For example, in the definition of the standard deviations (11) one can see that that the probability density function \(\abs{\psi(q)}^2\) is weighed by a quadratic factor \(q^2\) that puts increasing emphasis on its tails. Therefore, the value of \(\Delta_\psi \bQ\) will depend predominantly at how this density behaves at the tails: if these falls off very quickly, e.g., like a Gaussian, it will be small, but if the tails drop off only slowly the standard deviation may be very large, even when most probability is concentrated in a small interval.

The upshot of this objection is that having a lower bound on the product of the standard deviations of position and momentum, as the Heisenberg-Kennard uncertainty relation (9) gives, does not by itself rule out a state where both the probability densities for position and momentum are extremely concentrated, in the sense of having more than \((1- \epsilon)\) of their probability concentrated in a a region of size smaller than \(\delta\), for any choice of \(\epsilon, \delta >0\). This means, in our view, that relation (9) actually fails to express what most physicists would take to be the very core idea of the uncertainty principle.

One way to deal with this objection is to consider alternative measures to quantify the spread or uncertainty associated with a probability density. Here we discuss two such proposals.

5.1 Landau-Pollak uncertainty relations

The most straightforward alternative is to pick some value \(\alpha\) close to one, say \(\alpha = 0.9\), and ask for the width of the smallest interval that supports the fraction \(\alpha\) of the total probability distribution in position and similarly for momentum:

\[\begin{align*} \tag{15} W_{\alpha}(\bQ, \psi) &:= \inf_{\abs{I}} \left\{ I: \int_I {\abs{\psi(q)}}^2 dq \geq \alpha \right\} \\ \notag W_{\beta}(\bP,\psi) &:= \inf_I \left\{\int_I \abs{\tilde\psi(p)}^2 dp \geq \beta \right\} \end{align*}\]

In a previous work (Uffink and Hilgevoord 1985) we called such measures bulk widths, because they indicate how concentrated the ”bulk” (i.e., fraction \(\alpha\) or \(\beta\)) of the probability distribution is. Landau and Pollak (1961) obtained an uncertainty relation in terms of these bulk widths.

\[\begin{align*} \tag{16} W_\alpha (\bQ, \psi) W_\beta (\bP, \psi) &\geq 2\pi \hbar \left( \alpha \beta - \sqrt{(1-\alpha)(1-\beta)} \right)^2 \\ \notag &\mbox{if } \alpha+ \beta \geq 1/2 \end{align*}\label{LP}\]

This Landau-Pollak inequality shows that if the choices of \(\alpha, \beta\) are not too low, there is a state-independent lower bound on the product of the bulk widths of the position and momentum distribution for any quantum state.

Note that bulk widths are not so sensitive to the behavior of the tails of the distributions and, therefore, the Landau-Pollak inequality is immune to the objection above.Thus, this inequality expresses constraints on quantum mechanical states not contained in relation (9). Further, by the well-known Bienaymé-Chebyshev inequality, one has

\[\begin{align*} \tag{17} W_\alpha (\bQ,\psi) &\leq \frac{2}{\sqrt {1- \alpha}} \Delta_\psi \bQ \\ \notag W_\beta (\bP, \psi) &\leq \frac{2}{\sqrt {1- \beta}} \Delta_\psi \bP \end{align*}\]

so that inequality (16) implies (by choosing \(\alpha,\beta\) optimal) that \( \Delta_\psi \bQ \Delta_\psi \bP \geq 0.12 \hbar \). This, obviously, is not the best lower bound for the product of standard deviations, but the important point is here that the Landau-Pollak inequality (16) in terms of bulk widths implies the existence of a lower bound on the product of standard deviations, while conversely, the Heisenberg-Kennard equality (9) does not imply any bound on the product of bulk widths. A generalization of this approach to non-commuting observables in a finite-dimensional Hilbert space is discussed in Uffink 1990.

5.2 Entropic uncertainty relations

Another approach to express the uncertainty principle is to use entropic measures of uncertainty. The foremost example of these is the Shannon entropy, which for the position and momentum distribution of a given state vector \(\ket{\psi}\) may be defined as:

\[\begin{align*} \tag{18} H(\bQ, \psi) &:= -\int \abs{\psi(q)}^2 \ln \abs{\psi(q)}^2 dq \\ \notag H(\bP, \psi) &:= -\int \abs{\tilde{\psi}(p)}^2 \ln \abs{\tilde{\psi}(p)}^2 dp \end{align*}\]

One can then show (see Beckner 1975; Białinicki-Birula and Micielski 1975) that

\[\tag{19} H(\bQ, \psi) + H(\bP,\psi) \geq \ln (e \pi \hbar) \]

A nice feature of this entropic uncertainty relation is that it provides a strict improvement of the Heisenberg-Kennard relation. That is to say, one can show (independently of quantum theory) that for any probability density function \(p(x)\)

\[\tag{20} -\int\! p(x) \ln p(x) dx \leq \ln (\sqrt{2 \pi e} \Delta x )\]

Applying this to the inequality (19) we get:

\[\tag{21} \frac{\hslash}{2} \leq(2\pi e)^{-1} \exp (H(\bQ, \psi) + H(\bP,\psi)) \leq \Delta_\psi \bQ\Delta_\psi \bP \]

showing that the entropic uncertainty relation implies the Heisenberg-Kennard uncertainty relation. A drawback of this relation is that it does not completely evade the objection mentioned above, (i.e., these entropic measures of uncertainty can become as large as one pleases while \(1-\epsilon\) of the probability in the distribution is concentrated on a very small interval), but the examples needed to show this are admittedly more far-fetched.

For non-commuting observables in a \(n\)-dimensional Hilbert space, one can similarly define an entropic uncertainty in the probability distribution \(\abs{\braket{a_i}{\psi}}^2\) for a given state \(\ket{\psi}\) and a complete set of eigenstates \(\ket{a_i}\), \( (i= 1, \ldots n)\), of the observable \(\bA\):

\[\tag{22} H(\bA ,\psi) := -\sum_{i=1}^n \abs{\braket{a_i}{\psi}}^2 \ln \abs{\braket{a_i}{\psi}}^2 \]

and \(H(\bB,\psi)\) similarly in terms of the probability distribution \(\abs{\braket{b_j}{\psi}}^2\) for a complete set of eigenstates \(\ket{b_j}\), (\(j =1, \ldots, n\)) of observable \(\bB\). Then we obtain the uncertainty relation (Maassen and Uffink 1988):

\[\tag{23} H( bA, \psi) + H(\bB, \psi) \geq 2 \ln \max_{i,j} \abs{\braket{a_i}{b_j}}, \]

which was further generalized and improved by (Frank and Lieb 2012). The most important advantage of these relations is that, in contrast to Robertson’s inequality (12), the lower bound is a positive constant, independent of the state.

6. Uncertainty relations for inaccuracy and disturbance

Both the standard deviation and the alternative measures of uncertainty considered in the previous subsection (and many more that we have not mentioned!) are designed to indicate the width or spread of a single given probability distribution. Applied to quantum mechanics, where the probability distributions for position and momentum are obtained from a given quantum state vector, one can use them to formulate uncertainty relations that characterize the spread in those distribution for any given state. The resulting inequalities then express limitations on what state-preparations quantum mechanics allows. They are thus expressions of what may be called a preparation uncertainty principle:

In quantum mechanics, it is impossible to prepare any system in a state \(\ket{\psi}\) such that its position and momentum are both precisely predictable, in the sense of having both the expected spread in a measurement of position and the expected spread in a momentum measurement arbitrarily small.

The relations (9, 16, 19) all belong to this category; the mere difference being that they employ different measures of spread: viz. the standard deviation, the bulk width or the Shannon entropy.

Note that in this formulation, there is no reference to simultaneous or joint measurements, nor to any notion of accuracy like the resolving power of the measurement instrument, nor to the issue of how much the system in the state that is being measured is disturbed by this measurement. This section is devoted to attempts that go beyond the mold of this preparation uncertain principle.

6.1 The recent debate on error-disturbance relations

We have seen that in 1927 Heisenberg argued that the measurement of (say) position must necessarily disturb the conjugate variable (i.e., momentum) by an amount that is inversely proportional to the inaccuracy of measurement of the former. We have also seen that this idea was not maintained in the Kennard’s uncertainty relation (9), a relation that was embraced by Heisenberg (1930) and most textbooks.

A rather natural question thus arises whether there are further inequalities in quantum mechanics that would address Heisenberg’s original thinking more directly, i.e., that do deal with how much one variable is disturbed by the accurate measurement of another. That is, we will look at attempts that would establish a claim which may be called a measurement uncertainty principle.

In quantum mechanics, there is no measurement procedure by which one can accurately measure the position of a system without disturbing it momentum, in the sense that some measure of inaccuracy in position and some measure of the disturbance of momentum of the system by the measurement cannot both be arbitrarily small.

This formulation of the uncertainty principle has always remained controversial. Uncertainty relations that would express this alleged principle are often called “error-disturbance” relations or “noise-disturbance” relations We will look at two recent proposals to search for such relations: Ozawa (2003) and Busch, Lahti, and Werner (2013).

In Ozawa’s approach, we assume that a system \(\cal S\) of interest in state \(\ket{\psi}\) is coupled to a measurement device \(\cal M\) in state \(\ket{\chi}\), and their interaction is governed by a unitary operator \(U\). On the Hilbert space of the joint system the observable \(\bQ\) of the system \(\cal S\) we are interested in is represented by

\[\tag{24} \bQ_{\rm in} = \bQ \otimes \mathbb{1}\]

The measurement interaction will allow us to perform an (inaccurate) measurement of this quantity by reading off a pointer observable \(\boldsymbol{Q'}\) of the measurement device after the interaction. Hence this inaccurate observable may be represented as

\[\tag{25} \bQ'_{\rm out} = U^\dagger( \mathbb{1} \otimes \bQ') U\]

The measure of noise in the measurement of \(\bQ\) is then chosen as:

\[\tag{26} \epsilon_\psi(\bQ) := \expval{(\bQ'_{\rm out} - \bQ_{\rm in})^2}_{\psi \otimes \chi}^{1/2}\]

A comparison of the initial momentum \(\bP_{\rm in} = \bP \otimes \mathbb{1}\) and the final momentum after the measurement \(\bP_{\rm out} = U^\dagger (\bP \otimes \mathbb{1})U\) is made by choosing a measure of the disturbance of \(\bP\) by the measurement procedure:

\[\tag{27} \eta_\psi(\bP):= \expval{(\bP_{\rm in} - \bP_{\rm out})^2}_{\psi\otimes\chi}^{1/2} \]

Ozawa obtained an inequality involving those two measures, which, however, is more involved than previous uncertainty relations. For our purposes, however, the important point is that Ozawa showed that the product \(\epsilon_\psi (\bQ) \eta_\psi (\bP)\) has no positive lower bound. His conclusion from this was that Heisenberg’s noise-disturbance relation is violated.

Yet, whether Ozawa’s result indeed succeeds in formulating Heisenberg’s qualitative discussion of disturbance and accuracy in the microscope example has come under dispute. See Busch, Lahti and Werner (2013, and 2014 (Other Internet Resources)), and Ozawa (2013, Other Internet Resources).

An objection raised in this dispute is that a quantity like \(\expval{(\bQ'_{\rm out} - \bQ_{\rm in})^2}^{1/2}\) tells us very little about how good the observable \({\bQ'}_{\rm out}\) can stand in as an inaccurate measurement of \(\bQ_{\rm in}\). The main point to observe here is that these operators generally do not commute, and that measurements of \(\bQ'_{\rm out}\), of \(\bQ_{\rm in}\) and of their difference will require altogether three different measurement contexts. To require that \(\epsilon_\psi(\bQ)\) vanishes, for example, means only that the state prepared belongs to the linear subspace corresponding to the zero eigenvalue of the operator \(\bQ'_{\rm out} - {\bQ}_{\rm in}\), and therefore that \(\expval{\bQ'_{\rm out}}_\psi = \expval{\bQ_{\rm in}}_\psi\), but this does not preclude that the probability distribution of \(\bQ_{\rm out}\) in state \(\psi\) might be wildly different from that of \(\bQ_{\rm in}\). But then no one would think of \(\bQ_{\rm out}\) as an accurate measurement of \(\bQ_{\rm in}\) so that the definition of \(\epsilon_\psi(\bQ)\) does not express what it is supposed to express. A similar objection can also be raised against \(\eta_\psi (\bP)\).

Another observation is that Ozawa’s conclusion that there is no lower bound for his error-disturbance product for is not at all surprising. That is, even without probing the system by a measurement apparatus, one can show that such a lower bound does not exist. If the initial state of a system is prepared at time \(t=0\) as a Gaussian quasi-monochromatic wave packet with \(\expval{\bQ_0}_\psi =0\) and evolves freely, we can use a time-of-flight measurement to learn about its later position. Ehrenfest’s theorem tells us: \(\expval{\bQ_t}_\psi = \frac{t}{m} \expval{\bP}_\psi\).

Hence, as an approximative measurement of the position \(\bQ_t\), one could propose the observable \(\bQ'_t = \frac{t}{m}\bP\). It is known that under the stated conditions (and with \(m\) and \(t\) large) this approximation holds very well, i.e., we do not only have \(\expval{\bQ'_t -\bQ_t}_\psi =0\), but also \(\expval{(\bQ'_t -\bQ_t)^2} \approx 0\), as nearly as we please. But since \(\bQ'_t\) is just the momentum multiplied by a constant, its measurement will obviously not disturb the momentum of the system. In other words, for this example, one has \(\epsilon_\psi (\bQ)\) as small as we please with zero disturbance of the momentum. Therefore, any hopes that there could be a positive lower bound for the product \(\epsilon_\psi (\bQ) \eta_\psi (\bP)\) seem to be dashed, even with the simplest of measurement schemes, i.e. a free evolution.

Ozawa’s results do not show that Heisenberg’s analysis of the microscope argument was wrong. Rather, they throw doubt on the appropriateness of the definitions he used to formalize Heisenberg’s informal argument.

An entirely different analysis of the problem of substantiating a measurement uncertainty relation was offered by Busch, Lahti, and Werner (2013). These authors consider a measurement device \(\cal M\) that makes a joint unsharp measurement of both position and momentum. To describe such joint unsharp measurements, they employ the extended modern formalism that characterizes obervables not by self-adjoint operators but by positive-operator-valued measures (POVM’s). In the present case, this means that the measurement procedure is characterized by a collection of positive operators, \(M(p,q)\), where the pair \(p,q\) represent the outcome variables of the measurement, with

\[\tag{28} M(p,q) \geq 0, \iint \! dp dq \, M(p,q) =\mathbb{1} .\]

The two marginals of this POVM,

\[\tag{29} \begin{align*} M_1(q) &= \int\! dp M(p,q)\\ M_2(p) &= \int\! dq M(p,q) \end{align*} \]

are also POVM’s in their own right and represent the unsharp position \(Q'\) and unsharp momentum \(P'\) observables respectively. (Note that these do not refer to a self-adjoint operator!)

For a system prepared in a state \(\ket{\psi}\), the joint probability density of obtaining outcomes \((p,q)\) in the joint unsharp measurement (28) is then

\[\tag{30} \rho(p,q) := \expvalexp{M(p,q)}{\psi},\]

while the marginals of this joint probability distribution give the distributions for \(Q'\) and \(P'\).

\[\begin{align*} \tag{31} \mu'(q) &: = \int \! dp \, \rho(p,q) = \expvalexp{M_1(q)}{\psi} \\ \notag \nu'(p) &:= \int \! dp \, \rho(p,q) = \expvalexp{M_2(q)}{\psi} \end{align*}\]

Since a joint sharp measurement of position and momentum is impossible in quantum mechanics, these marginal distributions (31) obtained from \(M\) will differ from that of ideal measurements of \(\bQ\) and of \(\bP\) on the system of interest in state \(\ket{\psi}\). However, one can indicate how much these marginals deviate from separate exact position and momentum measurements on the state \(\ket{\psi}\) by a pairwise comparison of (31) to the exact distributions

\[\begin{align*} \tag{32} \mu(q) &:= \abs{\braket{q}{\psi}}^2 \\ \notag \nu(p) &:= \abs{\braket{p}{\psi}}^2 \end{align*}\]

In order to do so, BLW propose a distance function \(D\) between probability distributions, such that \(D(\mu, \mu')\) tells us how close the marginal position distribution \(\mu'(q)\) for the unsharp position \(Q'\) is to the exact distribution \(\mu(q)\) in a sharp position measurement, and likewise, \(D(\nu ,\nu')\) tells us how close the marginal momentum distribution \(\nu'(p)\) for \(P'\) is to the the exact momentum distribution \(\nu(p)\).

The distance they chose is the Wasserstein-2 distance, a.k.a. (a variation on) the earth-movers distance.

Definition (Wasserstein-2 distance)
Let \(\mu(x)\) and \(\mu'(y)\) be any two probability distributions on the real line, and \(\gamma(x,y)\) any joint probability distribution that has \(\mu'\) and \(\mu\) as its marginals. Then:

\[\tag{33} D(\mu, \mu') := \inf_\gamma \left(\iint (x-y)^2 \gamma (x,y) dx dy \right)^{1/2}\]

Applying this definition to the case at hand, i.e.  pairwise to the quantum mechanical distributions \(\mu'(q)\) and \(\mu(q)\) and to \(\nu'(p)\) and \(\nu(p)\) in (31) and (32), BLW’s final step is to take a supremum over all possible input states \(\ket{\psi}\) to obtain

\[\tag{34} \begin{align*} \Delta(Q, Q') & = \sup_{\ket{\psi}} D(\mu, \mu') \\ \Delta(P, P') & = \sup_{\ket{\psi}} D(\nu, \nu') \end{align*} \]

From these definitions, they obtain

\[\tag{35}\Delta(Q, Q') \Delta (P,P') \geq \frac{\hbar}{2}\]

Arguing that \(\Delta(Q, Q')\) provides a sensible measure for the inaccuracy or noise about position, and \(\Delta(P, P')\) for the disturbance of momentum by any such joint unsharp measurement, the authors conclude, in contrast to Ozawa’s analysis, that an error-disturbance uncertainty relation does hold, which they take as “a remarkable vindication of Heisenberg’s intuitions” in the microscope thought experiment.

In comparison of the two, there are a few positive remarks to make about the Busch-Lahti-Werner (BLW) approach. First of all, by focusing on the distance (33) this approach is comparing entire probability distributions rather than just the expectations of operator differences. When this distance is very small, one is justified to conclude that the distribution has changed very little under the measurement procedure. This brings us closer to the conclusion that the error or disturbance introduced is small. Secondly, by introducing a supremum over all states to obtain \(\Delta( Q, Q')\), it follows that when this latter expression is small, the measured distribution \(\mu'\) differs only little from the exact distribution \(\mu\) whatever the state of the system is. As the authors argue, this means that \(\Delta(Q,Q')\) can be seen as a figure-of-merit of the measurement device alone, and in this sense analogous to the resolving power of a microscope.

But we also think there is an undesirable feature of the BLW approach. This is due to the supremum over states appearing twice, both in \(\Delta(Q,Q')\) and in \(\Delta(P,P')\). This feature, we argue, deprives their result from practical applicability.

To elucidate: In concrete applications, one would prepare a system in some state (not exactly known) and perform a given joint measurement \(M\) of \(Q'\) and \(P'\). If it is given that, say, \(\Delta(Q,Q')\) is very small, one can safely infer that \(Q\) has been measured with small inaccuracy, since this guarantees that the measured position distribution differs very little from what an exact position measurement would give, regardless of the state of the system. Now, one would like to be able to infer that in this case the disturbance of the momentum \(P\) from \(P'\) must be considerable for the state prepared. But the BLW only gives us:

\[ \Delta(P, P') = \sup_{\ket{\psi}} D(\nu, \nu') \geq \frac{\hbar}{2 \Delta(Q, Q')} \]

and this does not imply anything for the state in question! Thus, the BLW uncertainty relation does not rule out that for some states it might be possible to perform a joint measurement in which both \(D(\mu, \mu')\) and \(D(\nu, \nu')\) are very small, and in this sense have negligibe error and disturbance. It seems premature to say that this vindicates Heisenberg’s intuitions.

Summing up, we emphasize that there is no contradiction between the BLW analysis and the Ozawa analysis: where Ozawa claims that the product of two quantities might for some states be less than the usual limit, BLW show that product of different quantities will satisfy this limit. The dispute is not about mathematically validity, but about how reasonable these quantities are to capture Heisenberg’s qualitative considerations. The present authors feel that, in this dispute, Ozawa’s analysis fail to be convincing. On the other hand, we also think that the BLW uncertainty relation is not satisfactory. Also, we would like to remark that both protagonists employ measures that are akin to standard deviations in being very sensitive to the tail behavior of probability distributions, and thus face a similar objection as raised in section 5. The final word in this dispute on whether a measurement uncertainty principle holds has not been reached, in our view.


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