Supplement to Gilbert Ryle

Ryle on Imagination

Picturing, visualizing, imagining, “seeing (a cat) with the mind’s eye”, and “hearing (a tune) in one’s head” are useful concepts; operations of imagining, picturing, visualizing, and the like are exercises of mental powers (232). Do these operations require objects: those philosophical posits known as visual or auditory “images”, “ideas”, or – as they are called today – “representations”? If so, the mind would be the obvious repository, container, or vehicle of pictorial or auditory “content”. But such mental operations do not require such objects.

Much as stage-murders do not have victims and are not murders, so seeing things in one’s mind’s eye does not involve either the existence of things seen nor the occurrence of acts of seeing them. (232)

If, to accommodate imaginings we need not posit ideas or images then, “there is thus no need to treat minds as the clandestine habitats of such fleshless beings” (232). Nor, we might add, is there need to treat the brain or central nervous system as the physical realization of this habitat or, in the current idiom, as vehicles of content.

The question how one can seem to hear a cat’s purr or seem to see an Egyptian Mau when there are no purrs to be heard or cats to be seen has the form, Ryle says, of a “wires and pulleys” question. But if we examine the way the expression, say, “she fancied or she imagined she saw an Egyptian Mau” works, we will see that we have no trouble using or understanding this expression; we know the kind of circumstances in which it is appropriate or not; in which it would be confirmed or challenged, and none of this requires theoretical knowledge or knowledge of causal processes. The meaning of this expression does not require that we ask the question that a theory of mental mechanisms or of mental causation would answer. Nor, incidentally and a fortiori, does it require a theory of mental mechanisms or of mental causation whose mysteriousness is salved by a theory about the mechanisms” alleged physical realizers. The problem, as far as it is one, says Ryle, is to construe descriptions of people as imagining that they see or hear or do things “without falling back on the idioms in which we talk of seeing horse-races, hearing concerts, or committing murders” (238). In the same way that saying someone has committed a stage-murder or a mock-murder “is to say, not that a certain mild or faint murder has been committed, but that no sort of murder has been committed”, to say that someone imagines seeing an Egyptian Mau is not to say that she sees an Egyptian Mau-image or, we might add, that she has a mental representation of an Egyptian Mau (which counts as non-veridical, say, because it is not the causal effect of a real one) but rather to say that she does not see an Egyptian Mau or anything cat-like at all. (238)

A. Pretend Actions

The question, “How can a person fancy he sees something without realizing that he is not seeing it?” seems to call out for a philosophically deep explanation. But this appearance fades, Ryle explains, when we realize that pretence is a notion partly constitutive of notions such as cheating, acting a part, make-believe, shamming being ill, and hypochondria. While cheating requires awareness of the deception, make-believe allows for various degrees of credulity and incredulity, and hypochondria demands being taken in by one’s own fancy. So the question how one can fancy seeing something should be compared with the question how one can fancy that one has a virus. The answer is not to be found by postulating vivid ideas but rather by noting the general fact that not all people are as judicial and as critical as one might wish.

Pretending does not require a second, hidden operation (planning, imaging, deliberating) accompanying or shadowing that which one is pretending to do. Forging a check involves nothing more—that is, no extra events or occurrences—than signing it. Forging a cheque requires (in a logical sense and not a causal one) the “thought” of genuinely signing it. In one sense the acts of signing and forging a cheque may be indistinguishable, and in that sense involve “the same” act; in another, they are not the same, for the description of the forgery will operate with a different battery of predicates and subordinate clauses. Pretending is a sophisticated performance which is parasitic on the naivety or naturalness of the original one.

B. Fancied Perceptions

“Imagine” and “fancy” sometimes have a different nuance from “pretend” and “act the part”, for whereas the latter terms are applied to activities that usually (but not always) have some overt “muscular” representation, the former are often reserved for things people do inaudibly and invisibly “in their heads”. “Fancy” and “imagine”, that is, are often used to characterize a person’s fancied perceptions – which may have no muscular or behavioural manifestations.

Thus, even if we agree that forging a cheque involves going through motions in a hypothetical manner, what motions would there be in the case of fancied perceptions? Hearing Bach’s Chaconne running through one’s head is not like listening to a private reproduction or internal echo of the partita. This tilts against the common idea in epistemology that a mental picture or visual image (or, we might add, a mental representation) stands to visual sensation as an echo to noise or a reflection stands to that which is reflected. On this traditional view, what is common between seeing and “seeing” is the existence of an image or mental representation, minus the cognitive element or judgment thought to be required for perception. But this, says, Ryle gets things the wrong way around. I may hear Bach’s Chaconne for Violin Solo played by Itzhak Perlman without knowing how it goes, but it is absurd to say that I “hear” it running through my head without knowing how it goes. Hearing in one’s mind, far from being a matter of having auditory sensations minus knowledge, is rather a species of knowledge-how. In hearing the Chaconne in my mind, I am exercising my knowledge of how the piece goes; I am, in a certain way, realizing what I would be hearing if it were really being played, in the same way that the forger, in forging a cheque, is realizing how it would be signed if the cheque were genuine. Picturing or fancying in my mind’s eye what it would be to hear Perlman play does not require that I see an image or have a visual sensation or experience sans judgment, or anything that goes proxy it. Imagining how Perlman would sound and look performing stands in the same relation to hearing and watching him perform as forging a cheque stands to its genuine signing. It is doing something which “stands in the same relation …as sophisticated performances stand to those more naïve performances, whose mention is obliquely contained in the description of the higher order performances.” (252)

Hearing the Chaconne running through my head, or seeing Perlman in my mind’s eye are fancied perceptions, not actions or doings. Although fancied perceptions and mock-actions are both species of knowledge-how, perception, unlike action, does not involve bringing anything about. So fancied perception, far from being a special private form of doing is not a doing at all. It makes no sense to speak of witnessing or failing to witness a seeing or hearing; thus it makes no sense to speak either way about fancied seeings or fancied hearings.

A similar story can be told for seeing things in one’s head or with the mind’s eye. My imagining the gooseberry green eyes of my cat, Vinzelles, does not involve having visual sensitivity to them (or visual “sensations” of them) of the sort looking at a photograph of him or directly into his face would. It involves having the thought of looking at them in the logical sense that imagining them is a more sophisticated operation than looking at them. Imagining his green eyes is “one utilization among others of the knowledge of how” the gooseberry green eyes look (255). Picturing Vinzelles’s gooseberry green eyes is something like a rehearsal for having my expectation of what his eyes look like fulfilled if I really were to look at them. So, far from picturing involving, as Hume thought, faint sensations, “it involves missing just what one would be due to get” if one were really looking at them.

The problem with Hume’s theory of ideas and its predecessors involve not only the idea of shadow sensations. It confuses the logical dependence of picturing on seeing, or “hearing” on hearing, with a causal dependence. Imaging or picturing involves knowledge how things look or hear and not having forgotten. But it does not require, what Hume seems to have thought, that in imagining Vinzelles’s gooseberry green eyes, his eyes have left a visual sense impression that occurred when my eyes were open which cause or bring about a faint sort of impression (or representation).

All that is required is to see that learning perceptual lessons entails some perceiving, that applying those lessons entails having learned them, and that imaging is one way of applying those lessons. (257)

Copyright © 2021 by
Julia Tanney <>

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