Supplement to School of Names

Disputation in Context

The constructive and the negative aspects of disputation are helpfully contrasted in this excerpt from a 3rd-century B.C. text preserved in several later sources:

Disputers separate distinct kinds so that they don’t interfere with each other and arrange different starting-points so that they don’t confuse each other. They express intentions, communicate what they’re referring to, and clarify what they’re talking about. They make it so that others share their knowledge and don’t strive to perplex each other. So the winner doesn’t lose what he defends, and the loser gains what he’s seeking. If done this way, then disputation is admissible.

When it comes to complicating phrases to falsify each other’s words, embellishing expressions to pervert what each other says, and giving trick analogies to twist the other’s point, they stretch the other’s words so there’s no way to get to his thought. If done like this, disputation interferes with the Great Way. Engaging in tangled debates and competing to see who’s last to quit can’t but be harmful to a gentleman.[26]

Of particular interest are the details of the positive description in the first half of the passage. Ideally, disputers should seek to clearly distinguish distinct kinds (lei) of things and different bases or “starting points” for using a term.[27] Keeping these distinctions straight, they clarify the claims they are making and the things they are referring to and through this process jointly obtain knowledge. The key to this process of seeking knowledge is keeping distinctions straight. Conversely, in the harmful style of disputation, the disputer distorts and twists the opponent’s words, making them come out false or inconsistent or extending them in unintended ways. The disputer obfuscates the differences between kinds of things and uses of words, offering flippant arguments for bizarre assertions to achieve victory at all costs. (The “White Horse Discourse” of Gongsun Long is probably an example of this style of disputation.)

While explaining the reasons for the disputers’ notoriety, the passage at the same time links their activities to mainstream Chinese philosophy of language, epistemology, and logic. Ancient Chinese semantic theories explained the use of general terms (see Section 4 of the entry Mohist Canons), and thus communication, by speakers’ ability to distinguish (bian) things or stuff (shi) as of the same or different kinds (lei) and to apply the same name (ming) to all stuff of a kind. Cognition or judgment was the attitude of distinguishing an object as being of the kind denoted by some term. Knowledge was a reliable ability to draw distinctions correctly, expressed by an ability to apply terms correctly (see Section 5 of the entry on Mohist Canons). Reasoning was a process of analogical extension, taking distinctions already drawn as a basis for distinguishing further things as “the same” or “different” (tong/yi), “this” or “not-this” (shi/fei), “so” or “not-so” (ran/bu ran). (See Section 7 of the entry on Mohist Canons.) Thus semantics, knowledge, and reasoning were all seen as grounded in a process of distinguishing similar from different kinds of things—the same process that is the core constituent activity in disputation. Indeed, the Chinese graphs typically translated as “distinguish” and “disputation” are pronounced the same (bian), have the same phonetic component, and are used interchangeably in ancient texts. Arguably they express two senses of a single word. Disputation concerned how to distinguish distinct kinds of things, thus identifying what was “of a kind” with what. So in the ancient Chinese philosophical context, disputation by its nature brought the participants just a step or two away from fundamental questions concerning how language relates to the world, how we know whether a claim is correct or not, what the criteria are for knowledge, and what makes some analogical inferences correct, others not.

These issues were not merely academic. Distinguishing the referents of names properly was regarded as an essential element of successful political rule, in at least two ways. First, language was seen as an indispensable tool for political administration, specifically for controlling and directing people’s behavior. Early Chinese philosophers emphasized the action-guiding functions of language to an extent not seen in the Western tradition. Like their Greek counterparts, such as Aristotle, Chinese thinkers regarded language as a means of expressing thought (see Section 4 of the entry on Mohist Canons). But the thoughts that dominated their attention were instructions and commands, not statements and reports. This is why many thinkers were especially concerned with the issue of “correcting names” (zheng ming), or rectifying and unifying the norms by which everyone in the linguistic community distinguishes the extensions of general terms. If speakers use terms differently, taking the same word to pick out different kinds of things, they will be unable to follow commands as their superiors intend. The result, according to some ancient writers, will inevitably be anarchy or disorder.

Correcting names and examining divisions, these are the reins of governing.… Suppose there were a man who when he sought oxen used the name ‘horse’ and when he sought horses used the name ‘ox’. He would surely not obtain what he sought. And if because of this he resorted to threats and anger, the steward would surely complain, and the oxen and horses would surely be in disorder. The hundred officials are a multitude of stewards, the myriad things a herd of oxen and horses. Not correcting their names or clearly dividing their job duties, yet frequently employing punishments and fines—no disorder is greater than this. (The Annals of Lü Buwei, 17.1/408)

Hence, as a famous passage from the Confucian Analects explains, “correcting names” is an essential part of governing (for further discussion, see Loy 2020):

“If the ruler of Wei awaited you to manage his government, what would you do first?”

Confucius said, “It would surely be to correct names! If names are not correct, speech does not conform [to the facts]. If speech does not conform, affairs are not completed,…punishments and fines are not on the mark,…and people have nowhere to put hand or foot. So the names the gentleman uses surely can be spoken [appropriately in the particular context], and his speech surely can be carried out. The gentleman, with respect to his speech, simply allows nothing reckless.” (Analects, 13.3)

Second, if the ruler’s use of words is at odds with reality—with the actual “shapes” (xing) of things, which serve as criteria for the correct use of names according to received norms—this will lead to mistaken judgment, failed plans, and ultimately social disorder (luan).

All disorder is a matter of shape and name not fitting. A ruler, though unworthy, may seem to employ the worthy, heed the good, and do what is admissible. The problem is that those he calls worthy are unworthy, what he calls good is depraved, and what he calls admissible is perverse. This is form and name being different in fact, word and object referring to different things. When the unworthy are taken to be worthy, the depraved good, the perverse admissible, how can the state be free of disorder and the ruler’s person escape danger? (Annals, 16.8/401)

So for some thinkers, how we distinguish terms is among the keys to sociopolitical order. If language is to guide action efficiently and reliably, everyone in the speech community must distinguish the referents of the terms used in instructions, ritual codes, legal codes, job titles, and political titles in the same, consistent way. Otherwise, people will not understand the content of their jobs and duties, nor be able to carry out commands or follow laws. Linguistic anarchy leads to political anarchy. This is why Xunzi, for example, considers disrupting names and distinctions—as the disputers did in their sophistries and paradoxes—a crime comparable to tampering with tallies and measures (22.1c). The content of the disputers’ controversies may sometimes have been frivolous, but the underlying issues were vital.

In this intellectual and political context, many interrelated questions arise concerning norms for using names and distinguishing their referents. What should the criteria be for distinguishing and naming things one way or another? Is there any objective basis for the distinctions—are there natural kinds? Or are distinctions between kinds purely conventional? By virtue of what do particular things belong to one kind or another? How should names correspond to things—one name for each identifiable kind of thing, or can some names refer more generally to several types of things? On what basis do we apply naming criteria in practice? Do we even need fixed criteria, or could we get along perfectly well without “correcting names,” merely adopting temporary, convenient standards for drawing distinctions in particular situations?[28]

These are the sorts of questions that motivated the intellectually compelling aspects of the disputers’ theses and paradoxes. Some of the disputers, in particular those identified with the School of Names, seem to have held that distinctions between kinds of things exist only relative to artificial or conventional standards, which may be entirely arbitrary. Since these standards are not fixed by nature, no way of drawing distinctions is uniquely or absolutely correct. This point led them to explore how distinctions can be shifted, reversed, or rejected. Pushing this idea further, some disputers may have held that in principle distinctions could be abandoned entirely, leading us to view the world as an undivided whole, the “Great One.” (We will return to this idea in the section on Hui Shi.) This questioning of distinctions and their ontological basis, combined with the mereological worldview shared by most early Chinese thinkers, was probably the chief motivation for the disputers’ sophistries and paradoxes, many of which are based on relations of sameness versus difference and part versus whole. Others concern spatiotemporal relations, though these too can easily be seen as growing out of a fascination with different ways of drawing distinctions.

Return to School of Names

Copyright © 2020 by
Chris Fraser <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free