Russell’s Moral Philosophy

First published Mon Dec 17, 2007; substantive revision Tue May 4, 2021

Russell remains famous as a logician, a metaphysician, and as a philosopher of mathematics, but in his own day he was also notorious for his social and political opinions. He wrote an immense amount about practical ethics—women’s rights, marriage and morals, war and peace, and the vexed question of whether socialists should smoke good cigars. (They should.) And unlike present-day practical ethicists (with a few notable exceptions such as Peter Singer) he was widely read by the non-philosophical public. (See for instance Phillips 2013, which details Russell’s successes as a popular moralist in the 1950s.) But though Russell was famous as a moralist and famous as a philosopher, he does not have much of a reputation as a moral philosopher in the more technical sense of the term. Until very recently, his contributions to what is nowadays known as ethical theory—meta-ethics (the nature and justification, if any, of moral judgments) and normative ethics (what makes right acts right etc)—were either unknown, disregarded or dismissed as unoriginal. Key texts on the history of twentieth century ethics—Warnock’s Ethics Since 1900 (1978), Urmson’s The Emotivist Theory of Ethics (1968), Milller’s Contemporary Metaethics: an Introduction (2013) and Schroeder’s Non-Cognitivism in Ethics (2010)—say nothing, or next to nothing, about Russell, at least in his capacity as a moral philosopher. It is only very recently—in the last fifteen years or so—that ethical theorists have begun to pay attention to him. (See Pigden 2003, 2007 and Potter 2006, though L.W. Aiken 1963 anticipated Potter and Pigden by about forty years.) Perhaps Russell would not have repined, since he professed himself dissatisfied with what he had said “on the philosophical basis of ethics” (RoE: 165/Papers 11: 310). But since he took an equally dim view of what he had read on that topic, the fact that he did not think much of his own contributions does not mean that he thought them any worse than anybody else’s. In my view, they are often rather better and deserve to be disinterred. But “disinterred” is the word since some of his most original contributions were left unpublished in his own lifetime and what he did publish was often buried in publications ostensibly devoted to less theoretical topics. Thus Russell’s brilliant little paper “Is There an Absolute Good”, which anticipates Mackie’s “The Refutation of Morals” by over twenty years, was delivered in 1922 at a meeting of the Apostles (an exclusive, prestigious but secret Cambridge discussion group of which Moore, Russell, and Ramsey were all members) and was not published until 1988. And Russell’s version of emotivism (which anticipates Ayer’s Language, Truth and Logic (1936) by one year, and Stevenson’s “The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms” (1937) by two) appeared towards the end of a popular book, Religion and Science (1935), whose principal purpose was not to discuss the nature of moral judgments, but to do down religion in the name of science. However, Russell’s dissatisfaction with his writings on ethical theory did not extend to his writings on social and political topics.

I have no difficulty in practical moral judgments, which I find I make on a roughly hedonistic [i.e., utilitarian] basis, but, when it comes to the philosophy of moral judgments, I am impelled in two opposite directions and remain perplexed. (RoE: 165–6/Papers 11: 311)

His perplexity, however, was theoretical rather than practical. He was pretty clear about what we ought to do (work for world government, for example), but “perplexed” about what he meant when he said that we ought to do it.

One point to stress, before we go on. Russell took a pride in his willingness to change his mind. Obstinacy in the face of counter-arguments was not, in his opinion, a virtue in a scientifically-minded philosopher. Unfortunately he overdid the open-mindedness, abandoning good theories for worse ones in the face of weak counter-arguments and sometimes forgetting some of his own best insights (a forgivable fault in given the fountain of good ideas that seemed to be continually erupting in his head). Russell’s mental development, therefore, is not always a stirring tale of intellectual progress. His first thoughts are often better than his second thoughts and his second thoughts better than his third thoughts. Thus the emotivism that was his dominant view in the latter part of his life is vulnerable to objections that he himself had raised in an earlier incarnation, as was the error theory that he briefly espoused in 1922. Nobody should be surprised, therefore, if I sometimes deploy an earlier Russell to criticize one of his later selves. Whitehead is reported to have said that Russell was a Platonic dialogue in himself, and in this temporally extended debate quite often it is one of the younger Russells who wins the argument.

1. The Open Question Argument and its Aftermath: Moore’s Influence on Russell

Russell’s destiny as an ethical thinker was dominated by one book—G.E. Moore’s Principia Ethica (1903). Before 1903, Russell devoted some of the energy that he could spare from German Social Democracy, the foundations of mathematics and the philosophy of Leibniz to working out a meta-ethic of his own. After 1903, he became an enthusiastic but critical convert to the doctrines of Principia Ethica (though there is some evidence that the conversion process may have begun as early as 1897). Moore is famous for the claim, which he professes to prove by means of what has come to be known as the Open Question Argument, that there is a “non-natural” property of goodness, not identical with or reducible to any other property or assemblage of properties, and that what we ought to do is to maximize the good and minimize the bad. Russell subscribed to this thesis—with certain important reservations—until 1913. Thereafter he continued to believe that if judgments about good and bad are to be objectively true, non-natural properties of goodness and badness are required to make them true. It is just that he ceased to believe that there are any such properties. Does this mean that judgments about good and evil are all false? Not necessarily (though Russell did subscribe to that view for a brief period during 1922). An alternative theory is that moral judgments are neither true nor false, since their role is not to state facts or to describe the way the world is, but to express emotions, desires or even commands. This (despite some waverings) was Russell’s dominant view for the rest of his life, though it took him twenty-two years to develop a well worked-out version of the theory. He tended to call it subjectivism or “the subjectivity of moral values” though it is nowadays known as non-cognitivism, expressivism or emotivism. He came to think that, despite their indicative appearance, moral judgments—at least judgments about what is good or bad in itself—are really in the optative mood. (A sentence is in the optative mood if it expresses a wish or a desire.) What “X is good” means is “Would that everyone desired X!”. It therefore expresses, but does not describe, the speaker’s state of mind, specifically his or her desires, and as such can be neither truth nor false, anymore than “Oh to be in England now that April’s here!”. If I say “Oh to be in England now that April’s here!”, you can infer that I desire to be in England now that April’s here (since absent an intention to mislead, it is not the sort of thing I would say unless I desired to be in England and thought that April was here). But I am not stating that I desire to be in England, since I am not stating anything at all (except perhaps that April is here). (See RoE: 131–144/Religion and Science: ch. 9.) Although this was Russell’s dominant view from 1913 until his death, he did not care for it very much.

I cannot see how to refute the arguments for the subjectivity of ethical values, but I find myself incapable of believing that all that is wrong with wanton cruelty is that I don’t like it. (RoE: 165/Papers 11: 310–11)

It is not entirely clear what Russell took these overwhelming arguments to be. But one of them seems to have proceeded from a Moorean premise. Russell took Moore to have refuted naturalism, the view that although there are moral truths, nothing metaphysically out of the ordinary is required to make them true. Conversely Russell took Moore to have proved that if there were to be moral truths about which things were good or bad as ends rather than means, the truths in question would require spooky non-natural properties of goodness, badness etc—quite unlike the “natural” properties posited by science and commonsense—to make them true. In the supposed absence of such properties, he was driven to the conclusion that moral judgments (at least judgments about goodness and badness) were either all false or neither true nor false. Thus Russell remained a renegade Moorean even after he had ceased to believe in the Moorean good. But if Moore was a decisive influence on Russell, it seems that Russell was an important influence on Moore. For Moore may have been driven to invent his most famous argument for a non-natural property of goodness—the Open Question Argument—by the need to deal with a naturalistic theory of Russell’s.

2. Desire, Motivation and the Open Question Argument: Did Russell Influence Moore?

2.1. The Open Question Argument versus the Barren Tautology Argument

“I certainly have been more influenced by [Russell] than any other single philosopher” wrote Moore in his intellectual autobiography (Schilpp (ed.) 1942: 16). But Moore’s “Autobiography” suggests (without actually saying so) that this influence was mostly metaphysical. I shall argue that Russell had a considerable influence on Moore’s ethical doctrines and that some of Moore’s key ideas were developed in the course of ongoing debates with Russell.

Moore’s Principia Ethica took a long time to finish. He had a pretty good draft in 1898, but he did not publish it until 1903. Why the long delay? One reason, I suspect, was that he had to deal with a problem posed (perhaps unwittingly) by Russell.

It is not generally recognized that Principia Ethica contains two distinct arguments against the “Naturalistic Fallacy”, the supposed intellectual error of identifying goodness with some other property (usually, though not necessarily, a naturalistic property). The first, which is derived from Sidgwick, and has a long philosophical pedigree, goes something like this:

For any naturalistic or metaphysical “X”, if “good” meant “X”, then (i) “X things are good” would be a barren tautology, equivalent to (ii) “X things are X” or (iii) “Good things are good”.
For any naturalistic or metaphysical “X”, if (i) “X things are good” were a barren tautology, it would not provide a reason for action (i.e., a reason to promote X-ness).
So for any naturalistic or metaphysical “X”, either (i) “X things are good” does not provide a reason for action (i.e., a reason to promote X-ness), or “good” does not mean “X”.

To put the point another way:

For any naturalistic or metaphysical “X”, if (i) “X things are good” provides a reason for action (that is, a reason to promote X-ness), then “good” does not mean “X”.

Following Russell, I call this the Barren Tautology Argument or BTA (RoE: 100/Papers 4: 572). The idea is that “good” cannot be synonymous with any naturalistic “X”, if “X things are good” is supposed to be a reason for action rather than a “barren tautology”. So for example, if “good” just means “pleasant” then “Pleasant things are good” is a barren tautology (equivalent to “Pleasant things are pleasant” or “Good things are good”) and cannot provide us with a reason for the pursuit of pleasure. Only if “goodness” and “pleasure” are not synonymous, can “Pleasant things are good” provide an intellectual incentive for the pursuit of pleasant things. This argument crops up at PE: §11 (though variants of it recur throughout the first four chapters (PE: §§14, 24 & 26):

When A says “Good means pleasant” and B says “Good means desired,” they may merely wish to assert that most people have used the word for what is pleasant and for what is desired respectively. [But I do not think] that any exponent of naturalistic Ethics would be willing to allow that this was all he meant. They are all so anxious to persuade us that what they call the good is what we really ought to do. “Do, pray, act so, because the word ‘good’ is generally used to denote actions of this nature”: such, on this view, would be the substance of their teaching … But how perfectly absurd is the reason they would give for it! “You are to do this, because most people use a certain word to denote conduct such as this.” “You are to say the thing which is not, because most people call it lying.” That is an argument just as good! …. When they say “Pleasure is good,” we cannot believe that they merely mean “Pleasure is pleasure” and nothing more than that.

However Moore did not invent this argument. A.N. Prior, in his Logic and the Basis of Ethics (1949: ch. IX), traces it back to Cudworth in the 17th Century, though it doubtful whether Moore was aware of this. (He does not seem to have been particularly well read.) But it certainly occurs in Sidgwick, which is presumably where Moore got it from. The Barren Tautology Argument is to be distinguished from the Open Question Argument proper (the OQA), which Moore did invent, at least in its modern form. This occurs at PE: §13, a section that does not appear in the 1898 draft. It can be stated thus:

“Are X things good?” is a significant or open question for any naturalistic or metaphysical predicate “X” (whether simple or complex). [A question is significant or open if an understanding of the language does not suffice for an answer. Thus “Are bachelors unmarried?” is not an Open Question.]
If two expressions (whether simple or complex) are synonymous this is evident on reflection to every competent speaker.
The meaning of a predicate or property word is the property for which it stands. Thus if two predicates or property words have distinct meanings, they name distinct properties.

From (1.4) and (1.5) it follows that

“Good” is not synonymous with any naturalistic or metaphysical predicate “X” (or “goodness” with any corresponding noun or noun-phrase “X-ness”).

If “good” were synonymous with some naturalistic predicate “X”, then this would be obvious on reflection to every competent speaker. Hence there would be some question of the form “Are X things good?” which would not appear to be open to competent speakers, since an understanding of the words involved would suffice for an affirmative answer. Given (1.4), there is no such question; hence “good” is not synonymous with any naturalistic predicate “X”.

From (1.6) and (1.7) it follows that

Goodness is not identical with any natural or metaphysical property of X-ness.

This argument is wheeled on to discredit a particular naturalistic analysis of “good”—“one of the more plausible, because one of the more complicated of such definitions”—that “ good mean[s] … that which we desire to desire”. Where did Moore get this definition? He does not say, crediting it, in effect, to Mr Nobody. But in fact the inventor of this plausible but fallacious definition was none other than the Hon. Bertrand Russell.

2.2. Wrestling With Desire: the Young Russell’s Adventures in Meta-Ethics

The desire-to-desire theory is the last in a sequence of three attempts to provide a foundation for ethics by defining “good” in terms of desire. In the first, “X is good” means “X will satisfy my desires”; in the second, it means “I want X for its own sake”; and in the third it means “X is what I desire to desire” (RoE: chs. 7, 9 & 10/Papers 1: nos. 36, 39 & 15).

“Ethical Axioms” (1894) was the last piece that Russell wrote for Sidgwick’s course on ethics (RoE: 53–56/Papers 1: 226–228). Russell takes it as a datum that “we do make moral judgments” and that “we regard these, like judgments as to what is, as liable to truth and falsehood”. We are “precluded from skepticism” (presumably the view that moral judgments are all false) “by the mere fact we will and act”. (This is not a very convincing argument since I can desire something—and hence act—without thinking it good, as non-human animals presumably do. The precondition of action is desire, not desire tricked out in the vocabulary of good and evil.) Hence “some basis must be found for ethical judgments”, but “it is sufficiently obvious that such a basis cannot be sought in any proposition about what is or has been”. Thus Russell has set himself a rather difficult problem, since it is not at all clear that there can be any true propositions that are not, in some sense, propositions about what is, has been or will be. Perhaps what he has in mind is a set of self-evident axioms about what ought to be or what we ought to do which do not admit of any further analysis. But he rejects this option because “the Kantian maxim” (whatever that is) is purely formal and because no “material precept” “has obtained the universal consent of moralists”. (It seems that a maxim cannot count as self-evident unless it is evident to every qualified self.) Russell also rejects the view that moral judgments are “merely statements of a psychological state” (as, for example, that the speaker desires this or that) on the grounds that in that case “they could not err (except by the speaker’s mistaking his own feelings)”. He seems to think that it is a conceptual truth that moral judgments are liable to error. Finally he plumps for the view that “we may define the good as that which satisfies desire” (that is, that what is good for each person is what will satisfy that person’s desires). This allows for the possibility of error, for though we usually know what we want, we can be wrong about whether we will like it when we get it. Russell hastens to explain that this definition is not as sordid as it sounds. “Our duty will consist in self-realization, but self-realization may of course be best attained by what is commonly called self-sacrifice.”

It is nice to know that no sordid or selfish consequences flow from defining the goodness in terms of the satisfaction of desire, but it is not at all clear that Russell has solved the problem that he had set himself. For propositions about what will satisfy desire are propositions about what will satisfy desire—that is, propositions about what will be. Underlying Russell’s argument is his evident desire to forge a conceptual connection between moral belief and action. The theory must (help) explain the fact that we often do what we believe to be our duty and usually pursue and promote what we believe to be good. This, not the thesis that we are necessarily motivated by our moral beliefs, is the premise of Hume’s famous Motivation Argument at Treatise, 3.1.1:

And this is confirmed by common experience, which informs us that men are often governed by their duties, and are deterred from some actions by the opinion of injustice, and impelled to others by that of obligation [my italics].

(See D.D. Raphael (ed.) 1991 The British Moralists [henceforward BM: §489].) Russell appears to have thought that a theory that left “good” and “ought” undefined would not meet this constraint. But if “good” means what procures satisfaction, then we have the beginnings of such an explanation. For we usually desire that our desires be satisfied, and hence we have a reason to pursue and promote the good.

This theory soon ceased to satisfy, and Russell reverted to the problem in “Are All Desires Equally Moral?”, a paper he composed in about 1896 (RoE: 68–70/Papers 1: 242–44). “The Good, for me, at any moment”, he declares, “is what I want” not what will satisfy my wants, since we desire the objects that will satisfy desire and not, “except derivatively”, that those desires should be satisfied. (This last point is distinctly dubious. Isn’t Reid’s desire for our good-on-the-whole in part a second order desire that at least some of our first-order desires should be satisfied? [See Thomas Reid, 1788, Essays on the Active Powers of Man, excerpted in BM: §§ 861–865.] And did not Russell himself believe that this desire was not only real but often unduly predominant in civilized persons, so much so that most of what we do is done for the sake of something else not because we have a spontaneous, first-order desire to do it? See for instance his 1894 paper “Cleopatra or Maggie Tulliver” [RoE: 57–67, Papers 1: 92–98] though the theme is repeated in subsequent writings such as The Principles of Social Reconstruction, first published in 1916.) Thus “X is good”, means “I want X”, a particularly crude kind of subjectivism that goes back to Hobbes (“whatsoever is the object of any man’s appetite or desire; that is it which he for his part calleth good”, BM: §25). This theory maintains the link between moral belief and action (naturally we pursue and promote the things that we want!) though it a) reduces moral judgments to “statements of a psychological state” and b) violates the requirement that statements about what ought to be should have nothing to do with what is, since, on this theory, my moral judgments reduce to statements about what is going on inside my head. The theory as stated is a little too crude for Russell however, since it precludes the possibility of moral error. After all, it is difficult to be wrong about what we want. The theory has the further unhappy consequence that we cannot desire what we believe to be bad, let alone what is bad, since from the very fact that I desire something, it follows that for me, at least, it is good. All desires are equally moral since they are all desires for the good.

Russell tries to sidestep these problems by distinguishing between “primary desires, for ends, and secondary desires, for means”. The good for each person is what he desires for its own sake and generally speaking he cannot be mistaken about this. But he can be mistaken about whether a given object is the means to what he ultimately desires. Furthermore, if he is mistaken, his secondary desires may be immoral. As Russell realizes, this leads to the “Socratic maxim that no man sins wittingly” since nobody can desire what he believes to be bad. But an agent can both desire the bad and have bad desires, since his secondary desires may be inimical to his ultimate ends. Unfortunately this amendment cannot save the theory. According to Russell’s theory, in some cases at any rate “X is good”, means “I want X for its own sake”, and such judgments are relatively immune from error. Furthermore, people do seem to desire what they believe to be bad (the “Socratic maxim” is not known as the “Socratic Paradox” for nothing!) and we commonly think that desires for ends, as well as desires for means, can be bad. Finally, the theory, even in its amended form, reduces moral judgments to statements of a psychological state. Thus the theory violates Russell’s theoretical constraints and is inconsistent with the way we usually talk.

What about the desire-to-desire theory? If “X is good” means “I desire to desire X” then there is a conceptual connection, though, as Lewis notes, an “iffy” one, between moral belief and action (Lewis 1989: 116/72). I will pursue and promote what I believe to be good in so far as I desire what I desire to desire. Moral judgments “like judgments as to what is, [are] liable to truth and falsehood”, though not very liable to falsehood, since it is difficult, but not impossible, to be mistaken about what we desire to desire. (I might be persuaded, especially under moral pressure, that I desire to desire something when in fact I do not.) But it is possible both to desire the bad (to desire what I desire not to desire) and to have bad desires (to have desires which I desire to desire not to desire). Self-conscious depravity is thus a real possibility and the Socratic paradox is dismissed. For like an unhappy junkie, I can act on desires which I desire not to desire. But it is not possible to desire to desire the bad since what we desire to desire is automatically good. Furthermore, moral judgments are reduced to statements of a psychological state, so much so that ethics becomes a branch of empirical psychology. The axioms of ethics, in so far as there are such things, are concerned with what is, since our desires, including our second-order desires are original existents.

Thus Russell was trying in the 1890s to devise a theory that would meet six constraints:

Moral judgments, “like judgments as to what is”, must have a truth-value.
Moral judgments must be liable to error (two constraints that Russell tends to confuse).
There must be a conceptual connection (possibly an iffy one) between moral belief and motivation [a rather weak form of motivational internalism].
It must be possible to desire the bad and to have bad desires.
Moral judgments must not reduce to “statements of a psychological state”.
The basis for moral judgments cannot be sought in any proposition about what is, has been or will be.

The last condition, which amounts to the denial of naturalism, goes back to a paper that Russell wrote for Sidgwick in 1893, “The Relation of What Ought to be to What Is, Has Been or Will Be” (RoE: 37–40/Papers 1: 213–214). Russell observes that “from the point of view of formal logic” it is impossible to derive an Ought from an Is. This leads him to the conclusion that “some one or more propositions ethical in form must be regarded as axiomatic unless [and this is a big ‘unless’] such propositions are materially equivalent to some assertion about what is, has been or will be”. By “materially equivalent” he seems to mean “mean the same as”. Thus morality might not hang from the skyhook of intuited axioms if moral judgments meant the same as natural judgments of some kind. But he goes on to argue against this possibility, that is, to argue that what Moore was to call naturalism is false. Nor is it odd that he should have anticipated Moore, since Sidgwick, who was their teacher, anticipated them both.

However this provides Russell with a sextet of constraints that cannot be jointly met. For example, it is hard to see how conditions (2.1) and (2.3) can be realized without analyzing “good” or “ought” in terms of desire or some such psychological state. Yet to do so violates conditions (2.5) and (2.6). Thus it comes as no surprise that the theories which Russell managed to come up with all fail to meet his constraints. The first (“X is good” means “X will satisfy my desires”) meets conditions (2.1) (since what we want may not satisfy us once we get it). It also meets condition (2.4) (just about) since it is possible to want things that will not, in fact, satisfy us. But it doesn’t meet (2.5), since “X is good” reduces to a statement about a future psychological state; and a fortiori it fails to meet condition (2.6). The second theory (“X is good” means “I want X for its own sake”) fares far worse. It meets condition (2.1) but not (2.2), (2.3) but not (2.4), and fails (2.5) and (2.6) altogether. As for the third (“X is good” means “X is what I desire to desire”), it meets (2.1), struggles to meet (2.2), meets (2.3) and (2.4) but fails both (2.5) and (2.6).

Interestingly if Russell abandoned (2.1) and (2.2) and adopted a non-cognitive theory he would have been able to arrive at a theory which would have satisfied the last four constraints. Take Russell’s own brand of emotivism (“X is good” means “Would that everyone desired X!”), which he did not develop until 1935 (RoE: 131–144/Religion and Science, ch. IX). This meets condition (2.3), since if I say that X is good, and if am sincere in my ethical pronouncements, then I desire that everyone (including myself) should desire X—a second order desire that is usually (but not always) accompanied by a first-order desire for X itself. Thus if I “believe” (note the scare quotes!) that X is good, I am likely to pursue or promote it. The theory meets condition (2.4) too, since I can desire things, from chocolate to crack, that I desire nobody (including myself) to desire. It meets condition (2.5) as well, since good-judgments, so far from being statements of a psychological state, are not statements at all but optatives. For much the same reason it meets condition (2.6): “X is good”, is not equivalent to a proposition about what is, has been or will be, because it is not equivalent to any proposition whatsoever. But of course the standard objection to non-cognitivist theories is precisely that they violate conditions (2.1) and (2.2). They treat utterances which are commonly regarded as true or false as lacking in truth-value (at least with respect to their primary meanings) and they immunize moral judgments from error by depriving them of the possibility of falsehood.

Now I don’t say that Russell’s six constraints are correct (they can’t be since they are inconsistent), nor that Russell’s meta-ethical theories are right (which at most one of them can be since they, too, are inconsistent). But I do say that the constraints are plausible and that it is a desideratum in a meta-ethical theory that it meet as many as possible. Russell demonstrates his philosophical acumen by making the attempt.

In 1897, Russell decided in effect, to sacrifice conditions (2.5) (2.6), and perhaps (2.2) to conditions (2.1), (2.3) and (2.4). In that year he read a paper to the Cambridge Apostles “Is Ethics a Branch of Empirical Psychology” in which he defined goodness as that which we desire to desire. (RoE: 71–78/Papers I: 100–104). Moral judgments (at least judgments about goodness) reduce to “statements of a psychological state” since to say something is good is to say that “we” desire to desire it, a statement well within the frontiers of psychology (whether “we” refers to the community at large or to the speaker whoever he or she may be). And of course, if judgments about goodness reduce to “statements of a psychological state”, they clearly reduce to statements about “what is, has been or will be”, since whether “we” desire to desire something is determined by whatever is the case in “our” minds. Are moral judgments liable to error? Only in so far as we can be mistaken about what we desire to desire, which is, perhaps, not very far. On the plus side, moral judgments will be true or false, and will have a conceptual connection (albeit an iffy one) to our actions and passions. Assuming that (at least sometimes) I actually desire what I desire to desire, the fact that (for me) X is good means that (at least sometimes) I will have a desire to pursue or promote X. Finally, it is perfectly possible to have bad or even evil desires, namely the desires I desire not to desire, thus solving a problem with Russell’s previous attempts at a desire-based ethic (see RoE: ch. 9/Papers I: ch. 39). Thus the answer Russell provides to his own question (“Is Ethics a Branch of Empirical Psychology?”) is a clear, but reluctant, yes.

2.3. Why the Open Question Argument?

Now why should this theory pose a problem for Moore? Because the time-honored Barren Tautology argument does not work against it. Remember, the conclusion of the Barren Tautology Argument is this:

For any naturalistic or metaphysical “X”, if (i) “X things are good”, provides a reason for action (that is, a reason to promote X-ness), then “good” does not mean “X”.

By substitution this gives us:

If (i′) “Things which we desire to desire are good”, provides a reason for action (that is, a reason to promote what we desire to desire), then “good” does not mean “what we desire to desire”.

But the point of defining goodness in terms of what we desire to desire is not to give us a reason to pursue or promote what we desire to desire—rather, it is supposed to explain why something’s being good gives us a reason (or at least, a motive), to pursue or promote it. Russell is not advocating the pursuit of what we desire to desire: he is trying to provide an analysis of “good” which helps to make sense of the fact that we tend to pursue and promote (what we believe to be) good things. (We do it because to be good just is to be something which we desire to desire, and hence something which, sometimes at any rate, we will actually desire.) In other words, (i′) “Things which we desire to desire are good” is meant to be a barren tautology—barren in terms of practical consequences, that is, though, hopefully, philosophically illuminating. It does not provide (and is not intended to provide) a reason for action. But in that case, the antecedent of (1.3″)—that the belief that “Things which we desire to desire are good”, provides a reason for action—is false, so far as Russell’s analysis is concerned. Thus even if the conditional (1.3″) is true, it does not support the consequent—that “good” does not mean “what we desire to desire”. The Barren Tautology Argument is therefore impotent against the desire-to-desire theory.

Nor is this all. The Barren Tautology Argument fails against other theories whose aim is to explicate the appeal of goodness rather than to advocate the pursuit of some alleged good thing. For instance, if “good” means “what we are ideally inclined to approve of”, then “What we are ideally inclined to approve of is good” will be a barren tautology. But since people like Hume, who propound such definitions, don’t intend them to be anything else, they are not compelled to the conclusion that such definitions are false. Thus if naturalism was to be defeated (which was clearly Moore’s project) a new argument had to be invented. And it is significant, I think, that Moore did not publish Principia Ethica until he had invented just such an argument.

The Open Question Argument proper does not terminate in a conditional but a categorical. It starts with the assumption that “Are X things good?” is a significant or open question for any naturalistic or metaphysical predicate “X”. It is not a tautology, barren or otherwise, that what we desire to desire is good, and the proof of this is that competent speakers can sensibly wonder whether or not it is true. Indeed, according to Moore, “any one can easily convince himself by inspection” that the predicate “good” “is positively different from the notion of ‘desiring to desire’”. If we grant Moore’s first implicit assumption—that if two expressions are synonymous this is evident on reflection to every competent speaker—we can derive the consequence that “good” does not mean “what we desire to desire”. And if we grant his second implicit assumption—that if two predicates or property words have distinct meanings they name distinct properties—then we can derive the conclusion that he really wants, namely that goodness is not identical with what we desire to desire. And by parity or reasoning we can do the same for any naturalistic property whatsoever.

Now Moore’s twin assumptions have subsequently fallen upon hard times. The first leads straight to the Paradox of Analysis (see Langford 1942), whilst the second would exclude synthetic identities such as water is H2O. But if they were correct, the OQA would indeed dispose of the desire-to-desire theory along with kindred theories such as Hume’s. It is notable that David Lewis, who revived Russell’s theory in 1989 (without realizing it was Russell’s), explicitly affirms what Moore implicitly denies—that there can be unobvious analytic truths; that is, truths not evident to every competent speaker (see Lewis 1989 and Pigden 2007). But if Moore were correct and there were no such things, then naturalistic analyses of the moral concepts such as Russell’s would be in big trouble. The BTA only works against some naturalistic analyses of “good”, namely those that define “good” in terms of some property that the theorist wishes to promote. The OQA, if it works at all, works against them all. It seems very likely that what prompted Moore to invent his philosophical weapon of mass destruction was the desire-to-desire theory of Bertrand Russell.

Then why didn’t Moore say so—or at least, why didn’t he attribute the desire-to-desire definition to its original inventor? Because Russell propounded his definition at a meeting of the Apostles, a supposedly secret society. The rather priggish Moore took the code of secrecy very seriously and used to fuss about discussing the doings of the Apostles by postcard in case they were read in transit. (The slightly less priggish Russell had to reassure him that only college porters were likely to read them and only initiates would understand.) To have attributed the desire-to-desire theory to an Apostolic paper of Russell’s would have broken the code of silence (a code designed to promote the unfettered exchange of honest opinion).

There is an irony in this episode. The last page of the paper, “Is Ethics a Branch of Empirical Psychology?” is marked with a query in Russell’s hand “Shall we spell {Good/good} with”, to which Moore replies “Good = good”—which looks like a succinct formulation of his famous no-definition definition of “good” (“If I am asked ‘How is good to be defined?’ my answer is that it cannot be defined and that is all I have to say about it.” PE: 58). If I am right, Russell’s desire-to-desire theory posed a problem for Moore which it took him five years to solve. But, given the annotation, it seems that the debate on Russell’s paper began a process of conversion that led Russell himself to accept the doctrines of Moore’s Principia Ethica.

3. Sidgwick’s Problem and the Rejection of Idealism

“We called him ‘old Sidg’ and regarded him as merely out of date” (My Philosophical Development: 30). So said Russell of his teacher, the great Victorian moral philosopher, Henry Sidgwick (though he later thought that he and his contemporaries “did not give [Sidgwick] nearly as much respect as he deserved”). But though Russell may have regarded Sidgwick as an old fogey, he set the agenda for a lot of Russell’s work on ethics in the 1890s. For Russell was much exercised by a problem that also bothered Sidgwick: the Dualism of Practical Reason. (See Sidgwick 1907: 496–516; see also Schulz 2004: ch. 4, in which it becomes abundantly clear how very preoccupied Sidgwick was with this problem.) According to Sidgwick, it is rational to do what is morally right (by maximizing pleasurable consciousness on the part of all sentient beings) and rational to do what is prudentially right (by maximizing pleasurable consciousness on the part of oneself), but, when the two come into conflict, the one does not seem to be any more rational than the other. If God exists, then He can ensure that it will pay in the long term to promote the public interest, by rewarding the righteous in the life to come. What is morally right will coincide with what is prudentially right, and that, consequently, is what Practical Reason will command. But if, as Sidgwick was reluctantly inclined to think, there is no God, what is morally right and what is prudentially right will sometimes come apart, and Practical Reason will speak with a divided voice. If it does not always pay to be good, then it is not clear that is more rational to be good than to be bad, a conclusion that Sidgwick found deeply disturbing. The rather priggish young Russell was bothered by the problem too (a solution, he said, would be “a real solid addition to my happiness”) because, like Sidgwick, he did not believe in God. But as a fashionable young philosopher of the 1890s he did believe in something that he thought would do nearly as well, namely, the Absolute. For at this time, Russell, like most of his philosophical contemporaries in the English-speaking world, was a neo-Hegelian or Absolute Idealist. Though we may seem to be living in a material world and to be material boys and girls, this is an Appearance only. Reality, the Absolute, is basically mental, a sort of timeless and harmonious group mind of which our separate selves are (perhaps delusory) aspects. As Bradley put it,

the Absolute is one system, and … its contents are nothing but sentient experience. It will hence be a single and all-inclusive experience, which embraces every partial diversity in concord. For it cannot be less than appearance, and hence no feeling or thought, of any kind, can fall outside its limits. (1930 [1893]: 129)

(We stress that it is hard to present this doctrine concisely without gross caricature.) But there was a crucial difference between McTaggart and Bradley, the two leading idealists of Russell’s day. McTaggart believed in personal immortality and claimed the harmony that already exists timelessly (so to speak) “must some day become explicit” (McTaggart 1996 [1893]: 210–211). Bradley did not.

At first Russell was an adherent of McTaggart. This afforded him a neat solution to Sidgwick’s problem. The happy day when the harmony becomes explicit can be promoted or retarded by human action. If I benefit myself at your expense not only am I doing down a self with whom I am, in Reality, intimately linked—I am putting off the day when the harmony that Really Is becomes apparent. And since this harmony will be supremely pleasurable I am harming myself into the bargain. Hence morality and self-interest coincide and Practical Reason is reunited with itself (Russell, 1893, “On the Foundations of Ethics”, RoE: 37–40/Papers 1: 206–211). This illustrates the point made by a number of unkind critics, that in the late 19th century Absolute Idealism functioned as a sort of methadone program for high-minded Victorian intellectuals, providing them with moral uplift as they struggled to get off the hard stuff of official Christianity. (See Stove 1991: chs. 5 & 6; Allard 2003 and, in more restrained language, Griffin 2003b: pp. 85–88.) Before long however, Russell moved over to Bradley’s camp and ceased to believe that the timelessly existing harmony would become manifest in time. Nevertheless, since we are all aspects of the Absolute, a sort of timeless super-self, there is essentially the same objection to indulging my desires at your expense as there is to indulging one of my own passions at the expense of others which are inconsistent with it. I am hurting, if not myself, at least a larger whole of which we are both parts (Russell, 1894, “Cleopatra or Maggie Tulliver”, RoE: 57–67/Papers I: 92–8). But before long even this solution ceased to satisfy. In a paper not published until 1957, “Seems Madam? Nay It Is”, Russell argued (as he put it to Moore) that “for all purposes that are not purely intellectual, the world of Appearance is the real world”. In particular, the hypothesis that there is a timeless and harmonious Reality provides no consolation for our present pains since it is a Reality that we never get to experience. If “the world of daily life remains wholly unaffected by [Reality], and goes on its way just as if there were no world of Reality at all”, and if this world of Reality is a world that we not only do not but cannot experience (since experience is necessarily temporal), how can its alleged existence afford us any consolation for what seems to be (and therefore is) evil in the world of Appearance? (Russell, 1897, “Seems, Madam? Nay, It Is”, RoE: 79–86/Papers 1: 105–111/Why I am Not a Christian: 75–82).

Now this argument has an interesting corollary which Russell does not explicitly draw. It may be that in Reality the pains I inflict on you affect me—or at least a larger mind-like thing in which we both participate—but if I never experience those effects, how can this give me a motive to do or forbear if my interests conflict with yours? How can the fact that you and I are in Reality one (or at least part of one) give me a reason to look out for you, if this oneness is something I never experience? If Absolute Idealism can provide no consolation for life’s disasters—which is what Russell is explicitly arguing—then it seems that it cannot supply me with a reason not to visit those disasters on you, if doing so is likely to benefit me. It may be that I suffer in a metaphysical sort of way when I profit at your expence, but if this suffering is something I never feel (since I am effectively confined to the world of Appearance) why should this bother me? Thus the Dualism of Practical Reason reasserts itself. Sometimes what is morally right is at odds with what is prudentially right and when it is, there seems no reason to prefer the one to the other.

Whether Russell realized this is not entirely clear. What is clear is that “Seems, Madam? Nay, It Is” marks the beginning of the end for Russell’s Absolute Idealism. Once he realized that

for all purposes that are not purely intellectual [including perhaps the purpose of providing moral uplift] the world of Appearance is the real world,

Russell came to feel that the world of Reality was no use for purely intellectual purposes either and soon resolved to do without it. A big “R” Reality, that could neither console us for life’s troubles nor reconcile Duty and Interest, was a big “R” Reality that might as well not exist. The methadone of Absolute Idealism having failed, Russell was forced to accept appearances at face value.

But what about the problem of the Dualism of Practical Reason? In later life, Russell ceased to worry about it perhaps because he realized that it is a problem that cannot be resolved. The Cosmos of Duty really is a Chaos (as Sidgwick rather colorfully put it). Duty and Interest can come into conflict, and when they do, there is no decisive reason for preferring the one to the other. All you can do is to try to instill moral and altruistic motivations, which is what Russell tried to do with his children. But when they asked why they should care about other people (as his daughter Kate defiantly did) his response was rather lame.

“I don’t want to! Why should I?”
“Because more people will be happier if you do than if you don’t.”
“So what? I don’t care about other people.”
“You should.”
“But why?”
“Because more people will be happier if you do than if you don’t.” (RoE: 16; Tait 1975: 185)

This isn’t much of an answer, but since the Cosmos of Duty really is a Chaos, it was perhaps the best that Russell could do.

4. Russell versus Moore: Two Kinds of Consequentialism

Although Russell became a convert to the doctrines of Principia Ethica, he disagreed with Moore on two important points. Russell, like Moore was what is nowadays known as a consequentialist. He believed that the rightness or otherwise of an act is “in some way, dependent on consequences”. But for the young Moore, it is “demonstrably certain” (!) that “I am morally bound to perform this action” is identical [that is synonymous] with the assertion “This action will produce the greatest amount of possible good in the Universe” (PE: ch. 5, §89). Thus it is analytic that the right thing to do is the action that will, actually produce the best consequences. But in Russell’s view this claim is neither analytic nor true. Moore’s own Open Question Argument can be deployed to prove that it is not analytic, and a little critical reflection reveals that it is not true.

It is held [by Moore] that what we ought to do is that action, among all that are possible, which will produce the best results on the whole; and this is regarded as constituting a definition of ought. I hold that this is not a definition, but a significant proposition, and in fact a false one. (RoE: 101/Papers 4: 573)

It is a “significant” or non-analytic proposition because a competent speaker can believe that X is the act that will produce the best consequences without believing that she ought to do it. If the two propositions “X is the act available to me that will produce the best consequences” and “I ought to do X” were really synonymous, then a competent speaker could not believe the one whilst remaining in doubt about the other. Since this is perfectly possible (as is shown by the fact that “Ought I to do what will have the best results?” is an obstinately open question for competent speakers of English) the two claims are not synonymous. (W.D. Ross developed a similar line of argument in The Right and the Good (1930) but it was Russell who convinced Moore that he was wrong. See Moore 1942: 558).

But the fact that these claims are not synonymous does not show that it is false that I ought to do that act which will, in fact, produce the best consequences. The latter claim could be synthetic (or, as Russell would have it, “significant”) but true. Why does Russell think it false? Russell raises the ad hominem objection that Moore’s thesis is flatly inconsistent with the moral conservatism that he goes on to embrace. According to Moore, although “there are cases where [an established moral] rule should be broken”, since “in some cases the neglect of an established moral rule will be the best course of action possible”, nevertheless, “we can never know what those cases are, and ought, therefore, never to break it” (PE: §99). “The individual, therefore, can be confidently recommended always to conform to rules which are generally useful and generally practiced.” But if we ought to perform the best action possible, what this implies is that there are some cases (though we can never know which) where we ought to do what it is not the case that we ought to do. Moore could avoid this contradiction by adopting the view that what we ought to do is that action which we have reason to believe will produce the best consequences. As Russell himself put it, Moore’s moral conservatism “implies that we ought to do what we have reason to think will have the best results, rather than what really will have the best results” [my italics]—since, in any given instance, we may have reason to think that the conventionally right act will have the best consequences even though we know that this won’t always be the case.

But Russell did not reject Moore’s brand of consequentialism because it was inconsistent with his moral conservatism, since he also rejected Moore’s moral conservatism. As he informed Moore by letter, he regarded his views on Practical Ethics as “unduly Conservative and anti-reforming”. However, anybody who thinks that there are some actions which we ought to do even though, as a matter of fact they won’t have the best consequences must, reject Moore’s view. And it is precisely because he believes this that Russell rejects Moore’s brand of consequentialism. “Some people”, says Russell, “whom I refrain from naming, might with advantage to the world have been strangled in infancy; but we cannot blame the good women who brought them up for having omitted this precaution.” So if Stalin’s mother (say) did the right thing in not strangling him at birth, then it follows that the right thing to do is not always the act with the best actual consequences. Russell admits that his view is not without paradox, since if it sometimes right to do what is actually disastrous, it follows that it can sometimes be “a pity [that] a man did his duty”, a thesis which Moore regards as “a contradiction in terms”. But paradoxical as this may seem, it is only a contradiction on the assumption that “the right action” simply means “the action with the best actual consequences”, an assumption which Moore’s own Open Question Argument proves to be false. Moore’s view, by contrast, is contradictory however “right” and “ought” are to be defined, since it implies that we sometimes ought to perform acts which (since they are not optimific) it is not the case that we ought to perform.

Russell’s criticisms can be summed up as follows:

  1. It is false that “I am morally bound/I ought/it is right for me to perform this action” is synonymous with the assertion “This action will produce the greatest amount of possible good in the Universe”, since the Open Question Argument can be deployed mutatis mutandis to prove otherwise.
  2. Moore subscribes to three theses that are flat-out contradictory:
    1. We ought to perform those acts that will in fact produce the best consequences.
    2. Following established rules does not always result in acts that produce the best consequences.
    3. We ought to follow the established rules.

    These three theses jointly imply that we sometimes ought to do things that it is not the case that we ought to do. Russell gently points out this contradiction and suggests, in effect, that Moore could resolve it by modifying (1) to (1′).

    We ought to perform those acts which it is reasonable to believe will produce the best consequences.
  3. The “good women” who brought up the likes of Hitler and Stalin cannot be blamed for not strangling them in infancy. This suggests that it was right of them to refrain even though the actual consequences of their acts of forbearance turned out to be horrendous. Thus the right thing to do is not that act which will actually produce the best consequences but that act which it is reasonable to believe will produce the best consequences.

Moore accepted argument A (see his “Reply to My Critics”: 558), and in his later book Ethics (1912) he treats consequentialism as a synthetic thesis.

It is, I think, quite plain that the meaning of the two words [“expedience” and “duty”] is not the same; for if it were, then it would be a mere tautology to say that it is always our duty to do what will have the best possible consequences. Our theory does not, therefore, do away with the distinction between the meaning of the two words “duty” and “expediency”; it only implies that both will always apply to the same actions. (Ethics: 89)

He also seems to have accepted Russell’s ad hominem argument B—that, given the fairly obvious fact that doing the done thing does not always produce the best results, his actualist brand of consequentialism is inconsistent with his moral conservatism. However, he did not resolve the problem by modifying thesis (1) as Russell, in effect, recommended—instead he resolved it by dropping thesis (3). In Principia, moral conservatism had been “confidently recommended” to the conscientious “individual”. By the time Moore came to write Ethics in 1912 it had simply disappeared, leaving the puzzled “individual” bereft of practical guidance. What ought the individual to do, when, as is usually the case, she cannot determine, which of the available acts will have the best total consequences? Moore does not say, thereby sacrificing helpfulness to theoretical consistency.

5. Politics, Consequentialism and the Need for Skepticism

Dry and abstract as these disputes may seem, they are not devoid of practical import. A common complaint against consequentialism is that it encourages the consequentialist to do evil that good may come. If the goods to be achieved or the evils to be averted are sufficiently large, it may be not only permissible but obligatory to torture prisoners, execute hostages or to massacre civilians—so long as there is no other, less costly, way to achieve the goods or avert the evils. This is not only objectionable in itself—it encourages ruthless types to commit horrors in the here and now for the sake of some imagined utopia, whilst pretending to themselves and others that they are actuated by the highest motives. Because in principle consequentialism licenses doing evil that good may come, in practice it encourages fanatics to do evil even when the good to come is highly unlikely. In his “Newly Discovered Maxims of la Rochefoucauld”, Russell remarks that “the purpose of morality is to allow people to inflict suffering without compunction” (Fact and Fiction: 184). And consequentialist moralities have enabled some of their devotees to inflict a great deal of suffering, not only without compunction, but often with an insufferable air of moral smugness.

By adopting expected utility as the criterion of right action Russell goes some way towards meeting these objections. In practice when people propose to perpetrate horrors for the sake of some greater good, the horrors are usually certain and the greater good is highly speculative. In weighing up the options, the good to be achieved by some tough course of action must be multiplied by the probability of achieving it, which is always a fraction of one, and often a rather small fraction at that. So although doing evil that good may come is not excluded in principle, the expected utility theorist is far less likely to do it in practice—at least if he or she is intellectually honest. The classless society (let us suppose) would be a very good thing, but I am probably not justified in shooting the hostages to bring it about. For I can be certain that if I shoot them, the hostages will be dead, whereas the probability that shooting them will bring about the classless society is very low. Moreover there is likely to be an as-good-or-better chance that I can bring about the classless society without shooting the hostages. Thus even if the classless society would be supremely good, the expected utility theorist will not be justified in shooting the hostages to bring it about. The expected utility theorist may be obliged to do evil that good may come, but only if the good is large, highly likely given the evil, and most unlikely without the evil. These conditions are seldom met.

Thus Russell could use the criterion of expected utility against warmongers and enthusiasts for revolutionary violence who employed utilitarian patterns of reasoning to inflict suffering without compunction. It was (for example) one of his chief weapons in his polemics against the Bolsheviks during the 1920s. As he wrote in a review of Bukharin’s Historical Materialism,

we do not know enough about the laws of social phenomena to be able to predict the future with any certainty, even in its broadest outlines … For this reason, it is unwise to adopt any policy involving great immediate suffering for the sake of even a great gain in the distant future, because the gain may never be realized (RoE: 203/Papers 9: 371).

Thus despite the desirability of socialism (in Russell’s eyes at any rate) the Bolshevik program had to be rejected for utilitarian or consequentialist reasons. (See also The Practice and Theory of Bolshevism, particularly Part II. ch.iv.) The Bolshevik “habit of militant certainty about doubtful matters” (Practice and Theory: xi) was not only irrational, but dangerous, since it led to pointless suffering. Hence “The Need for Political Skepticism”, the title of one of Russell’s essays, and a major theme in his moral and political writing (Sceptical Essays: ch. 11). Dogmatism leads to cruelty since it encourages people to overestimate the likelihood that their objectives will be realized and hence to exaggerate the expected utility of persecuting policies. Scepticism (or “fallibilism” as we would nowadays tend to say) is the antidote. Hence the maxim that Russell puts into the mouth of la Rochefoucauld: “It does not matter what you believe, so long as you don’t altogether believe it” (Fact and Fiction: 185).

6. Consequentialism, Emotivism and Moral Reform

The criterion of expected utility had another advantage for Russell. It allowed him to recommend a less “conservative and anti-reforming” version of Moore’s principle that “the individual can be confidently recommended … to conform to rules which are generally useful and generally practiced.” Russell was an act-consequentialist rather than a rule-consequentialist. An act is right if the expected consequences of performing it are as good or better than any other. It is not right because it conforms to some rule, even a rule that it is generally useful to obey. Nevertheless, rules are necessary because we do not have world enough and time to calculate the consequences of every act.

I think that, speaking philosophically, all acts ought to be judged by their effects; but as this is difficult and uncertain and takes time, it is desirable, in practice, that some kinds of acts should be condemned and others praised without waiting to investigate consequences. I should say, therefore, with the utilitarians, that the right act, in any given circumstances, is that which, on the data, will probably produce the greatest balance of good over evil of all the acts that are possible; but that the performance of such acts may be promoted by the existence of a moral code. (RoE: 216/Power: 168)

Thus Russell believed that it is generally right to obey “generally useful” rules, though these are “rules of thumb” and there may be circumstances in which it is right (that is obligatory) to break them.

Even the best moral rules, however, will have some exceptions, since no class of actions always has bad [or good!] results. (RoE: 137/Religion and Science: 227–8)

But though Russell thought it is generally right to obey generally useful rules, he also thought that many of the rules that are “generally practiced” are not “generally useful”. Sometimes they derive from bygone superstitions and sometimes they foster the interests of the powerful at other peoples expense.

Primitive ethics …select certain modes of behavior for censure [or praise] for reasons which are lost in anthropological obscurity. (Education and the Social Order: 23)


one of the purposes—usually in large part unconscious—of a traditional morality is to make the existing social system work. It achieves this purpose, when it is successful, both more cheaply and more effectively than a police force does … The most obvious example … is the inculcation of obedience. It is (or rather was) the duty of children to submit to parents, wives to husbands, servants to masters, subjects to princes, and (in religious matters) laymen to priests. (RoE: 207/Power: 157)

Thus Russell was inclined to agree with Plato’s Thrasymachus, at least to the extent that what passes for justice is often [to] the advantage of the stronger [that is the ruling caste, class or gender]. Russell was opposed both to power-moralities (codes designed to bolster the interests of exploitative elites) and to the senseless and often pernicious remnants of defunct superstitions.

An ethic not derived from superstition must decide first upon the kind of social effects which it desires to achieve and the social effects which it desires to avoid. It must then decide, as far as knowledge permits, what acts will promote the desired consequences: these acts it will praise, while those acts having a contrary tendency it will condemn. (Education and the Social Order: 73)

It was Russell’s mission as a practical moralist, a social reformer and a popular sage to promote a humane and non-superstitious ethic. This was partly a matter of preaching and partly a matter of argument: preaching as regards ends and argument as regards means.

In the latter, and more preachy, part of his career, it was Russell’s dominant view that judgments about what things are good or bad as ends do not have a truth-value. To say that it is a good thing “that the individual, like Leibniz’s monads should mirror the world” (Education and the Social Order: 10) is to say something like “Would that everyone desired that the individual, like one of Leibniz’s monads, should mirror the world!” Since this is neither true nor false, it cannot be rationally argued for. The best we can do is to remove objections and present the end in a favorable light. Russell was perfectly clear about this.

Why [should the individual mirror the world]? I cannot say why, except that knowledge and comprehensiveness appear to me glorious attributes in virtue of which I prefer Newton to an oyster. The man who holds concentrated within his own mind, as within a camera obscura, the depths of space, the evolution of the sun and its planets, the geological ages of the earth, and the brief history of humanity, appears to me to be doing what is distinctively human and what adds most to the diversified spectacle of nature.

This is eloquent stuff (and too me, at least, convincing) but it hardly constitutes an argument. And this Russell freely admitted.

Ultimate values are not matters as to which argument is possible. If a man maintains that misery is desirable and that it would be a good thing if everybody always had a violent toothache, we may disagree with him, and we may laugh at him if we catch him going to the dentist, but we cannot prove that he is mistaken as we could if he said that iron is lighter than water … As to ultimate values, men may agree or disagree, they may fight with guns or with ballot papers but they cannot reason logically. (Education and the Social Order: 136)

This is rather disconcerting, especially if we replace the comic examples that Russell employs in Education and the Social Order (he imagines a prophet “who advance[s] the theory that happiness should be confined to those whose first names begin with Z”) with the real-life moral elitists and chauvinists that he discusses in other works of the 1930s and 1940s. Nietzsche and the Nazis really did believe that the sufferings of some people were not significant evils (herd-men in the case of Nietzsche, Jews, Slavs and Gypsies in the case of the Nazis) and it was Russell’s thesis that no rational argument could be advanced against them.

Let us consider two theories as to the good. One says, like Christianity, Kant, and democracy: whatever the good may be, any one man’s enjoyment of it has the same value as any other man’s. The other says: there is a certain sub-class of mankind—white men, Germans, gentiles, or what not—whose good or evil alone counts in an estimation of ends; other men are only to be considered as means … When [irrelevant] arguments are swept away, there remains, so far as I can see, nothing to be said except for each party to express moral disapproval of the other. Those who reject this conclusion advance no argument against it except that it is unpleasant. (“Reply to Criticisms” RoE: 146–147/Papers 11: 48–49)

But unpleasant as this conclusion may be, it does not imply that those with a humane and egalitarian conception of the good should give up preaching on its behalf. On the contrary, such preaching becomes imperative, especially for those with rhetorical gifts. Which is why Russell devoted so much time and effort to this activity.

According to me, the person who judges that A is good is wishing others to feel certain desires. He will therefore, if not hindered by other activities, try to rouse these desires in other people if he thinks he knows how to do so. This is the purpose of preaching, and it was my purpose in the various books in which I have expressed ethical opinions. The art of presenting one’s desires persuasively is totally different from that of logical demonstration, but it is equally legitimate. (“Reply to Criticisms” RoE: 149/Papers 11: 51)

Persuasion as regards ends may be a non-rational process, but that does not mean that it is irrational, let alone wrong, to engage in it.

When it comes to means however, rational argument becomes a genuine possibility. It might seem otherwise since judgments about what is right or what ought to be done—which for Russell are essentially concerned with means—would appear to be as incapable of truth as judgments about what is good and bad. In Russell’s view, “the right act, in any given circumstances, is that which, on the data, will probably produce the greatest balance of good over evil” and the right rule or policy is likewise the one that can be expected to produce the best effects. That is, “X is right” is assertible (roughly, a sensible thing to say) when X can be expected to lead to the best results. But if “Y is good”, is really in the optative mood, amounting to the exclamation “Would that everyone desired Y!”, then “X is right” would appear to be optative too, since it comes down to something like “X leads to more of what [would that everyone desired!]”. Here, the clause in square brackets, which is obviously in the optative mood, infects the entire sentence with its optative character. “X leads to more of what [would that everyone desired!]”, in so far as it can be made sense of, does not seem to be the kind of thing that could be true or false.

However, Russell believed that judgments about what is right or what ought to be done can be given an analysis which gives them a sort of ersatz objectivity and hence the possibility of truth. If Dmitri has a reasonably determinate conception of the good, that is, a coherent set of opinions about which things are good and which bad, then although Dmitri’s opinions themselves are neither true nor false—since, despite appearances they are not really opinions at all but optative expressions of Dmitri’s desires—it can nevertheless be true or false that X is good in Dmitri’s opinion, that is, good-according-to-Dmitri. “Oh to be in England, now that April’s here!” is neither true nor false, but if I say it sincerely, it will in fact be true that I desire to be in England. Similarly, if Dmitri says that “Bungy-jumping is good” what he says won’t be true, since really it is in the optative mood, but if he says it sincerely, it will be true that Bungy-jumping is good-in-Dmitri’s-opinion, or good-according-to-Dmitri. Thus although there are no facts of the matter about which things are good or bad, there are facts of the matter about which things are believed by this or that person to be good or bad. Furthermore—and this is the crucial point—there are facts of the matter about whether a given action or a given policy is likely to promote what somebody-or-other believes to be good. Since Hitler believed that victory over Britain would be good, there was a fact of the matter about whether bombing London as opposed to bombing the RAF’s airfields would be likely bring about the states of affairs that he desired. As it turned out, the policy he pursued did not produce results that were best-according-to-Hitler. Hence if Hitler had adopted a consequentialist reading of “ought”, and had indexed it to his own requirements, “I ought to bomb London” (as said by Hitler) would have been false. And its truth or its falsehood would have been a factually arguable question.

Now, suppose we define the right act with respect to B, not as “that which, on the data, will probably produce the greatest balance of good over evil” but as “that which, on the data, will probably produce the greatest balance of what B believes to be good over what B believes to be evil”. The right rule of policy with respect to B will correspondingly be defined as the rule or policy that will probably, in the appropriate circumstances, produce the greatest balance of what B believes to be good over what B believes to be evil. Then, so long as B has a reasonably coherent set of ideals, the claim that a given act or policy is right or wrong with respect to B will usually have a determinate truth-value. Claims of the form “X is right wrt to B” will be either true or false, so long as the person (or group of persons) designated by B has a clear and consistent set of values. There will thus be a fact of the matter about whether X is right wrt to B which can be the subject of rational enquiry. And if “B” stands in for us (whoever “we” may be) and if we share a reasonably coherent set of ideals, then there will be a fact of the matter about whether X is right or wrong with respect to our ideals. Thus if there is agreement with respect to ideals and if we adopt a consequentialist conception of rightness, indexed, not to what is good, but to what we believe to be good, then we can have a rational debate—maybe even a scientific enquiry—about the rights and wrongs of actions, rules or policies, or at least about their rightness or wrongness with respect to us.

The framing of moral rules, so long as the ultimate Good is supposed known, [Russell should have said ‘supposed agreed’] is a matter for science. For example: should capital punishment be inflicted for theft, or only for murder, or not at all? Jeremy Bentham, who considered pleasure to be the Good, devoted himself to working out what criminal code would most promote pleasure, and concluded that it ought to be much less severe than that prevailing in his day. All this, except the proposition that pleasure is the Good, comes within the sphere of science. (RoE: 137–138/Religion and Science: 228–229)

Once the ends have been agreed, we can have a rational debate about the code most likely to promote those ends. In some cases, such questions can be resolved by scientific enquiry, or at any rate by statistics. But (with one or two exceptions) rational argument is only really possible when we take the ends as read and confine our attention to the means.

We are now in a position to understand Russell’s general strategy as a polemicist for moral reform and its relation to his emotivist meta-ethic.

  1. He dismisses supposed duties that cannot be given a consequentialist justification as the products of bygone superstitions or, in some cases, the ideological props to predatory elites.
  2. He uses non-rational methods to preach the goodness of some ends—a life inspired by love and guided by knowledge, mirroring the cosmos like one of Leibniz’s monads etc.—and the evil of others. This is essentially a process of getting his readers to share his desires.
  3. He then argues for his revised code of conduct as likely to promote those ends. Here there can be truth and falsehood and consequently rational argument, but only because “ought” and “right” have been given a consequentialist reading and indexed to the ends that Russell desires to promote.

7. Russell’s Ideal: the Influence of Spinoza

Before going on to discuss Russell’s meta-ethic in more detail, it is worth pausing for a moment to consider his ideal. For although Russell claimed to make his “practical moral judgments” on a “roughly hedonistic basis” (RoE: 165–6/Papers 11: 311), he was far from being an out-and out hedonist. He was, as we have seen, a utilitarian of sorts, who believed that the right thing to do is the action that, on the available evidence, seems likely to produce the best balance of good over evil consequences. Since we cannot perform the requisite calculations in every case, we need codes of conduct, though these should be taken with a pinch of salt and reassessed from time to time in the light of new information. This is sensible and humane, but perhaps a little pedestrian. However Russell’s conception of the good—the end to be promoted—is a bit more interesting. To begin with, although he valued human happiness, he did not see this in crudely hedonistic terms. However pleasurable the life of a pig may be, Russell would not have preferred the life of a pig to that of a human being. Russell also valued passion and a life which allowed for spontaneous (but “creative”) impulses. These views distinguish him from the classical utilitarians who he otherwise admired. However, the really distinctive features of Russell’s ethic were derived from Spinoza (1632–1677), who remained a philosophical hero even though Russell rejected most of his metaphysics as set out (rather confusingly) in his Ethics of 1677. There was something about Spinoza’s attitude to life that Russell regarded as profoundly right. Kenneth Blackwell calls this “the ethic of impersonal self-enlargement” (Blackwell 1985: 17). According to this ideal, the best life is lived in awareness of the Other. This includes other selves (since Russell considered a purely selfish life unfulfilling, and a life without history—which involves knowledge of other selves—drab) but also the wholly other—the non-human universe of large impersonal forces, the wind, the sea, the mountains and the stars and even (if they exist) the entities of mathematics. He felt that the self is enlarged by the contemplation of the not-self and that the person whose concerns are limited to their own states of mind has confined themself within a spiritual prison. By the same token, a philosophy that reduces reality to an emanation either of the self or of the collective reduces the self by denying it access to the Other. All this may sound unduly elevated, but in practice what this means is that the good person takes an interest in other people (including people who may not be connected with them) and in the world at large. Russell sometimes talks about contemplation in this connection, but this should not be understood as a purely passive process. The contemplative person does not just sit and stare (though Russell was not averse to this kind of contemplation) but actively seeks to know the Other through science, history and other forms of enquiry. Thus Russell’s distaste for idealism and for anti-realist and instrumentalist philosophies of science is connected with his ideal of impersonal self-enlargement. Of course Russell does not attempt to derive an Is (such as the claim that idealism or pragmatism is false) from an Ought (such as the claim that we ought to enlarge the Self through contemplation of the Other, something that would be difficult if either of these philosophies were correct). But he does suggest that there is something morally suspect, as well as wrong-headed, about attempts to reduce the vast forces of nature to human experience or to useful predictive devices enabling human beings to achieve their puny ends. For Russell the good life is a life that looks outward, which is one reason for his dislike of philosophies that diminish what is outside ourselves into something not worth looking at. (See RoE: 223–235 and, more generally, The Conquest of Happiness, 1930.)

8. Objections to Emotivism and Relativism

A we have seen, Russell’s meta-ethic was closely connected to his program of moral reform. The idea was to advocate a set of humane and egalitarian ends, using non-rational methods of persuasion, and then to argue on the basis of psychology, social science, history and common sense that that these ends would be best achieved if, on the whole, people obeyed a reformed moral code. Judgments that this or that is good or bad were to be construed as disguised optatives (“Would that everyone desired X!” and “Would that everyone desired not Y!” respectively). “Ought” and “right” were to be given a consequentialist reading and indexed to the ends that Russell hoped his audience could be persuaded to share. Thus Russell combined an emotivist analysis of “good” and “bad” with a consequentialist/relativist reading of “ought” and “right”. But was he right to do so?

Although Russell and Santayana were toying with emotivism in the 1910s, it was not until the 1930s that the theory really hit the philosophical headlines. Since then it has taken a beating, and although it still finds favor with the semi-philosophical public, it is no longer widely believed by professional philosophers. Relativism likewise is generally regarded as a down-list option, though, as with emotivism, there are one or two distinguished philosophers who are prepared to stick up for it. Does Russell’s meta-ethic stand up against the objections that have laid emotivism and relativism low?

8.1 The Vicious Circle Problem

According to Stevenson and Ayer the function of moral judgments is to express approval and disapproval. But to approve of X is to think or feel that X is good or right: to disapprove is to think or feel that it is bad or wrong. Thus the emotivist analysis of the moral terms is viciously circular. (Russell himself had developed a similar line of argument against theories which identify rightness with a tendency to arouse approval in his “The Elements of Ethics” (1912).)

This objection leaves Russell untouched. To approve of X may be to think or feel that X is good, but for Russell to think X good is not to approve of it, but to desire that everyone should desire X. Implausible as this may be, there is no circle, vicious or otherwise.

8.2 The Problem of the Disappearing Dispute

If judgments about what is good or bad in itself merely express approval and disapproval, then “X is good” said by me and “X is bad” said by you do not contradict one another. After all, I am merely expressing my feelings whilst you are expressing yours, and there is nothing remotely inconsistent about the supposition that X arouses approval in me and disapproval in you. But plainly when I call X good and you call it bad we are contradicting one other. Hence emotivism, which seems to imply otherwise, is false.

Again, Russell’s brand of emotivism is immune to this objection. According to Russell, “X is good” and “X is bad” are really in the optative mood despite their indicative appearances. As such, they express desires or wishes, and desires and wishes can, in a sense, be inconsistent with one other, namely when they are not (in Russell’s phrase) “compossible”, that is, when they cannot both be realized. “Would that I had all the ice-cream!” said by me and “Would that I had all the ice-cream!” said by you express contradictory desires since we cannot both have all the ice-cream. As such, the two optatives contradict each other, not because they describe incompatible facts but because they prescribe incompatible states of affairs. Similarly “X is good” said by me and “X is bad” said by you express contradictory desires and hence contradict each other. For “X is good” means “Would that everybody desired X!” and “X is bad” means “Would that everybody desired that not-X!”, and the desires expressed by these two optatives are not compossible, or at least, are only compossible on the condition that we all have inconsistent desires (both for X and for not-X).

But the situation is a little different when we come to judgments about what is right or what ought to be done. As we have seen, Russell is inclined to give such judgments a consequentialist reading and then to index them to some presumed set of projects. It is therefore true with respect to, say, Russell and myself that we ought to abolish the Death Penalty, since abolishing the Death Penalty is conducive to the ends that we happen to favor. But it is equally true with respect to some hardcore retributivist that we ought not to abolish the Death penalty, since it is not conducive to the eye-for-an-eye ends that she considers good. And this seems to be a problem. For when Russell and I say we ought to abolish the Death Penalty and the retributivist says we that we ought not, it seems that we are contradicting each other. Yet if the two “oughts” are indexed to different visions of the good, it seems they are quite compatible. What Russell and I are saying is that abolishing the Death Penalty can be rationally expected to maximize the things we consider good and to minimize the things that we consider evil. What the retributivist is saying (if she is a consequentialist) is that not abolishing the Death Penalty can be rationally expected to maximize the things she considers good (which include retributive punishment) and to minimize the things she considers evil (such as murderers not getting their just deserts). And these claims can both be true. Hence Russell’s theory brings about a spurious appearance of semantic harmony where in fact there is conflict and contradiction. His theory suggests that the friends and foes of the Death Penalty are not contradicting each other, when in fact it is evident that they are. Genuine disagreement would only be possible between those who agreed about the ends but disagreed about the means. Thus if (in 1940) Hitler claimed that the Luftwaffe ought to bomb London rather than the RAF airfields whilst Goering claimed that the Luftwaffe ought to bomb the RAF airfields rather than bombing London, the two would be in contradiction since their ends were presumably the same. But their views would be quite compatible with those of a pacifist who claimed that nobody ought ever to bomb anything!

Russell himself had raised much the same objection against relativist definitions of “good” and “bad” in 1912:

If in asserting that A is good, X meant merely to assert that A had a certain relation to himself such as pleasing his taste in some way [or being conducive his ends] and Y, in saying that A is not good, meant merely to deny that A had a like relation to himself; then there would be no subject of debate between them. (Philosophical Essays: 20–21/Papers 6: 222)

But, as Russell plainly believes, there is a subject of debate between them, which means that relativistic readings of “good” and “bad” must (at least sometimes) be wrong. A similar problem afflicts his own subsequent analyses of “ought” and “right”. Since their “oughts” are indexed to different ends, it seems that when the Nazi says “We ought to bomb London” and the pacifist says “Nobody ever ought to bomb anything” they are not contradicting one another, though it is as clear as daylight that they are.

Russell might reply that his suggestion is not intended as an account of what “right”, “wrong” and “ought” actually mean, but as proposal about what they ought to mean. His theory is not intended as a description of our current semantic slum, but as a scheme for linguistic reform. It may be that at present we take those whose “oughts” are indexed to different ends to be contradicting one other but Russell is hoping to change all that. Given current usage, when Hitler says “We ought to bomb London” and the pacifist says “Nobody ever ought to bomb anything”, the two claims contradict each other, but once Russell’s reform is has been implemented this disagreeable dispute will be smoothed into non-existence.

The problem with this is that Russell’s “proposal” is not a very attractive one. One of the things we want to do with moral language is express our disagreements. Russell’s new-fangled “ought” would be unable fulfill one of the most important linguistic functions of the old-fashioned “ought”, namely to express that fact that people with different ends disagree (as we would now put it) on what ought to be done. In depriving people with different ends of the means to contradict each other Russell would be doing them a disservice. Moreover, Russell would be left with a peculiarly ramshackle meta-ethic. He would have a descriptive account of what “good” and “bad” do mean and a prescriptive suggestion about the about what “right”, “wrong” and “ought” ought to mean. There is no actual inconsistency in this but it does seem to be a bit anomalous. If the name of the game is to analyze the moral concepts, then it seems Russell’s analysis of “right” and “ought” is wrong. But if the name of the game is to reform the moral concepts, then why not subject “good” and “bad” to the same treatment, giving them the kind objectivity that Russell would evidently have preferred them to have?

8.3 “Ought” and the Open Question Argument

Another problem is that the later Russell’s account of “ought”-judgments runs foul of Moore’s Open Question Argument (as his earlier self could have told him). To say that A ought to do X (with respect to B) is to say that on the available evidence A’s doing X would be most likely to maximize what some contextually specified person or group B takes to be good and to minimize what B takes to be evil. But, construed as an account of what we actually mean, this is obviously incorrect. As Russell himself had nearly put it thirty years earlier:

It is held that what we ought to do is that action, among all that are possible, which [is likely on the available evidence] to produce the best results on the whole [according to some contextually specified standard of goodness]; and this is regarded as constituting a definition of ought. I hold that this is not a definition, but a significant proposition … It might be proved, in the course of moral exhortation, that such and such an action [is likely on the available evidence to] have the best results [according to some contextually specified standard of goodness]; and yet the person exhorted might inquire why he should perform the action. The exhorter would have to reply: “Because you ought to do what [is likely to] have the best results [according to some contextually specified standard of goodness].” And this reply distinctly adds something. The same arguments by which good was shown to be indefinable can be repeated here, mutatis mutandis, to show the indefinability of ought. (RoE: 101/Papers 4: 573, somewhat modified)

Thus Russell is making exactly the same mistake that he accused Moore of making in 1904! (See above, §4).

Again Russell might reply that he is not attempting to describe how we actually use “ought” but making a suggestion about “ought” should be used. But if we are to ring out the old “ought” and ring in the new, we need to be assured that this would be a good idea. And that requires something rather more solid in the way of a cost/benefit analysis than Russell manages to supply.

8.4 The Problem of Validity

It is a common complaint against emotivism that it precludes the possibility of moral arguments that are valid in a non-trivial sense. An argument is formally valid if and only if, no matter how the non-logical vocabulary is interpreted, the premises cannot be true and the conclusion false. But if the premises of a moral argument are not truth-apt—if they are semantically incapable of truth or falsity—then all moral arguments, no matter how obviously “illogical” they may appear, will be trivially valid, since the premises cannot be true! We can avoid this absurdity by making explicit what the standard definition of validity presupposes—that an argument cannot be a candidate for validity unless the premises and the conclusions are both truth-apt. But if we do that, moral arguments cease to be candidates for validity, no matter how logically impeccable they may appear to be. Stevenson (1944: 154–159) accepts this conclusion as a consequence of his theory, but to the rest of us it seems a very large dead rat to swallow.

Russell is immune to this argument as regards “ought”, “right” and “wrong” since in his view ought-judgments are susceptible to truth and falsity. “It is wrong (wrt to B) to kill the innocent” is a truth-apt expression. Hence the argument “It is wrong (wrt to B) to kill the innocent; to bomb the village would be to kill the innocent: therefore it is wrong (wrt to B) to bomb the village”, is a candidate for validity, and is in fact, valid. To argue from the same premises that it would be right (wrt B) to bomb the village would be obviously fallacious.

But what about this argument?

  1. It is good to contemplate whatever is beautiful;
  2. Michelangelo’s David is beautiful;


  1. It is good to contemplate Michelangelo’s David.

Isn’t it obviously valid? And wouldn’t it be obviously invalid to conclude from the same premises that contemplating Michelangelo’s David would be bad? Yet if arguments involving “good” are not even candidates for validity, it appears that the two arguments are on a par!

This is a telling objection against some forms of emotivism which portray moral judgments as mere expressions of raw feeling, analogous to cries of ecstasy or groans of pain. But Russell is better placed to meet this difficulty, since in his view judgments about what is ultimately good and bad are disguised optatives, designed to express desires or wishes of a certain kind. And it is possible to construct a rudimentary concept of logical consequence (and hence of validity) that applies to arguments in the optative mood. Sentences in the optative have fulfillment conditions just as sentences in the indicative have truth-conditions. To understand an optative sentence is a) to understand that it is in the optative and b) to understand what the world would have to be like to satisfy the desires or the wishes expressed. Just as indicative validity can be defined in terms of truth, optative validity can be defined in terms of fulfillment. (It would be nice to talk of “satisfaction” rather than “fulfillment” here, but the word “satisfaction” has been preempted to stand for a different but related notion.) An optative sentence Q is the logical consequence of a set of optative sentences P and a (possibly empty) set of factual sentences C, if and only if, however the non-logical vocabulary is interpreted, the desires expressed in P cannot be fulfilled under the circumstances described in C unless the desire expressed by Q is fulfilled too. An optative argument is valid if the conclusion is an optative consequence of the premises; invalid otherwise. Hence there can be valid (and invalid!) arguments about goodness as well as logical relations between the relevant sentences. Thus our argument becomes:

Would that everyone desired to contemplate whatever is beautiful!
Michelangelo’s David is beautiful.
Would that everyone desired to contemplate Michelangelo’s David!

This is not perhaps a very plausible reconstruction of the original argument, but it is logically valid in the sense defined. For the wish expressed at premise 1′) cannot be fulfilled under the factual conditions specified at premise 2′) without fulfilling the wish expressed at the conclusion 3′).

8.5 Geach’s Problem

But there is another broadly logical objection to emotivism that is much more difficult for Russell to meet. The objection was first mooted by W.D. Ross (1939) but it was reinvented and refined by P.T. Geach (1960, 1965), who modestly attributes it to Frege. Consider the following obviously valid argument:

It is always good to contemplate beautiful works of art.
If it is always good to contemplate beautiful works of art, then it is good to contemplate Michelangelo’s David.


It is good to contemplate Michelangelo’s David.

In this argument, the sentence “It is always good to contemplate beautiful works of art”, occurs twice. In (1) it occurs by itself as an assertion; in (2) it occurs unasserted as part of a larger sentence. We know what the sentence is supposed to mean at its first occurrence—despite its indicative appearance it is really in the optative mood and expresses a wish: “Would that everyone always desired to desire to contemplate beautiful works of art!”. But what about its second occurrence where it appears as the antecedent to a conditional? Is it expressing that wish there? Surely not. For someone can subscribe to the conditional (2) whilst rejecting the relevant wish. For example, we can imagine somebody reasoning like this:

It is not good to contemplate Michelangelo’s David [perhaps because it arouses unhealthy sexual appetites for strapping fifteen-year-olds].
If it is always good to contemplate beautiful works of art, then it is good to contemplate Michelangelo’s David.


It is not always good to contemplate beautiful works of art.

The person who accepts this argument clearly does not wish that everyone should always desire to contemplate beautiful works of art. But she subscribes to premise (2) nonetheless. Thus the sentence “it is always good to contemplate beautiful works of art”, cannot generally be construed as an optative when it occurs in an embedded context (that is when it occurs as a sub-sentence within a larger, more complex sentence). This is already a very damaging objection to Russell’s theory of how “good” functions, since it shows that the theory is radically incomplete. Russell can only account for a very restricted class of cases, namely those in which sentences of the form “X is good” are used by themselves to make an assertion, not the numerous cases in which such sentences occur, unasserted, as components of larger sentences. (It is, so to speak, a theory of the semantic atoms that cannot account for their role within semantic molecules.) But there is worse to come. Suppose Russell added one or more epicycles to his theory to explain how “X is good” manages to be meaningful in unasserted contexts. The revised theory would have to distinguish between different uses of “good”, giving one account for asserted contexts and a different account (or set of accounts) for the unasserted contexts. Thus “X is good” would sometimes be a disguised optative and sometimes something else. (Never mind what—it does not really matter.) Now, consider the following argument schema:

  1. X is good.
  2. If X is good then Q.


  1. Q

In this argument “X is good” would have one meaning in premise (i)—in which it would be an optative—and another in premise (ii)—in which it would be a creature of some other semantic kind. (I have emphasized the point by putting the first occurrence in italics and the second in bold.) But an argument is only valid if the words involved retain the same meanings throughout the inference. If not, we have an instance of the fallacy of equivocation. So it looks as if any attempt to deal with Geach’s first problem by explaining how “good” works in unasserted contexts would have the unintended side-effect of converting obviously valid arguments such as the above into instances of equivocation. Not only is the theory radically incomplete—if it were completed, it would reduce a huge number of obviously valid arguments to invalidity by construing them as equivocal.

This is, perhaps, the leading problem for non-cognitivist or expressivist theories of value and a vast amount of ink has been spilt trying to solve it. (See, for instance, A. Miller, 2013, Contemporary Metaethics: an Introduction, 2nd edn: 6, 37–9, 53–67, 68, 70–1, 73, 79n23, 89–102, 118, 127–32 & 245 and Schroeder, 2010, Non-Cognitivism in Ethics: chs. 3, 4 & 7.) It would take me too far afield to discuss the matter in detail. Suffice to say that Russell’s theory faces ship-wreck unless this problem can be solved and, in my opinion, the problem is insoluble.

8.6 Commitment and Inconsistency

I am accused of inconsistency, perhaps justly, because, although I hold ultimate ethical valuations to be subjective, I nevertheless allow myself emphatic opinions on ethical questions.

Thus wrote Russell in reply to critics who thought that his emotivism precluded him from being so relentlessly preachy. There was, they thought, some kind of pragmatic inconsistency between vehement moral opinions (frequently voiced) and meta-ethical emotivism (RoE: 145–150/Papers 11: 48–52). Russell makes short work of this. In his view the function of the words “good” and “bad” is to express certain kinds of desires. Since he had the relevant desires there was no inconsistency in his using “good” and “bad” to express the desires that they were designed to express. There is nothing inconsistent about using a piece of verbal machinery to do what you think it is designed to do.

I am quite at a loss to understand why any one should be surprised at my expressing vehement ethical judgments. By my own theory, I am, in doing so, expressing vehement desires as to the desires of mankind; I feel such desires, so why not express them?

Nor (as he might have added) is there any inconsistency between Russell’s meta-ethical emotivism and his moral and political activism. To think, for example, that nuclear war would be bad is to desire that everyone not desire it, a desire that presumably springs from a first-order desire that there should be no such thing. In trying to avert nuclear war, therefore, Russell was acting on a desire that for him had a high priority. Which looks like an eminently rational thing to do.

8.7 Russell’s Feelings and the Duck Argument

But in defending himself against the charge of inconsistency, Russell makes a crucial concession.

But what are “good” desires? Are they anything more than desires that you share? Certainly there seems to be something more … In opposing the proposal [to introduce bull-fighting into America], I should feel, not only that I was expressing my desires, but that my desires in the matter are right, whatever that may mean.

What exactly is it that Russell feels? That those who think bull-fighting is good (and therefore desire it) are making some kind of mistake and conversely that those think that bull-fighting is bad (and are therefore opposed to it) are in some sense getting it right. Thus the “something more” that Russell could not help feeling was that his views about the badness of bullfighting were true and the views of the imaginary bull-fighting aficionados false. But how can that be if “bull-fighting is bad,” really is in the optative? For a sentence to be true or false it must be semantically capable of truth and falsity or, as the current jargon has it, truth-apt. Thus in admitting that he could not help feeling that he would be right (that is, correct) to oppose bull-fighting in America, Russell, was admitting to feelings which suggest that his meta-ethic is false. Moreover the very fact that he had these feelings provides evidence for his theory’s falsehood. Consider “Oh to be in England, now that April’s here!”, a sentence that is clearly in the optative (except for the bit about April’s being here). It is hard to see how anybody who understood this sentence could coherently feel or think it to be true or false. Its optative character is obvious (to those who understand English) and the fact that it is in the optative excludes the possibility of truth and falsehood. Since Russell was inclined to feel that “Bull-fighting is bad” is true, and since this is not an incoherent thing to feel or think, this strongly suggests that “bull-fighting is bad”, unlike “Oh to be in England!”, is not in the optative mood.

Indeed there is something odd about the very idea of a disguised optative. Of course, it is possible to give orders or express wishes by means of sentences that are grammatically in the indicative mood. Henry IV’s “You have good leave to leave us”, is grammatically in the indicative but it is merely a slightly less curt variant of the obviously imperative “Worcester, get thee gone” (Shakespeare, Henry IV, 1.3). But when we use indicatives to express wishes or convey commands we are engaging in communicative acts which would misfire badly if the people we were talking to failed to get the point. Even if King Henry had confined himself to “You have good leave to leave us”, omitting the explicitly imperative “Worcester, get thee gone”, Worcester would have had to be singularly obtuse not to realize that he was being ordered to leave. Competent speakers are usually well aware when a grammatically indicative sentence is being used to give a command or express a desire (indeed, this is one of the criteria of linguistic competence!). But it is Russell’s hypothesis that, despite appearances, “X is good” (in the sense of good as an end) is exclusively in the optative mood even though, for most people, it is neither intended nor interpreted as such. We have been good-ing and bad-ing things up and down for hundreds of years whilst radically misunderstanding the meanings of our own utterances. To suppose this is to suppose that meaning is independent of our collective intentions, which is a very large dead rat to swallow. Russell might reply that our usage belies our stated intentions, that we use “X is good” as if it were in the optative, and that despite our protestations to the contrary, his theory provides the best explanation of our actual use. The problem with this reply is that it is based on an obviously false premise. We don’t in fact use “X is good” as if it were in the optative mood—we treat as if it were truth-apt. This brings me to the most obvious and perhaps the most compelling objection to emotivism—what I like to call the Duck Argument.

The main problem for most forms of non-cognitivism is that moral judgments look and behave like propositions—that is, in this connection, the kinds of things that can be true or false. They have, as the jargon has it, a “propositional surface”. We claim that such sentences are true or false, we speak of knowing the difference between good and bad, right and wrong (where knowledge would appear to entail truth), we wonder whether our ethical opinions are right or wrong (in the sense of correct or incorrect) and believe that we or others are, or at least may be, mistaken in our moral beliefs (in the sense that they may be false). All this is difficult to make sense of except on the assumption that moral judgments are what they appear to be—statements which express beliefs, describe some purported facts and are therefore capable of truth and falsity. The argument does not show that there are such facts (after all, much the same points could be made about theological discourse, and a set of truth-apt sentences cannot conjure God into existence). It could be that there are no moral facts corresponding to our opinions and thus that they are predominately false, like the propositions of Greek mythology. But the way we talk strongly suggests that our moral pronouncements are in the true/false game, and thus that they are truth-apt or truth-valued. If something looks like a duck, swims like a duck and quacks like a duck, then the chances are that it is indeed a duck! Likewise, if something looks like a truth-apt expression (since on the surface it is in the indicative mood), if it behaves logically like a truth-apt expression (which again is what “X is good” undoubtedly does), if it is treated by the people whose use sustains its meaning as if it were truth-apt, then, absent compelling arguments to the contrary, it probably is truth-apt.

8.8 Objections Concluded

Thus Russell’s brand of emotivism is subject to devastating objections, some of which he was aware of. Moreover he was not that keen on it. Although he thought he could show that

I am not guilty of any logical inconsistency in holding to [emotivism] and at the same time expressing strong ethical preferences … in feeling I am not satisfied. (RoE: 149/Papers 11: 51)

In particular, he found himself “incapable of believing that all that is wrong with wanton cruelty is that I don’t like it”. Why then was he an emotivist? Because he could not “see how to refute the arguments for the subjectivity of ethical values” (RoE: 165/Papers 11: 310–311). What were these arguments and why did Russell find them so compelling?

9. Objections to Objectivism

“When I was young,” writes Russell,

I agreed with G.E. Moore in believing in the objectivity of good and evil. Santayana’s criticism in a book called Winds of Doctrine, [which Russell read in 1913] caused me to abandon this view, though I have never been able to be as bland and comfortable about it as he was. (Portraits from Memory: 91)

As a piece of intellectual autobiography this is not very illuminating. Santayana’s book abounds in mellifluous sneers, but arguments are conspicuous by their absence. Russell’s reasons for rejecting a non-natural property of goodness have to be reconstructed from literary asides, delivered in passing in the course of his anti-War polemics.

9.1 Persecution, Punishment and the Subjectivity of Value

However, Santayana does give one reason, not for doubting the existence of the Moorean Good, but for wishing that nobody believed in it. The idea that there are objective moral facts breeds intolerance and fanaticism. Accordingly, the rejection of this idea “would tend to render people more truly social”, specifically, more tolerant. “Moral warfare would continue”, he writes, “but not with poisoned arrows.” Russell came to agree, especially after the outbreak of World War I.

My H[erbert] S[pencer] lecture was partly inspired by disgust at the universal outburst of righteousness in all nations since the war began. It seems the essence of virtue is persecution, and it has given me a disgust of all ethical notions, which evidently are chiefly useful as an excuse for murder. (Letter to Samuel Alexander, 5/2/1915, RoE: 107/Papers 8: 56)

There is something rather paradoxical about this, since Russell was firmly convinced of the rightness of his own anti-War activities: “When the War came, I felt as if I heard the voice of God. I knew it was my business to protest, however futile protest might be” (Autobiography II: 18). If there are no objective moral properties, there is no such thing as moral knowledge, which means that Russell cannot have literally known that he ought to protest. At best he could have known that he ought to protest given his values. But though he sometimes seems to talk as if it is objectively wrong to believe in objective values, Russell’s position is (or can be made to be) coherent. It might just be a fact that moral realists tend to be more intolerant and cruel than moral relativists and anti-realists. Hence those who dislike intolerance and cruelty have a reason for running down objectivity. As Russell himself put it,

for my part, I should wish to see in the world less cruelty, persecution, punishment, and moral reprobation than exists at present; to this end, I believe that a recognition of the subjectivity of ethics might conduce. (RoE: 117/Papers 13: 326)

The word “recognition” suggests that the “subjectivity of ethics” is true, and thus that there is no such thing as a non-natural property of goodness. But setting the success-word to one side, it might be the case that we would be better off believing in the subjectivity of ethics since believing in objective values leads to persecution, punishment, cruelty and moral reprobation. It might pay in terms of peace, love and understanding if people came to believe Russell’s brand of emotivism. But the fact that a belief pays, in some sense, does not make it true, as Russell himself was at pains to point out (see Philosophical Essays, chs. iv & v). So even if we would be better off believing that there were no objective values (a thesis Russell later came to doubt), this does not prove that there are no such things.

9.2 Russell and the Argument from Relativity

So what were Russell’s reasons for rejecting a non-natural property of goodness? One argument, subsequently popularized by J.L. Mackie (1977) as “the Argument from Relativity”, starts with the diversity of moral opinion and the supposed impossibility of proof when it comes to ultimate values.

If our views as to what ought to be done were to be truly rational, we ought to have a rational way of ascertaining what things are such as ought to exist on their own account [that is, what things are good] …. On [this] point, no argument is possible. There can be nothing beyond an appeal to individual tastes. If, for example, one man thinks vindictive punishment desirable in itself, apart from any reformatory or deterrent effects, while another man thinks it undesirable in itself, it is impossible to bring any arguments in support of either side. (RoE: 112/Papers 13: 186)

Now it is, of course, a consequence of Russell’s later view both a) that it is impossible to have a rational argument about “what things are such as ought to exist on their own account” and b) that in such disputes there can be nothing beyond “an appeal to individual tastes”. But though you can argue from emotivism and the non-existence of objective goodness to the truth of a) and b), can you argue from a) and b) to the non-existence of objective goodness?

The argument, I suggest, is best construed as an inference to the best explanation. The best explanation of a) that it is impossible to have a rational argument about what is good or bad in itself and b) that in such disputes there can be nothing beyond “an appeal to individual tastes” is the hypothesis c) that there is nothing objective to disagree about since there is no such thing as goodness—rather our opinions on these topics are somehow dependent on, or expressive of, our disparate desires and perhaps our diverse upbringings.

Is this a good argument? Not by itself, no. For it is not clear that theses a) and b) represent genuine facts. And even if a) and b) are true and do represent genuine facts, is c) the best explanation? Perhaps there is a property of goodness but it happens to be a property that it is difficult to discern. Some people are just better at seeing what is good or bad than others. As Russell himself put it in 1909 “the difficulty of discovering the truth does not prove that there is no truth to be discovered” (Philosophical Essays: 20/Papers 6: 222).

However, the Argument From Relativity looks a little better if we follow Russell’s hints and combine it with the Argument from Explanatory Impotence.

9.3 Russell and Explanatory Impotence

In his polemical article “North Staffs’ Praise of War” (1916) Russell suggests an argument which prefigures a famous argument of Gilbert Harman’s 1977. (It is typical of Russell, incidentally, that he develops his meta-ethical position in the course of a newspaper controversy about the rights and wrongs of World War I rather than in an article in an academic journal.)

I have been led to [the view that all ethics is subjective] by a number of reasons, some logical, some derived from observation. Occam’s Razor … leads me to discard the notion of absolute good if ethics can be accounted for without it. Observation of ethical valuations leads me to think that all ethical valuations can be so accounted for, and that the claim of universality which men associate with their ethical judgments embodies merely the impulse to persecution or tyranny. (RoE: 117/Papers 13: 325–6)

The idea seems to be that our moral evaluations—our beliefs about what is good or bad, wrong or right—can be explained without supposing that they correspond to facts involving Moorean properties of “absolute” goodness or badness. And since our evaluations can be accounted for without supposing that there are any such properties, and since the only reason for we believing in them is the evidence of our evaluations, we have no reason to suppose that such properties exist, and some reasons (of an Occamist sort) for supposing that they do not.

As it stands, this argument is inconclusive. For a Moorean might simply hang tough, insisting that his own views about goodness are best explained by close encounters of the Platonic kind, involving an intimate acquaintance with both goodness itself and the properties on which it supervenes. Of course, it is difficult to make naturalistic sense of such cognitions, but it is difficult to make naturalistic sense of our knowledge of logic, mathematics and modality. This is the “companions in guilt” strategy that is often deployed in arguing for moral objectivity (for more on which, see Lillehammer 2007). However the Argument from Explanatory Impotence gets a little stronger if we combine it with the Argument from Relativity. For the fact is that people often disagree about what is intrinsically good or bad, about how good or bad the good things and the bad things really are, and about the relations between goodness and badness and what we ought to do. We have already seen that Russell disagreed with Moore about whether we ought to do that action that will actually bring about the best consequences or the action that it is reasonable to believe will bring about the best consequences, which means that they had different intuitions about the relations between goodness and obligation. Moore disagreed with Sidgwick about whether anything besides pleasure is good as an end:

This proposition that “pleasure alone is good as an end,” the fundamental proposition of Ethical Hedonism [is] in Professor Sidgwick’s language, … an object of intuition. I shall try to shew you why my intuition denies it, just as his intuition affirms it. It may always be true notwithstanding; neither intuition can prove whether it is true or not; I am bound to be satisfied, if I can “present considerations capable of determining the intellect” to reject it. (PE: §45)

More comically, the Cambridge Apostles seem to have had a serious disagreement in 1899 about whether “self-abuse” was bad in itself, Moore intuiting that it was and his opponents arguing that it was not (Levy 1981: 207–8). Now, how could Moore explain the intuitions of his opponents? Not by an encounter with badness, since anybody fully acquainted with badness and its relata would have been forced to admit that self-abuse was bad. The non-natural facts being impotent in this particular, he would have been driven back on natural causes (such as a taste for self-abuse) to explain the misperceptions of his degenerate opponents. Thus he would have been forced to admit that some moral evaluations could be explained without the aid of non-natural properties. But once this is admitted, a “Why stop there?” problem opens up. For after all, it would have been child’s play for his opponents to return the compliment, Moore’s self-denying intuitions being the obvious products of a Puritanical upbringing. Once we admit that some moral intuitions can be explained by natural, as opposed to non-natural, causes—which seems pretty obvious given the prevalence of moral “error”—it is hard to hold the line and insist that there are any of them that cannot be accounted for by temperament, upbringing, desire and taste. It is possible, of course, that some moral evaluations are due to natural, and some to non-natural, causes, but given that everybody admits that many of our intuitions can be given a naturalistic explanation (namely, the mistaken ones), Occam’s razor suggests that there is no need for the non-natural to explain those moral intuitions that we regard as correct. When supplemented by Relativity (which is what Russell seems to be hinting at) Explanatory Impotence provides a powerful argument against non-natural properties.

9.4 Emotivism or the Error Theory?

Thus Russell’s explicit arguments for the “subjectivity of value” are objections to objectivism rather than arguments for a rival hypothesis. Moore’s theory is wrong since it presupposes non-existent non-natural properties of goodness and badness. But if naturalism is not an option, that still leaves two alternatives—some kind of non-cognitivism or an error-theory (see §1). Russell’s dominant view was to be a form of emotivism, and hence of non-cognitivism. But although emotivism was Russell’s dominant view from 1913 onwards, there were two significant wobbles. In 1922 he proposed a version of the error theory, anticipating J. L. Mackie by over twenty years. And in 1954 in Human Society in Ethics and Politics, he endeavored to inject a little objectivity into ethics by developing a form of naturalism. The first wobble is more interesting than the second, but neither should be neglected in an account of Russell’s ethics, even though Russell abandoned the theory of HSEP within weeks of publication, reverting to the emotivism of 1935.

10. Russell’s Error-Theoretic Wobble: There Is No Absolute Good

“Is There an Absolute Good?” was apparently delivered on the 14th of March 1922 at special meeting of the Apostles (RoE: 122–124/Papers 9: 345–346). Russell opens up in the fine, flippant style that the Apostles tended to admire:

When the generation to which I belong were young, Moore persuaded us all that there is an absolute good. Most of us drew the inference that we were absolutely good, but this is not an essential part of Moore’s position, though it is one of its most attractive parts.

But he soon gets down to philosophical business in what must be one of the pithiest meta-ethical papers on record (it is a mere 809 words long). Moore is right, he says, in thinking that “when we say a thing is good we do not merely mean that we have towards it a certain feeling, of liking or approval or what not.” Indeed “ethical judgments claim objectivity”; that is, they purport to tell it like it is. However, this “claim [to] objectivity … makes them all false”. Since there is no property of goodness corresponding to the linguistic predicate “good”, nothing can ever possess it. Hence, any claim that friendship or anything else is good will be false, since there is no such thing as goodness for friendship or pleasure to be. The same goes for badness. Moreover, if there is no such thing as goodness or badness, there is no such thing as rightness either, since for an action to be genuinely right it must be such that it can reasonably be expected to produce more good and less bad than any alternative. But if there is no such thing as goodness to be produced, no action can be expected to produce more of it than any other. Of course, an action can still be relatively right: more likely to produce more of what somebody believes to be good and less of what somebody believes to be bad than any alternative. But no action can be genuinely right or genuinely obligatory, since there are no such properties as goodness or badness for conscientious agents to maximize or minimize.

Thus far this is very like the error theory of J.L. Mackie (Mackie 1946, 1977: ch. 1 and Joyce 2001). But there is a twist. For Mackie, as for Russell, “good” is a meaningful predicate even though there is no property corresponding to the word. But Mackie, unlike Russell, is unfazed by this fact. So far as Mackie is concerned, meaningful predicates that refer to non-existent properties pose no particular problems. But for Russell, we can only talk meaningfully about non-existent things if they are defined in terms of things with which we are acquainted. This is a consequence of his Fundamental Principle that

every proposition that we can understand must be composed wholly of constituents with which we are acquainted (Mysticism and Logic: 209/Papers 6: 154)

or, as he was later to put it,

that sentences we can understand must be composed of words with whose meaning we are acquainted. (Schilpp (ed.) 1944: 692/Papers 11: 27)

According to Russell, it

seems natural to infer, as Moore did, that, since propositions in which the word “good” occurs have meaning, the word “good” [itself] has [a] meaning.

This, however, is a “fallacy”. Even though “good” can appear in meaningful sentences it does not have a meaning of its own. This is very puzzling. What does Russell mean when he says that “good” has no meaning? And why is Moore’s view dependent on the thesis that it does?

Let us start with Moore. As stated above (§2.1), Moore’s Open Question Argument goes like this:

  1. “Are X things good?” is a significant or open question for any naturalistic or metaphysical predicate “X”; (whether simple or complex).
  2. If two expressions (whether simple or complex) are synonymous this is evident on reflection to every competent speaker.
  3. The meaning of a predicate or property word is the property for which it stands. Thus if two predicates or property words have distinct meanings they name distinct properties.

From (1) and (2) it follows that

  1. “Good” is not synonymous with any naturalistic or metaphysical predicate “X” (or “goodness” with any corresponding noun or noun-phrase “X-ness”).

From (3) and (4) it follows that

  1. Goodness is not identical with any natural or metaphysical property of X-ness.

Premise (3) is crucial. Moore takes it for granted that the meaning of a predicate is the property for which it stands. Hence, if there were no property of goodness corresponding to the word “good”, “good” would be meaningless. Since “good” is quite obviously not meaningless, the corresponding property is guaranteed. Thus we move from an obvious semantic fact—that “good” is plainly meaningful—to a much more contentious metaphysical claim—that there is a corresponding property of goodness. What greases the wheels of this transition is the apparently innocuous assumption that if a word like “good” is to mean something, there must be some thing (or at least some property) that it means. If this doctrine were true, then the objections to objectivism discussed in the last section would fall to the ground. The very fact that we can talk meaningfully about goodness would show that there must indeed be such a property. It might be causally impotent and metaphysically queer, but the fact that we can discuss it would entail that we were stuck with it anyway.

To the end of his days Russell believed that

there are words which are only significant because there is something that they mean, and if there were not this something, they would be empty noises not words. (Russell 1959: 177)

But when he was young he thought that most words were like this, which explains the swollen ontology of The Principles of Mathematics:

Homeric gods, relations, chimeras and four-dimensional spaces all have being, for if they were not entities of a kind, we could make no propositions about them. (Russell, The Principles of Mathematics: 449)

The breakthrough came with his Theory of Definite Descriptions (1905). Phrases such as “the present King of France” are incomplete symbols, which can function meaningfully in the context of a sentence even though there may be nothing that they mean. They are incomplete because they have no meaning when taken in isolation and in the context of a sentence can be analyzed away. When “the King of France is bald” is analyzed in accordance with Russell’s formula—“There is something which is King of France such that if anything is King of France, it is identical with that thing, and that thing is bald”—the phrase “the King of France” simply disappears, though we are left with the predicate “is King of France”. “The King of France is bald”, is false because there is no King of France—nothing which satisfies the propositional function being king of France—and there is no need to suppose that the King of France must have some kind of being in order for this proposition to make sense.

This brings us back to the Open Question Argument. So far as I can see, Russell continued to accept premises (1) and (2) and thus—with reservations—sub-conclusion (4). “Good” does not mean that same as any naturalistic predicate X—at least, it does not mean the same as any of the naturalistic predicates that have been suggested so far. But he also accepts something like premise (3), that the meaning of a predicate is the property for which it stands. It was because he believed that some predicates were among the words “which are only significant because there is something that they mean”, and which would be “empty noises not words” in the absence of this something, that he continued to believe in properties, right up until 1959. How then can Russell fend off Moore’s conclusion (5) that there is a property of goodness that is not identical to any naturalistic property of X-ness? By modifying premise (3):

The meaning of a predicate or property word is the property for which it stands, so long as that predicate is a complete symbol.

Some predicates are not complete symbols, and these can function meaningfully in the absence of the properties that they might denote. One of these predicates is the word “good”.

Without the theory of incomplete symbols, it seemed natural to infer, as Moore did, that, since propositions in which the word “good” occurs have meaning, therefore the word “good” has meaning [or as we might now say, a referent]; but this was a fallacy.

My point is that the word “good” does not stand for a predicate [by which Russell means a property] at all, but has a meaning only in the sense in which descriptive phrases have meaning, i.e., in use, not in isolation.

Thus “good” can be meaningful in the absence of a property of goodness and the error theory is safe from semantic refutation.

But Russell is not quite out of the woods. He continued to believe in his Fundamental Principle that to understand a proposition we must be acquainted with the referents of the words that remain once the proposition has been boiled down to its ultimate constituents. This means, in effect, that things which don’t exist have to be defined in terms of things which do, indeed, that things which don’t exist have to be defined terms of things (including universals) with which we are acquainted. How then is “good” to be defined? More pedantically, how are sentences involving “good” to be analyzed so that the word “good” can be eliminated? According to Russell,

when we judge “M is good”, we mean: “M has that predicate [property] which is common to A, B, C, …[the things we approve of] but is absent in X, Y, Z, …[the things we disapprove of].”

The emotions of approval and disapproval, Russell notes,

do not enter into the meaning of the proposition “M is good”, but only into its genesis.

That is, “good” is defined in terms of the things that we approve (and disapprove) of, even though the fact that we approve (or disapprove) of them is not incorporated into the analysis. Now, in Russell’s opinion, the proposition

M has that property which is common to A, B, C, … [the things we approve of] but is absent in X, Y, Z, … [the things we disapprove of],

will be always be false since the things we approve of have nothing in common apart from the fact that we approve of them. That is why “all propositions in which the word ‘good’ has a primary occurrence are false.” But will such propositions in fact be false? Surely X, Y, Z, etc. do have a property in common, namely the property of being X or Y or Z or …! Perhaps Russell would reply that disjunctive properties are not real properties. He took a dim view of disjunctive facts in The Philosophy of Logical Atomism, and if disjunctive facts should be rejected, then disjunctive properties would appear to be equally suspect (Papers 8: 185–6/The Philosophy of Logical Atomism: 71–72). Even so, we cannot be sure that in every case the things that we approve of don’t have something in common other than a) the fact that we approve of them and b) that they satisfy a disjunctive predicate. Nor is this the only problem. Though Russell defines “good” in terms of the things that “we” approve (and disapprove) of, what he seems to mean is that each person defines “good” in terms of the things that he or she approves (or disapproves) of. Thus if you and I approve of different things, when I say “M is good” and you say “M is not good” what I mean is that M has the property shared by X, Y, Z … [the things that I approve of] whereas what you mean is that is that it does not have the property shared by A, B, C … [the things that you approve of]. But in that case the Problem of the Disappearing Dispute rears its ugly head. On Russell’s theory my “M is good” and your “M is not good” may be quite consistent. But since they are obviously not consistent, there must be something wrong with Russell’s theory. We can put the point by paraphrasing Russell’s own criticisms of simple subjectivism:

If in asserting that A is good, [a person] X meant merely to assert that A had a certain relation to himself such as pleasing his taste in some way [or that A had a characteristic shared by the things of which he approved] and Y, in saying that A is not good, meant merely to deny that A had a like relation to himself [or to deny that A had the characteristic shared by the things of which he, Y, approved]; then there would be no subject of debate between them. (Philosophical Essays: 20–21/Papers 6: 222)

Nor is this all. As we saw in §8.1, our moral sentiments are partly constituted by our moral beliefs. What distinguishes approval from a warm feeling of liking is not some difference in phenomenological flavor but the thought that the thing we approve of is good or right. Our moral sentiments are feelings that, where what follows the “that” is a moral judgment. But if we can’t have feelings of approval or disapproval without the corresponding moral beliefs, we can’t explain the intellectual origins of the common conceptions of goodness and badness in terms of pre-existing sentiments of approval or disapproval. For prior to these conceptions there were no such sentiments. This is not the criticism that sank the emotivist theories of Ayer and Stevenson. The problem is not that Russell’s analysis of “good” is viciously circular because it presupposes the very concept that it purports to explicate. The problem is that his genealogy of “good” is viciously circular (and therefore false) since it presupposes the concept it purports to explain. For in his capacity as an error-theorist Russell does not define “good” and “bad” in terms of approval and disapproval. Rather he gives a genealogy of these notions in which the feelings of approval and disapproval play a crucial part. As he himself puts it: “the emotions of approval and disapproval do not enter into the meaning of the proposition ‘M is good’, but only into its genesis”. But our concepts of “good” and “bad” cannot be caused by prior feelings of approval and disapproval if those feelings are partly constituted by the very beliefs they are supposed to cause. My belief that M is good cannot be caused by tendency to approve of M, if I cannot approve of M without believing that M is good.

However, the real difficulty with Russell’s error theory and the one which probably weighed with Russell himself, seems to be this. Given Russell’s theory of meaning, he can make sense of non-existent properties but not non-natural predicates. At least, he cannot make sense of predicates that are not definable in terms of things with which we are acquainted. Thus on the assumption that we are not acquainted with goodness (which we obviously cannot be if there is really no such thing), and on the assumption that “good” cannot defined in terms of the things with which we are acquainted (which seems pretty plausible if is not equivalent to any naturalistic predicate) then we cannot even understand the predicate “good”. At least, we cannot understand it, if it is construed as a descriptive predicate whose function it is to denote a property (whether real or non-existent).

After 1922, Russell abandoned the error theory and reverted to the emotivism that he had been flirting with since 1913. His reasons remain obscure. But perhaps it had something to do with the fact that his Fundamental Principle, when combined with the OQA, made it difficult, if not impossible, to make sense of “good” as standing for a property that is both non-existent and non-natural. Since he retained his faith in the Fundamental Principle he had to give up the error theory. And since he had already rejected the objectivity of ethics—what we would nowadays describe as moral realism—this left him no alternative but some form of non-cognitivsm. In my opinion this was the wrong choice. He would have done better to give up the Fundamental Principle and stick with the error theory. But perhaps the thesis that moral judgments are mostly false was a bit too much for a dedicated moralist such as he. As he wrote to his brother, he would rather “be mad with truth than sane with lies” and the idea that morality was largely composed of lies—or a best useful fictions—would have been too much to bear (see Pigden (ed.) 1999: 20, 121–122, & 189–193).

11. Russell’s Humean Wobble: Human Society in Ethics and Politics

Russell’s Human Society is a fun book to read, but meta-ethically it is a bit of a mess. There is much wit and some wisdom, though both the wit and the wisdom are more conspicuous when he is discussing human nature and human society than when he is discussing the finer points of ethical theory. (I particularly like his frequent complaints that human behavior seldom rises to the level of enlightened self-interest. If only we could manage to be intelligently selfish, the world would be a much better place.) The drift of the argument is sometimes difficult to discern, partly because of has frequent digressions to make bon mots, and partly because of his dialectical method of presentation, which approaches what he takes to be the truth via a series of successive approximations. Human Society in Ethics and Politics was published in 1954, but the meta-ethical bits were originally written some years earlier and intended for inclusion in Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits (1948). Russell held them back because he was not sure whether ethical propositions rose to the dignity of knowledge. He continued to be doubtful about this, but by the early 1950s his doubts had sufficiently dissipated for publication to become a possibility. Nevertheless, there are marked analogies between the two books. Human Knowledge attempts to establish the existence of a mind-independent world on the basis of private perceptions. Human Society attempts to establish an ethic that is in some degree independent of individual minds on the basis of subjective sentiments.

Hume looms large in Russell’s Human Knowledge. Indeed the whole book can be seen as an attempt to concede the premises of Hume’s skeptical argument—that the data we start with are private and personal and that we cannot infer an external world from such data by means of demonstrative inference—whilst resisting its conclusion—that we can have no knowledge of an external world. (Hence the need for non-demonstrative inference.) But although Hume was Russell’s chief opponent in Human Knowledge, he was perhaps a meta-ethical ally in Human Society. In the Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Moral, Hume sought to base an inter-subjective ethic on human sentiments, specifically the sentiments of approbation and disapprobation. Hume was much more at ease in the world than Russell, and was only interested in moral reform in so far as morals rested on the “delusive glosses of superstition and false religion” (which in his opinion included all religion) or the ideological delusions of factious politicians and mercantile economists. But he did want a meta-ethic that would enable him to transfer the monkish virtues (whose status as virtues depended on the “delusive glosses”) from the catalogue of virtues to the catalogue of vices. Thus he wanted to be able to show that those who approved of “celibacy, fasting, penance, mortification, self-denial, humility, silence, solitude” were making some kind of mistake. How did he propose to do this? By combining a definition with an empirical research program.

The hypothesis which we embrace is plain. It maintains that morality is determined by sentiment. It defines [my italics] virtue to be whatever mental action or quality gives to a spectator the pleasing sentiment of approbation; and vice the contrary. We then proceed to examine a plain matter of fact, to wit, what actions have this influence. (Hume 1975 [1748]: 289)

The matter of fact is less plain than Hume suggests, since the “spectator” is an idealized observer, whose moral sense operates at optimum in part because (unlike the rest of us) he is relevantly informed. This means that we cannot simply predict the reactions of the spectator by observing the reactions of mankind, since mankind is sometimes mistaken about the relevant facts. In particular, since many people are subject to the delusive glosses of superstition and false religion, their reactions are liable to be distorted by false beliefs, leading them to approve of what is really vicious (such as celibacy, fasting etc) and to disapprove of what is really right (such as playing whist on Sundays with “modest women”). Since a virtue is whatever mental action or quality gives to a [suitably qualified] spectator the pleasing sentiment of approbation, and since nobody would approve of fasting, celibacy etc if they did not think they would be useful in procuring an agreeable afterlife, no suitably qualified person would approve of them, since being suitably qualified involves not being subject to the delusive glosses of superstition and false religion. However Hume’s meta-ethic rests partly on a definition (which Hume obviously conceives of as reporting a truth of language) and partly on the thesis that people share the same moral sensibility which can therefore be “idealized” to serve as the criterion for virtue. In other words Hume’s theory rests on the presupposition that, given the same information, we would approve or disapprove of much the same things.

What about Russell? His theory, like Hume’s rests on a set of “fundamental propositions and definitions”:

  1. Surveying the acts which arouse emotions of approval or disapproval, we find that, as a general rule, the acts which are approved of are those believed likely to have, on the balance, effects of certain kinds, while opposite effects are expected from acts that are disapproved of.
  2. Effects that lead to approval are defined as “good”, and those leading to disapproval as “bad”.
  3. An act of which, on the available evidence, the effects are likely to be better than those of any other act that is possible in the circumstances, is defined as “right”; any other act is “wrong”. What we “ought” to do is, by definition, the act which is right.

These definitions and propositions, if accepted provide a coherent body of propositions which are true (or false) in the same sense as if they were propositions of science. (RoE: 161–162/Human Society in Ethics and Politics: 116)

Now (1) is a variant of Sidgwick’s thesis that common-sense moralities tend to solidify around rules which are believed to have generally beneficial consequences, where the benefit is cashed out in terms of human welfare. It is a dubious thesis, especially as Russell himself had argued that many traditional moralities foster the interests of the elite at the expense of other groups—foreigners, women, slaves and serfs. Perhaps Russell wants to exclude such moralities, by restricting his claim to civilized communities, where “civilized” rules out societies with blatantly elitist moral codes. Thesis (2) purports to define “good effects”, but it does not state whose approval is to determine goodness—people in general, people at their impartial best, or just the enlightened and well-informed? Without some clarity on this point, too many things will wind up as good, since for any likely effect there will be some weirdo somewhere who approves of it. Conversely, if being disapproved of means that an effect is not good, the class of good effects may vanish altogether, since for any likely effect there will be some weirdo somewhere who disapproves of it. Paradoxically given his long career as a moral radical, Russell’s meta-ethic seems to have less critical bite than Hume’s, at least as regards ends. Hume’s theory allows him to transfer a reputed virtue to the catalogue of vices if people approve of it on the basis of false beliefs. Russell seems to be stuck with whatever effects people happen to approve of even if their tendency to approve is based on false beliefs and malodorous passions. But the real problem lies with (3). It defines “right” and “ought” in consequentialist terms and as we have seen (and as Russell himself had argued many years before) such a definition is clearly false, at least if it is construed as a report of current usage. It is not a tautology to say that the right thing to do is the action that seems likely to produce the best consequences, which it would be if Russell’s definition were correct.

The theory could be improved by retaining (1) and (2) with the class of approvers more carefully specified, but replacing (3) with something like:

The right thing to do is defined as the action which an impartial, informed and non-superstitious spectator would approve of doing.

On the assumption that the impartial spectator would retain the broadly consequentialist tendencies of our rude ancestors, (1) and (3a) together would allow us to derive:

The right thing to do is that action which seems likely to produce the best effects.

And this would be a moderately plausible synthetic claim rather than a patently false definition. Moreover, it would provide the basis for the right kind of utilitarian ethic—at least, it would do so if the ethical jury in (2) is specified in such a way as to ensure that they approve of the right effects.

But so far from being “true in the same sense as if they were propositions of science”, the definitions (2) and (3a) are simply false, at least if they are construed as accounts of what the words in question actually mean. Russell seems to have been aware of this, as the tell-tale phrase “if they are accepted” indicates. Perhaps these definitions should be understood not as attempts to codify current usage but as proposals for linguistic reform (which, was a common dodge on the part of mid-century philosophers when their purported analyses proved false). But in that case they can be rejected without making any kind of mistake, along with Russell’s entire ethic. And what can be rejected without intellectual error can hardly qualify as knowledge.

Russell himself may have agreed. He was not at all sure that there was such a thing as ethical knowledge and soon reverted to his earlier emotivism. Within one month of the publication of Human Society he was expressing “complete agreement” with the emotivism of A.J. Ayer (RoE: 165/Papers 11: 175). The reason, I suspect, is that he came to see that his definitions of ‘right’ and ‘good’ were intellectually optional. Some years later a Mr Harold Osborn sent him a book which attempted to provide an objective basis for a humanistic ethic. Russell’s letter of thanks points out a problem: “any system of ethics which claims objectivity can only do so by means of a concealed ethical premise, which, if disputed, cannot be demonstrated” (Dear Bertrand Russell: 98). That is precisely what is wrong with Human Society in Ethics and Politics.

12. Conclusion

We started out with Russell’s adverse verdict on his own meta-ethics: “I am not, myself, satisfied with what I have read or said on the philosophical basis of ethics” (RoE: 165/Papers 11: 310–11). And we can see in a sense that he was right. Every meta-ethic that he developed seems to be subject to insuperable, objections. But although Russell’s writings on ethics are unsatisfactory, this does not mean that they are worthless. Meta-ethics is a difficult subject and it is hard to get it right. And if we ever are to get it right, we must learn from those, like Russell, who got it interestingly and instructively wrong. In the course of his long philosophical career, Russell canvassed most of the meta-ethical options that have dominated debate in the Twentieth and Twenty-First Centuries—naturalism, non-naturalism, emotivism and the error-theory, and even, to some extent, subjectivism and relativism. And though none of his theories quite worked out, there is much to be learned from his mistakes. Nor is this all. His arguments as well as his theories are often interesting and instructive. As we have seen, the ethical corollary to the argument of “Seems Madam? Nay, It Is,” puts the kybosh on any attempt to resolve Sidgwick’s Dualism of Practical Reason by arguing that although we are distinct beings with different interests in the world of Appearance, we are, in Reality, all one (§3). Russell’s arguments against objectivism are often quite powerful, and one anticipates Gilbert Harman’s, influential argument that objective values can be safely dismissed since they lack explanatory power (§9.3–9.4). Russell’s damning critique of Moore’s analytic consequentialism led Moore to abandon the view and perhaps to give up his “unduly anti-reforming” moral conservatism. Moreover Russell’s indirect influence on meta-ethics may have been profound since the Open Question Argument, was probably invented to deal with Russell’s ideas. Finally, in the realm of normative ethics, Russell developed a sensible and humane version of consequentialism, which (despite its shaky meta-ethical foundations) is resistant, if not immune, to many of the standard criticisms, especially if combined—as Russell thought it should be combined—with a healthy dose of political skepticism. It provides a powerful tool for social and political criticism, a tool which Russell vigorously employed on a vast range of topics in his writings on practical ethics.

Indeed, I should emphasize that, lengthy as this entry is, I have said virtually nothing about the vast bulk of Russell’s writings on moral and political topics. If we are to judge by his literary output, Russell was much more interested in social and political questions and the rights and wrongs of war and peace than in abstract questions of ethical theory. But, when it comes to Russell’s popular writings, there is no need for an intermediary. His books are easy to get hold of, easy to read, often very funny, and, despite the now dated allusions, easy to understand. Read them yourself and make up your own mind.


Primary Literature

Note: Many of Russell’s books have been through several editions with different publishers and the consequence is that pagination is not always uniform. Page numbers cited above are from the editions listed below. For the original dates and places of publication, see the Bibliography attached to the entry on Bertrand Russell.

Books by Russell

  • 2000 [1896], German Social Democracy, Nottingham: Spokesman. Originally published 1896.
  • 1992a [1900], A Critical Exposition of the Philosophy of Leibniz, London: Routledge (first published in 1900).
  • 1992b [1903], The Principles of Mathematics, London: Routledge. Originally published 1903, second edition with a new introduction by the author (1937).
  • 1993 [1920], The Practice and Theory of Bolshevism, Nottingham: Spokesman (originally published 1920).
  • 1929, Marriage and Morals, London: George Allen and Unwin: New York: Horace Liveright.
  • 1930, The Conquest of Happiness, London: Allen and Unwin.
  • 1992 [1932], Education and the Social Order, London: Routledge (originally published 1932).
  • 1961 [1935], Religion and Science, New York: Oxford University Press (originally published 1935).
  • 1995 [1938], Power: A New Social Analysis, London: Routledge (originally published 1938).
  • 1992 [1940], An Inquiry into Meaning and Truth, London: Routledge (originally published in 1940).
  • 1948, Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits, London: George Allen and Unwin; New York: Simon and Schuster.
  • 1949, Authority and the Individual, London: George Allen and Unwin; New York: Simon and Schuster.
  • 1954, Human Society in Ethics and Politics, London: George Allen and Unwin; New York: Simon and Schuster.
  • 1959, My Philosophical Development, London: George Allen and Unwin.
  • 1967, 1968, 1969, The Autobiography of Bertrand Russell, 3 vols, London: George Allen and Unwin. One volume paperback edition (with introduction by Michael Foot) London: Routledge (2000).

Anthologies of Russell’s Writings

  • The Basic Writings of Bertrand Russell, 1903–1959, Egner and Dennon (eds.), London: Routledge, 1992 (originally published 1961).
  • Dear Bertrand Russell, London: George Allen and Unwin, 1969.
  • Fact and Fiction, London: Routledge, 1994 (originally published 1961).
  • In Praise of Idleness, London: Routledge, 1996 (originally published 1935).
  • Logic and Knowledge: Essays, 1901–1950, London: George Allen and Unwin; New York: The Macmillan Company, 1956.
  • Mortals and Others, volume I: Bertrand Russell’s American Essays 1931–1935, edited by Harry Ruja, London: Allen and Unwin, 1975.
  • Mortals and Others, volume II: Bertrand Russell’s American Essays 1931–1935, edited by Harry Ruja, London: Routledge, 1998.
  • Mysticism and Logic and Other Essays, London: Routledge, 1994 (originally published 1918).
  • [PE], Philosophical Essays, London: Routledge, 1994 (originally published in this format 1961 and in an earlier version with a slightly different selection of essays in 1910).
  • Portraits From Memory and Other Essays, London: George Allen and Unwin, 1956.
  • [RoE], Russell on Ethics, edited by Charles Pigden, London: Routledge, 1999.
  • [RoM], Russell on Metaphysics, edited by Stephen Mumford, London: Routledge, 2003.
  • [RoR], Russell on Religion, edited by Louis Greenspan and Stefan Anderson, London: Routledge, 1999.
  • The Selected Letters of Bertrand Russell: The Private Years, 1884–1914, edited by Nicholas Griffin, London: Routledge, 2002.
  • The Selected Letters of Bertrand Russell: The Public Years, 1914–1970, edited by Nicholas Griffin, London: Routledge, 2001.
  • Sceptical Essays, London: Routledge, 1977 (originally published 1928).
  • Unpopular Essays, London: George Allen and Unwin; New York: Simon and Schuster, 1950.
  • Why I am Not a Christian and Other Essays on Religion and Related Subjects, edited by Paul Edwards, London: George Allen and Unwin, 1957.
  • Yours Faitfully, Bertand Russell: A Lifelong fight for Peace, Justice and Truth in Letters to the Editor, edited by Ray Perkins, Chicago and Lasalle: Open Court, 2002.

The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell

Referred to as Papers in the text.

  • Vol. 1: Cambridge Essays, 1888–99, London, Boston, Sydney: George Allen and Unwin, 1983.
  • Vol. 4: Foundations of Logic, 1903–05, London and New York: Routledge, 1994.
  • Vol. 6: Logical and Philosophical Papers, 1909–13, London and New York: Routledge, 1992.
  • Vol. 8: The Philosophy of Logical Atomism and Other Essays, 1914–19, London: George Allen and Unwin, 1986.
  • Vol. 9: Essays on Language, Mind and Matter, 1919–26, London: Unwin Hyman, 1988.
  • Vol. 10: A Fresh Look at Empiricism, 1927–42, London and New York: Routledge, 1996.
  • Vol. 11: Last Philosophical Testament, 1943–68, London and New York: Routledge, 1997.
  • Vol. 12: Contemplation and Action, 1902–14, London, Boston, Sydney: George Allen and] Unwin, 1985.
  • Vol. 13: Prophecy and Dissent, 1914–16, London: Unwin Hyman, 1988.

Secondary Literature

  • Aiken, Lillian W., 1963, Bertrand Russell’s Philosophy of Morals, New York: Humanities Press.
  • Allard, James, 2003, “Idealism in Britain and the United States” in Baldwin (ed.), 2003: 43–59.
  • Ayer, A.J., 1936, Language, Truth and Logic, 2nd edition, New York: Dover, 1952.
  • Baldwin, Thomas (ed.), 2003, The Cambridge History of Philosophy 1870–1945, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Barnes, W.H.F., 1933, “A Suggestion About Value,” Analysis, 1: 45–46.
  • Blackwell, Kenneth, 1985, The Spinozistic Ethics of Bertrand Russell, London: Allen and Unwin.
  • Bradley, F.H., 1930 [1893], Appearance and Reality, ninth impression, corrected, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Geach, P.T., 1960, “Ascriptivism”, Philosophical Review, 69(2); reprinted in Geach 1972: 250–254.
  • –––, 1965, “Assertion”, Philosophical Review, 74(4): 449–465; reprinted in Geach 1972: 254–269.
  • –––, 1972, Logic Matters, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Griffin, Nicholas (ed.), 2003a, The Cambridge Companion to Bertrand Russell, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2003b, “Russell’s Philosophical Background” in Griffin 2003a: 84–107.
  • Harman, Gilbert, 1977, The Nature of Morality, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Hume, David, 1978 [1739–40], A Treatise of Humean Nature, 2nd edition, Selby-Bigge/Nidditch (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1975 [1748], Enquiries Concerning Human Understanding and Concerning the Principles of Morals, 3rd edition, Selby-Bigge/Nidditch (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Joyce, Richard, 2001, The Myth of Morality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Langford, C.H., 1942, “The Notion of Analysis in Moore’s Philosophy”, in Schilpp (ed.) 1942: 321–342.
  • Levy, Paul, 1981, Moore: G.E. Moore and the Cambridge Apostles, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lewis, David, 1989, “Dispositional Theories of Value”. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, LXIII: 113–137; reprinted in David Lewis, 2000, Papers in Ethics and Social Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press: 68–94.
  • Lillehammer, Hallvard, 2007, Companions in Guilt: Arguments for Ethical Objectivity, Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Mackie, J.L., 1946, “The Refutation of Morals”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 24: 77–90.
  • –––, 1977, Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong, Harmondsworth: Penguin.
  • McTaggart J.E.M., 1996, Philosophical Studies, Bristol: Thoemmes; originally published in 1934, though the passage quoted comes from “The Further Determination of the Absolute” privately printed in 1893.
  • Miller, A., 2013, Contemporary Metaethics: an Introduction, 2nd edition, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Moore, G.E., 1903, Principia Ethica, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; abbreviated as PE.
  • –––, 1912, Ethics, London: Williams and Norgate; reprinted, with new pagination, London: Oxford University Press, 1966 (all references to this reprint). [The more recent Clarendon edition of 2005, with an introduction by William H. Shaw, has the same pagination as the 1966 edition.]
  • –––, 1942, “A Reply to My Critics,” in Schilpp 1942: 533–678.
  • –––, 1993, Principia Ethica, revised edition with the Preface to the second edition and other papers, edited by Thomas Baldwin, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; first edition published in 1903.
  • Nuccetelli, S. and G. Seay (eds.), 2007, Themes from G.E. Moore: New Essays in Epistemology and Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Perkins, Ray, 2007, “Russell’s Meta-ethics,” Russell: The Journal of Bertrand Russell Studies, 26: 179–184.
  • –––, 2012, “Was Russell’s Error Theory a Mistake?” Russell: The Journal of Bertrand Russell Studies, 32: 30–41.
  • –––, 2019, “Bertrand Russell’s Moral Philosophy,” in Wahl (ed.) 2019: 334–360.
  • Phillips, Paul, 2013, Contesting the Moral High Ground: Popular Moralists in Mid-Twentieth-Century Britain, Montreal: McGill-Queen’s University Press.
  • Pigden, Charles R., 2003, “Bertrand Russell: Moral Philosopher or Unphilosophical Moralist?” in Griffin 2003a: 450–474.
  • –––, 2007, “Desiring to Desire: Russell, Lewis and G.E. Moore,” in Nuccetelli and Seay 2007: 244–260.
  • –––, 2019, “Two Arguments for Emotivism and a Methodological Moral,” Russell: The Journal of Bertrand Russell Studies, 39(1): 5–35.
  • Potter, Michael K., 2006, Bertrand Russell’s Ethics, Bristol: Thoemmes.
  • Prior, A.N., 1949, Logic and the Basis of Ethics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Raphael, D.D. (ed.), 1991 [BM], The British Moralists, 2 volumes, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Reid, Thomas, 1843, Essays on the Active Powers of the Human Mind, edited by G.N. Wright, London: Thomas Tegg; available in a paperback reprint from Kessinger Publishing.
  • Ross, W.D., 1930, The Right and the Good, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1939, The Foundations of Ethics, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Ryan, Alan, 1988, Bertrand Russell: a Political Life, Harmondsworth: Allen Lane
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur (ed.), 1942, The Philosophy of G.E. Moore (The Library of Living Philosophers), Evanston: Northwestern University.
  • ––– (ed.), 1944, The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell (The Library of Living Philosophers), Chicago: Northwestern University.
  • Schulz, Bart, 2004, Henry Sidgwick: Eye of the Universe, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Schroeder, Mark, 2010, Non-Cognitivism in Ethics, London: Routledge.
  • Sidgwick, Henry, 1982, The Methods of Ethics, Indianapolis, Hackett; this is a reprint of the 7th edition of 1907, first published in 1874.
  • Soames, Scott, 2003, Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century, vol. 1: The Dawn of Analysis, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Spinoza, Benedictus de, 1985, Ethics, in Curley ed. and trans., The Collected Works of Spinoza (Volume 1), Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Stevenson, C., 1937, “The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms,” Mind, 46: 14–31.
  • Stevenson, Charles, 1944, Ethics and Language, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Stove, David, 1991, The Plato Cult and Other Philosophical Follies, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Tait, Katherine, 1975, My Father Bertrand Russell, New York: Harcourt, Bruce Jovanovich.
  • Urmson, J.O., 1968, The Emotive Theory of Ethics, London: Hutchinson.
  • Wahl, Russell (ed.), 2019, The Bloomsbury Companion to Bertrand Russell, London: Bloomsbury.
  • Warnock, Mary, 1978, Ethics Since 1900, 3rd edn., Edinburg, VA: Axios Institute Press.

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