Supplement to Gilbert Ryle

Ryle on Perception

The second route to the understanding of “sensation” or “feeling” as sense-impressions is via the allegiance to causal theories of perception; one which construes perception as a natural phenomenon in the domain of which the notions of propagation, transmission, impulse, stimulus and response have their home. In this context, sense-experiences are also considered as given, but instead of being given in the sense of “accepted without argument”, they are given in the sense of “inflicted”; they are things impressed upon us, impulses transmitted through us, and “not as things found by us by some sort of pre-cogitative finding”.

Ryle has no quarrel with such an account—up to a point. The point at which Ryle baulks comes at the final stage at which there is a postulated jump from neural impulses in the body to sense-impressions. Ryle dismisses this view as one we have no reason to believe unless we have already been convinced by the whole story of the chain of physical, neural, and psychic impulses. Even if the Cartesian picture presupposed by this view were true (including, we might add, the neo-Cartesian view which inherits the problem of mental causation), “we would still be without the Cartesian grounds for asserting the existence of sense-impressions which we possess for pains and tickles”. In other words, the sense-impressions posited via this route are arrived at by acceptance of a theory (inference to the best explanation) and not via introspection. Yet the sense-impressions posited in the last jump are supposed to be conscious perceptual experiences.

Ryle’s diagnosis of this problem, as with many problems that turn into philosophical conundrums, is that two different kinds of explanation have been confused. Physiological, causal accounts of perception cannot answer questions about perceptual successes and failures. The successes and failures involved in seeing a misprint (or a crop of wheat) are different from those involved in seeing black marks on a page or a planted field. To borrow again a metaphor from Austin, I stick my neck out less, in the sense that I have less to be wrong about, if I demur from identifying what I see as a crop of wheat and identify it only as a planted field. I stick my neck out even less if I demur from identifying what I see as a planted field and declare merely that it seems to be a planted field from where I stand.

But, though the successes and failures are different depending on how I describe what I see, this does not mean that what is missing from the account is some extra, psychological event in the causal chain. Causal questions of course can be asked about perception, but not all our questions are of that kind. Sense-impressions were postulated as the missing causal links in order to solve a problem that is not causal after all.

In Dilemmas, Ryle discusses in more detail the logical-grammatical differences between verbs of success or achievement and “hunt” or “try” verbs which do not carry this particular normative dimension. He also distinguishes verbs whose role it is “to declare a terminus”. Verbs such as “reaching” and “winning” share with “to see” the negative property of not standing for processes taking place in or to things, or for states in which things remain. They differ in this sense from verbs of perceptual exploration, or “hunt” or “try”-verbs.

Neither the physiologist, the psychologist, nor I, myself, can catch me in the act of seeing a tree—for seeing a tree is not the sort of thing in which I can be caught. “Look” and “see” are different in this respect. I cannot be seeing something in the same way I can be looking at or looking for something. The verb “to see” does not signify an experience in the usual sense of “experience” understood as something that I undergo, am engaged in, or as a sub-stretch of my life story (as I have experienced the Tour de France by the roadside and as I am presently experiencing an early Spring in the Gard). Seeing a cat is not a causal effect, to put the point too crudely, not because it is an eccentric sort of state or process exempt from causal explanations but because it is not a state or process at all. There is no answer to questions such as “what made him see?” as there are for questions such as “what made him flinch”? The programme, Ryle tells us, of locating, inspecting, and measuring the process or state of seeing and of correlating it with other states and processes, is a hopeless programme; not because the quarry wears seven-leagued boots or an invisibility cloak, “but because the idea that there was such a quarry was the product, almost, of inattention to grammar” (1954, 104).

Understanding the “thick” concepts of perception – those that carry more luggage or sit upon higher rungs on the ladder of sophistication – will require more than talking about events or happenings that are quasi-physiological, just as understanding the purchasing power of a coin will involve climbing higher up the normative ladder of sophistication than considering the coin’s physical composition. Just as seeing or missing a misprint involve questions of technique, about the nature of the task, about the various kinds of things that make for success and about the various kinds of mistakes that are to be avoided, so are questions about seeing that interest epistemologists those in general about “the crafts or arts of finding things out by seeing and hearing, including questions about the nature of mistakes and failures in perception and their relations with mistakes and failures in thinking, spelling, counting, and the like” (1956, 348). Verbs like “see” or “hear” do not merely denote special experiences or mental happenings, with special causal antecedents; they denote achievements of tasks, or successes or undertakings. The questions of technique to be asked about them are not answerable by any multiplication of answers to questions of causal conditioning. Though both kinds of questions may be asked the one cannot be reduced to the other: “they are questions of quite different types” (1956, 349).

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Julia Tanney <>

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