Supplement to Self-Consciousness

Scepticism About Essential Indexicality & Agency

Cappelen and Dever’s (2013; cf. Millikan 1990; Magidor 2015) attack on essential indexicality has generated a significant literature. This is especially so regarding their claim that, as they put it, “there are no interesting or distinctive explanatory connections between indexicality and agency” (2013: 18). Their central target is the claim, which we can call “Necessity”, that indexical thoughts (beliefs, desires, or intentions) are required for the explanation or rationalisation of action. True, they argue, it is a self-conscious I-thought that spurs Perry’s messy shopper into action, but this hardly shows that all action rationalisation requires such indexical thought. They argue (2013: 37) that if Necessity is true, then the following “Impersonal Incompleteness Claim” is true:

Impersonal action rationalizations are necessarily incomplete because of a missing indexical component.

An impersonal action rationalisation is one that at no point cites an indexical thought. Cappelen and Dever consider a number of arguments in favour of IIC, arguing that each fails. To sharpen the discussion they provide several examples, central among which is that of François ducking to avoid being shot. A proponent of essential indexicality might attribute the following in a rationalisation of François’ action: the belief “I am about to be shot”, the desire “I not be shot”, and the belief “If I duck I”ll not be shot’. This involves attributing first-personal thoughts to François. The impersonal action rationalisation that Cappelen and Dever propose (2013: 36) replaces occurrences of the first-person with a proper name referring to the agent, as follows:

Belief 1:
François is about to be shot.
Desire 1:
François not be shot.
Belief 2:
If François ducks, he will not be shot

One way to think about Capellen and Dever’s argument against Necessity is as a challenge to show that this rationalisation is incomplete, and that it is so due to a missing indexical element.

This challenge is taken up by Bermúdez (2016, 2017) whose argument can be simplified as follows:

  1. no rationalisation can be complete if an agent can hold every propositional attitude yet not act,
  2. it is possible to hold every propositional attitude in an impersonal action rationalisation yet not act since one believes that one is not the person referred to in the rationalisation (Bermúdez 2017: 15).

It follows that impersonal action rationalisations are incomplete, thus vindicating the first conjunct of IIC.

Morgan (2019) argues that this argument fails for the reason that the sceptic about Necessity can reasonably reject (ii). Among the criticisms that Morgan directs at (ii) is the point that Bermúdez has not ruled out the possibility that what Millikan (1990) calls “active self-names” are responsible for action. An active self-name is a name, in the language of thought, which “names a person whom I know, under that name, how to manipulate directly; I know how to affect her behaviour” (Millikan 1990: 730). And, as she rhetorically asks, “What has know how to do with indexicality?” (Millikan 1990: 730). On Millikan’s view, even though active self-names may be expressed in language by the word “I”, they are not themselves indexical since their reference is not determined by the context of production. On such a view, the idea that I believe that I am not the person referred to in the (active self-name employing) rationalisation amounts to the, dubiously coherent, idea that I believe that I am not me.

On Morgan’s (2019) view, although Bermúdez’s argument fails, an analogous argument concerning temporal indexicals succeeds, for the reason that it is not plausible that there could be a non-indexical item in the language of thought that can do the work that we would otherwise attribute to now-thought. This argument, and Bermúdez’s original argument, are subject to the objection that (i) is false since all manner of things can defeat an action. No matter what propositional attitudes an agent holds, they will not act if, for example, they are paralysed, or if they are weak-willed, or if they believe that they are incapable of acting. This point is made by Magidor, who notes that “hard-wired, physiological constraints” (2015: 262) can mean that two subjects with all the same beliefs can end up performing quite different actions. Of course, (i) might be revised to rule out such defeaters but it will then be pointed out that (ii) works by adding in a defeater (the belief that I am not the person referred to in the explanation).

A different approach is taken by Ninan (2016) and Torre (2018), both of whom focus on the capacity of impersonal action explanations to account for the fact that two agents can hold all the same (relevant) propositional attitudes and yet one act while the other does not (also see García-Carpintero 2017). Suppose that both François and Anais both hold beliefs 1 and 2, and desire 1. What, then, could account for the fact that François ducks while Anais runs for help? According to the defender of Necessity we might suppose the difference is explained by self-consciousness, by the fact that François also believes that he himself is François, a belief that he would express first-personally, while Anais does not.

Capellen and Dever, aware of this issue, propose the “Action Inventory Model” (2013: §3.9) according to which the fact that François ducks, whereas Anais does not, is explained by the fact that François ducks is an action that is available to François but not to Anais. The difference, on this view, is not explained by any difference in their propositional attitudes but rather in what actions are available to them. As Magidor puts essentially the same point, “Jack lifts Jack’s legs to run while Jill lifts Jill’s legs to run” (2015: 262).

Ninan (2016) objects to this view on the grounds that such agent-specific action types (e.g. François ducks or Lifts Jack’s Legs) are necessarily such that no two agents could ever perform them. But we also have a notion of agent-neutral action types (e.g. ducks), allowing us to think of two agents as performing the same action (cf. Verdejo 2020; Valente 2018). Further, given that ducks is an action available to both François and Anais, the Action Inventory Model cannot explain why François ducks but Anais does not. Torre (2018) offers a different objection to the Action Inventory Model, claiming that the availability of François ducks is not sufficient to explain the action. Rather what is required is the first-personal belief that François ducks is one of one’s own available actions. After all, Torre argues, it may be that Anais has the magical power to perform François ducks yet is ignorant of this fact. In such a circumstance it seems implausible to suppose that Anais will perform the action since ignorance seems to stand in the way of action (a distinct, though related, argument for a version of Necessity can be found in Prosser 2015). Once more, the conclusion we are invited to draw is that the Action Inventory Model fails.

Another defence of Necessity comes in the form of the claim that the practical reasoning and/or intention required for action is necessarily first-personal (Babb 2016; Gjelsvik 2017; cf. Hunter 2017). Although there are different lines of thought here, the central idea is that practical reasoning is essentially reasoning about what one will do and its outcome, intention, is only satisfied if one so acts, where these both require first-personal readings. Since the propositional attitudes appealed to in the above impersonal action rationalisation are not the sorts of things that can engage one’s deliberation about what one is to do and could not eventuate in intentions regarding what one is to do, it follows that impersonal action rationalisations are incomplete (also see §4.2 Self-Consciousness and Rationality). Proponents of this view need to show that such first person formulations really are necessary. This may involve doing more than arguing that the content is not as described by Cappelen and Dever (e.g., Intend that: François ducks) since, on the face of it, there are two alternatives: one may think that the content of the relevant intention is first-personal (e.g. Intend that: I duck) or, adjusting the above point from Ninan (2016), that it is impersonal (e.g., Intend: to duck) (for discussion of such issues, see Morgan 2018).

Copyright © 2020 by
Joel Smith <>

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