Notes to Religious Diversity (Pluralism)

1. The phrase “religious exclusivist” has been used by some as a label for those who claim that their perspective on a religious issue is true (and, thus, that any incompatible perspective is false). In this sense, for example, those who claim that their perspective on the question of who will spend eternity with God is true—whether that perspective is that no one spends eternity with God, that the proponents of only certain religions will spend eternity with God, or that everyone will spend eternity with God— are by virtue of this truth claim religious exclusivists. Looked at in this way, “religious pluralism,” however it is defined, is not a competing position. Rather, individuals are either religious exclusivists or not. If they believe that a given perspective on a religious issue is true, then, regardless of the nature or content of that perspective, they are religious exclusivists; if they don't hold such a belief, then they are not religious exclusivists with respect to the issue in question (Schilbrack 2014, 6–7).

2. We must distinguish the type of selective pluralism I’m describing from what Kevin Meeker has labeled “anarchistic pluralism.” As will be discussed later, a selective pluralist is someone who believes that more than one, but not necessarily all, competing perspectives are equally close to the truth, while an anarchistic pluralist is someone who believes that all competing perspectives on a given issue are equally close to the truth. Most individuals who consider themselves pluralists are selective pluralists since they would want to reserve the right to maintain that some perspectives are equally “true” while also maintaining that some perspectives are false (Meeker 2003, 524–534). S. Mark Heim, whose views will be considered later, might be considered by some an anarchistic pluralist (Heim 1995).

3. Some will surely be uneasy with Plantinga’s dependence on nonfalsifiable private, privileged truth, noting that many, if not most, religious extremists make an unacceptable appeal to such truth as justification for their actions. Plantinga’s supporters can counter that the fact that some such appeals are ad hoc, self-serving justifications for very harmful behavior doesn’t mean this is always the case.

4. The focus of discussions about reasonable belief among those engaging in the current “epistemology of disagreement” dialog is not exclusively, or even primarily, on religious beliefs. However, the various perspectives do apply directly to religious beliefs.

5. Kelly James Clark agrees: “Whatever warranted beliefs about God one has antecedently … will remain warranted in the face of claims of religious diversity” (Clark 1997, 317).

6. One possible exception is Paul J. Griffiths (Griffiths 1988, 400–404).

7. It is important to note explicitly that a person can be an exclusivist on this issue while a non-exclusivist in relation to other issues, for instance, with respect to the question of who can experience God’s presence now.

8. One famous Christian exclusivist of this type was Karl Barth. Attempts to reconcile ourselves to God, he argued, are doomed to failure. It is, instead, only through the true revelation of God in Jesus Christ that God provides and reveals the means for our salvation (Peterson et al. 2013, 323).

9. Proponents of this view often point to Romans 9: 16–22, where we read that just as a potter can do with a lump of clay whatever she or he wants for whatever reason, so too can God do what God wants with and to us as humans for God’s own reasons.

10. I am in this section referring to public education as it is understood in the United States, Canada, Australia, and many European and Asian countries: education funded by the government and administered by governmental agencies. This must be distinguished from public education in, for instance, the United Kingdom, where "public" refers to education furnished by independent, fee-based institutions independent of government funding and administration.

Copyright © 2020 by
David Basinger <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free