The principal aim of research on religious language is to give an account of the meaning of religious sentences and utterances. Religious sentences are generally taken to be have a religious subject matter; a religious utterance is the production in speech or writing of a token religious sentence. In principle, religious subject matters could encompass a variety of agents, states of affairs or properties—such as God, deities, angels, miracles, redemption, grace, holiness, sinfulness. Most attention, however, has been devoted to the meaning of what we say about God.
The scope of religious language and discourse could be construed more widely. For instance, while The Song of Songs has little in the way of distinctively religious content, it could be included in the field because of its place within a religious canon. Alternatively, the field could be characterised pragmatically to include utterances which are used for religious purposes or in religious contexts (Alston 2005: 220; Donovan 1976: 1; Soskice 1999: 349; Charlesworth 1974: 3). In practice, however, philosophical treatments have not extended so broadly, instead focusing on sentences and utterances with putatively religious content. This is partly because it is difficult to find a principled characterisation of a religious context that would delineate a philosophically interesting scope for the topic. When a church congregation is told “Please kneel”, this direction appears to be in a religious context and have a religious purpose but it is difficult to see how the analysis of the meaning of this instruction would informatively contribute to the topic. It is also because the most pressing questions about religious language seem to be those that come into alignment with questions in other areas of philosophy of religion. Is there anything distinctive about the meanings of what we say about God and other religious matters that are also the focus of metaphysical and epistemological discussion? If, in talking about God, speakers are not expressing propositions or not talking literally—to take a couple of the more radical proposals—that would accordingly require dramatic adjustments in approaching questions about knowledge of God or God’s existence.
Research in the field has a lengthy history, with sustained discussion of the meanings of religious expressions and utterances stretching back at least to the middle of antiquity. Notable treatments of the topic include the work by medieval theologians and philosophers concerned with the meanings of divine predicates, including the debates surrounding analogy and apophaticism (White 2010; Turner 1995; Scott & Citron 2016), and debates about the meaningfulness of religious language that were prompted by Ayer’s 1936 popularisation of logical positivism in Language, Truth and Logic and remained a central issue in the philosophy of religion through the mid-twentieth century. Religious language has also become a topic of interest in continental philosophy (Derrida 1989 and 1992; Marion 1994 and 1995).
A distinction that guides the selection of material for this article is between revisionary and non-revisionary accounts of religious language. Non-revisionary theories aim to explain what religious sentences and utterances mean. Revisionary theories, in contrast, propose accounts of what religious language should mean or how it should be used. While non-revisionary theories are descriptive of religious language and should do justice to linguistic data, revisionary theories are usually driven by metaphysical or epistemological considerations. This article will mainly be concerned with theories of the former type i.e., what religious utterances mean rather than what they should mean.
- 1. Preliminaries: The Face Value Theory
- 2. The Content of Religious Utterances
- 3. The Use of Religious Language
- 4. Religious Minimalism
- 5. Reference and Logic
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1. Preliminaries: The Face Value Theory
A useful starting point for thinking about religious language is a face value theory that promises to give an interpretation of religious sentences and utterances that adheres as closely as possible to what they appear to say. Take, for instance, the affirmation of an indicative religious sentence such as
- (1)God is omnipotent
According to the face value theory, (1) has various apparent characteristics: (a) It has the propositional—or “linguistic” or “semantic”—content that God is omnipotent and is true just in case God is omnipotent; (b) it is an assertion that conventionally expresses the speaker’s belief that God is omnipotent; (c) it is a descriptive utterance that represents (truly or falsely) the fact that God is omnipotent, just as other descriptive utterances in other fields of discourse (in science, history, etc.) represent facts. For proponents of face value theory, generalisations of (a), (b) and (c) that extend to indicative religious utterances such as (1)—(a*), (b*) and (c*) respectively—provide the starting point for the interpretation of religious discourse. It should be treated in the same way as the interpretation of other descriptive areas of discourse: there’s nothing special about religious discourse other than its distinctive subject matter.
The face value theory will, of course, need more development if it is to explain other areas of religious discourse. The approach taken to (1) clearly does not apply to non-literal or non-assertoric religious utterances, such as metaphors, questions, fictional stories, expressions of hope, or devotion. However, these are all forms of expression that occur outside religious discourse; they are not unique to religion. For the face value theory, the treatment of religious cases will fall in line with the treatment of non-literal and non-assertoric communication more generally. So, other than the fact that religious discourse is about God, the afterlife and so on, there is nothing remarkable or distinctive in the interpretation of religious utterances.
A large part of research on religious language has been concerned with whether one or more of (a*), (b*) and (c*) ought plausibly to be rejected. Indeed, the attention that some theories of religious language receive is in part due to their divergence from a face value interpretation. Most of the theories that are discussed within the field reject at least one of the components of face value theory.
The most radical rejection of face value theory is the denial of (a*), i.e., that religious utterances express religious propositions. These theories will be explored in section 2. The most famous example of this position is Ayer’s version logical positivism (2.1). Non-cognitive accounts, from which we have selected Braithwaite (2.2.1) and Berkeley (2.2.2), are similarly radical but are differently motivated and offer a more positive alternative account of the meaning of religious utterances. The prospects for a more sophisticated non-cognitivism are considered in 2.2.3. A third class of theories (2.3), propose that religious utterances are paradoxical or fail to express complete propositions. A fourth group, reductionist and subjectivist theories (2.4), allow that religious utterances express propositions but not the ones that they appear to. Instead, their truth conditions are given by “reduced” (typically non-religious) sentences.
Section 3 will look at theories that reject (b*), i.e., that indicative statements affirmed about God are not literal assertions. 3.1 will review metaphor theories, encompassing a discussion of analogy. Interpretations of religious discourse as a form of praise or prayer, suggested by Jean-Luc Marion and Jacques Derrida, will be considered in 3.2. These theories propose that despite appearing to literally assert religious sentences, speakers are instead employing a different type of speech act. An alternative approach is to argue that religious utterances are avowed for practical reasons rather than their truth. Ian Ramsey (3.3) takes this approach, as do hermeneutic fictionalists (3.4).
Minimalists (4.1) agree that indicative religious utterances are representational and assertoric but deny that they represent religious facts in the way that other areas of descriptive discourse represent facts. That is, they agree with (a*) and (b*) but reject (c*). This view is sometimes associated with Wittgenstein, whose brief remarks and lectures on religion have been highly influential. However, the interpretation of his work is not widely agreed upon and some different possibilities will be considered in 4.2.
The face value theory is a widely assumed—if not the default—approach taken to religious discourse in contemporary analytic philosophy of religion. Resistance to it is sometimes presented a brief aberration confined to the middle decades of the twentieth century (Mackie 1982: 2; Swinburne 1993: 88) with questionable if not anti-religious motivations (van Inwagen 2006: 156; Plantinga 2000: ch. 2, particularly in reference to Gordon Kaufman). However, as will become clear in the following sections, the opposition to face value theory is not of recent vintage and although some who disagree with face value theory may be atheists, the position is not tied to atheism.
2. The Content of Religious Utterances
Although Ayer’s version of verificationism is one of the most well-known rejections of (a*), his approach is unusual in two respects. First, he offers no positive alternative account of the meaning of religious utterances. Ayer saw little value in religious discourse and preferred its elimination. In contrast, the other theories considered in this section propose that religious language may be meaningful even if it does not express religious propositions. Various options have been proposed: it may express non-cognitive states, have a practical value in modifying the thought and action of speakers, or represent non-religious facts. Second, Ayer’s account is ostensibly comprehensive for religious language whereas most other theories are more piecemeal, that is, they reject (a*) for some significant subclass of religious utterances but for other religious utterances accept face value theory.
2.1 Ayer and Verificationism
The verificationist theory of meaning was popularised by A.J. Ayer in his 1936 Language, Truth and Logic. Ayer argues that religious statements—his term for indicative sentences—are “literally meaningless”. According to Ayer, a statement is factually contentful if and only if it is empirically verifiable. A statement is empirically verifiable if what it says can in principle be shown to be true or false by observation. Although logically necessary statements are not verifiable, according to Ayer they are analytic or true by virtue of the meaning of their constituent terms. As such, “none of them provide any information about any matter of fact” (1936: 79). Ayer encapsulated the verificationist theory of meaning with the infamous empirical verification principle: to have literal meaning a statement must be either analytically true (and thereby factually uninformative) or empirically verifiable.
Ayer’s chief target is metaphysics and he rather ambitiously titled the first chapter of his book “The Elimination of Metaphysics”. Metaphysics is taken to be made up of statements that concern the nature of reality that falls beyond the scope of scientific inquiry. Examples include the existence of the external world, the number of substances that there are in the world, whether the world is made up of ideas and the reality of propositions or universals. Because theories on these issues are not empirically verifiable, Ayer takes them to lack “factual meaning”: they should be eliminated as a topic of debate. Other conspicuous victims of the application of the verification principle were ethical, aesthetic and religious statements all of which, so Ayer argues, are not susceptible to verification and are thereby similarly factually meaningless.
Notably, however, Ayer has a positive “emotivist” story to tell about ethical statements. Although he takes ethical statements to be unverifiable descriptions of normative facts, from which he concludes that an ethical predicate “adds nothing to the literal meaning of the sentence”, he argues that ethical language has a non-descriptive function of expressing approval or disapproval as well as encouraging attitudes of approval or disapproval in others. For example, in saying “Stealing money is wrong”, the speaker does not say something that is true or false but expresses disapproval towards stealing (1936: 107). Ayer extends his emotivism to aesthetic language: it is used “simply to express certain feelings and evoke a certain response” (1936: 113). What of religious language? Ayer is silent on this issue, implying that religious language should be dispensed with in the same way as other areas of metaphysics.
Logical positivism was briefly in vogue in the 1930s but quickly ran into intractable difficulties. That something is seriously awry can be seen by subjecting the verification principle to its own standards: it is itself neither empirically verifiable nor analytically true, so literally meaningless according to its own criterion. Ayer exacerbated this problem by exaggerating the predicament of statements that failed to satisfy this principle, sometimes characterising them as “nonsense”. However, the central reason for the theory’s collapse was the failure to come up with a workable version of the verification principle (see MacDonald 2010 for a review). Ayer was unable to find a happy medium between a strict formulation that renders statements of scientific theory unverifiable and a lax formulation that allows any statement to be verifiable.
This brings us to the question of why religious statements should be held by to fall foul of the verification principle. Why can’t religious statements legitimately be regarded as scientific hypotheses (as Swinburne 1994, among others, argues)? Religious statements do in many cases appear to have implications for what is or should be observable. We can predict, for instance, that a world created by God will exhibit various kinds of orderliness. It seems, therefore, that some religious statements should be in a good a position to satisfy the standards of literal content set up by the empirical verification principle. Ayer’s reply to this argument is surprisingly terse. Suppose, he argues, that “God exists” entails that there should be observable regularities in nature. If that exhausted the observable results of “God exists” then “to assert the existence of a god will be simply equivalent to asserting that there is the requisite regularity in nature” (1936: 115). Clearly, Ayer contends, this is not all that religious believers intend to assert in saying that God exists: they are committed to the existence of an unverifiable supernatural agent.
Ayer’s response seems to involve a sleight of hand. The verification principle is presented as a way of demarcating factually contentful from contentless statements. In arguing against the verifiability of religious statements, Ayer relies on the assumption that the verification principle provides the means for specifying what statements mean. In this case, that the content of “God exists” is exhausted by the observation statements that (in combination with other assumptions) can be deduced from it. However, this is in effect to concede that religious statements are verifiable according to the original (official) version of the verification principle. As to the meaning-specifying, unofficial version of the verification principle, this is not something that Ayer defends. However, it would place religious statements in good company with scientific statements that posit theoretical entities that are not directly observable and the meanings of which are similarly not exhausted by the observation statements that are derivable from them.
Despite the availability of conclusive objections to Ayer, worries about the verifiability (or falsifiability) of religious statements continued to exert a remarkable influence on work in the philosophy of religion, with papers and books being produced well into the second half of the twentieth century. Particularly notable is John Hick’s argument that theism could be verified postmortem: “the verifying situation lies in the final fulfilment of God’s purpose for us beyond this present life” (1977b: 190). Other examples include Flew and MacIntyre (1955), Ferré (1962), Macquarrie (1967), Donovan (1976) and Tilley (1978); for a discussion of this prolonged impact see Scott (2013: 45–48).
2.2 Varieties of Non-Cognitivism
2.2.1 Religious Plans: R. B. Braithwaite
Ayer argues that although ethical statements are not descriptive they have the important function of giving voice to our non-cognitive attitudes of approval and disapproval. However, he offers no positive non-cognitive theory of the meaning of religious statements. Braithwaite addresses this asymmetry with a non-cognitivist account of religious language. His theory is modelled on Ayer’s ethical emotivism but with modifications. Braithwaite takes the same approach to religious statements. He proposes that religious statements are “primarily declarations of adherence to a policy of action, declarations of commitment to a way of life” (1955: 15). For example, “God is love” expresses the intention to follow an agapeistic way of life. Religious discourse concerned with matters that are not directly concerned with behavioural conduct, such as claims about important religious figures, parables, accounts of the creation, and so on, Braithwaite calls stories. These stories, according to Braithwaite, provide models of exemplary behaviour (or behaviour to avoid) that serve as psychological assistance for the believer to act on their intentions. For this reason, their truth is not crucial to the action-guiding role that they play: they are entertained rather than believed (1955: 24). Braithwaite combines a non-cognitive theory of a range of core religious judgements and doctrinal claims with a theory of religious “stories” as useful fictions.
A religious belief is an intention to behave in a certain way (a moral belief) together with the entertainment of certain stories associated with the intention in the mind of the believer. (1955: 32)
To the extent that the negative part of Braithwaite’s position—that religious utterances lack factual significance—relies on Ayer’s verificationism, his theory encounters similar problems. However, the positive part of Braithwaite’s theory also runs into difficulties both for its psychological implausability (Swinburne 1993: ch. 6) and as a theory of religious language (Scott 2013: ch. 4). Here is one objection. What are the intentions expressed by different religious statements? Braithwaite is rather sketchy on the details but he proposes that Christian statements express an intention to pursue an agapeistic way of life (1955: 21–22). However, equipped with only one plan, Braithwaite’s theory will have all Christian claims (or at least all doctrinal claims) meaning the same. They will all express an intention to pursue the same plan. Even if Braithwaite could identify some additional plans there seems no prospect of finding plans to individuate the meanings of all statements of Christian belief.
2.2.2 Mixed Strategies: George Berkeley
George Berkeley offers the most detailed and important account of religious language of any of the major early modern philosophers. These are elaborated in his 1732 dialogue Alciphron. His account has negative and positive elements. First, he rejects (a*) for a limited range of religious utterances. Specifically, Christian doctrinal concerns about grace, original sin, the afterlife and other Christian “mysteries”. Regarding the rest of religious discourse, Berkeley offers a thoroughly cognitive account: religious terms—and in particular “God”—correspond to ideas that refer to really existing features of reality. Moreover, Berkeley believes many Christian claims are not only cognitively contentful but also rationally defensible. Second, he proposes that this limited group of utterances should be interpreted non-cognitively: they do not represent facts but evoke various attitudes and practical dispositions.
In a part of the dialogue concerned with the Christian doctrine of grace, Berkeley attributes two arguments to the sceptical interlocutor Alciphron. First, when we consider the meaning of the word “grace” we find a “perfect vacuity or privation of ideas”; it is an “empty name” (Alciphron, 7.4). Second, in saying that grace “acts” or “causes” things to happen, we are employing words that are clear and intelligible when used to describe the behaviour of physical objects but have no similarly clear significations when applied to a “spiritual” matters. In supposing that talk of the causally efficacious properties of grace is contentful, speakers are unjustifiably trading on the familiar meanings of these words when talking about physical properties and causal relations between physical objects; when used to elaborate on the nature of grace or describe its nature, these words do not have a clear sense. We have, concludes Alciphron, no clear idea corresponding to the word “grace”; we “cannot assent to any proposition concerning it” or have any faith about it. Berkeley, through the interlocutor Euphranor, rejects Alciphron’s conclusion but concedes Alciphron’s arguments that the word “grace” does not suggest a clear idea. Nevertheless, a discourse “that directs how to act or excites to the doing or forbearance of an action may … be useful and significant”—and express faith—even if it is not representational (Alciphron, 7.5).
Berkeley goes on to develop his non-representation account not just for grace but a variety of Christian doctrines. Talking of grace has a practical role in encouraging conduct in accordance with Christian faith:
Grace may … be an object of our faith, and influence our life and actions, as a principle destructive of evil habits and productive of good ones, although we cannot attain a distinct idea of it. (Alciphron, 7.7)
He takes a similar approach to the Trinity: we lack a clear idea of what it is, but talk of it is significant because of its practical role in modifying the attitudes and conduct of the faithful (Alciphron, 7.8). Original sin receives a similar treatment. In general, talk of the “religious mysteries”, according to Berkeley, serves a practical function of motivating and guiding the faithful to think and act according to Christian principles. They are “placed in the will and affections rather than in the understanding, and producing holy lives rather than subtle theories” (Alciphron, 7.10).
One of the distinctive characteristics of Berkeley’s account is his attempt to develop a non-cognitive theory for only a limited region of religious language, while retaining a cognitivist account for the rest. Let’s call this a mixed theory. There are two pressing problems for a mixed theory. First, how should we differentiate areas of religious language which should be given a face value interpretation from those that should be given a non-cognitive interpretation? Second, how are the non-cognitive areas of religious language meaningfully related to the cognitive areas of language? Berkeley answers the first problem by an introspective experiment. We reflect on what we are thinking when we talk about the Christian mysteries and find that we lack clear ideas or beliefs. However, this is unsatisfactory. There is no general agreement on which religious expressions or sentences we are sufficiently clear about to make them suitable vehicles for expressing religious beliefs. Nor does Berkeley identify anything that specifically characterises the Christian mysteries as matters on which speakers have much less clear ideas than many of the other ideas that form part of religious judgements, not least the ideas of God and divine properties. Berkeley does not, therefore, have a successful method for discriminating religious ideas and thoughts that are cognitively contentful from those that are not.
On the second problem, suppose for example we follow Berkeley giving a face value account of
- (4)God is good
and a non-cognitive interpretation of
- (5)Salvation is given by divine grace.
That is, (5) does not have a propositional content but is used to encourage faith and virtue. How should (6), be interpreted?
- (6)If God is good then salvation is given by divine grace.
The mixed theory has two problems. This sentence combines (4) and (5) in a conditional sentence but since the consequent is taken to express an attitude it is unclear how it should be understood. This is because one can assert (6) without expressing the attitude in (5); one might, for example, think that the antecedent and consequent are false but nevertheless think that (6) is true because if the antecedent were true then the consequent would be true. It seems, therefore, that if the mixed theorist is right that (5) expresses a non-cognitive attitude then it must have a different meaning in (6) where it is not tied to the expression of any attitude. This brings us to a second problem, which is that (4) and (6) together entail (5). Together these sentences make an evidently valid modus ponens argument. However, if (5) means something different when asserted and when embedded in the conditional (6), then this argument is invalid. More generally, the mixed theory looks in difficulty when trying to explain the meaning of conditionals or valid arguments that contain expressive and cognitive religious sentences.
2.2.3 The Prospects for Religious Non-Cognitivism
Some of the problems with Berkeley’s theory arise from its limited application to only parts of religious language. This raises the question of whether a more thoroughgoing non-cognitivist theory of religious language could be developed, perhaps employing the methods developed in the defence of current expressivist theories of ethics. The prospects for such a theory remain relatively unexplored territory but here are a couple of relevant consideration, one in favour and one against.
An important part of religious discourse is the communication of faithful attitudes. Moreover, faith is a state that appears to be intrinsically connected to our motivations and feelings. This is something that Berkeley makes great play of:
Faith, I say, is not an indolent perception, but an operative persuasion of mind, which ever worketh some suitable action, disposition, or emotion in those who have it; as it were easy to prove and illustrate by innumerable instances taken from human affairs. (Alciphron, 7.10)
The idea that faith must have a practical element commands broad support. Faith is said to be intrinsically motivational (Bishop 2007: 105–106), to involve desires (MacDonald 1993: 44; Howard-Snyder 2013: 363), plans and commitments (Swinburne 2005: 211–212; Kvanvig 2013: 111), stances (Callahan & O’Connor 2014: 13–14) pro-attitudes (Audi 2011: 67; Alston 1996: 12–13; Schellenberg 2014: 83). Berkeley sees it as one of the main selling points of his non-cognitivism that it explains why faith in religious mysteries should have practical effects on the dispositions and behaviour of the faithful and lead people to change their lives (Alciphron, 7.10). More generally, it appears that there are at least the rudimentary components for an argument akin to the argument from motivational force used to support ethical non-cognitivism (see van Roojen 2016). This offers one potentially promising line of argument for the non-cognitivist to pursue. Note that religious utterances need not be exclusively either cognitive or non-cognitive. It is possible to argue that religious utterances conventionally express both non-cognitive attitudes and beliefs (for a defence of this position see Scott 2013: 71–85).
There are general objections to ethical and other varieties of non-cognitivism—most notably the Frege-Geach and the “embedding” problems (see Schroeder 2010 for an overview)—that will equally apply to a putative expressivist account of religious language. However, a thoroughgoing religious non-cognitivism will face the additional problem of identifying the relevant attitudes and plans that are expressed in religious utterances. While there are attitudes that might be considered characteristic of religious language—for instance, awe, devotion and obedience—it is difficult to see how such attitudes could provide the resources to provide a plausible account of the meaning of religious utterances or to individuate the meanings of different religious utterances. To take just one example, “God is omniscient” will need to be expressive of a distinct non-cognitive attitude to “God is omnipresent” to distinguish their meanings.
2.3 Paradoxical Content
Some of the claims most commonly made about God’s nature and doctrinal claims, particularly those of Christianity, have been said to be absurd, paradoxical or impossible to understand. The most familiar version of this worry concerns the consistency of the predicates ascribed to God such as omnipotence and doctrinal views such as the Trinity. Considerable effort has been directed towards establishing that religious claims are coherent (for example, Swinburne 1994). Those who concede that some religious claims are paradoxical have proposed a variety of different responses. Paradox in religious claims has been seen as grounds for atheism (Martin 1990), for modifying religious doctrine or changing our attitudes towards them (Hick 1977a: 1993), or as an ineliminable part of faith (Kierkegaard  1985; see Evans 1989). However, there is a further question about what such claims mean. If we take paradoxical utterances (or ones that are in some way absurd or impossible to understand) as failing to express propositions, then allowing that some of the principal expressions of faith are paradoxical (or absurd or impossible to understand) is thereby to reject (a*).
A number of accounts of religious language appear potentially sympathetic with this approach. For example, Ronald Hepburn (1958)—according to whom “paradoxical and near-paradoxical language is the staple of accounts of God’s nature” (16)—proposes that religious ideas and stories may have the role of imaginatively informing a moral way of life. This view has some similarities with fictionalism, discussed below. More recently, Stephen Mulhall (2015) has suggested that some religious utterances can be understood as unresolvable riddles the meanings of which we are unable to grasp fully, inviting an open-ended process of articulating their meaning that is pursued by those engaged in religious discourse.
Also relevant here are the works of authors in the apophatic and mystical tradition that was particularly prominent from mid-antiquity through to the late medieval period. Although a variety of accounts of religious language are suggested by the writings of authors in this tradition, some of what they say appears sympathetic to paradoxicalism about utterances about God’s nature. Two themes that are found in their writings are particularly notable. First, God’s nature is taken to be both inconceivable and inexpressible (Dionysius The Mystical Theology: ch. 5; Gregory of Nyssa Contra Eunomium II: 61; Maximus the Confessor, Chapters on Knowledge: part one 1–2, part two 2; Maimonides, The Guide of the Perplexed: ch. 58). It appears to follow from this that in saying, for example, “God is good”, one does not succeed in representing God in either thought or language. A second theme found in some apophatic writers is that an important aspect of religious engagement is establishing a secure relationship with God—sometimes characterised as an “ascent” to God (Dionysius The Mystical Theology: ch. 1.1; Cloud of Unknowing: ch. 4)—and a recognition of the abject failure of what we say to communicate any representation of God’s nature may form part of that process. Far from being pointless, religious discourse about God may assist in the recognition of our intellectual and linguistic limitations (Cloud of Unknowing: ch. 8). For further discussion and other interpretations of these works see Turner 1995 and for a detailed review focused on religious language see Scott and Citron 2016, Gäb 2020 and Hewitt 2020.
One difficulty that might be pressed by supporters of the face value theory is these theories, as least to the extent that they are providing accounts of religious language, appear revisionary rather than descriptive of the meanings of religious utterances. For example, the proposal that “God is good” does not simply express the proposition that God is good seems, in the case of apophaticism, to be based on a contentious theological view about what can be represented in thought and language rather than what speakers mean when they utter this sentence. The sentence is used in a variety of apparently descriptive ways by speakers: it is said to be true (or false), it is used in apparently valid arguments, can be embedded in a conditional, it is said to be a matter of belief or even of knowledge. Any account of religious language will need to do justice to the evidence that religious utterances are used descriptively, particularly ones that put (a*) into question.
A variety of philosophical positions go by the name “reductionism” but reductionist theories of language aim to give the truth conditions for sentences that are apparently about a certain range of phenomena in terms of sentences about some other range of phenomena. We can call these (following Dummett 1991: 322) the disputed and reduced class of sentences respectively. Commonly discussed examples include logical behaviourism (see Graham 2017), which reduces sentences about mental states to ones about behaviour, and temporal reductionism (see Markosian 2016) which proposes that sentences about time can be reduced to sentences about temporal relations between things and events. Most varieties of religious reductionism posit various naturalistic phenomena as the subject of the reduced class of sentences. Unlike other positions considered in this section, religious reductionists agree with face value theories that religious utterances have propositional content, however, they argue that the content in question is not the face value subject matter but instead the subject matter described by the reduced class of sentences.
A variety of reductionism adopted by early Christian writers in their treatment of pagan religion, such as Lactantius ([4th century] 1871: 22) and Augustine (The City of God, VII ch. 18), proposes that the pagan deities were based on real, mortal historical figures revered after their death for their contributions to human society and subsequently elevated to the status of gods. However, this is clearly not a linguistic reductionism. Augustine—in a chapter titled “A more credible cause of the pagan error”—aims to discourage and debunk pagan beliefs: they are fictions inspired by the benevolent deeds of mortal leaders. Linguistic reductionism does not seek to explain religious belief but identifies a reductive class of sentences by which the truth or falsity of sentences in the disputed class is determined.
Linguistic reductionism has never received widespread support, and has never been developed systematically or comprehensively for religious language. Nevertheless, it has an interesting pedigree. For example, Spinoza, one of the most influential defenders of pantheism, suggested ways of interpreting sentences about God in terms of facts about nature (Mason 2007). He writes:
By God’s direction I mean the fixed and immutable order of Nature, or chain of natural events … So it is the same thing whether we say that all things happen according to Nature’s laws or that they are regulated by God’s decree and direction. ( 2002: 417)
Since all human actions are, according to Spinoza, the product of the predetermined order of nature, we can—following the reductive strategy—say that nobody acts except by the will of God. Similarly, since anything that we can achieve is produced by either our own actions and/or by external conditions, all such achievements can be understood as the result of divine providence. So, for example, (6) is true if (5) is true.
- (5)Nobody acts except by the will of God.
- (6)All actions are the product of the predetermined order of nature.
Spinoza also proposes naturalistic reductions of talk about the Holy Spirit (1667 [2002, 525]), divine action and providence (1667 [2002, 445]) and miracles (1667 [2002, 448]).
Naturalistic interpretations of religious language became popular in the 1920s in both Britain and America. For example, Julian Huxley (1931) suggests that talk of God could be understood as a way of talking about forces operating in nature or about aspects of nature that we do not understand (see Bowler 2001), and proposes naturalistic interpretations of talk of the Holy Ghost and the Son of God (1927: 37). Influential early figures in the American tradition of “religious naturalism” or “religious empiricism” are Bernard Meland (1976) and Henry Wieman (1932). Wieman offers various naturalistic accounts of talk of God, usually identifying God with natural processes that yield or facilitate ethically or socially desirable results.
Also notable is the work of Gordon Kaufman, a leading figure in the development of modern liberal theology. He observes that in many cases the natural phenomena that are integral to giving our lives meaning are deeply mysterious, for instance, that humans are capable of consciousness and thought and the appreciation of beauty. He contends that “God” is the name given to the “pervasive mystery” that gives life meaning (2007: 12). Saying that God is “real” or “exists” express the belief that underpinning this “pervasive mystery” are natural forces that promote and facilitate ethical, aesthetic and social human flourishing (1981: 49).
Does truth-conditional reductionism offer a plausible theory of religious language? The obvious place to start is to consider whether or not there are any compelling reasons to prefer a reductive rather than a face value theory. Unfortunately, reductionists appear to stumble at this first hurdle. It is clear from the writings of reductionists that the reductionist interpretation of religious discourse is not advanced from a consideration of the meanings of what speakers say when they talk about God but instead on the basis of religious or metaphysical theories about the nature of the universe. However, the belief that there is no creator God is not a reason for giving naturalistic truth-conditions to (1); it is a reason for thinking that (1) is false. Notably, even among writers more sympathetic to linguistic reductionism we find lapses into non-linguistic reductionism. For example, while Kaufman sometimes presents his theory as an account of what is meant by talk about God, at other times he presents a much more clearly revisionary proposal. He writes, “It is this cosmic serendipitous creativity, I suggest, that we should today think of as God” (Kaufman 2007: 26, my italics) and he proposes that the “traditional notion” of God’s purposive activity in the word should be replaced with
what I call trajectories or directional movements that emerge spontaneously in the course of evolutionary and historical developments. (2007: 25)
For further discussion of reductionism see Alston 2005 and Scott 2013: ch. 9; the latter also discusses subjectivist versions of reductionism.
3. The Use of Religious Language
Suppose that religious sentences represent a religious subject matter, i.e., that (a*) is true. There remains the further question of what speakers mean when they use religious sentences. The semantic or propositional content of a sentence and its truth conditions is one thing, the information that a sentence is used to communicate is another. Any philosophical account of religious discourse must allow for non-literal utterances, where the propositional content of the utterance and the thought that it is used to communicate appear to diverge. However, according to the face value theory, utterances such as (7), (8) and (9) should—unless the context indicates otherwise—be understood as literal assertions that, if sincerely stated by a religious believer, express the speaker’s belief in what is said.
- (7)God created the world.
- (8) The authors of the Bible were inspired by the Holy Spirit.
- (9)God is omnipotent.
There are two main types of opposition to (b*). The first is that religious utterances—including utterances of indicative sentences that are apparently literal—are not literal assertions but fall under some other standard category of speech act. Speech acts—or illocutionary acts in Austin’s (1955 [1975, 95]) terminology—are what a speaker does in saying something. Examples include assertions, questions, commands, warnings, threats, statements of intention, requests. So, according to the first type of opposition to (b*) religious utterances, while many of them appear to be literal assertions, are in fact some other kind of speech act. Proposals include analogy or metaphor (3.1), praise or prayer (3.2), and pretence or other kinds of quasi-assertion (3.3). The second type of opposition to (b*), considered in (3.4), proposes that religious sentences are used for various (non-assertoric) purposes but does not identify a unified speech act as characteristic of religious discourse.
3.1 Analogy and Metaphor
The two main kinds of non-literal discourse that have been seen as particularly important in religion are analogy and metaphor. Analogy relates to the use of expressions that occur in both religious and non-religious contexts. Take, for example, the expressions “good”, “wise” and “powerful” when used in ordinary contexts to talk about people. Do these expressions have the same meaning when used to talk about God, or are they used analogously: is the conventional meaning they have when used to talk about mundane objects in some way modified when used to talk about God? Discussion of religious analogy was particularly lively in early medieval theology and Aquinas was a leading proponent of an analogical treatment of religious predicates. See Roger M. White (2010) for a detailed account of Aquinas’ theory, its background in Aristotle’s philosophy as well as subsequent ideas about analogy in religion in the work of Karl Barth and Immanuel Kant.
A detailed contemporary account of analogy by Richard Swinburne (1993: ch. 4) proposes that analogical use of a term involves a modification of its syntactic and/or semantic rules. A syntactic rule for the use of a term p sets down general conditions governing its use. A semantic rule for p gives examples of the things to which p correctly applies, or does not correctly apply. For instance, giving a semantic rule for red might involve pointing to various examples of red objects and contrasting them with objects that are not red (1993: 58). In using an expression analogically, Swinburne proposes, its semantic or syntactic rules are loosened. So W*, the analogical use of a predicate W, may require a less strict degree of resemblance to standard examples of W for its correct use. Swinburne believes that “person” which in its ordinary sense has living human beings with physical bodies as its standard examples, must be used analogically with a suitable weakening of its semantic rules and modification of its syntactic rules when applied to God.
It is notable that on Swinburne’s theory analogy can be seen as a commonplace feature of language use that is both compatible with a face value theory and found much more widely than in religious discourse. For example, consider the following utterances:
- (10)The lawn is square.
- (11)The audience was silent.
Lawns do not, of course, have four sides of equal length and in saying (11) the speaker does not mean that the audience was not making any noise whatsoever. According to modern pragmatic theories of interpretation (such as Sperber & Wilson 1986; Carston 2002; Recanti 2004), constituent expressions or concepts undergo an ad hoc modification prompted by the context in which they are uttered and understood. For instance, (10) might involve a loosening of the concept SQUARE, i.e., SQUARE* that includes not just objects that are square but also objects (like lawns) that look square or are approximately square. Akin to Swinburne’s account of rule modification in analogy, the condition that squares have four sides of equal length and internal angles of ninety degrees is relaxed. Understood in this way, however, analogy is not distinctive of religious discourse but a prevalent characteristic of normal communication. When God is the subject matter, expressions undergo a suitable ad hoc loosening as part of normal, literal communication.
Recent research has focused more on religious metaphors. The importance of metaphor has long been noted by theologians, with Sally McFague (1983) offering the most extensive treatment, while in the philosophy of religion William Alston (1989: ch. 1 and 2), Janet Soskice (1985), Anthony Kenny (2005) and Richard Swinburne (1991: ch. 3; 1993: ch. 4 and 5) have all contributed to the discussion.
Since metaphors are commonplace in various areas of discourse, it may seem that questions about religious metaphor should be subsumed under questions about metaphor in general raised in the philosophy of language. However, some have proposed that what is said about God is irreducibly metaphorical. Tillich’s (1951) theory that religious language is symbolic is perhaps an early expression of the view, and Anthony Kenny and Sally McFague are more recent proponents of a view of this type (see also Jüngel 1974; Sarot 1992). William Alston, the chief critic of the theory, offers the following statement of irreducibility theory (1989: 17–19):
- (IT)Religious metaphors are the only way of stating truths about God, and the content of a metaphorical utterance about God cannot be stated, even in part, in literal terms.
Alston sees the supporter of IT as construing even apparently literal claims about God as metaphorical. However, Alston’s formulation may be overly modest, since both Kenny and McFague seem to take the view that all talk of God is irreducibly metaphorical, irrespective of whether it is true or false.
IT fails, according to Alston, because metaphors, religious metaphors in particular, are always in principle susceptible to literal paraphrase. Scott (2013: 180–182) argues that IT, on any plausible account of what metaphors are, faces insurmountable problems. For example, according to one standard theory (Searle 1993), metaphors say something that is usually patently false with the aim of implying something other than the false thing that is said. “God is my rock”, for instance, might imply that God is a source of confidence for the speaker. However, it follows from IT that if a metaphor about God implies anything true about God then that implied claim should also be metaphorical. This appears to undermine truthful communication about God. If, however, talk of God is not in the business of expressing truths, according to what norm are utterances about God affirmed or rejected? Metaphor theories therefore face challenges in specifying and defending the irreducibility claim as well as in as well as elaborating what a metaphor is.
3.2 Praise and Prayer
Although some caution is needed in placing work in continental philosophy into the analytic classifications that inform this article, the treatment of religious language by Jean-Luc Marion (1994, 1982 ) and Jacques Derrida (1992) appears sympathetic to the speech act theories considered in this section. Speakers, according to Marion, in uttering indicative sentences about God praise God (and thereby express devotion, awe, and so on, towards God) rather than express beliefs about God. Derrida is critical of Marion; not, however, because he endorses a face value approach but because he believes speakers are better understood as voicing prayers to God rather than praise.
Marion’s theory is influenced by the apophatic idea that God cannot be accurately conceived of. Conceiving of something, according to Marion, involves placing some descriptive limitation or restriction on that thing. God and other religious subjects, Marion claims, are “saturated phenomena” that cannot be captured by human concepts:
That he is the given par excellence implies that “God” is given without restriction, without reserve, without restraint. “God” is given not at all partially, following this or that outline … but absolutely, without the reserve of any outline, with every side open … (1994: 588)
However, inspired by Dionysius’ writings, he presents an interpretation of religious discourse as referring to God without ascribing properties to God. For example, “God is good” addresses rather than describes God (1982 [1995, 76]). Marion calls this non-objectifying and non-predicative way of talking about God “praise”; it is a form of speech that is laudatory but combined with a recognition (at least by the speaker) that the property that is apparently predicated of God is inappropriate. Praise “feeds on the impossibility or, better, the impropriety of the category” (1982 [1995, 76]). In talking of God, therefore, speakers praise God but recognise the inadequacy of the concepts they are using to represent God: the predicate expressions are not used with the belief that they accurately represent God. In saying “God is good” speakers do not, therefore, believe or assert that God is good. For further discussion see James Smith 2002.
Derrida is sympathetic to Marion’s account but raises the objection that praising God (the “encomium” of God), on Marion’s account, still involves predication:
Even if it is not a predicative affirmation of the current type, the encomium preserves the style and the structure of a predicative affirmation. It says something about someone … [Praise] entails a predicative aim, however foreign it may be to “normal” ontological predication. (1992: 137)
Derrida proposes instead that religious talk about God should be understood as prayer rather than praise. Unlike praise, prayer is a form of address that, Derrida argues, is entirely non-descriptive. Prayer “is not predicative, theoretical (theological), or constative” (1992: 110). He elaborates:
I will hold to one other distinction: prayer in itself, one may say, implies nothing other than the supplicating address to the other, perhaps beyond all supplication and giving, to give the promise of His presence as other, and finally the transcendence of His otherness itself, even without any other determination; the encomium, although it is not a simple attributive speech, nevertheless preserves an irreducible relationship to the attribution. (1982 [1995, 111])
Derrida’s objection is unconvincing. (12) and (13), for example, appear to have the same “style and structure”:
- (12) God is good.
- (13)The table is round.
However, Marion’s point is presumably that the similarity of (12) and (13) is purely superficial. Marion does not give specifics, but one way of developing his is account is to take (12) to be communicating (something like):
- (14)Oh, God you are good!
Where (14) is understood as an expression of (say) the speaker’s respect and admiration of God and the speaker recognises the descriptive inadequacy of “good”. Derrida is, in effect, reading too much into the surface appearance of utterances: (12) and (13) may look similar but they are not thereby speech acts of the same type.
The strengths and weaknesses of Derrida’s and Marion’s accounts are as yet largely unexplored in analytic philosophy. There are, however, some obvious challenges that need to be addressed. For example, Marion claims in praising God the predicates that are ascribed to God are recognised as inadequate by speakers. This seems implausible. Speakers in many cases appear to believe what they are saying about God. Marion might argue that such religious believers have false beliefs about God’s nature, but to claim that they do not have beliefs about God’s nature that they intend to communicate seems to be a misrepresentation of speakers’ states of mind. Moreover, Derrida’s own suggestion that talk of God should be understood as prayer does not seem to have any advantage over the position his is criticising. Prayer also involves utterances that appear to represent God: “Our Father, which art in heaven”, for instance.
Fictionalists defend the moral and intellectual legitimacy of engaging with a field of discourse for speakers that do not believe that the sentences of that discourse are true (for a general overview see Divers & Liggins 2005, for a review focused on religious fictionalism see Scott & Malcolm 2018, Brock 2020). Some fictionalists propose that that speakers employ quasi-assertion. A quasi-assertion is a speech act that has the appearance of an assertion—it is the utterance of an indicative sentence—but it does not commit the speaker to the truth of the expressed proposition. The speaker goes along with or accepts the content of what is quasi-asserted but does not thereby believe it. The details of quasi-assertion depend on the kind of fictionalism being proposed and a variety of options have been proposed (for an overview see Kalderon 2005: 119–129). On some accounts, quasi-assertion involves the assertion of something other than the propositional content of the uttered sentence. For example, a fictionalist about mathematics might argue that a mathematical sentence M is used to assert that M is true according to standard mathematics (Field 1980). Alternatively, to quasi-assert a sentence might be to pretend to assert it. Comparable approaches are found among religious fictionalist. Peter Lipton (2007), for instance, suggests that engagement with religious could be akin to immersion in a fiction; the fictionalist accordingly pretends that the claims of religion are true. Other religious fictionalists (such as Robin Le Poidevin 2016, 2019) propose that the fictionalist, without believing that a religious utterance is true, may say it on the basis that it is true within some religious tradition.
Particularly important for our purposes is the distinction between revolutionary and hermeneutic fictionalism. Revolutionary religious fictionalism is not a theory of religious language—it is not a position on what speakers actually mean—but instead a revisionary proposal that is usually offered in response to error theory about religion. Despite religious claims being untrue, revolutionary fictionalists argue religious discourse has sufficient pragmatic benefits that we should continue to employ religious language and engage in religious thought rather than eliminate it, even though we should not believe that it is true. In general, revolutionary fictionalism is motivated by the wish to continue to receive the social and other benefits of engagement with a religion without commitment to its truth. LePoidevin and Lipton are both revolutionary fictionalists. The Sea of Faith Network, inspired by the work of Don Cupitt (1980), can also be understood as sympathetic to revolutionary fictionalism because it promotes Christian practice and the continuing engagement with religious discourse without religious belief. Interesting though they are, we will not be investigating these theories further because they are not saying anything about the meaning of religious utterances. Instead, they are recommending a change of attitude towards the claims of religion and quasi-assert rather than assert them.
Hermeneutic fictionalism about religion is the view that speakers are not committed to the truth of what they say on religious matters: speakers are quasi-asserting rather than asserting indicative religious sentences. This is not offered as a proposal about what speakers should do but instead as a fact about current linguistic practice. Speakers accept but do not believe what they say when engaging in religious discourse. So, along with other positions discussed in this section, hermeneutic fictionalists reject (b*). Defending this position may seem like a tall order: isn’t hermeneutic fictionalism undermined by the apparent linguistic evidence that religious speakers are committed to the truth of what they say? Nevertheless, there are a couple of positions that look to be potential contenders for religious hermeneutic fictionalism.
First, Georges Rey has defended a position that he calls meta-atheism according to which practitioners of religion exhibit widespread self-deception about what they say (2006: 337). For anyone with a basic education in science, Rey contends, it is obvious that religious claims are false. Rey is not proposing, however, that educated speakers are insincere when they affirm religious claims since they may think of themselves as believing what they are saying (2006: 338). Instead, speakers are in a state of self-deception. While they may recognise on a more critical level that religious claims are false, they do not entertain this when engaging in religious discourse. Why do religious people do not recognise and consciously draw out the implications of their disbelief? Rey suggests a number of reasons: loyalty to family and other social groups, personal ties and identifications with religious institutions, resistance to changing one’s public stance, the wish for one’s life to be part of a larger project. Rey supplements his arguments by pointing up differences between religious and scientific judgements aimed at showing that the latter are “understood to be fictional from the start” (2006: 345). Now, Rey’s position is, to say the least, contentious—for starters, his contention that religious claims are obviously false seems unsupportable (see Scott 2015 for a more detailed critique). However, with some assumptions about self-deception, we can understand meta-atheism as a kind of hermeneutic religious fictionalism. Speakers are in a conflicted state of self-deception that falls short of belief: on some level or in some uncritical contexts speakers treat religious claims as if they were true, while also believing in critical and reflective contexts that they are false. Accordingly, in uttering religious sentences speakers engage in quasi-assertion whereby they accept what is said without genuinely believing it to be true.
Second, a point of debate in current research on the nature of faith is whether propositional faith—i.e., faith that p—requires belief that p. Supporters of traditional doxastic accounts defend this condition while supporters of non-doxastic theories of faith argue that it is sufficient that one have a positive cognitive attitude towards p other than belief. There are various proposal for what this non-doxastic attitude is. Candidates include: acceptance (Alston 2007), assent (Schellenberg 2005), assumption (Swinburne 2005; Howard-Snyder 2013), trust (Audi 2011), hope (McKaughan 2013; Pojman 1986 and 2001), or acquiescence (Buchak 2012). However, to the extent that religious discourse is in the business of trading in the expression of faithful attitudes then it follows from the non-doxastic position that a speaker may sincerely affirm their faith in a religious proposition without believing it to be true. Notably, some non-doxastic theorists offer linguistic evidence to show that speakers do not believe what they say. This appears to concede a hermeneutic fictionalist account of faithful discourse (for discussion see Malcolm & Scott 2017 and Scott 2020). It seems likely that many proponents of non-doxastic theories of faith will not welcome the characterisation of their position as a variety of hermeneutic fictionalism (see Howard-Snyder 2016 and Malcolm 2018). However, non-doxastic theories are usually presented primarily as psychological or epistemological theories about the nature of faith; the implications of the position for religious discourse, and its relationship with hermeneutic fictionalism, have yet to be fully set out.
3.4 Religious Purposes
We have been looking at theories than characterise the affirmation of indicative religious sentences by a type of speech act other than literal assertion. However, some accounts propose that religious discourse, rather than exhibiting a distinctive type of speech act, employs language for certain distinctive purposes. Possible examples of this position include Wittgenstein’s suggestion that a religious judgement should be understood as a picture that has a regulative function in guiding practical decisions (1966: 53–4) and Kant’s proposal that religious utterances communicate guidance for how to think (Critique of Pure Reason A671/B699; A686/B714). This section will consider the accounts from Ian Ramsey (1957) and more recently Rowan Williams (2014).
According to Ramsey, full-blooded religious engagement involves two things: a commitment and a discernment. The commitment is an attitude that is directed towards the universe as a whole; it is “total” and has a particular intensity akin to a personal relationship. The discernment involves a “disclosure”, which he describes as a recognition of something of enormous importance. The something in question is not a new fact but a recognition that “brings together” what is known whereby one appreciates the world in a new light. For Ramsey, the purpose of religious language is to communicate and promote religious commitment and discernment: “religious language talks of the discernment with which is associated, by way of response, a total commitment” (1957: 49). With respect to utterances about God, Ramsey says:
My suggestion is that we understand their logical behaviour aright if we see them as primarily evocative of what we have called the odd discernment, that characteristically religious situation which, if evoked, provokes a total commitment. (1957: 50)
When it comes to the details of how to interpret specific religious utterances, Ramsey’s proposals are very varied. Some utterances he takes to be expressive of attitudes. Talk of “eternal purpose” aims to evoke a sense of “cosmic wonder” (1957: 77). Some are metalinguistic claims about the proper use of religious discourse:
to say that “God is impassable” is to claim that the word “God” is a word which cannot be confined to passability language. (1957: 89)
Others are about mystery:
Let us recognize that the doctrine of the Virgin Birth is essentially a claim for mystery at Christ’s birth or at Christ’s death. (1957: 132)
However, for Ramsey, religious sentences have representational content but are used by speakers in a variety of non-representational ways—expressive, metalinguistic, to generate a sense of mystery—for the purposes of evoking discernment and encouraging commitment, rather than descriptively.
Recently Rowan Williams (2014) has proposed that religious language serves to challenge us both morally, by undermining selfishness and complacency, as well as conceptually by encouraging us to think about the world in different terms. The use of religious language involves innovations that “invite us to rethink our metaphysical principles” (2014: 130), undercut “our sense of being a finished subject with a clear agenda of need and desire” (2014: 152–3), and “open us to a truth that is changing us and never leaves us in complacent possession of the power we think we have” (2014: 154). A similar approach is taken to discourse about God. What we are representing in talking of God is not an object but “a particular aspect of every perception, the aspect that gives to any specific perception its provisionality, its openness to being represented afresh” (2014: 148). These purposes can be furthered even by using religious sentences that are not consistent.
Face value theorists will, of course, find much to object to in both Ramsey’s and Williams’ discussions of religious language. One obvious point to raise is that if engagement in religious discourse is driven by the purposes that Ramsey and Williams describe then it seems that one need not be concerned with the truth of what one says. Notably, Williams appears to be sympathetic to the endorsement of incoherent claims if they further the broader proposed purposes of religious discourse. However, caution is needed in classifying these accounts as descriptive of religious discourse rather than revisionary proposals for objectives that speakers might aim for. If they fall into the latter category, then they are in a similar position to revolutionary fictionalism.
4. Religious Minimalism
Minimalist accounts of religious language, which are—rightly or wrongly—closely associated with Wittgenstein, agree with (a*) and (b*) but take issue with the face value understanding of descriptiveness along with associated ideas of fact, representation, reference and truth. For convenience, let us call these realism-relevant concepts. The opposition involves two main ideas. First, rather than posit a demanding standard that a field of discourse must meet to count as genuinely descriptive, minimalists propose that a discourse that satisfies very modest conditions—for example, that it possesses a truth predicate and standards of justification for what is affirmed or rejected—is thereby descriptive. Second, realism-relevant concepts are taken to be at least partly constituted by features of the discourse (or “language game”) in which they are used. Minimalists thereby reject a uniform account of descriptiveness across different areas of discourse. Descriptiveness, reference, truth, and so on are language-game-internal concepts: they are constituted differently in different areas of discourse. 4.1 will consider minimalist accounts of religious discourse and 4.2 will look at whether Wittgenstein might plausibly be understood as sharing this approach.
The discussion in this section touches on issues that have been explored in detail outside of the philosophy of religion. For more on the wider philosophical background see Stoljar & Damnjanovic 2014 on deflationary and Pedersen & Wright 2013 and 2016 on pluralist accounts of truth.
4.1 Minimalism About Religion
The two key features of minimalism are prominent in Hilary Putnam’s Wittgensteinian account of religious language in Renewing Philosophy (1992). First, Putnam draws attention to Wittgenstein’s well-known remarks on family resemblances (1953: 65–66). Wittgenstein’s target in these remarks is the idea that an expression requires necessary and sufficient conditions for its correct application. Intuitively, it seems that there must be such conditions if the meaning of the expression remains the same when it is used in different contexts. However, consider the term “game”, with its varying applications—board games, card games, Olympic games, and so on; we can see, Putnam (following Wittgenstein) argues, that for any particular condition that appears to characterise some types of game, there will be others that fail to satisfy it. Rather than common necessary and sufficient conditions for all uses of “game”, there is a network of similarities and relationships between them. Putnam proposes that Wittgenstein took a similar lesson to apply to notions like language, reference and truth:
referring uses don’t have an “essence”; there isn’t some one thing which can be called referring. There are overlapping similarities between one sort of referring and the next, that is all. (1992: 167–8)
Philosophical confusion results when, for instance, we attempt to apply standards of reference appropriate to descriptions of the perceived world to mathematical claims. Putnam then extends this point to religion:
The use of religious language is both like and unlike ordinary cases of reference: but to ask whether it is “really” reference or “not really” reference is to be in a muddle. There is no essence of reference … In short, Wittgenstein is telling you what isn’t the way to understand religious language. The way to understand religious language isn’t to try to apply some metaphysical classification of possible forms of discourse. (1992: 168)
A similar point is taken to extend to truth, descriptiveness and other realism-relevant concepts.
Second, Putnam argues that truth can be understood as idealised rational acceptability. This is not to say that truth depends on justification here and now—that is, what seems to us justified on currently available evidence—but rather that truth is not independent of all justification: “To claim a statement is true is to claim it could be justified” (1981: 56). To be truth-apt, it is sufficient that the assertoric utterances of religious discourse are governed by internal standards of warrant. While the standards of warrant in a given area of religious discourse may be significantly different to those in science (appealing to the authority of the Bible or the Pope, for instance, would not count in favour of a scientific theory), the condition that there are such standards is clearly satisfied. To arrive at a positive account of what constitutes truth (and other realism-relevant concepts) in religion, therefore, requires an examination of the specific standards of justification that are in play in religious discourse (or, more accurately, the different standards in different religious discourses).
D.Z. Phillips was a leading interpreter and champion of a Wittgensteinian approach to philosophy of religion. His early writings appear sympathetic to a non-cognitivist account of religious discourse. He questions whether religious utterances are descriptive and proposes, for instance, that “religious belief is itself the expression of a moral vision” (1976: 143) and that
the praising and the glorifying does not refer to some object called God. Rather, the expression of such praise and glory is what we call the worship of God. (1976: 149)
In his later writings from the 1990s, however, Phillips’ remarks appear more minimalist.
By all means say that “God” functions as a referring expression, that “God” refers to a sort of object, that God’s reality is a matter of fact, and so on. But please remember that, as yet, no conceptual or grammatical clarification has taken place. We have all the work still to do since we shall now have to show, in this religious context, what speaking of “reference”, “object”, “existence”, and so on amounts to, how it differs, in obvious ways, from other uses of these terms. (1995: 138)
Here, Phillips allows that religious expressions refer and religious sentences are descriptive, etc., but proposes—in line with minimalism—that the reference and descriptiveness of religious discourse is partly constituted by features distinctive of religious discourse. For a detailed and sympathetic treatment of Phillips’ work see Burley 2012 and for a critique see Scott & Moore 1997.
In general, religious minimalists agree on a number of points. They grant that religious statements have propositional content, and may be true, descriptive, factual, and so on. Second, realism-relevant concepts are understood as language game internal concepts. To know what makes for truth in religion, for instance, we need to look at the internal standards of justification that inform religious discourse. Third, the primary aim of minimalism, at least in the Wittgensteinian form it takes in philosophy of religion, is to elucidate the different standards that characterise different areas of discourse, and to spell out the differences between realism-relevant concepts in religion and realism-relevant concepts in science or history. However, there is also an important area of disagreement between religious minimalists. Phillips takes the different constitution of truth in different areas discourse to show that “true” means something different in different discourses: We have multiple truth concepts, with different extensions (1976: 142; 1995: 149). In contrast, Putnam appears to be more sympathetic to a pluralist account of truth: the truth predicate has certain necessary and sufficient conditions for its use (such as the disquotational schema) but may be additionally constituted by different further conditions according to whether we are talking about religious truths, scientific truths, or ethical truths (see Wright 1992: ch. 2). Fragmentary accounts of truth of the kind that Phillips appears to endorse have been widely criticised—see, for example, Timothy Williamson (1994: 141) Christine Tappolet (1997).
Religious minimalism is usually offered as a program of research rather than a detailed account of religious discourse. There is talk of the need to attend to the practices and forms of life of religious believers, an emphasis on the difference between religious and other areas of discourse, and warnings against applying scientific or historical standards to religious judgements, but the positive story of the meaning of religious utterances is often left as a promissory note. However, there are some areas where more substantial points of disagreement can be pursued. For instance, many supporters of the face value theory will reject the pluralist or fragmentary accounts of truth that inform the minimalist approach. Also, even if one is sympathetic to a pluralist account of truth, it does not straightforwardly follow that truth in religion is different from truth in science or history (for a defense of this point see Scott 2013: ch. 11). Religious minimalism will also be rejected by non-cognitivists. If the descriptiveness of religious language is secured as easily as minimalists propose, then this will undermine the non-cognitivist position that it is—despite superficial appearances—not descriptive. Non-cognitivists argue that the “propositional surface” of language conceals a variety of different functions: ethical statements express approval or disapproval, mathematical statements are stipulations, and so on. For a defense of this see Blackburn 1998.
Wittgenstein’s work on religion has served as a sourcebook for modern opposition to the face value theory. His remarks have been seen as lending support to many of the positions considered in this article. Non-cognitivists can find support in Wittgenstein’s characterisation of religion as “a passionate commitment to a system of reference” (1970 [1994, 64]; see also Tilghman 1991); fictionalists in his proposal that religious believers live their lives according to certain “pictures”; non-assertoric speech act theorists in his comparison of religious utterances to commands (1970 [1994, 61]). Wittgenstein was even attracted (if only briefly) to a subjectivist interpretation of God-talk ([PO]: 42). Given Wittgenstein writings on religion are only infrequent and relatively brief, it is perhaps not surprising that, beyond his clear resistance to the face value theory, he would not have settled views on the topic. For accounts profoundly influenced by or interpretative of Wittgenstein, see Winch (1987), N. Malcom (1997), Rhees (1970).
The minimalist reading of Wittgenstein is supported by his apparent endorsements of a deflationary account of truth (1953: 136), although he does not explicitly endorse the idealised justification theory that Putnam proposes. However, the best evidence for minimalism comes from his emphasis on the differences between the use of religious sentences, and historical or scientific (and in general empirical and descriptive) sentences. Specifically, he points up differences between the standards of warrant employed in religious and other discourses—the kinds of circumstance in which a religious believer judges something to be true, grounds for disagreements between religious believers and non-believers, and so on. This pervades his work on religion. For example, Wittgenstein compares the religious belief in the Last Judgement with scientifically based beliefs, or ordinary beliefs about observable states of affairs (he gives the example “There is a German aeroplane overhead”). While religious believers may speak of “evidence” and “historical events”, Wittgenstein argues that the evidence and events cited in connection with religious judgements do not constitutes reasons to believe them in the way that evidence given in support of a hypothesis gives a reason to believe that the hypothesis is true. In religious discourse “reasons look entirely different from normal reasons” (1966: 56), religious belief is not “a matter of reasonability” (1966: 58), religious beliefs are not hypotheses or opinions, they are not properly spoken of as objects of knowledge or as having a high probability, and when historical facts are introduced in support of religious belief “they are not treated as historical, empirical, propositions” (1966: 57). Here Wittgenstein seems at pains to emphasise the contrast between religious discourse and empirical discourses. Indeed, he implies that when taken (or where offered) as reporting scientific facts or scientific theories, religious sentences are in error. Wittgenstein is not, according to the minimalist interpretation, seeking to find any disadvantageous comparison between religion and science; to show, for example, that religion is merely expressive of attitudes, while science is properly descriptive. Rather, he is describing the different standards that make for truth and descriptiveness in these fields of discourse and, in so doing, elucidating the distinctive characteristics of religious truth as well as other realism-relevant concepts.
Notably, if Wittgenstein was a minimalist about religious discourse then one standard line of objection to his account is misplaced. Wittgenstein is sometimes criticised as proposing that religious discourse should be quarantined from other areas of discourse, in particular science and history. This is seen as leading to a variety of fideism, where religious beliefs are compartmentalised and unsusceptible to non-religious intellectual evaluation. The objection is forcefully prosecuted by Kai Nielsen. According to Wittgenstein, Nielsen argues,
no philosophical or other kind of reasonable criticism, or for that matter defence, is possible for forms of life or, indeed, of any form of life, including Hinduism, Christianity and the like. (2000: 147)
However, contrasting the different standards exhibited by religious and scientific discourses is consistent with scientifically or historically well-founded evidence informing religious judgement. Indeed, minimalists would be remiss in not taking account of the fact that historical evidence clearly is seriously weighed in a variety of religious beliefs including belief in Christ’s resurrection, or the creation of the world, and beliefs about miracle workers and what they have done. Insofar as this happens, the verdicts of historical or scientific investigation can modify religious judgements. In a similar way, many religious judgements are dependent on historically or scientifically assessable evidence. For example, compelling evidence that the documentary and eyewitness testimony for a miracle was a hoax would be a good reason not to believe that the miracle in question occurred and this evidence comes from “outside” the religious language game. However, minimalists can allow that empirical evidence is part of the justification for many religious beliefs while maintaining the theory that religious discourse employs distinct standards of justification to science.
5. Reference and Logic
Although they have received less attention that the other topics in this article, two other issues relating to religious language should be noted. First, the reference of “God”, second, the logic of religious language.
Recent work on the reference of “God” mostly proceeds from the assumption that “God” is a name rather than a title or a description (for criticism of this view see Johnston 2011: 6–7; for supporting arguments see Scott 2013: 86–7). From this starting point, attention has focused on how to apply the rich resources of research on names from the philosophy of language to this case. For example, according to descriptivist theories “God” has a descriptive content (a view that stretches back at least as far as Anselm), whereas according to Millian theories “God” refers to its bearer without conveying any information about the object referred to. The latter theory can be combined with a causal theory of reference (Kripke 1980) to explain how the name becomes attached to the referent. Although many of the arguments in this debate derive from the philosophy of language, there are also interesting implications of these positions for the philosophy of religion. For instance, a descriptivist theory appears to place limits on how wrong we can be about what God is like. A causal theory of reference, in contrast, will need to be backed up by a defence of the possibility of causal interaction with God and an account of how God is named. For discussion of these theories see Alston 1989 and 1991, Gellman 1997 and Sullivan 2012. For a recent review of the field see Scott 2013: ch. 7.
Does religious language adhere to a non-classical logic? This issue has been raised in at least two contexts. First, some of the writings of authors in the apophatic tradition have been seen as supporting a paraconsistent logic of religious language, specifically dialetheism, the view that some contradictory sentences are true (see Priest 2002: 22–3, although Scott & Citron 2016: 72 cast doubt on this as a plausible interpretation of apophatic authors). Second, Michael Dummett considers a number of arguments in favour of the view the divine omniscience entails bivalence, i.e., that for any statement p it is determinately either true or false. For example, if God knows that p, then He knows that he knows that p and therefore it is true; but if God does not know p then He knows that He does not know it and hence knows that it is not true. From this it can be shown that God must know whether p is true or false, thereby securing bivalence (2004: 94–96; see also 1991: 318–9, 348–351). Since, for Dummett, realism for a field of discourse hinges on the success of the principle of bivalence for the statements of that discourse, it would follow that theism leads to global realism. For a critical discussion of Dummett’s arguments see Scott and Stevens 2007.
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