Supplement to School of Names

Deng Xi’s Exploits

The most concrete account we have of Deng Xi’s activities comes from Book 18 of The Annals of Lü Buwei. Since the text dates from more than 260 years after his death, however, it cannot be considered historically accurate. We should regard it not as a factual account, but as presenting the received image of Deng Xi circa 235 B.C. in the eyes of scholar-officials writing for a ruling-class audience. Deng Xi here is not a purveyor of idle doctrines and sophistries, but a glib lawyer whose rhetorical skills erase the difference between right and wrong. He is depicted as disrupting the rule of Zi Chan, chief minister of the state of Zheng from 543 to 522 B.C., by repeatedly reinterpreting his edicts until there was no difference between “admissible” (ke) and “inadmissible.”

In Zheng many people posted [political protest] writings for each other to read. Zi Chan decreed there be no posting of writings. Deng Xi delivered them [to readers’ homes instead of publicly posting them]. Zi Chan decreed there be no deliveries [of writings]. Deng Xi enclosed them [with other deliveries]. If the decrees were endless, Deng Xi’s responses to them were also endless. This is there being no distinction between admissible and inadmissible. (Annals, 18.4/453)

The chapter that presents this anecdote argues that one should respect a speaker’s intent, whatever his actual words. The purpose of using language is to get the point of what someone is trying to say.

Expressions are the markers of thought. To examine the markers and abandon the thought is perverse. So the ancients, once they got the thought, set aside the speech. In listening to speech, use the speech to observe the thought. (18.4/455)

According to the Annals, what is important is the intent or spirit of the law rather than the letter. Deng Xi devoted himself to perverting the intent that Zi Chan tried to express—he interpreted the decrees so that actions Zi Chan intended to deem prohibited or inadmissible were classified as admissible. This theme links the story to the complaints we cited earlier about how the disputers twisted people’s intentions, rendering them unable to get their original point across. Contrary to the principle advocated by the Annals, Deng Xi ignores the intent and focuses only on the wording (and in doing so touches on issues in legal interpretation that remain relevant today). As the Annals writers see things, he uses his rhetorical skills to eliminate the distinction between admissible and inadmissible, so that right (shi) and wrong (fei) become simply whatever he chooses to argue for or against.

Zi Chan governed Zheng. Deng Xi strove to cause difficulties for him. He made agreements with those of the people who had lawsuits. For a big case, one coat; for a small case, a jacket and trousers. The people who presented coats, jackets, and trousers and studied litigation with him were too numerous to count. He turned wrong into right and right into wrong. There was no standard of right and wrong, and what was admissible and inadmissible changed daily. Those he desired to win would thereby win; those he desired to be found guilty would thereby be found guilty. (18.4/454)

Deng Xi could go so far as to advise both sides in the same case, sometimes displaying a sense of humor while doing so.

The Wei river was extremely high. A person from the house of a rich man of Zheng drowned. Someone found the body. The rich man asked to buy it back. The man demanded very much money. The rich man told Deng Xi about it. Deng Xi said, “Calm down about it. There’s certainly no one else he can sell it to.” The one who found the body was troubled by this and told Deng Xi about it. Deng Xi replied to him too by saying, “Calm down about it. There’s certainly nowhere else they can buy it.” (18.4/453)

Arguing for both of two inconsistent contentions later became known as the doctrine of treating “both sides as admissible” (liang ke). Deng Xi is depicted as taking both sides of the issue, one after the other, untroubled by any pragmatic contradiction in his position. (Strictly speaking, of course, in the anecdote there is no contradiction, and both of his remarks are true.) Among ancient Chinese writers with authoritarian sympathies, such conduct won him a reputation for being unprincipled. Still, even readers concerned about excessive or frivolous litigation should be dismayed by the account the Annals gives of Deng Xi’s eventual fate:

The state of Zheng fell into great disorder, and the people clamored. Zi Chan was troubled by this and so executed Deng Xi and displayed his corpse. The people’s hearts then submitted, right and wrong were settled, and laws and regulations were enforced. (18.4/454)

The more reliable Zuo Commentary tells us that Deng Xi was executed in 501 B.C., some 21 years after Zi Chan’s death, by Si Chuan, a later ruler of Zheng. Si Chuan then adopted his penal code. Authorship of the penal code suggests that the historical Deng Xi may in fact have been a well-intentioned legal reformer, rather than merely an unscrupulous lawyer.

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Copyright © 2020 by
Chris Fraser <>

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