Rule-Following and Intentionality

First published Tue Apr 12, 2022

Ludwig Wittgenstein’s reflections on rule-following—principally, sections 138–242 of Philosophical Investigations and section VI of Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics—raise a series of provoking questions and puzzles about the nature of language and thought. The literature on this topic is vast. We’ll structure our discussion around Saul Kripke’s Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language (1982), the most widely discussed commentary on Wittgenstein on rule-following.[1] In this book, Kripke’s Wittgenstein famously develops a “sceptical challenge” to the idea that that there are facts about the meanings of linguistic expressions and contents of thoughts, and goes on to propose a “sceptical solution” to the challenge, which attempts to preserve the propriety of talk of meaning and content while conceding to the sceptic the non-existence of the kind of semantic or intentional facts on which she casts doubt. After some preliminary comments about rules, meaning, and content (§1), we’ll outline the sceptical argument (§2), and we’ll offer an overview of some of the main responses to it. First, we’ll discuss sceptical responses of the sort proposed by Kripke’s Wittgenstein himself (§3). Then, we’ll consider straight responses, which advance candidate meaning-constituting facts. We’ll examine in detail the two forms of straight solution that are most widely discussed in the secondary literature, reductive dispositionalism (§4) and non-reductionism (§5).

For the purposes of this entry, we’ll understand ‘intentionality’ in a broad sense, so that it covers the meanings of linguistic expressions (and utterances) and also the contents of propositional attitudes. Clearly, these notions are closely related: just as we can say of the sentence ‘\(68 + 57 = 125\)’ that it means that 68 plus 57 is 125, we can say of Octavia’s belief that it has the content that 68 plus 57 is 125 (or that Octavia believes that 68 plus 57 is 125).

1. Rules, Meaning, and Content

What does the notion of rule-following have to do with the notions of linguistic meaning and mental content? For our purposes, the important point is that meaning something by a linguistic expression is analogous to following a rule. Suppose I write out the beginning of an arithmetical series

\[ 2, 4, 6, 8, 10, \ldots \]

If the rule I’m following is add 2, the continuation

\[ 12, 14, 16, \ldots \]

is correct, in that it accords with the rule I’m following, while the continuation

\[ 13, 19, 20, \ldots \]

is incorrect, in that it fails to accord with the rule I’m following.

We have here an analogy with my meaning something by a linguistic expression. Say that I mean blue by ‘blue’. Then, ‘blue’ is correctly applicable to, for example, a US postbox but not to a ripe (Roma) tomato. We can express this point by saying that the former application accords with the predicate’s meaning while the latter application fails to do so. Given this analogy, arguments about rule-following have consequences for our conception of linguistic meaning: if an argument shows that there are no facts about which rule an agent is following, it may also show that there are no facts about what a speaker means by a linguistic expression.

Note that the notion of accord in play in the case of following a rule is also in play in our conception of mental states with intentional content generally. Say that one intends to attend the performance of Sartre’s play No Exit at the Hopewell Theatre on Wednesday. Then, one’s attending the performance at the Hopewell on Wednesday accords with one’s intention (in the sense that it fulfils it), while one’s staying at home to grade logic exams fails to accord with it. Say that one believes that the cat is on the mat. Then, the state of affairs in which the cat is on the mat accords with one’s belief (in the sense that it renders it true), while the state of affairs in which the cat is on the roof does not. Say that one desires to smoke a Bolivar Number 3. Then, one’s smoking a Bolivar Number 3 accords with one’s desire (in the sense that it satisfies it), while one’s smoking a Café Crème does not accord with it. Given this, arguments about rule-following have consequences for our conception of mental content: if an argument shows that there are no facts about what rule an agent is following, it may also show that there are no facts about the contents of a thinker’s mental states.

Before considering the arguments themselves, we’ll pause to reflect on views about the relative priority of linguistic meaning and mental content, and on what presuppositions are required in order for the arguments to be run.

In his influential 1989 survey, Paul Boghossian distinguishes between two broad types of view:

  • The Sellarsian View: the notion of linguistic meaning is explanatorily prior to the notion of mental content (Sellars 1956).
  • The Gricean View: the notion of mental content is explanatorily prior to the notion of linguistic meaning (Grice 1989).

Boghossian suggests that, irrespective of which of these views is adopted, it will not be possible to develop a sceptical argument that exclusively targets linguistic meaning. On the Sellarsian View, the conclusion that there are no facts about linguistic meaning will ensure that there are no facts about mental content, since on that view it is from the former sort of fact that the latter sort of fact would have to be derived. On the Gricean view, raising a sceptical doubt about linguistic meaning cannot be done without raising a sceptical doubt about mental content.

We would add a third possible view:

  • The Davidsonian View: the notions of mental content and linguistic meaning are explanatorily interdependent; neither takes explanatory priority over the other (Davidson 1984, 2001).

Clearly, on the Davidsonian view, one cannot pose a sceptical threat to the existence of facts about the meanings of linguistic expressions without also threatening the existence of facts about mental content, and vice versa. And we can add Boghossian’s further observation:

If [the sceptical arguments are] effective at all, they should be as effective against linguistic content as they are against mental content. This is evident from the fact that the arguments construct their skeptical case by exploiting features of content properties, but without exploiting any facts about the putative bearers of those properties. Thus, they would apply to anything said to possess content, whether it was mental or not. (1990 [2008: 62])

In what follows, then, we’ll move freely between considering arguments about rule-following, linguistic meaning, and mental content.[2]

2. The Sceptical Argument

We’ll begin with a brief outline of the argument of Kripke’s sceptic. Suppose that I’ve never dealt with numbers larger than 57.[3] (Given our finite nature and the infinitude of the natural number series, there will always in fact be such a number.) I’m asked to perform the computation ‘\(68+57\)’, and I arrive at the answer ‘125’, which I take to be right. However, a “bizarre skeptic” (Kripke 1982: 8) questions my certainty. She suggests that in the past I used ‘plus’ and ‘+’ to mean a different function, which she calls “quaddition”. Quaddition yields the same result as addition if the numbers are lower than 57, and 5 otherwise, so the correct result of the aforementioned computation is ‘5’, not ‘125’. I should answer ‘5’ if I intend to use ‘plus’ in the same way in which I have been using it in the past, or so the sceptic suggests.

Kripke allows that the sceptic’s proposal is “absolutely wild”, and that she is “crazy” if she “proposes [her] hypothesis sincerely”. He grants, however, that it is not logically impossible, and so “there must be some fact about my past usage that can be cited to refute” that hypothesis (1982: 9). That is, there must be some fact about my past usage that determines that I meant addition by ‘plus’ in the past, and thus that (again, assuming that I intend to use the expression in the same way I have been using it so far) I should answer ‘125’ rather than ‘5’. Importantly, the sceptic does not question my memory concerning past use; indeed, she goes as far as to allow that the exercise of my cognitive powers is faultless, and that I have access to all the facts about my mind and behaviour that are potentially constitutive of my meaning one thing rather than another (1982: 14). Her thought is that if I am not able, even in such cognitively ideal conditions, to provide the fact in virtue of which I mean addition, a fact that properly singles out the function of addition rather than the function of quaddition, it is because there is no such fact. Furthermore, the focus is on past use because “if I use language at all, I cannot doubt coherently that ‘plus’, as I now use it, denotes plus” (1982: 13). But, if the sceptic’s challenge succeeds, it can be generalized, for “if there was no such thing as my meaning plus rather than quus in the past, neither can there be any such thing in the present” (1982: 21). (The fact that the sceptic grants the idealisation of our cognitive powers in the way that she does shows that her argument is not of a piece with the argument of the epistemological sceptic, who is concerned with whether our actual cognitive capacities can lead to knowledge. See Boghossian 1989 [2002: 150]. For dissent over this point, see Ginsborg 2018. Martin Kusch takes the argument to be metaphysical [2006: xiv], but, in contrast with Boghossian, he takes the dialogic setting to play an essential role in it.)

As we’ll see, the search for a fact fails, and the sceptic concludes that “the entire idea of meaning vanishes into thin air” (Kripke 1982: 22). Kripke rejects this paradoxical conclusion as “insane and intolerable” (1982: 60) and “incredible and self-defeating” (1982: 71), and goes on to develop, on behalf of Wittgenstein, a sceptical solution, which he takes to be similar in some respects to David Hume’s solution to the sceptical problem about causation (1982: 4; 62–69), and which purports to conceive of meaning in a way that does not lead to paradox. We discuss the sceptical solution in section 3. (George Wilson was the first to insist on the significance of the distinction between the parts of the sceptic’s position Kripke’s Wittgenstein accepts and the parts he rejects—between the basic sceptical conclusion, according to which there are no facts about a speaker of the sort that the sceptic is seeking that constitute her meaning something by an expression, and the radical sceptical conclusion, according to which no one means anything by an expression [Wilson 1994, 1998]. We will return to Wilson’s view in section 3.3.)

Why does Kripke take the search for candidate meaning facts to fail? Recall that all my previous uses of ‘+’ are compatible with my meaning quaddition, which is what enables the sceptic to say that I meant that all along. One might complain that the challenge operates from a “ridiculous model of instruction” (1982: 15), which fails to take into account that to be a competent adder is to have internalized a general instruction or rule that is now “engraved on my mind as on a slate” and which “justifies and determines my present response” (1982: 15–16). But the sceptic will reply that the worry can be raised again with respect to the general instruction or rule, which is just as susceptible to being interpreted in a deviant way as the initial expression. Kripke then considers a variety of other candidates, which are the kernel of various philosophical theories, and argues, on behalf of the sceptic, that none of them fit the bill. Among the facts considered are my being disposed to produce the sum (1982: 22–32), my instantiating a machine whose operations embody the function of addition (1982: 32–35), the simplicity of the addition hypothesis (1982: 37–39), my having a distinctive experience “with its own special quale, known directly” through introspection (1982: 41), my having an image in mind that supposedly singles out addition (1982: 42), my being in a primitive, irreducible state of meaning addition (1982: 51–53), and my grasping an abstract entity, such as a Fregean sense, which singles out addition (1982: 53–54). None of them, Kripke argues, is successful in ruling out the skeptic’s hypothesis that I meant quaddition rather than addition.

As mentioned above, dispositionalism and non-reductionism are the most prominently discussed proposals, and we’ll consider them more carefully in section 4 and section 5, respectively. At this stage, we should ask the following question: what are the conditions that a candidate meaning fact must meet? There is controversy in the literature about their nature and plausibility.

2.1 The Extensionality Condition

Here is how Kripke first lays out the two conditions:

An answer to the skeptic must satisfy two conditions. First, it must give an account of what fact it is (about my mental state) that constitutes my meaning plus, not quus. But further, there is a condition that any putative candidate for such a fact must satisfy. It must, in some sense, show how I am justified in giving the answer ‘125’ to ‘\(68+57\)’. The ‘directions’ … that determine what I should do in each instance, must somehow be ‘contained’ in any candidate for the fact as to what I meant. Otherwise, the skeptic has not been answered when he holds that my present response is arbitrary. (1982: 11)

To begin with, Kripke claims that whatever fact makes it the case that a speaker means addition by ‘+’ must single out the addition function, as opposed to the quaddition function, as what is meant. It follows from this that the putative meaning-constituting fact must account for the conditions of correct application of ‘+’. In other words, the fact in which my meaning addition by ‘+’ consists must single out ‘4’ as the correct response to ‘\(2 + 2\)’, ‘110’ as the correct response to ‘\(55 + 55\)’, ‘125’ as the correct response to the query ‘\(68 + 57\)’, and so on. Meaning facts render the applications of expressions correct or incorrect, and so a fact cannot count as a meaning-constituting fact unless it does this. This is an uncontroversial claim, which most philosophers accept. As Simon Blackburn notes, this

distinguishes the production of terms from mere noise, and turns utterance into assertion—into the making of judgement,

and so

it is not seriously open to a philosopher to deny that, in this minimal sense, there is such a thing as correctness and incorrectness. (1984 [2002: 29]; see also Wikforss 2001: 206; Hattiangadi 2006, 222; Glüer & Wikforss 2009: 35; see Travis 2006 for a dissenting view)

Moreover, this is something on which those who seek to offer a reductive account of meaning (e.g., Fodor 1990; Millikan 1984) and those who are sceptical about the prospects of reduction (e.g., Boghossian 1989; Verheggen 2011; Bridges 2014) seem to agree.

We’ll call this first condition the extensionality condition. In the case of a predicate like ‘green’, for example, it requires that the fact which constitutes its meaning determines the appropriate class of things to which ‘green’ is correctly applicable. This will be the class of green things as opposed, say, to the class of grue things (where an object is grue if and only if it is green before some specified time t and blue thereafter), and in the arithmetical case on which we have focussed so far, the extension of ‘+’ will contain the triple \(\langle 57, 68, 125\rangle\) (and not the triple \(\langle 57, 68, 5\rangle\)).

To see how a candidate meaning-constituting fact might fail the extensionality condition, consider a simple form of dispositional theory of meaning which proposes as constitutive of my meaning addition the fact that I’m disposed to answer with the sum (as opposed, say, to the quum) when faced with arithmetical queries of the form ‘\(x + y\)’. The sceptic argues that this fact doesn’t single out the addition function:

Let ‘quaddition’ be redefined so as to be a function which agrees with addition for all pairs of numbers small enough for me to have any disposition to add them, and let it diverge from addition thereafter (say, it is 5). Then, just as the skeptic previously proposed the hypothesis that I meant quaddition in the old sense, now he proposes quaddition in the new sense. A dispositional account will be impotent to refute him. As before, there are infinitely many candidates the skeptic can propose for the role of quaddition. (Kripke 1982: 27)

We’ll consider whether dispositionalism can muster resources to deal plausibly with this problem concerning the satisfaction of the extensionality condition below (in section 4).

2.2 The Normativity Condition

According to a prominent line of thought, the notion of correctness involved in the seemingly platitudinous claim that meaningful expressions have conditions of correct application is intrinsically normative. On this reading, meaning facts are normative facts—they not only sort the applications of expressions into correct or incorrect, but also prescribe how expressions ought to be applied. They issue semantic categorical obligations that bind speakers in determinate ways; the justified applications are precisely those that fulfil these semantic obligations. (The kind of normativity at stake is meaning engendered, rather than meaning determining; it is grounded in meaning, rather than grounding meaning. See Glüer and Wikforss 2009 for this helpful distinction.)

To illustrate how the second condition, thus construed, constrains accounts of meaning, let us again consider Kripke’s discussion of dispositionalism. He thinks that the dispositionalist offers “a descriptive account” of the relation between what one means by an expression and one’s uses of that expression, but that “this is not the proper account of the relation, which is normative, not descriptive” (1982: 37). More generally, Kripke says, “the relation of meaning and intention to future action is normative, not descriptive” (1982: 37). Among the commentators who read the second condition in this way are Wikforss 2001, Glüer and Wikforss 2009, Hattiangadi 2006 and 2007, and Miller 2011, 2012. Thus construed, the sceptical argument can be compared to arguments in metaethics that purport to establish, by drawing on J. L. Mackie’s (1977) argument from queerness concerning the seemingly problematic metaphysical and epistemological status of moral properties, an error-theory of moral judgment (Miller 2010a, 2020). (See the entry on moral anti-realism.)[4]

Kripke’s discussion has resulted in a vigorous debate about whether meaning really is normative, as well as about how the normativity of meaning is best understood. For a defence of the claim that meaning is normative, see Whiting 2007, 2009, 2016 (note that Whiting focuses on the idea that meaning facts engender permissions to apply words correctly and obligations not to apply them incorrectly, though both the permissions and the obligations are defeasible). For criticism of the view that meaning is normative, see Fodor 1990, Glüer and Pagin 1998, Glüer 1999, Wikforss 2001, Boghossian 2005, Miller 2006, Hattiangadi 2006, 2007, and Glüer and Wikforss 2009. (See also the entry on the normativity of meaning.) Some philosophers seek to carve a middle ground between the normativist and the anti-normativist positions—for instance, by claiming that meaning facts are essentially justificatory (Gampel 1997), or that they have hypothetical implications that are essential to them, thus being fundamentally unlike natural facts, which may be hypothetically normative only accidentally (Verheggen 2011; Chapter 2 of Myers and Verheggen 2016). Hannah Ginsborg proposes a novel conception of normativity as more basic than rules (Ginsborg 2011b, 2012, forthcoming), which we shall briefly discuss in the last section.

Some commentators take the normativity condition to amount to an agential requirement, one that primarily concerns the applications or uses of expressions. The thought is that meaningful uses of expressions are not arbitrary—they are not unjustified leaps in the dark. An adequate conception of meaning must be able to account for this. This view of the normativity condition claims to shed light on Kripke’s numerous appeals to the metaphor of blindness (1982: 10, 15, 17, 23, 87). Kusch thinks that the requirement of non-blindness is best understood as falling under the purview of semantic normativity (which, contra the normativist interpreters, he does not take to involve categorical obligations), and that it is best understood as indicating that the speaker’s “meaning-constituting mental state guides and instructs” her on how to apply the expression, that the speaker “can refer to this mental state in order to justify her use” of the expression, and that this state

not only justifies certain applications—in the sense that meaning addition justifies ‘125’ in answer to ‘\(68+57=\ques\)’—it also justifies the way in which the answer is usually produced. (Kusch 2006: 8–9, italics added)

Along similar lines, it has been suggested that the meaning-constituting facts be able to accommodate the idea that “the meaningful use of words must be revealed as intentional” (Sultanescu and Verheggen 2019, 13; Sultanescu forthcoming). The paradox has also been interpreted as belonging

to the philosophy of rational explanation, of explanations that account for what people do or think by citing their reasons for doing or thinking so. (Bridges 2014: 249; see also Bridges 2016)

Some interpreters take the sceptical argument to involve the imposition of an epistemological constraint—a constraint related to the epistemic justification of semantic judgments, rather than to the rationality of the applications of expressions. Warren Goldfarb notes that Kripke “does seem to mean that the justifications must in some sense be transparent” (1985 [2002: 98]). José Zalabardo takes Kripke to be demanding that the meaning-constituting facts provide speakers with justification for their judgments about the correctness of the applications of their predicates. Justification is construed in an internalist sense: speakers possess the relevant justification if the procedure through which they decide whether predicates apply to objects involved “conscious engagement with the facts that determine how these questions should be answered” (1997 [2002: 286]). (See also Jackman 2003, Guardo 2012, and Merino-Rajme 2015). Crispin Wright proposes a more specific epistemic constraint, namely, that of accounting for the seemingly puzzling fact that the epistemology of meaning is first-person authoritative even though meaning something by an expression is in crucial respects akin to having a dispositional trait. In Wright’s words, the constraint is to explain

how it is possible to be effortlessly, non-inferentially and generally reliably authoritative about psychological states which have no distinctive occurrent phenomenology and which have to answer, after the fashion of dispositions, to what one says and does in situations so far unconsidered. (2001: 150)

Note that all the construals of the second condition appear to put pressure on dispositionalism over and above that exerted by the extensionality condition. Prima facie, dispositional facts are facts about what we will or would do, not about what we ought to do; dispositional facts appear not to be essentially justificatory or hypothetically prescriptive; dispositions do not justify or rationalise their manifestations, and in making semantic judgements we do not typically engage with facts about our linguistic dispositions; lastly, it is unclear how a dispositional account of meaning could be rendered consistent with its intuitive first-person epistemology. See section 4 for further discussion of dispositionalism.

3. The Sceptical Solution

If the sceptical argument is cogent, it seems to follow that there are no meaning-constituting facts, no facts in virtue of which linguistic expressions mean one thing rather than another. As noted above, this appears to imply the paradoxical conclusion that “the entire idea of meaning vanishes into thin air” (1982: 22). Kripke distinguishes between two broad ways in which one might attempt to avoid this conclusion (1982: 66–7). On the one hand, one might provide a straight response, by identifying some meaning-constituting fact of the sort called into question by the sceptic. The various proposals discussed briefly in section 2 above are instances of straight responses. The two most prominent types of straight response in the literature—reductive dispositionalism and non-reductionism—are discussed in more detail in section 4 and section 5 below. On the other hand, one might provide a sceptical response. That is, one might concede that there are no meaning-constituting facts of the sort demanded by the sceptic but deny that this leads to a paradoxical conclusion. In this section, we shall focus on this strategy.

The proponent of the sceptical solution can be understood as rejecting eliminativism about our practices of ascribing meaning. Mirroring parallel discussions in metaethics, the two most obvious paths available to her involve providing either an error-theoretic account or a non-factualist account of ascriptions of meaning. We shall follow Boghossian in viewing these paths as forms of irrealism about meaning, content and rules (Boghossian 1989, 1990). A prominent general line of argument in the recent literature suggests that irrealist views of any area make presuppositions that irrealist views of meaning and content are bound to deny, so that irrealism about meaning and content is ultimately incoherent (Boghossian 1989, 1990; Hattiangadi 2007, 2017, 2018; Miller 2011, 2015a, 2020). We’ll illustrate this general line of attack by sketching an argument to the effect that, regardless of whether one pursues an error-theoretic or a non-factualist approach, adopting irrealism leads inexorably to an “insane and intolerable” and “incredible and self-defeating” form of eliminativism on which the notions of meaning and content do turn out to “vanish into thin air”. We’ll then briefly consider an alternative way of providing a sceptical response, which aims to revise the conception of meaning fact that is at work in the sceptic’s mindset.

3.1 Error Theories

Suppose we adopt an error theory: the view that all atomic, positive statements ascribing meaning, content, or the following of a rule, are false. While some error theories are eliminativist (e.g., Churchland 1981 on propositional attitudes), the error theorist need not subscribe to eliminativism. For instance, J.L. Mackie (1977) argues that although moral judgements are uniformly false, eliminativism can be avoided given that some moral judgements are such that their acceptance facilitates securing the benefits of social cooperation in circumstances where “the limitation of men’s sympathies” (1977: 108) threaten their attainment.[5] On this view, even though our practice of making moral judgments results in falsehoods, it meets a subsidiary norm (or norms) in terms of whose satisfaction its pragmatic utility can be secured.[6] Might an error theorist about meaning, content and rule-following attempt to avoid eliminativism by following a similar strategy?

It might seem that there is room for this approach. In the case of meaning, the subsidiary norm might be something like the following: one ought to assert “Jones means addition by ‘+’” only when Jones’s

particular responses to arithmetical queries agree with those of the community in enough cases, especially the simple ones (and if his “wrong” answers are not often bizarrely wrong, as is ‘5’ for ‘\(68 + 57\)’, but seem to agree with ours in procedure, even when he makes a “computational mistake”). (Kripke 1982: 92)

This norm would thus be cashed out in terms of agreement with respect to inclinations “to go on” in certain ways, and the utility of our complying with it would be that it enables us to make helpful discriminations—for example, when seeking to buy five apples—between grocers whose inclinations match ours and grocers with “bizarre” quus-like inclinations.[7]

While this strategy might seem to some to be promising in the moral case, it faces special problems in the case of meaning, content and rules (Boghossian 1989, 1990; Miller 2015a). In order for the strategy to be able so much as to be pursued, there has to be such a thing as complying or failing to comply with a subsidiary norm—and so, a fortiori, such a thing as complying or failing to comply with a norm as such. An error theorist about rule-following, however, denies precisely that there are facts about norm-compliance and non-compliance. Having argued that all statements about rule-compliance are false, the error theorist apparently lacks the resources for telling a story about the pragmatic utility of our continuing to engage in the practice of making judgements about rule-following. The upshot seems to be that, if we accept that there are no facts about speakers in virtue of which expressions have meaning, embracing an error theory will not prevent the notion of meaning from “vanishing into thin air”.

3.2 Non-Factualist Theories

One might attempt to avoid eliminativism about meaning by embracing a different type of irrealism, namely, non-factualism. A non-factualist about a domain maintains that judgments and claims made within that domain are not in the business of stating facts. Indeed, the standard view in the secondary literature is that Kripke’s Wittgenstein himself is proposing a form of semantic non-factualism in the sceptical solution outlined in chapter 3 of Kripke (1982). See, e.g., McGinn (1984), Wright (1984), Boghossian (1989), and Hale (2017). Might semantic non-factualism afford us a way to embrace the conclusion of the sceptical argument while avoiding eliminativism?

This move faces difficulties parallel to those faced by error theories (Boghossian 1989, 1990; Hattiangadi 2007: chapter 4, 2018; Miller 2011, 2020). The non-factualist about meaning proposes that we construe ascriptions of meaning as having a purpose or function different from that of stating facts. But, insofar as a sentence is regarded as having a function, there is an intelligible distinction between correct and incorrect uses of that sentence; in other words, the sentence is rule-governed. That the notion of correctness in these cases cannot be identified with truth or warranted assertibility makes no difference to the applicability of a generalised version of the extensionality condition, which we outlined in section 2. Thus, suppose that ‘\(S\)’ is a sentence that has a non-descriptive semantic function. Consider these two specifications of the conditions in which uttering ‘\(S\)’ is correct, where \(R_1\) and \(R_2\) would confer different correctness-values on utterances of ‘\(S\)’:

Uttering ‘\(S\)’ is correct iff the conditions in which it is uttered accord with \(R_1\);
Uttering ‘\(S\)’ is correct iff the conditions in which it is uttered accord with \(R_2\).

Whatever makes it the case that (a) provides the correctness conditions for utterances of ‘\(S\)’ must rule out (b) as providing those conditions.

Now, let’s consider the case of plans, which are expressed in sentences that wear their non-descriptive semantic function on their sleeves. (We choose the case of plans deliberately here, as a view of this kind is mooted in Gibbard 2012.) Take the sentence ‘Let’s write a fugue!’. Consider two possible correctness conditions for it:

‘Let’s write a fugue!’, as uttered by Glenn, is correct iff Glenn plans to write a fugue


‘Let’s write a fugue!’, as uttered by Glenn, is correct iff either (a) it is time t earlier than t* and Glenn plans to write a fugue or (b) it is time t later than or equal to t* and Glenn plans to write a novel.

Glenn’s finite nature together with the infinitude of the temporal sequence ensures that the sceptic will always be able to argue that no fact about Glenn is capable of ruling in something like (a*) and ruling out something like (b*) as the relevant correctness condition. The non-factualist is entitled to regard “Let’s write a fugue!” as having a determinate meaning only if she can provide some fact about Glenn or his speech community that determines that that sentence is governed by (a*) rather than (b*). The same argument can be pressed against the suggestion that “Jones means addition by ‘+’” should be regarded as having some non-descriptive semantic function. The non-factualist will be able to regard “Jones means addition by ‘+’” as having a determinate meaning only if she can provide some fact about Jones or his speech community that determines that that sentence is governed by one rule or correctness condition rather than another.

So, a non-factualist account of any region of thought and talk, which is committed to the claim that there are no facts of the relevant sort, would seem to presupposes a realist account of meaning, content and rules according to which there are semantic facts, intentional facts, and facts about normative accord. So, a non-factualist account of meaning, content and rules, which is committed to the claim that there are no semantic facts, intentional facts, or facts about normative accord that our semantic, intentional, or normative discourse purports to capture, presupposes a realist account of meaning, content and rules according to which there are semantic facts, intentional facts, and facts about normative accord. It thus faces a charge of incoherence.

As noted above, we chose “plans” as our stalking horse here in order to make explicit the problem this poses for Allan Gibbard’s (2012) account of meaning (it makes no difference to the argument whether “plans” are taken to be linguistic items possessing meaning or mental states possessing intentional content). A Gibbard-style expressivist approach to an area such as morality denies that there are moral facts, but presupposes that there are facts about meaning, content and normative accord (facts that determine what accords and fails to accord with a plan). A Gibbard-style approach to meaning, content and rules thus, on the one hand, denies that there are semantic facts, intentional facts and facts about normative accord (facts that determine what accords and fails to accord with a plan), and, on the other, presupposes that there are such facts. It thus faces a charge of incoherence.

A similar objection to Gibbard’s view is outlined in Hattiangadi (2018). According to Hattiangadi, a Gibbard-style expressivist account of moral claims, for example, aims to give an “oblique” explanation of them in terms of the states of mind they express (rather than a “straight” explanation in terms of (moral) states of affairs which potentially render them true). But such an oblique explanation in the moral case presupposes a straight explanation of intentionality. In parallel, an oblique explanation of meaning and intentionality would presuppose a straight explanation of meaning and intentionality, again threatening the view with incoherence. In a reply to Hattiangadi, Gibbard reflects on the strategy of the metaethical expressivist and attempts to use it to counter Hattiangadi’s worry. He writes:

A parallel can be found in ethics: Suppose we claim that being good consists in being pleasurable. The concept of being pleasurable can be completely non-ethical and naturalistic, but the claim “Being good consists in being pleasurable” is ethical—and so, if Moore and others are right, nonnaturalistic. Is there, then, “a straight or substantive explanation of intentionality”? The correct answer will parallel that for the question, “Is there a straight substantive explanation of being good?” If ethical hedonists are right and being good consists in being pleasurable, then there’s a straight, substantive explanation of being good in the sense of a naturalistic explanation of the property that being good consists in. But the claim “Being good is being pleasurable” isn’t itself naturalistic. If Ayer was right, it amounts to “Hurrah for all and only what”s pleasurable. (Gibbard 2018: 770)

We leave assessment of Gibbard’s reply as an exercise for readers.[8]

3.3 An Alternate Form of Factualism

Wilson takes the lesson of the sceptical argument to be not that there are no meaning facts, but rather that a certain conception of such facts, which he calls classical realism, is hopeless, and conceives of the sceptical solution as accommodating meaning facts when conceived in a different way (Wilson 1994; see also Wright 1992: chapter 6). Classical realism is sometimes referred to as semantic platonism, the view that “the meanings of our words are guaranteed by the pre-existing structure of reality” (Pears 1988: 363; cf. Child 2001, Verheggen 2003, Zalabardo 2003, Hanks 2017). What is essential to classical realism or semantic platonism is that the properties that guarantee meaningfulness must be antecedently singled out by individuals (or communities) in order to endow their words with semantic standards (Wilson 1994 [2002: 251]). As Zalabardo puts it, what is required is

a conscious act in which I decide to pair the predicate with the property in such a way that the satisfaction conditions of the predicate, as I mean it, are determined by the instantiation conditions of the property. (2003: 314)

Wilson takes the sceptical challenge to reveal that no sense can be made of this idea, for it is not possible for an individual (or community) non-linguistically to single out properties as “the de re subject of her meaning-constituting intentions” (1998: 105). But, to repeat, what this allegedly shows is not that there are no meaning facts, but rather that we must reform our conception of them.

The alternative picture of meaning that Wilson fleshes out conceives of expressions as not connected to properties that serve as “pre-established” standards of correctness” (2003: 181–182), and suggests that “what we mean by [an expression] is something that gets settled only over the course of time” (2003: 186). In response to Wilson’s proposal, it has been argued that it is susceptible to collapsing into a form of subjectivism (Kremer 2000), and that it is untenable, for it falls prey to the sceptical challenge that it purports to bypass (Miller 2010b). It has also been argued, contra Wilson, that classical realism is merely an instance of a more general conception of meaning that takes standards of correctness to be determined by entities—whether abstract properties or real features of the world around us—that are considered independently of how we might describe them linguistically; it is this conception that must be rejected, as it is ultimately responsible for generating the paradox (Verheggen 2003).[9]

4. Reductive Dispositionalism

The most widely discussed attempt at a straight solution to the sceptical challenge is reductive dispositionalism. According to a simple version of reductive dispositionalism, the fact that Jones has the concept of addition rather than of quaddition is to be identified with (or is constituted by) his disposition to produce the result of adding (and not quadding) the numbers x and y in response to arithmetical queries of the form ‘\(x + y = \ques\)’, and the fact that he means cat by ‘cat’ is to be identified with (or is constituted by) his disposition to apply ‘cat’ to cats. (See Horwich 1998, 2010, 2012 for a systematic development of dispositionalism; an answer to Kripke’s challenge is articulated in Horwich 2015.)

As Boghossian notes (1989 [2002: 164–165]), the general form of dispositionalism targeted by the sceptic covers both conceptual role theories and causal/informational theories. In both cases, the account is intended to be reductive, insofar as the content-determining dispositions are to be characterized in wholly non-semantic and non-intentional terms. The sceptic’s attack on reductive dispositionalist theories is thus an attack on two of the most popular accounts of the determination of content in contemporary philosophy of mind and language.

The sceptic argues that dispositionalist theories face three problems. The first problem—the finitude problem—is that there is a sense in which, much like the totality of our previous linguistic behaviour, our dispositions are finite. Given that the extension of the addition function is infinite, containing a denumerably infinite number of triples \(\langle x, y, z\rangle\) such that x plus y is identical to z, Jones’s meaning addition by ‘+’ cannot be identified with her dispositions to respond to arithmetical queries since it is simply false that she is disposed to answer with the sum when faced with the query ‘\(x + y = \ques\)’. In some (indeed, most) cases, the numbers involved will be so large that Jones’s brain’s capacity for computation is far exceeded, and Jones may even die long before she is able to grasp the relevant numbers. We might follow Boghossian in dubbing such numbers “inaccessible” (2015: 335), and we might define quaddition to be a function that diverges from addition over only inaccessible numbers. In this case, the problem is that, given Jones’s dispositions, it is indeterminate whether he means plus or quus.

The second problem—the error problem—is that someone might be systematically disposed to make mistakes. Take Smith, who is systematically disposed to miscarry when responding to ‘\(x + y = \ques\)’ queries. When Smith produces ‘28’ in response to ‘\(19 + 19 = \ques\)’, we want to be able to say that her answer is incorrect in the light of what she means by ‘+’. However, if what she means is determined by her dispositions, we are forced to say that she actually means some non-standard function (one that corresponds to addition with the carrying operation removed), so that her answer ‘28’ is correct.

The third problem—the normativity problem—is that the dispositionalist view seems unable to capture the normativity of meaning. Given what she means by ‘+’, Jones ought to respond to arithmetical queries of the form ‘\(x + y = \ques\)’ by producing the sum of x and y, but the meaning-constituting fact proposed by the dispositionalist is at most a fact about how she would respond to queries of the relevant form:

Suppose I do mean addition by ‘+’. What is the relation of this supposition to the question how I will respond to the problem ‘\(68+57\)’? The dispositionalist gives a descriptive account of this relation: if ‘+’ meant addition, then I will answer ‘125’. But this is not the proper account of the relation, which is normative, not descriptive. The point is not that, if I meant addition by ‘+’, I will answer ‘125’, but that, if I intend to accord with my past meaning of ‘+’, I should answer ‘125’. Computational error, finiteness of my capacity, and other disturbing factors may lead me not to be disposed to respond as I should, but if so, I have not acted in accordance with my intentions. The relation of meaning and intention to future action is normative, not descriptive. (Kripke 1982: 37)

In section 2, we outlined a number of ways in which a normativity condition might be thought to impose a constraint on accounts of meaning. We suggested that in all of these ways this condition puts at least prima facie pressure on dispositionalist theories of meaning. We will limit ourselves in the remainder of this section to some remarks on the finitude problem and the error problem. These two problems indicate two obstacles that the dispositionalist must overcome in order to meet the extensionality condition.

Blackburn responds to the finitude problem by pointing out that familiar dispositional properties (such as fragility) are in a sense infinitary: “there is an infinite number of places and times and strikings and surfaces on which it could be displayed” (1984 [2002: 35]). If a glass has infinitary dispositions, perhaps a human does too, and perhaps this will yield an extended disposition that covers the case of queries involving inaccessible numbers. Even though we have no way of getting an ordinary glass to Alpha Centauri (it would decay long before it got there), we can think of it as possessing an extended disposition to break there: breaking is what the glass would be disposed to do were its dispositions on earth allowed to manifest themselves on Alpha Centauri. Likewise, even though Jones has no disposition to answer queries involving inaccessible numbers, responding with the sum is what Jones would be disposed to do were her dispositions in accessible cases allowed to manifest themselves in inaccessible cases. This would in turn allow us to say that the answer that she would accept in those cases is “the one that would be given by reiterating procedures [Jones is] disposed to use, a number of times” (1984 [2002: 35]).

Blackburn’s response to the finitude problem is open to criticism. First, Blackburn’s talk of procedures Jones is disposed to use is illegitimate in this context: to “use” a “procedure” is to follow a rule, and we cannot help ourselves to the idea that Jones is following the rule for addition here (or any rule, for that matter), as it is Jones’s status as a rule-follower that we are hoping to recover from facts about her dispositions. What we can say is that as far as the accessible cases go, the answers Jones is disposed to give conform to the rule for addition. But, of course, they also conform to the rule for quaddition. What makes Jones an adder, and not a quadder, according to Blackburn’s suggestion, is that were Jones’s dispositions in the accessible cases allowed to manifest themselves in the inaccessible cases, she would respond with the sum, and not the quum.

However, Boghossian (2015: 341) points out that there is a crucial disanalogy between this case and the extended disposition to break on Alpha Centauri plausibly ascribed to the glass. To think of the dispositions the glass has on earth as manifesting themselves on Alpha Centauri, we don’t need to think of the glass in any way that is inconsistent with its nature as a physical object. It can be regarded as having the same intrinsic physical characteristics on Alpha Centauri as it has on earth, and if it is true that, given those characteristics, it would break if struck on Alpha Centauri, that suffices for the attribution of the extended disposition to break on Alpha Centauri. Matters stand differently with Jones. In order to think of Jones’s dispositions to respond in accessible cases as manifesting themselves in inaccessible cases, we would have to think of her in a way that is inconsistent with her nature as a finite biological being. This is because responding to queries involving inaccessible numbers would require, let’s suppose, a brain the size of the universe. But the fact that with a brain the size of the universe the sum would be produced no more warrants the attribution of the relevant extended disposition to Jones than does the fact that with a brain the size of the universe she would outplay Magnus Carlsen warrant the attribution to her of the potential to win the world chess championship. Jones has no extended disposition of the sort adumbrated by Blackburn.[10] The upshot, then, is that Jones’s dispositions do not determine whether she means plus rather than some quus-like function by ‘+’, where quus diverges from plus for inaccessible numbers.[11]

We’ve followed Boghossian (2015) in setting up the finitude problem as fundamentally a problem about determinacy. In a recent paper, Jared Warren admits that solving the finitude problem, thus construed, turns on solving the error problem (2020: 268), and proceeds to offer an attempted solution to that problem. Consider the following proposal: the fact which constitutes Jones’s meaning addition by ‘+’ is the fact that, when faced with arithmetical queries involving the ‘+’ sign, Jones is stably disposed to reply with the sum in the overwhelming majority of normal situations.[12] What are normal situations, and what is it for a disposition to be stable? Normal situations are those in which neither external nor internal factors are interfering with Jones’s general cognitive functioning. More specifically, the normal situations are those in which Jones is clearheaded—situations in which the air is not permeated with mind-bending chemicals, in which Jones is not drunk, exhausted, or badly hungover, so that neither external causes nor internal causes are interfering with her cognitive performance. Furthermore, to say that Jones’s disposition to respond with the sum is stable is to say that, as the number of arithmetical queries she has faced increases, the ratio of answers that give something other than the sum to answers that give the sum tends towards zero. And to keep the bar relatively low, we don’t require that in normal conditions it is metaphysically impossible for Jones to answer with something other than the sum. We only require that, when such conditions obtain, it is rational to be nearly certain that she will answer with the sum. Call the disposition which we have described here disp. disp corresponds to the meaning-constituting dispositions that Warren proposes as offering a solution to the error problem. The proposal is intended to be reductive. Warren notes that “normalcy”, defined as he defines it, “isn’t semantic or intentional or otherwise problematically question-begging” (2020: 271).

However, Warren’s attempt to solve the error problem can be questioned. The error problem arises as a result of the fact that the following two possibilities are consistent with Jones’s possession of disp. First, Jones means addition by ‘+’ and is responding correctly to the relevant queries. Second, Jones means some quus-like function and is responding incorrectly. What Warren thus needs is a characterisation of normal situations such that the latter possibility is ruled out. Thus, what is required is a characterisation of normal situations such that, when those situations obtain, we are entitled to be nearly certain that Jones will answer with the sum, and that in answering with the sum Jones is responding correctly. The trouble is that there is an infinite range of functions \(F_1\),…, \(F_n\) that have different extensions from the addition function. If Jones means some function \(F_i\) among them, and if she answers with the sum, she would be answering incorrectly. Thus, the normal situations have to be such that their obtaining ensures that Jones means by ‘+’ none of the functions in this open-ended and infinite set. The question that drives Kripke’s Wittgenstein’s objection is: how could this be achieved other than through the inclusion of a clause in the characterisation of normal situations to the effect that Jones means addition by ‘+’ (or at least, that Jones means a function with the same extension as addition)? How could the obtaining of a non-semantically characterised set of situations have the effect of excluding every member of an open-ended and infinite set of semantically or intentionally characterised states of affairs (Jones means \(F_1\) by ‘+’, Jones means \(F_2\) by ‘+’, and so on ad infinitum)?[13]

Thus, it can be argued that the dispositionalist account offered by Warren either fails to resolve the indeterminacy problem or does so only at the expense of deploying semantic and intentional notions, which is inconsistent with its reductive aspirations.[14]

Postscript to section 4: Lewis on Natural Properties

A reductionist position that has been somewhat neglected in the rule-following literature is suggested by David Lewis in his “New Work for a Theory of Universals” (1983). Lewis writes:

The naive solution is that adding means going on in the same way as before when the numbers get big, whereas quadding means doing something different; there is nothing present in the subject that constitutes an intention to do different things in different cases; therefore he intends addition, not quaddition. We should not scoff at this naive response. It is the correct solution to the puzzle. But we must pay to regain our naiveté. Our theory of properties must have adequate resources to somehow ratify the judgement that instances of adding are all alike in a way that instances of quadding are not. The property of adding is not perfectly natural, of course, not on a par with unit charge or sphericality. And the property of quadding is not perfectly unnatural. But quadding is worse by a disjunction. So quaddition is to that extent less of a way to go on doing the same, and therefore it is to that extent less of an eligible thing to intend to do. (1983: 376)

Take a predicate like ‘green’. The totality of facts about our previous use and dispositions to use ‘green’ are consistent with it referring to the property green but also with it referring to the property grue. So, what might ground the claim that the property green is somehow privileged as the referent of ‘green’? Lewis can be taken to advocate a form of “interpretationism” according to which semantic facts are constitutively determined by the best theory of the data (J. R. G. Williams 2007). Among the a priori constitutive constraints governing what counts as the best theory is a principle requiring that the referents assigned to expressions be the most natural of those consistent with the data. Since green is more natural than grue, it is more “eligible” than grue to be assigned to ‘green’ as its referent. Likewise for adding and quadding. In this way, the indeterminacy left open by facts about use is fended off, Lewis thinks.

Lewis’s proposal is not ad hoc, as the notion of a natural property that it utilises is required, for example, by his account of laws of nature (see the entry on David Lewis, section 4.6). However, its application to the rule-following problem faces a number of challenges. First, it is not obvious how it extends to the mathematical examples that are the focus of Kripke’s Wittgenstein. Boghossian writes,

I see no obvious notion of naturalness that will cover both the notion of a natural property, as it might figure in an account of similarity or lawlikeness, and that of a natural function. (2015: 355)

It has also been argued that even if Lewis’s proposal might meet the extensionality condition, it cannot meet the normativity condition (Merino-Rajme 2015).

Lewis’s proposal is also likely to be challenged on epistemological grounds similar to those used by Kripke and Wright in dismissing the suggestion that quaddition can be ruled out in light of the fact the hypothesis that Jones meant quaddition is less simple than the hypothesis that he meant addition. A speaker can know that in response to the query ‘\(68+57\)’, ‘125’ is the answer that accords with what she meant by ‘+’, without having to infer this from facts about her previous linguistic behaviour. That is to say, in recognising that the answer ‘125’ fits what we mean by ‘+’, we do not proceed “by inference to the best semantic explanation of [our] previous uses of that expression” (Wright 2001: 109; see also Kripke 1982: 40). But this is apparently what we would have to do if the “simplicity” suggestion were correct: the best explanation would be yielded by the simplest of the hypotheses consistent with our previous linguistic behavior. The “simplicity” suggestion thus apparently makes a mystery of our (generally) non-inferential semantic knowledge. Lewis’s suggestion will be challenged on similar grounds. We do not infer what we mean by ‘+’ from facts about naturalness together with constitutive principles governing interpretation. Again, the account appears to make a mystery of the non-inferential nature of much of our semantic knowledge. Moreover, it faces difficulties in accommodating the authority normally credited to self-ascriptions of meaning. For Lewis, in virtue of the role they play in his account of scientific laws, simplicity and naturalness are objective notions. However, a speaker’s opinions about what she means, unlike, say, her opinions about the structure of the world or of our hypotheses about it, are generally authoritative, unless there are special reasons to doubt them. What might the basis for this default authority be, if what she means is determined by facts about simplicity and naturalness?

Moreover, the Lewisian view seems to be a form of semantic platonism (Child 2011: 126), in so far as it upholds the idea that our meaning what we do by our words is somehow guaranteed by the structure of reality. But it might be taken to be a radical form of semantic platonism, in so far as it seems to leave no room for the speaker’s contribution to the singling out of properties (see section 3.3). Unlike other versions of semantic platonism, it is vulnerable to a complaint to the effect that the subjective perspective of the thinker or speaker is entirely annihilated.

For a lucid exposition and critique of Lewis’s position, see J.R.G. Williams (2007). For rare examples of treatments of Lewis’s views in the context of the rule-following literature, see Merino-Rajme (2015), Glüer (2017), and Azzouni (2017).

5. Non-Reductionism

The apparently very serious problems we outlined for the dispositionalist conception of meaning have been taken by a number of philosophers to show that we ought to resist the temptation to explain meaning and content in more basic terms. How might one formulate a non-reductionist position? On Stroud’s view, it amounts to denying that we can explain

the phenomena of meaning and understanding “from outside” them, as it were, without attributing intentional attitudes or supposing that anything means anything or is understood in a certain way to those whose understanding is being accounted for. (Stroud 2000: viii)

More generally, we might say that the facts constitutive of the semantic domain cannot be characterised or explained in non-semantic terms, that is, without employing the notions of meaning or understanding; the facts constitutive of rule-following cannot be characterised or explained without employing the notion of rule-following. Some philosophers who embrace non-reductionism also defend the view according to which semantic facts do not supervene on anything; they are metaphysically fundamental. Boghossian relies on the finitude problem to argue that, if meaning facts are determinate, then they cannot supervene on non-semantic facts (Boghossian 2015). However, the denial of supervenience is not essential to non-reductionism (cf. Child 2019b): at the core of the position is the idea that any attempt to account for meaning in more basic terms is hopeless or philosophically confused.

Kripke briefly considers the possibility that the states of meaning or understanding, or the facts about meaning and understanding, are primitive or sui generis, which he cashes out as the idea that

meaning addition by “plus” … is simply a primitive state, not to be assimilated to sensations or headaches or any “qualitative” states, nor to be assimilated to dispositions, but a state of a unique kind of its own. (1982: 51)

He raises two complaints against this approach. First, he characterizes it as desperate, insofar as “it leaves the nature of this postulated primitive state … completely mysterious” (1982: 51), for such an approach does not provide an account of what makes it possible for one to “be confident that [one] does, at present” mean what one does (1982: 51). Second, he thinks that a non-reductionist account does not address the “logical difficulty implicit in Wittgenstein’s sceptical argument” (1982: 51), which is that it would seem that we could not “conceive of a finite state which could not be interpreted in a quus-like way” (1982: 52).

Some philosophers claim that Kripke’s treatment of the non-reductionist position is unsatisfactory. McGinn, who appears to ignore Kripke’s brief discussion of non-reductionism, thinks that there is an

undefended and undisclosed premise [in the sceptic’s argument], namely that semantic discourse cannot be regarded as irreducible. (1984: 82)[15]

McGinn also notes that Kripke has no qualms with adopting a non-reductionist view of meaning in other works—see, for instance, Kripke 1972: 94–97. Goldfarb thinks that “the conception Kripke exploits is basically physicalistic” (1985 [2002: 95]), and thus that pursuing a non-physicalist approach hasn’t been ruled out. Boghossian thinks that what Kripke needs for his treatment of non-reductionism to succeed is an argument from queerness aiming to show that there is something inherently queer about meaning properties, which he fails to provide (1989 [2002: 180]; cf. Hattiangadi 2007: 47–50). Ultimately, Boghossian is sympathetic to the non-reductionist approach, though he thinks that “it really is not plausible” that such a conception might be true of linguistic meaning (1989 [2002: 179]); on his view, it is facts about mental content that are irreducible.

Before exploring several of the non-reductionist positions proposed in recent years, we should note that some of the proponents of non-reductionism think that Kripke’s sceptical challenge is based on confusion, and that our task is to unearth that confusion. Thus, on their view, the proper response is not to solve the sceptical problem by showing that the sceptic failed properly to acknowledge some set of facts (or some features of some such facts), but to dissolve it by showing that there is, in fact, no problem. McDowell, for instance, argues that Kripke misunderstands the dialectic pursued by Wittgenstein in Philosophical Investigations. On his view,

the right response to the paradox, Wittgenstein in effect tells us, is not to accept it but to correct the misunderstanding on which it depends, (1984 [1998: 229])

which puts us in a position to dissolve the paradox and, with it, the problem of how meaning is possible. This involves renouncing the problematic assumption that understanding an expression requires interpreting that expression. McDowell’s diagnosis isn’t confined to linguistic expressions. What we ought to resist is the thought that,

whatever is in a person’s mind at any time, it needs interpretation if it is to sort items outside the mind into those that are in accord with it and those that are not. (1992 [1998: 268])

Similarly, Stroud thinks that the paradox is “an expression of an unsatisfiable demand” (1990 [2000: 88]), namely, the demand for

some facts, the recognition of which would not require that we already speak and understand a language, and some rules, which would tell us what, given those facts, it was correct to say.

Such facts and such rules would have to be such as to “serve to get us into language in the first place” (Stroud 1990b [2000: 94]). The demand is most strongly manifested in Kripke’s assumption that there must be an item that instructs or tells the speaker what to do with her expressions. Stroud claims that proper engagement with Wittgenstein’s remarks reveals this assumption to be misguided, for it embarks us on a regress (Stroud 1996 [2000: 180–185]). Once we recognize the misguidedness of the picture that Kripke assumes, we will no longer feel the force of the sceptical challenge, Stroud thinks. However, contra Stroud, it seems that the extensionality condition is all we need in order to pose a stripped-down version of the question that the sceptic is raising, namely, the question of what makes the standards of correctness that govern our uses of expressions and our deployments of concepts possible.

It might be argued that the urgency of this question, or even its very intelligibility, is merely a symptom of a frame of mind from within which meaning seems impossible, and that our proper task is to leave this confused frame of mind behind (e.g., McDowell 1992 [1998: 272, 274]; 1998a: 57–58). However, this line of reasoning might be taken to presume that a question is urgent or intelligible only if it is in principle possible to offer a reductive answer to it, that constructive philosophy is necessarily reductive philosophy. Verheggen argues that the rejection of reductionism does not commit one to quietism. As she sees it, non-reductionism can be constructive; it can revolve around advancing and defending positive claims (Verheggen 2000, 2003). Even though the project of providing necessary and sufficient conditions for meaning is hopeless, the non-reductionist can still aspire to articulate necessary conditions that aren’t “even remotely trivial” (Myers and Verheggen 2016: 3), and to draw illuminating connections between meaning and other irreducible phenomena. Through a creative reconstruction of Davidson’s triangulation argument, Verheggen argues that interaction with a second individual and aspects of the shared world is a necessary condition for one’s having a language and thoughts (see chapter 1 of Myers and Verheggen 2016). The constitution of the standards of correctness that govern language and thought necessitates that the individual be aware of the possibility of being mistaken, an awareness that can only be grounded in linguistic interactions with another individual and features of the world. Thus, the triangulation argument is taken by Verheggen to reveal the hopelessness of the reductive ambition, insofar as it shows that we cannot offer an account of the constitution of the standards of correctness that govern language and thought without presupposing that a commitment to those standards is already in place. (See also Sultanescu and Verheggen 2019 for an account of the Davidsonian answer to Kripke’s sceptical challenge and Verheggen 2017a for an account of the Davidsonian answer to Wittgenstein’s paradox.) William Child also defends a variety of non-reductionism, one that “does not give merely pleonastic answers but aims to say something genuinely informative” (Child 2019a: 97). He does so by relying on Wittgenstein’s remarks on meaning and rule-following.

According to Wright, “it is an important methodological precept that we do not despair of giving answers to constitutive questions too soon” (2001: 191). He goes on to propose a non-reductionist view that is sensitive to the difficulty of accounting for our knowledge of what we mean. (As we noted in section 2, Wright takes Kripke’s sceptic to impose a legitimate epistemological constraint on answers to the skeptical challenge.) He offers a “judgment-dependent” account of intention, according to which what one intends is determined by one’s best judgment about what one intends. Insofar as the concepts of intention and meaning are “relevantly similar” (2001: 206), this account can also claim to shed light on the nature of meaning. Thus, we might say, on Wright’s behalf, that what one means by an expression is determined by one’s best judgment about what one means. The notion of judgment is taken by Wright as primitive. Still, the authoritative nature of first-personal avowals is allegedly vindicated. See especially essays 5–7 in Wright 2001.[16]

Wright and Boghossian recently offered independent arguments to the effect that the adoption of a non-reductionist view of meaning does not secure the intelligibility of the idea of guidance by a rule. According to Wright, the only way in which rule-following can be understood is if it conforms to what he calls “the modus ponens model” (2007: 491). The model states that an act is a genuine instance of rule-following if it can be rationalized by, on the one hand, citing the rule and, on the other, indicating that the circumstances, which must be specifiable without appealing to the rule, call for its application. Wright investigates basic cases of language use, and argues that if we assume that the modus ponens model applies to these cases, we are saddled with an Augustinian picture, according to which conceptual capacities are necessarily prior to capacities to use language. At the same time, he accepts that Wittgenstein has revealed the bankruptcy of the Augustinian picture in Philosophical Investigations; so, the idea of antecedent conceptual capacities is unintelligible. This is taken to show that the modus ponens model cannot apply to basic cases. Wright calls this “the minor premise problem”, and argues that it compels us to accept that “in the basic case we do not really follow—are not really guided by—anything” (2007: 497).

Boghossian also relies on the modus ponens model to argue that a non-reductionist position does not allow us to make sense of the intelligibility of rule-following. He offers “an intuitive characterization” of the phenomenon of rule-following, according to which it has the following structure:

a state that can play the role of rule-acceptance; and some non-deviant causal chain leading from that state to a piece of behavior that would allow us to say that the rule explains and (in the personal-level case) rationalizes the behavior in question. (2012: 31)

What allows us to say that the rule explains and rationalizes the behaviour is an act of inference from the rule to what it requires in particular contexts. But inference is, according to Boghossian, “an example of rule-following par excellence” (2012: 40), which indicates that the act of inference must fit the intuitive characterization above, thus requiring a further act. A regress is unavoidable for the proponent of non-reductionism, according to Boghossian. This is the inference problem.

Arguably, the two problems are anticipated in Kripke’s line of reasoning, especially in his remark, mentioned earlier in this section, to the effect that the non-reductionist view faces a logical difficulty (1982: 51–52). The difficulty seems to arise from three claims that seem uncontroversial but are inconsistent:

  1. the state of meaning plus by ‘+’ must guide the speaker in her applications of the expression ‘+’;
  2. a state of meaning can be interpreted in more than one way;
  3. something that can be interpreted in more than one way cannot guide.

We might think that one’s state of meaning something by an expression is not the sort of thing that one can interpret (thus denying (ii)), or that whether something can be interpreted in more than one way is irrelevant for the question of whether it can guide (thus denying (iii)). But neither of these options entitles us to reject (i); the non-reductionist still owes us an account of what it is to be guided by a rule (or by one’s understanding of an expression).

Miller offers an account of guidance by drawing on McDowell’s writings on Wittgenstein. He argues that the inference problem and the minor premise problem are not genuine difficulties for the non-reductionist. On his view, the upshot of Wittgenstein’s reflections on rule-following is that

in applying a rule R in a particular case there need be no further inferential step—over and above that involving R itself—mediating between acceptance of R and that particular application. (2015b: 405)

This is just what it is for rule-following not to be a matter of interpretation: the rule is applied immediately, as it were—without the mediation of a further rule, such as an inference rule, in the manner suggested by Boghossian, or a rule for the deployment of a prior concept, in the manner suggested by Wright. What puts an agent in a position to follow a rule is her having been trained into a practice or custom of following rules of that sort (2015b: 407), where the notions of training, practice, and custom are semantically characterized and cannot receive further philosophical illumination.

Thus, according to some defenders of non-reductionism, rule-following has an essentially social character. One dispute that is intramural to the non-reductionist approach concerns the precise way in which this social character should be understood. When it comes to meaning, Verheggen distinguishes between communitarian views, according to which

having a (first) language essentially depends on meaning by one’s words what members of some community mean by them,

and interpersonalist views, according to which

having a (first) language essentially depends on having used (at least some of) one’s words to communicate with others, (Myers and Verheggen 2016: 84; see also Verheggen 2006 for the initial articulation of the distinction)

and goes on to defend the interpersonalist view. Relatedly, there is the question of how we should understand the notions of practice and custom and the role that they play in a correct conception of intentionality, broadly construed. It might be thought, as Wittgenstein seems to suggest in Philosophical Investigations (e.g., #198; #201–202), that it is essential to thinking and speaking that one be trained into practices or customs, and thus that our conception should reflect the centrality of these notions (McDowell 1984, M. Williams 1999, Stroud 2000, M. Williams 2010, Miller 2015b); at least initially, this appears to favour the communitarian view. (See also Section 4 of Haase 2018 for a different kind of attempt to flesh out the Wittgensteinian notion of practice, and Pettit 1990 for a form of non-reductionism on which communal interaction is required in at least some cases of rule-following). But on the Davidsonian conception, at the centre of which is disagreement and the need to settle it rationally against the constraints of the shared world, the idea of practice might not serve any explanatory purpose; even though shared beliefs may be essential for thought, shared standards of correctness are not essential for language. The Davidsonian conception is a variety of interpersonalism. This intramural debate is very much ongoing.

Some philosophers have explored the possibility of a middle path between reductive dispositionalism and non-reductionism. Thus, in a paper in which she discusses Stroud’s view, Ginsborg distinguishes between austere forms of non-reductionism, which she takes to be incompatible with constructive philosophising about meaning, and “less austere and partly reductionist” approaches, which allow that “we could account for meaning in terms of a more basic idea of goal-directed human activity” (2011a: 153), but without allowing that such activity can be captured in purely dispositionalist or physicalist terms. She goes on to articulate a less austere view, which explains meaning in terms of a notion of normativity that she takes to be primitive. On this view, for someone to mean something by an expression is for her to have a disposition to apply it in particular contexts and, crucially, to take the manifestations of that disposition to be appropriate. Taking one’s responses to be appropriate

does not depend on the antecedent grasp of a rule or standard determining that response as correct rather than incorrect, or even on the awareness that there is such a rule or standard; (2011a: 169)

this establishes the primitive status of the notion of appropriateness. Thus, Ginsborg provides a dispositionalist account of meaning, albeit with a crucial proviso to the effect that the relevant dispositions are to be characterized in normative terms. She thinks that the account can serve as a straight solution to the sceptical challenge. On the one hand, it purports to vindicate the normativity of meaning, and thus to meet the normativity condition; on the other hand, it purports to account for the distinction between correct and incorrect applications of expressions, and thus to meet the extensionality condition. For Ginsborg, the set of correct applications of an expression are the applications that one is disposed to regard as appropriate—the applications that ought, in the primitive sense, to be made (see Ginsborg 2011b for a more detailed account of her solution to Kripke’s problem).

Ginsborg’s view is in some respects similar to Robert Brandom’s. Brandom seeks to explain meaning in terms of use, where use is specified in a way that is

neither so generous as to permit semantic or intentional vocabulary, nor so parsimonious as to insist on purely naturalistic vocabulary. (1994: xiii)

Thus, his approach to meaning might also be viewed as less austere and partly reductionist. We do not have room to explain the details of Brandom’s intricate view; suffice it to say that, on that view, the proper specification of the use that determines meaning essentially involves normative vocabulary. The facts that determine meaning are facts about the entitlements and commitments that are implicit in the performances of speech acts. Thus, what a speaker means by an utterance is to be understood as consisting, roughly, in the performances that she is committed to in virtue of the utterance as well as in the performances that entitle her to make it. Ultimately, these facts are “products of human activity” (xiv), being a matter of our adopting normative attitudes toward one another--of taking one another to be committed or entitled, in light of our performances, to various other performances. However, although there are similarities, there are also important differences between Brandom’s approach and Ginsborg’s. While for Brandom the norms that are constitutive of meaning are socially instituted, for Ginsborg they are natural. Moreover, the notion of appropriateness that Ginsborg fleshes out is more basic than the notion of reason, and thus more basic than the notions of entitlement and commitment that Brandom takes to be constitutive of meaning (Ginsborg 2011a: 172fn21). Still, Ginsborg does think that “expressions have meanings only in virtue of there being ways in which they ought to be applied” (2012: 132). So, to put it crudely, on both accounts, meaning facts are reduced to facts or considerations about what ought to be the case. The question that the austere non-reductionist will raise is whether the latter kinds of fact are apt to solve the indeterminacy problem, and thus to meet the extensionality condition.

The challenge of the sceptic makes perspicuous the fact that a non-semantically described pattern is compatible with indefinitely many interpretations. Does the appeal to the normative domain help us rule out the sceptic’s alternative hypotheses? Given that, arguably, on a partly reductionist picture of the sort that Brandom proposes, utterances are, ultimately, nothing more than “normatively constrained noise- or mark-makings” (Whiting 2006: 11), that is, non-semantically described performances that stand in normative relations to other non-semantically described performances, it does not seem that we have the resources to single out as privileged a particular interpretation or standard of correctness. Similarly, a normative pattern that instantiates how one ought, in the primitive sense proposed by Ginsborg, to go on with respect to an expression seems to be consistent with more than one semantic interpretation of that expression. It might be thought that Ginsborg could appeal to the non-semantically characterized disposition in order to fix the meanings of the relevant expression. However, we have already shown in section 4 that dispositionalist accounts face very serious obstacles (see Verheggen 2015; Chapter II of Myers and Verheggen 2016, and Miller 2019 for more discussion of the failure of dispositionalism in relation to Ginsborg’s view). So, the proponent of the less austere approach to meaning owes the austere non-reductionist an account of how the extensionality condition might be met. (See Haddock 2012 and Sultanescu 2021 for more discussion of Ginsborg’s view, and Rosen 1997, McDowell 2002, Hattiangadi 2003, and Whiting 2006 for more discussion of Brandom’s view.)


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  • –––, 1989 [2002], “Critical Notice: Wittgenstein on Meaning, by Colin McGinn”, Mind, 98(390): 289–305; reprinted as “Critical Notice of Colin McGinn’s Wittgenstein on Meaning” in Miller and Wright 2002: 108–128 (ch. 7). doi:10.1093/mind/XCVIII.390.289
  • –––, 1992, Truth and Objectivity. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1995 [2003], “Truth in Ethics”, Ratio, 8(3): 209–226; reprinted in Wright 2003: 183–203. doi:10.1111/j.1467-9329.1995.tb00084.x
  • –––, 2001, Rails to Infinity: Essays on Themes from Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2003, Saving The Differences: Essays on Themes from “Truth and Objectivity”, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2007, “Rule-Following without Reasons: Wittgenstein’s Quietism and the Constitutive Question”, Ratio, 20(4): 481–502. doi:10.1111/j.1467-9329.2007.00379.x
  • Zalabardo, José L., 1997 [2002], “Kripke’s Nonnativity Argument”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 27(4): 467–488; reprinted in Miller and Wright 2002: 274–293 (ch. 14). doi:10.1080/00455091.1997.10717482
  • –––, 2003, “Wittgenstein on Accord”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 84(3): 311–329. doi:10.1111/1468-0114.00176

Other Internet Resources

  • Rule-Following, online bibliography by Martin Kusch, University of Vienna, Oxford Bibliographies.


We’re grateful to Claudine Verheggen for helpful comments. Thanks, too, to the SEP editors and reviewers for useful feedback and assistance.

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Olivia Sultanescu <>

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