Supplement to School of Names

Miscellaneous Paradoxes

One of the paradoxes listed in “Under Heaven” is self-explanatory, a version of Zeno’s racetrack paradox:

A one-foot stick, every day take away half of it, in a myriad ages it will not be exhausted.

If we remove half each day, the stick will never be completely used up, since each day half its length remains. Mohist Canon B60 appears to present a solution to this paradox. If we try to move a certain distance by taking half the length at a time, the text explains, it is impossible to reach the end, since at every stage half of the previous portion remains. The implied solution is that in moving a measured length, we do not first cover one fraction and then another but can instead move the whole distance in one stage.

Several of the other paradoxes may be explicable in light of passages in the Mohist Dialectics, though any interpretation remains tentative.

Dogs are not hounds.

In the Mohist Dialectics, ‘dog’ and ‘hound’ (or ‘pup’ and ‘dog’) are stock examples of coextensive terms, of which a speaker might know one without knowing the other. Thus a speaker unaware that the terms are coextensive could know of dogs and yet say without error that he didn’t know of hounds (B40), and in some contexts it is admissible to say “Killing dogs is not killing hounds” (B54). The paradox may be twisting or extending this theme.

Fire is not hot.

The point may be that when we feel the heat of the fire, the heat is in us, not the fire. Mohist Canon B47 may be a rebuttal of this paradox. It reads: “Fire is hot.” “We call the fire hot, we don’t deem the heat of the fire to belong to us.” The proponent of the paradox might have contended that when we feel the heat of the fire, the heat is in us, not the fire. The Mohists’ argument is not fully clear, but it may be that heat is among the distinguishing criteria for the kind fire, so simply to call something “fire” is to deem it “hot.” As a matter of linguistic usage, it is the fire that is hot (cf. Graham 2003: 417). Alternatively, the paradox could be based on a deliberate confusion of predication with identity, such as that we find in Gongsun Long’s “White Horse Discourse.” Since the extension of ‘fire’ is different from that of ‘hot’, “fire is not [identical to] hot,” for some hot things are not fire.

The eyes do not see.

Interestingly, the Mohists agree with this apparent paradox. “The knower sees by means of the eyes and the eyes see by means of the fire but the fire does not see.… Seeing by means of the eyes is like seeing by means of the fire” (B46). Like the fire, the eyes themselves do not see, but rather are the means by which we see. (This view coheres well with the theory of sense perception presented in Xunzi, Book 22, according to which the heart-mind employs the eyes to register differences between forms and surface features, by which it then recognizes things.)

The shadow of a flying bird has never moved.

Canon B17 reads: “The shadow does not move. Explained by: Being made over again.” “Explanation. When light arrives, the shadow disappears.” That is, the shadow itself does not move across the ground. Rather, as the bird moves, the area it blocks from the light shifts, causing one shadow to vanish and a new shadow to form over and over again.

Interpretation of the rest of the list is largely guesswork, with little basis for justifying one account over another. Certain readings can be excluded as implausible, because they invoke concepts or topics that had no role in the context of early Chinese philosophy of language, epistemology, or ontology, such as the dichotomy between appearance and reality or relations between universals and particulars. Beyond this, however, it can be difficult to offer compelling arguments that one or another interpretation best explains the paradoxes. The interpretations given in brackets are speculative.

  • Eggs have feathers. [The future, potential feathers of the chick are already possessed by the egg (?).]
  • A chicken has three feet. [It “has feet” and also it has “two feet,” the left and the right, for a total of “three feet” (?).]
  • The city of Ying possesses the world. [Because each part of the whole “possesses” the whole?]
  • Hounds can be deemed sheep. [The distinctions by which we name things can be changed arbitrarily (?).]
  • Horses have eggs.
  • Frogs have tails. [A frog was once a tadpole, which has a tail (?).]
  • Mountains emerge from mouths.
  • A wheel does not touch the ground. [Because the wheel as a whole does not touch, but only a single point at each instant? Because the point of contact is dimensionless?]
  • Pointing (referring) does not reach, reaching does not detach. [Referring to something by a name, or pointing to it physically, is never enough to ensure that one’s audience picks out the correct referent (?). To actually “reach” something, one must touch it and cannot let go (?).]
  • A tortoise is longer than a snake. [A snake’s body has a longer length, but a tortoise has a much longer life (?).]
  • The set square is not square, the compass cannot make a circle. [The set square and compass themselves are not actually square or circular (?). They do not produce perfect geometric figures (?).]
  • The chisel does not surround the handle.
  • The barbed arrow at its swiftest, there is a time when it neither moves nor stops. [The instant the string is released, before the arrow moves? Note that this is distinct from Zeno’s arrow paradox, which is that the flying arrow is at rest in every instant of time and so does not move. Here the paradox is that the arrow is neither in motion nor at rest.]
  • A brown horse and black ox are three. [The three are the horse, the ox, and “color,” which is a component of both a brown horse and a black ox (?).]
  • A white dog is black. [Because it has black eyes, and perhaps black paw pads?]
  • An orphan colt has never had a mother. [Orphans are motherless; it has never been the case that a colt deemed an “orphan” had a mother (?).]

(For other recent treatments of the paradoxes, see Lucas 2012, Indraccolo 2016, and Fraser 2020.)

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Chris Fraser <>

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