Simplicius of Cilicia (ca. 480–560 CE), roughly a contemporary of John Philoponus, is without doubt the most important Neoplatonic commentator on Aristotle and one of the two most influential exegetes within the Aristotelian tradition, along with Alexander of Aphrodisias (around 200 CE). Simplicius’ works are an unmatched source for the intellectual traditions that preceded him: Presocratic, Platonic, and especially the Peripatetic tradition. He is also an independent thinker in his own right, with a coherent philosophical agenda. Best known for his tendency to harmonise Plato and Aristotle, he nevertheless criticised Aristotle on several occasions and considered himself a loyal follower of Plato. Writing in an age when Christianity was the dominant religious and political view, Simplicius aimed to show that the Hellenic tradition is not only much older, but also more venerable and more coherent than the Christian tradition. Unimpressed by charges of alleged contradictions among Greek philosophers, Simplicius repeatedly proclaimed that “the ancient wisdom (palaia philosophia) remains unrefuted” (In Phys. 77.11). It is also noteworthy that, like Proclus and other Neoplatonists, Simplicius presents himself as a thinker for whom philosophy and theology form a complete unity. As has frequently been observed, Simplicius’ works, despite their scholarly outlook, have an important spiritual dimension (see §5).
Simplicius’ commentaries have only recently been studied with an eye to his own philosophical views. He was long considered a mere source for Greek philosophy, and, as noted by Baltussen (2010: 714),
Simplicius’ importance as a source for ancient Greek philosophy and science has long overshadowed his contributions as an independent thinker.
Nineteenth-century Quellenforschung was especially interested in his Commentary on the Physics, which was edited in two volumes (Simplicii in Aristotelis Physicorum libros quattuor priores/quattuor posteriores, comprising almost 1500 pages) by Hermann Diels; this commentary served as the basis for Diels’ edition of the Doxographi Graeci (Greek Doxographers), which includes the main doctrines on natural philosophy according to ancient doxographical compendia.
One of the aims of this entry is to emphasise that Simplicius’ writings have much more to offer than a mere doxography of his predecessors—but always bearing in mind that it is only possible to appreciate how Simplicius arranges and interprets the material at his disposal by duly attending to his Neoplatonic agenda.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Simplicius as a Commentator: General Remarks
- 3. The Decisive Role of Alexander of Aphrodisias
- 4. How to Comment on Aristotle as a Neoplatonist?
- 5. The Commentary as Spiritual Exercise
- 6. The Harmony of Plato and Aristotle and Christian Threads
- 7. Simplicius’ Legacy
- List of abbreviations
- Introductions, monographs, and collected volumes
- Editions and Translations of His Commentaries
- Editions and Translations of other Ancient Authors
- Scholarly works
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Life and Works
Not much is known about Simplicius’ life. In Histories II, 30.1 [Keydell], Agathias informs us that Simplicius was born in Cilicia (south coastal region of Asia Minor; today southern Turkey, north to northeast of the island Cyprus). According to Simplicius’ own commentaries, he was educated in Alexandria by Ammonius, son of Hermias (In Cael. 271.19), and in Athens by Damascius (In Phys. 601.19). Hence, he refers to Proclus as “teacher of my teachers” (In Phys. 611.11–12; 795.4–5) and “successor of Plato (diadochos, i.e., head of the school) who lived shortly before me” (In Cael. 640.24–25). The following text from Simplicius’ Commentary on the Physics illustrates well the important role that Proclus played in the tradition of Athenian Neoplatonism:
All the philosophers after Proclus and down to my time, more or less, followed Proclus not only on this detail, but in all the other dogmas, except for Asclepiodorus, Proclus’ most gifted student, and our Damascius. The former because of his immense talent, took pleasure in innovating in doctrinal matters, whereas Damascius, because of his love of work and his sympathy for Iamblichus, was not afraid to reconsider many of Proclus’ dogmas. (Simplicius, In Phys. 795.11–17, translated by I. Hadot and M. Chase, in I. Hadot 2015: 126 n. 223
Several passages in Simplicius’ commentaries also testify to the crucial role that Iamblichus’ philosophy and exegesis played for him (see §1 and §5 in the supplement on “The Commentaries of Simplicius”). Simplicius’ controversy with the Christian commentator Philoponus, who taught in Alexandria, regarding whether the world was created in time (see §3 in the supplement on “The Commentaries of Simplicius”) is well known. However, it seems that they never met personally (“[I] feel no hostility against this man whom, to my knowledge, I have never seen”; In Cael. 26.18–19, translated by C. Wildberg).
In 529, a year that some historians have considered the end of Antiquity, emperor Justinian ordered that “no one was any longer allowed to teach philosophy and astronomy” (this is often referred to as the closure of the Platonic Academy; for details and further literature see Goulet & Coda 2016: 344). It is assumed that this edict mainly targeted non-Christian philosophers such as Neoplatonists and Manichaeans. Following this prohibition, but not immediately, Simplicius travelled with six other Neoplatonic philosophers under the lead of Damascius to the court of the Persian King Chosroes, who had only come to power in Ctesiphon in 531. Disappointed by their experience in Persia—the historian Agathias suggests that the philosophers at first considered Chosroes a kind of ideal Platonic philosopher king—and protected by a peace treaty between Persia and Rome in 532, the philosophers left the country, apparently several months after their arrival. Where the seven went after that is still a matter of debate. The treaty says, inter alia, that
these men should be allowed to return to their own country and live there henceforth in safety, without being forced to adopt opinions which they did not hold, or to change their own faith. (translated by A. Cameron 1969/1970: 169)
Damascius recorded that he returned in 538 to his home country of Syria (Hoffmann 1994: 590–591). Did the others follow him, or did they return to Athens, Syria, or Harran (ancient Carrhae, in the north of Mesopotamia, close to the Syrian border)? This question has not been satisfactorily answered (for the ongoing discussion, see Goulet & Coda 2016: 343–346; Watts 2005: 290–298). However, it seems clear that, in order to write his commentaries—which, as most scholars assume, were composed after returning from Chosroes’ court (I. Hadot 2014: 135)—Simplicius needed quite an extensive library. Therefore, he could only have returned to a place that provided such a library.
Simplicius wrote four commentaries that survive today (on Epictetus’ Handbook and Aristotle’s Categories, Physics, and De Caelo). It is debatable whether, as univocally attested by the all manuscripts, Simplicius is also the author of a fifth commentary, on Aristotle’s De anima. Although there are several other works that he might have written, these do not include any commentaries on Plato aside from one work on the Phaedo (Goulet & Coda 2016: 361–364, 390–394; see In Cael. 369.4–6 and In Epict. I, 350–354 [Hadot]). As is discussed in the supplement The Commentaries of Simplicius, it is difficult to determine the order and periods in which Simplicius composed his commentaries.
Although there are no extant commentaries on Plato that are known to come from Simplicius’ hand, Simplicius’ readers will notice his intimate familiarity with and highest esteem for Plato. Simplicius’ commentaries constitute a rich source for Platonic philosophy, and he is well known for his tendency to harmonise Plato and Aristotle (see §6). His work continues a tendency, probably initiated by Porphyry, to make Plato’s pupil an integral part of the Platonic tradition, reading Aristotle through Platonic—or rather Neoplatonic—lenses. Simplicius frequently chooses a Platonic dialogue in order to compare Plato’s and Aristotle’s philosophy in a specific domain by way of contrast—for example, when he comments on the Physics and the De Caelo, where the Timaeus is always at hand. The Sophist and his the doctrine of the highest kinds (megista genê) play an important role in Simplicius’ commentary on the Categories (cf. already in Plotinus VI 1–3 [42–44]). It should also be noted that Iamblichus’ Neoplatonic psychology, which can be considered a systematisation of Plato’s views, lies in the background throughout the Commentary on the De anima. When Simplicius finds references to Eleatic philosophy in Aristotle (especially in Physics I), the Sophist and Parmenides also figure prominently.
It is also important to identify Simplicius’ purpose and intended audience in writing his compendious exegetical works. Given the sheer size of the commentaries and their argumentative structure, which at times is rather complex, it is difficult to imagine that Simplicius is aiming at students. Moreover, given the uneven length of the exegeses of specific lemmata and the considerable number of so-called digressions (see §2), it is not clear how a teacher could organise the material in the commentaries for a series of lessons. To be suitable for the classroom, Simplicius’ style would have needed to be much more didactic and elementary. Although Baltussen (2010: 717) maintains that
Simplicius writes mostly for a student audience and that his works are intended to be read (In Cael. 377.32, 653.9; In Phys. 111.17, 762.29),
this seems unlikely. Rather, his underlying incentive seems to be to preserve as much original material (from Aristotle, his predecessors, and his commentators) as possible and to present it in a way that brings the unity of the Hellenic tradition to the fore. This would explain why Simplicius continuously reminds his readers not only of the harmony (sumphônia) between Plato and Aristotle, with Aristotle as a loyal member of the Platonic tradition, but also the continuity of Aristotle with the Presocratics, especially the Pythagoreans and the Eleatics. There are several indications in Simplicius’ collective text that he is addressing readers of “considerable sophistication” (Bowen 2013: 5) and that the target audience, as should be suspected given his use of the first person plural, is
contemporary Platonists in some community (to which he did or did not belong) or […] readers imagined to be of like mind in a counterfactual present. (2013: 5)
This fully accords with the view that Simplicius probably did not teach in any school and that when he wrote his commentaries, there was therefore no philosophical curriculum. As Golitsis (2018: 95) has convincingly suggested,
[T]here was no place where they [sc. the Platonic philosophers] could be trained […]. Simplicius invites them to learn by themselves or, if possible, in groups. (see In Cat. 7.33–8.2)
What makes Simplicius’ commentaries a unique source for the history of philosophy before him is the fact that he preserved so much material from his predecessors, often in verbatim quotations:
[…] Simplicius, clearly aware of the fact that the works of many philosophers earlier, contemporary with, and later than Aristotle were in danger of disappearing made a point of quoting from them at length. And so he has often preserved for us texts and information not extant elsewhere. Suffice it to mention, by way of example, the fragments of Anaximander, Parmenides, Zeno, Melissus, Empedocles, Anaxagoras, Theophrastus (especially his History of Philosophy or Physikôn Doxai), Eudemus (especially his History of Geometry), Xenocrates, Epicurus, The Stoics, Porphyry, etc. It is noteworthy that in the case of the Presocratics Simplicius alone has preserved at least two thirds of all the verbatim quotations. (Tarán 1987b: 247)
2. Simplicius as a Commentator: General Remarks
In his introduction to the Commentary on the Categories, Simplicius provides a neat characterisation of the good commentator (axion exêgêtên) on Aristotle (and Plato):
The worthy exegete of Aristotle’s writings must not fall wholly short of the latter’s greatness of intellect (megalonoia). He must also have experience of everything the Philosopher has written, and must be an expert (epistemôn) of Aristotle’s customary use of language (sunêtheia). His judgement must be impartial (adekaston), so that he may neither, out of misplaced zeal, seek to prove something well said to be unsatisfactory, nor, if some point should require attention, should he obstinately persist in trying to demonstrate that [Aristotle] is always and everywhere infallible, as if he had enrolled himself in the Philosopher’s school. [The good exegete] must, I believe, not convict the philosophers of discordance (diaphônia) by looking only at the letter (lexis) of what [Aristotle] says against Plato; but he must look towards the spirit (nous), and track down (anikhneuein) the harmony (sumphônia) which reigns between them on the majority of points. (Simplicius, In Cat. 7.23–32, translated by M. Chase, slightly modified)
This is certainly one of the most interesting passages for those trying to understand the Simplicius’ view of the role of the commentator. The passage can, with caution, be considered a kind of self-portrait of the Neoplatonic commentator at work, a glimpse into his workshop, as it were. The good commentator must (1) be able to understand and follow Aristotle’s arguments (“greatness of intellect”). He must (2) have read all of Aristotle’s works and must know his terminology and ways of expressing himself (“customary use of language”). This is required in order to explain “Aristotle by means of Aristotle” (see [Pseudo-?]Simplicius, In de Anima 1.14–15, and Elias/David, In Cat. 123.7–11) and show that he does not contradict himself. The good commentator must also (3) be impartial, that is, not openly polemical against Aristotle and merely scoring points, but at the same time not an uncritical enthusiast. Simplicius illustrates this elsewhere with his well-known saying, “amicus Plato vel Aristoteles, sed magis amica veritas” (“Plato or Aristotle are dear to me, but much dearer is the truth”; see Tarán 1984 and In Cael. 301.19–21 [about Alexander]). In other words, it is certainly legitimate to criticise Aristotle. But things are different with respect to Plato, because it seems that Simplicius never criticised him. Finally, the good commentator must (4) strive for harmony in most cases, by means of a distinction between the superficial sense of a text (lexis) and its true or deeper meaning (nous).
In order to forge a clearer profile of the commentator, it will be useful to compare him to other Aristotelian commentators, such as Alexander of Aphrodisias, Iamblichus, David, and Elias. The Neoplatonists certainly did not consider Alexander to be an impartial commentator on Aristotle. Rather, Simplicius often treats him as someone who stands in firm opposition to the harmony of Plato and Aristotle. As good a text as any to characterise Alexander’s attitude towards Aristotle can be found in the opening words of his De anima:
Just as I have great reverence for Aristotle’s works on other subjects, since I find more truth in the views passed down from him than in what others have claimed, I regard what he states in his theory of the soul in the same way as well. I will therefore have fulfilled my aim if I can set out his claims about the soul as clearly as possible and offer suitable arguments to show how each of them is well formulated. (Alexander, De anima 2.4–9 [Bruns], translated by V. Caston)
On the other hand, the Neoplatonists viewed Iamblichus as someone who brought Plato and Aristotle too close together. A text from Philoponus points to interpreters who argued that the two even agreed on the nature of universals:
Thus, also Proclus plainly and openly agrees with us about the difference of the two philosophers [sc. as regards the status of universals], or rather he has demonstrated it from the words/writings of Aristotle himself. From this one can only wonder about the overshooting amount of shamelessness among those who try to show that Aristotle and Plato did agree also in this point. (Philoponus, De aeternitate mundi 32.8–13 [Rabe], trans. by author)
It is very likely that Iamblichus was among these interpreters. We know from elsewhere that he even saw agreement regarding the theory of Forms (Elias/David, In Cat. 123.1–3). Along the same lines, Simplicius seems to have reconciled Aristotle’s comparison of the soul with an empty writing tablet (De anima III 4, 429b31–430a2) and Plato’s theory of innate knowledge (de Haas 2000, 169–170).
Was Simplicius impartial towards Plato? This is insisted upon, for instance, by Elias/David (In Cat. 122.27–32), but not, at least not explicitly, by Simplicius. As noted above, Simplicius is prepared to criticise Aristotle time and again (for instance, in his digression on place [topos]), but he never seems to criticise Plato. For Simplicius, Plato is the one who brought the truth to light, the explainer or interpreter of the truth (ho tês alêtheias exêgêtês, In Cael. 131.1), but Aristotle is never granted such an honorary title (cf. Syrianus’ and Proclus’ distinction between a “divine Plato”and a (merely) “daimonic/semi-divine Aristotle”). Therefore, one may surmise that Plato was not subject to the impartiality requirement, since he was, compared to all other representatives of the ancient philosophical tradition (hoi palaioi), somehow closest to the truth.
3. The Decisive Role of Alexander of Aphrodisias
If one were to name a single commentator apart from Simplicius’ Neoplatonic sources (esp. Porphyry and Iamblichus) who mostly strongly shaped his commentaries, it would undoubtedly be Alexander of Aphrodisias (around 200 CE):
[It is] profitable for those who choose to understand and explain Aristotle’s thought by way of Alexander’s commentaries, to examine what he said. (Simplicius, In Cael. 297.8–10, translated by J. Hankinson)
Baltussen used this telling quotation to preface the chapter on Alexander of Aphrodisias in his monograph on Simplicius (2008: 107). It illustrates rather well that Simplicius by no means blindly followed “the commentator” (ho exêgêtês), as he calls him (In Phys. 1170.2, In Cael. 121.12 and 700.9), but was eager to carefully examine what Alexander had to say. It is known, for instance, that Simplicius had direct access to Alexander’s commentaries on the Physics, the Heavens, and the Categories. All of these are now lost, but a good deal can be reconstructed based on Simplicius’ testimony (see the overview in Kupreeva [2018: 387-388 and 443]). It can even be said without exaggeration that large parts of Simplicius’ oeuvre are, in fact, extended conversations with “Aristotle’s most famous exegete” (Baltussen 2016: 1). While Simplicius owes much to Alexander, his attitude towards him is ambiguous and comparable to how Syrianus deals with Alexander’s Commentary on the Metaphysics. Syrianus focuses especially on those passages where Aristotle attacks Pythagorean-Platonic metaphysics (esp. in books 13 and 14 of the Metaphysics), but in other cases, Alexander’s comments suffice (O’Meara & Dillon 2008: 5). In other words, Alexander’s comments generally have great value; he is the more genuine (gnêsiôteros) commentator on Aristotle (In Phys. 80.15–16), especially as far as the Peripatetic tradition is concerned. Moreover, while Aristotle is the most genuine disciple of Plato (gnêsiôtatos), Alexander is the “most careful of Aristotle’s partisans” (epimelestatos spoudastês, In Cael. 378.20–22, borrowing the translation from Mueller).
On the other hand, Alexander of Aphrodisias can also be a stumbling block for integrating Aristotle into the Platonic tradition. This is reflected in several passages where Simplicius remarks on Alexander’s way of explaining Aristotle and, more specifically, his attitude towards Plato. For while Simplicius as a rule tries to explain away critical remarks that Aristotle aimed at his teacher, for instance, via the distinction between the superficial meaning of a text (lexis, to phainomenon) and its real purpose (dianoia, nous), Alexander always sides with Aristotle against Plato:
It is my opinion that Alexander of Aphrodisias obviously understands the words of Aristotle well on other occasions—and does so better than the other Peripatetics, but, in the case of the things which Aristotle says concerning Plato, he does not seem to me to bear in mind that Aristotle’s counter-arguments are directed at the surface import of Plato’s statements (pros to phainomenon). But, contesting Plato frivolously (kakoscholôs) in a way, he tries not only, as Aristotle also does, to refute the surface import of what Plato says, taking simpler <people> into consideration, but he also attacks the ideas (tas ennoias) of the divine Plato and tries to draw consequences from what Plato says, frequently not even attending to the surface import.
Consequently I, setting out the truth, which is dear to god and to Aristotle, will here try to do a careful investigation, putting forward the things which Alexander says are the opinions of Plato about the motion of the soul. I do this because of those who deal with his words in a more superficial way and dare to take from them in a way which is hostile to the views of Plato, which is the same as to say hostile to the opinions of Aristotle and to divine truth. (Simplicius, In Cael. 377.20–34, translated by I. Mueller)
But Alexander von Aphrodisias does not understand Plato’s doctrines as Aristotle understood them, nor does he accept that their views are in agreement (sumphônia) […]. (Simplicius, In Cael. 297.1–4, translated by R. J. Hankinson)
I have said these things against Alexander for, while I respect the man and wish him well, I think that honouring the truth the more is dear to him too. (Simplicius, In Cael. 301.19–21, translated by R. J. Hankinson)
But Alexander, although he is accustomed to drag in Plato even where he is quite irrelevant, for some reason has here forgotten Plato instead. (Simplicius, In Phys. 560.11–13, translated by J. O. Urmson)
4. How to Comment on Aristotle as a Neoplatonist?
The Neoplatonic commentaries of late Antiquity represent rather sophisticated readings of Plato and Aristotle, integrating a rich prehistory of exegesis and philosophical debate, but also structured according to certain well-defined rules and methods. Since Simplicius comes almost at the end of this tradition, his commentaries are also a repository from which such constituent parts of Platonic exegetical practices can be reconstructed. Generally speaking, both ancient and medieval commentators share a nondevelopmentalist approach to their authors and treat single works as part of a greater philosophical whole or system. Simplicius’ main aim is to clarify the Aristotelian text, explain Aristotle by means of his own writings, and demonstrate the harmony of Plato, Aristotle and older pre-Socratic traditions.
Several elements are characteristic of Simplicius’ commentaries. All are lemmatised, that is, Aristotle’s (or Epictetus’) text is divided into smaller sections of text which are then commented upon, and the commentaries are introduced with prologues of varying lengths (see below for more details). The comments on a single lemma are sometimes subdivided into two sections, one which mainly comments on the philosophical content (theôria) and one which comments on single expressions or words (lexis). Such a distinction goes back to Proclus (Festugière 1963 ). Since the commentaries are probably not written for teaching purposes (see §1), they are not structured according to “lessons” (praxeis), as was the usual practice in the Alexandrian school after Ammonius. Digressions or autonomous essays that interrupt the running commentary are also characteristic of Simplicius (see Golitsis 2008a and §2.3 in the supplement “The Commentaries of Simplicius”). Like Aristotle, Simplicius frequently integrates longer doxographies. At times, he approaches philosophical issues through the method of “difficulties and solutions” (aporiai kai luseis), which can frequently be found in Damascius, Simplicius’ teacher, and ultimately goes back to Aristotle (cf. Metaphysics Beta, with its long list of aporiai). From Iamblichus, Simplicius borrows the policy that each of Plato’s and Aristotle’s works should be explained by first establishing its main, overarching topics (skopos) which hold all the parts together:
For the goal (skopos), once correctly identified, defines and rectifies our thought (dianoia), so that we are not vainly transported about in every direction, but refer everything to it. (Simplicius, In Cat. 8.13–15, translated by Michael Chase)
A common practice among later Neoplatonists was to preface their commentaries with a series of questions or preliminary points (kephalaia) that should be settled before embarking on the exegesis proper (Hadot & Hoffmann 1990: 21–160; Hoffmann 1998; Mansfeld 1994; for an excellent (English) summary see Hoffmann 2006: 607–613). The form that these prolegomena, as they were called, take in Simplicius was introduced by the Neoplatonist Proclus (Elias/David, In Cat. 107.24–26). In the case of Aristotle’s Categories, for instance, we find not only prolegomena suited for this very text (in seven points), but also a general introduction to Aristotle’s philosophy (in ten points; for a useful overview see Hoffmann 2006: 607–613). This is because the Categories was the first of Aristotle’s texts to be read in the Neoplatonic school:
Since the Categories is the first book of Aristotle’s which we encounter, and Aristotle’s school—the so-called Peripatetic—is one of the schools of philosophy, we ought first to say how and in how many ways the philosophical schools received their appellations. Secondly, what is the division of the Aristotelian writings, so that the class to which we shall assign the present work shall be clear. Third, whence should one begin [the study of] Aristotle’s writings? Fourth, what is the goal of Aristotle’s philosophy? Fifth, which things lead us towards this goal? Sixth, what is the form of the Aristotelian writings? Seventh, why did the Philosopher practise obscurity? Eighth, what must the exegete of accounts (logoi) such as these be like? Ninth, what kind of student should be accepted? Tenth, in the case of each Aristotelian treatise, how many main points (kephalaia) should be taken up, which are they, and for what reason? (Simplicius, In Cat. 3.18–29, translated by M. Chase)
Finally, the tenth of the matters set forth was: how many, and of what kind, are the preliminary points (kephalaia) we must articulate prior to the study of each Aristotelian treatise. They are the following: the goal (skopos), the usefulness (to chrêsimon), the reason for the title (aitia epigraphês), its place in the order of reading (taxis anagnôseôs), whether the book is a genuine work of the Philosopher (gnêsion), its division into chapters (eis kephalaia dihairesis). It may also not be inappropriate to inquire under what part of his philosophy (meros tês philosophias) the work is placed. (Simplicius, In Cat. 8.9–13, translated by M. Chase)
Such an introductory scheme could be modified according to the specific needs and exigencies of a text, so that there is not always a discussion of all preliminary points:
It is to be noted, however, that all these things do not always require articulation, for often, the usefulness becomes clear at the same time as the goal, while the title is obvious to everyone, as [in the case of] the On the Soul. Authenticity, for its part, does not need to be established in every case, but in general only when there is some starting-point for controversy. (Simplicius, In Cat. 8.31–9.3, translated by M. Chase)
5. The Commentary as Spiritual Exercise
I offer these things as a hymn to You, Lord (despota), Creator (dêmiourgos) of the whole cosmos and of the simple bodies in it, and to those who have been made by You, desiring to behold the greatness of Your works and proclaim it to the worthy so that, thinking nothing mean or merely human about You, we might kneel down to You because of the superiority which You have over all the things created by You. (Simplicius, In Cael. 731.25–29, translated by I. Mueller)
Simplicius’ Commentary on the Heavens ends with a prayer to the demiurge. In this prayer, the whole work is termed a “hymn” (humnos) to the creator god. Several recent studies have pointed out that the later Neoplatonists considered theology and ritual (theurgy) an integral part of their philosophy. For instance, Proclus composed several hymns and begins his Commentary on the Parmenides with a long prayer. Both he and his teacher Syrianus were eager to show that Plato was in harmony with most ancient religious traditions such as the Orphics, the Pythagoreans and the Chaldaean Oracles. Simplicius’ extant commentaries all end with a prayer, the only exception being the Commentary on the De anima, where we find a small prayer at the beginning of the work:
And now, under the Guide who is the cause of all souls and all reasoning, let us start upon the projected work. (Simplicius, In de Anima 1.3–21, translated by J. O. Urmson, slightly modified)
Surprisingly, and unexpectedly for readers familiar with Aristotle’s Physics and De caelo, which are both rather technical in character, Simplicius’ comments time and again betray a deeply religious or spiritual mindset. In the tradition of Athenian Neoplatonism, where religious and ritual elements were crucial ingredients of philosophy, Simplicius’ Platonisation of Aristotle, as it were, also entails a spiritualisation of Aristotle’s works.
This is where the ultimate usefulness (chrêsimon) of Simplicius’ writings is located. Philippe Hoffmann has demonstrated this admirably:
The example of Simplicius’s Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics is emblematic of the connection between learned exegesis and religion: the “usefulness” of physics, Simplicius explains, is to provoke the awakening in souls of the anagogical triad of Love, Truth, and Faith (to which is added a fourth term, Hope); and the successive reading of the Physics and the De Caelo leads the soul of the philosopher-exegete and those of his audience (or of his readers) to a “union” (henôsis), through Faith and the “vital sympathy” correlative with it, with the divine Heaven and with the demiurgic intellect that produces the World. (Hoffmann 2006: 599–600)
Within this text is a motif that may be called the ultimate goal (telos) of all ancient philosophical schools, but especially of the Platonic tradition, to wit, “assimilation to god” (Plato, Theaetetus 176b–c, trans. by author). The average Aristotle scholar today might find this far-fetched, to say the least. However, neither of Simplicius’ commentaries on natural philosophy was by any means a religious manifesto. Rather, they are both crammed with technical details and a vast knowledge of texts and philosophical problems. But to ignore this religious dimension would do injustice to Simplicius’ general approach to philosophy and exegesis, for in late Antiquity, philosophy was considered a “way of life” (P. Hadot 1995) and always related to ethics and the ultimate goal of human life, i.e., purification, ascent, and salvation/deification of the soul:
If we take Simplicius at his word that the ‘study of physics […] arouses us to marvel and magnify the maker of the cosmos', his commentaries on Physics and On the Heavens are indeed also a form of worship in which his ingenuity and respect for the established tradition contribute to the general effort of clarifying the interpreters of nature (and the interpreters of the interpreters). In trying to defend the Platonist point of view in contradistinction to the Christian outlook he uses polemic to persuade and refute, the comprehensive exegesis to clarify and proselytise. His commentaries thus became one very elaborate protreptic and guide to Aristotle's works. (Baltussen 2008: 195)
6. The Harmony of Plato and Aristotle and Christian Threads
[The good exegete] must, I believe, not convict the philosophers of discordance (diaphônia) by looking only at the letter (lexis) of what [Aristotle] says against Plato; but he must look towards the spirit (nous), and track down (anikhneuein) the harmony (sumphônia) which reigns between them on the majority of points. (Simplicius, In Cat. 7.29–32, translated by M. Chase)
This programmatic statement from the introductory section to the Commentary on the Categories shows that the harmony of Plato and Aristotle was one of Simplicius’ top priorities as a commentator. As mentioned earlier, the ancient notion of harmony (sumphônia) did not entail a strict identity of philosophical views. Rather, it referred to positions that are reconcilable, compatible, or even complementary:
The text of the two philosophers can be in accord by being complementary in a unified system, which is quite different from their being in accord as to the very ideas they contain. (Golitsis 2018: 72)
Neoplatonists frequently characterised Aristotle as the secretary of nature, as it were, while Plato was the metaphysician par excellence (cf. Raphael’s “The School of Athens”). Each had his own peculiar domain and his peculiar philosophical attitude, but one could nevertheless speak of a harmony between the two approaches:
[Aristotle] always refuses to deviate from nature; on the contrary, he considers even things which are above nature according to their relation to nature, just as, by contrast, the divine Plato, according to Pythagorean usage, examines even natural things insofar as they participate in the things above nature. (Simplicius, In Cat. 6.27–30, translated by M. Chase)
One ought to know that Aristotle is always doing natural philosophy when he does theology, while Plato is always doing theology when he does natural philosophy. (Elias/David, In Cat. 120.30–121.4)
However, I think that one should also attend to the purpose (skopos) as well as at the words and recognise that the difference (diaphora) between the two philosophers on these questions is not about things (pragmata) but about words: Plato rejects the ordinary use of words (sunêtheia) in the name of precision, but Aristotle makes use of the ordinary use of words on the grounds that the truth is not at all harmed by this. (Simplicius, In Cael. 69.11–15, translated by I. Mueller)
Here, therefore, the difference (diaphora) between the philosophers is not over a reality (pragma), but over a name (onoma), as it is in most cases. I think the reason often is that Aristotle wishes to preserve linguistic usage and carries out his arguments on the basis of what is evident to the senses, while Plato often scorns them and readily resorts to intellective theories. (Simplicius, In Phys. 1249.12–17, translated by I. Bodnár, M. Chase, and M. Share; cf. (Pseudo-?)Simplicius, In de Anima 28.12–13)
Certainly, one may wonder whether such a program does justice to either Plato or Aristotle, although this issue is not relevant to the present discussion of Simplicius. Within the framework of Late Neoplatonism, it seems advisable to distinguish Simplicius from Syrianus and Proclus, since both of the latter are much more explicit and polemical when it comes to reprimanding Aristotle for his criticism of Plato. On the other hand, while it is true that Simplicius makes a great effort to reconcile the two philosophers, such a rapprochement could also be considered a Platonisation of Aristotle and a stealthy neutralisation of his at times anti-Platonic line of reasoning.
Be that as it may, it is nevertheless clear that there is a rich pedigree in the history of the Platonic tradition regarding harmonisation. Simplicius continues and extends a program that was inaugurated by his teacher Ammonius, and also before him by Porphyry, and it was afterwards continued in Alexandria by Hierocles and Olympiodorus, more or less along the same lines as Simplicius. Karamanolis (2018: 36) argues convincingly that Porphyry (and before him some Middle Platonists) had already considered Aristotle a crucial part of the Platonic tradition:
[…] Porphyry wrote commentaries on works of Aristotle because he found these works to represent an elaboration on, and a development of, Plato’s philosophy. […] What Porphyry does deny is that Aristotle contradicts the essence of Plato’s philosophical views when he articulates theories that are not in Plato, since these may be inspired from Plato or continue in some way Plato’s thinking on a given issue.
Scholars have remarked that Simplicius’ eagerness to harmonise Plato and Aristotle should be seen in the context of the Neoplatonist’s anti-Christian attitude and especially his polemics against the Christian Platonist John Philoponus (Hoffmann 2014: 286). After Christianity became the official state religion (in 380 CE), it was ever more difficult for pagan philosophers to teach and practice their cultic rituals. This development culminated in the famous edict of 529, commonly referred to as the closing of the Platonic Academy (see §1). One of the main criticisms, made as early as the first Christian apologist Tertullian, was that Greek philosophers and their schools would constantly contradict each other, so that it was impossible to speak of a unified intellectual tradition or heritage. In this respect, John Philoponus was particularly dangerous in criticising the Hellenic tradition from within, and with an excellent knowledge of all of the relevant texts. If all of this weren’t bad enough, the Christian Platonist from Alexandria openly countered efforts toward harmonisation. Being a fervent champion of the creation of the world in time (according to the Christian creed), Philoponus argues that one of the most common arguments of the harmonisers—that Aristotle would only criticise the apparent meaning of Plato’s words—is not valid. He even refers to it as a fiction (muthos), adding that if it were true, Aristotle would have said so explicitly:
From these passages we can most certainly see that Aristotle’s refutations of Plato are not directed at people who have wrongly understood Plato, which is a fiction created by some more recent commentators out of embarrassment at the disagreement between the <two> philosophers, but rather constitute a rebuttal of the notions of Plato himself. For, if Aristotle had not been attacking Plato’s own doctrine of the Forms but, as these commentators claim, that of people who have misunderstood him, he would have specified precisely this at the outset and not have refuted the doctrine of the Forms generally and without qualification. (Philoponus, De aet. Mundi 29.2–13, translated by P. Golitsis 2018: 73)
Simplicius’ polemics with Philoponus in his commentaries on the Physics and De Caelo will be examined in more detail below.
Ammonius, pupil of Proclus was also an important predecessor for Simplicius. Ammonius taught in Alexandria (around the second half of the fifth century) and famously argued that Aristotle’s Unmoved Mover is both a final and an efficient cause (Simplicius, In Cael. 271.13–21 and In Phys. 1360.24–1363.24). Such a reading of Aristotle, which Proclus still firmly opposes (In Parm. IV 842.20–27 [Steel], where he calls the Unmoved Mover agonos, i.e., not productive or infertile; see also Tempelis 1998: 134 n. 609), was an important step in combining the demiurge in Plato’s Timaeus with Aristotle’s self-thinking intellect (Metaphysics Lambda 6–7). Simplicius welcomes Ammonius’ innovation and, not surprisingly, refers to him with great approval (see In Phys. 1362.11–16 and Golitsis 2017a).
But it should not be forgotten that there were also other threads to Simplicius’ approach of harmonising the Hellenic tradition and especially of integrating Aristotle. At In Cael. 297.1–6, he mentions some interpreters (tines) who betrayed a hostile attitude towards Aristotle. It is likely that he mainly had Syrianus and Proclus in mind. Simplicius had to deal with such criticism with much more delicacy than the criticism coming from Philoponus. There is a telling passage in In Cael. 640.20–31, where Simplicius explains that Proclus has refuted Aristotle’s criticism of Plato in the De caelo in a special monograph (now lost; see Steel 2005 and Luna, Segonds, and Endress 2012: 1591–1596) in order to immediately remark that the criticism was only apparent.
What are the different strategies Simplicius uses to harmonise Plato and Aristotle or to integrate the Presocratics and even earlier traditions (Chaldeans, Orphics) into the Platonic tradition? In Platonic Theology I 4, Proclus discusses at length an exegetical device that seems to be comparable to the doctrine of the “four senses of scripture” (quattuor sensus sacrae scripturae), well known from biblical exegesis. According to Proclus, different hermeneutical methods may be applied to different texts, depending on the mode of their composition. From the perspective of the Neoplatonists, different authors or even schools of thought had different ways of expressing themselves; this applied mainly to traditions that were active or alleged to be active before Socrates and Plato: the Chaldeans, the Orphics, Homer (and Hesiod), the Presocratics (esp. Parmenides and Pythagoras, including the Pseudo-Pythagorean tradition)—but also to Plato and Aristotle. Texts could be written “in riddles”, “as myths”, “in symbols”, or “in images”, and they could be “inspired” or “dialectical”. At times, this entailed that these texts needed to be translated or decoded in order to serve in philosophical debates. It goes without saying that such presuppositions also granted a certain kind of exegetical freedom to the interpreters. Plato himself, Proclus explains, betrays at least four modes of expressing himself in different dialogues, while Aristotle was often considered to intentionally write in an obscure way for members of his school. Moreover, while Plato, according to Simplicius, “rejects the ordinary use of words in the name of precision”, Aristotle “makes use of the ordinary use” (Simplicius, In Cael. 69.11–15).
It is against this background that Simplicius’ attempt to harmonise the Greek tradition should be interpreted. Compared to Proclus, Simplicius’ approach is less complex, and it is, in fact, rather similar in principle. Regarding the Presocratics, Simplicius remarks that they frequently speak in riddles (ainigmatôdôs) and that Aristotle’s criticism of them is merely directed against their apparent meaning. What is more, we should keep in mind that they wrote before the methods of philosophical discourse and formal logic were firmly established by Plato and Aristotle:
But since we will hear Aristotle too refuting the opinions of earlier philosophers, and before Aristotle Plato seems to do this, and before both of them Parmenides and Xenophanes, it should be known that these people, being concerned for those who listen more superficially, refuted the apparent absurdity (to phainomenon atopon) in their accounts, since the ancients were accustomed to express their doctrines in riddles (ainigmatôdôs). (Simplicius, In Phys. 36.25–31, translated by R. Barney and S. Menn)
[…] Eudemus bears witness to this when he says: ‘Someone might be amazed at Parmenides for following these untrustworthy arguments and being deceived by things of this kind, but these matters had not yet then been clarified. For neither did anyone refer to “[being spoken of] in many ways” but Plato was the first to introduce “in two ways”, nor [did anyone speak of] the “in itself” or “the accidental”; and it seems that he [i.e., Parmenides] was indeed misled by these points. These have been studied through the arguments and counter arguments, and the syllogistic <figure>. For there was no agreement unless it was seen to be necessary. But our predecessors made claims without proof. (Simplicius, In Phys. 120.6–12, translated by P. Huby and C. C. W. Taylor)
Simplicius uses the same pattern of argument regarding Aristotle’s criticism of Plato: Aristotle argues merely against the apparent meaning of Plato’s words (see, for instance, In Cael. 352.27–28, 296.6–8 and 26–30, 377.20 ff.). Pantelis Golitsis has rightly pointed out that such criticism had a “preventive” and “pedagogical” function for ordinary, more superficial, and inexperienced readers who were prone to misunderstand Plato. This goes back, in part, to the Neoplatonist Syrianus (Golitsis 2018: 94). For instance, Golitsis points to In Phys. 821.27–29, where Simplicius explains that “Aristotle philosophised in a way which is more suited to the majority of people and because he was aware of their misunderstandings […]” (translated by J. O. Urmson and P. Golitsis). Simplicius’ arguments are, as previously noted, indebted to Ammonius. Olympiodorus, Ammonius’ pupil in Alexandria, shows a strategy similar to Simplicius’ strategy. The only difference may be that, as already noted, Simplicius never seems to disagree with Plato. Was the Alexandrian or the Ammonian school more liberal in this respect? Once again, it is interesting to compare Simplicius with Olympiodorus:
Olympiodorus follows Ammonius in emphasizing the harmony between Aristotle and his master […]. He calls him a true disciple of Plato (In Alc. 5.29–32). Whenever possible he resolves apparent contradictions and says that in the rare instances where Aristotle diverges from Plato he is still indebted to him (In Gorg. 41.9, 214.13–215.11). Olympiodorus is not blind to the divergences, and in those cases he usually, though not always, agrees with Plato. (Opsomer 2010: 707)
7. Simplicius’ Legacy
In the Middle Ages and after, Simplicius was read by a wide range of authors, but to date no systematic study of his legacy has been published. This final section presents only a limited selection of evidence for his legacy. In the Latin West, the Dominican friar William of Moerbeke (1215–1286) translated some of Simplicius’ commentaries into Latin. This made them accessible to readers such as Thomas Aquinas, Henry of Ghent, Duns Scotus, and many others. Moerbeke finished translating the Commentary on the Categories in 1266 (Chase 2008: 12–17 and 20–24). He also translated a small part of the Commentary on the De Caelo, the so-called fragmentum Toletanum, followed by a full translation of the commentary in 1271 (see Bossier 1987). In addition, there is a partial translation by Robert Grosseteste that is older then the one by Moerbeke, but it is difficult to determine who actually made use of it.
Regarding Moerbeke’s influence on Thomas, the latter seems to have followed Simplicius in the way he conceives the history of philosophy and, more specifically, the relation between Plato and Aristotle (see Hankey 2002):
The diversity of these two positions stems from this, that some, in order to seek the truth about the nature of things, have proceeded from intelligible reasons, and this was the particular characteristic of the Platonists. Some, however, have proceeded from sensible things, and this was the particular characteristic of the philosophy of Aristotle, as Simplicius says in his commentary Upon the Categories. (Thomas Aquinas, De Spiritualibus creaturis 3.40.275–282, as quoted in Hankey 2002: n. 46)
Moreover, Thomas must have considered Simplicius a rich source of information about ancient philosophers and their doctrines and especially about the Peripatetic tradition. Bossier (1987) and others have suggested that Thomas might have used material from the previously mentioned fragmentum Toletanum in his Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics (XII 8, on concentric spheres and their different movers). There is no evidence of an early Latin translation of the other commentaries, with the possible exception of a small part of the Commentary on the Physics, which also goes back to Robert Grosseteste (Mansion 1956: 94).
The Arabic tradition is another important source of information about Simplicius (for a concise summary, see Goulet & Coda 2016: 384–394; see also Vallat 2014a and 2014b and Gätje 1982). As in the Latin tradition, the Commentaries on the Categories and the De anima seem to have primarily been read by scholars (in both Arabic and Syriac). However, there also appears to be some evidence for a lost Commentary on the First Book of Euclid (Goulet & Coda 2016: 390–394; I. Hadot 2014, 39–53; R. Rashed 2005). Before Simplicius, Proclus had already commented on Euclid. Proclus’ commentary still exists, and so there is a question regarding Simplicius’ motivation for writing a second commentary, and it may be that Simplicius’ commentary was simply an augmented and revised version of Proclus’ commentary. Philosophers in the Arabic tradition, like those in the Latin tradition, also used Simplicius to defend the harmony of Plato and Aristotle.
The Byzantine tradition is primarily relevant for the textual transmission of Simplicius’ works. From the little that is known, Byzantine scholars seem to have had a special interest in the Commentary on the Physics. One of the most important manuscripts conserving this commentary (Mosquensis Muz. 3649), not used by Hermann Diels in his CAG edition, was copied by the Byzantine princess Theodora Palaiologina Rhaulaina (ca. 1240–1300; see Harlfinger 1987). Simplicius’ Commentary on the Physics was used by Michael Psellus, Nicophorus Blemmydes (in his Isagogical Epitome; Golitsis 2007), Georgios Pachymeres (in his own Commentary on the Physics, traditionally attributed to Psellus; Golitsis 2008b), Georgios Gemistius-Plethon, Georgios Scholarius, and Theodorus of Gaza. Since there was a lively debate among Byzantine philosophers on the relation between Plato and Aristotle, it is very likely that Simplicius had an impact in this respect.
Interest in the Commentary on the De anima can also be traced in the Renaissance, for instance, the attention paid to (Pseudo-?)Simplicius’ reading of De anima III 5 as regarding the human intellect only, and also his explanation of the key notion of entelecheia and his relation to Averroes’ psychology (Nardi 1951; Salatowsky 2006; Blackwell 2011). Moreover, Renaissance philosophers, like scholars in Byzantium and the Latin West, thought much about the relation between Plato and Aristotle, with some sharing Simplicius’ preference for harmony or concordism and others opposing it. Thus, for example, Thomas Aquinas’ view on the harmony of Plato and Aristotle was partly inspired by passages from Simplicius (in William of Moerbeke’s Latin translation). Other than in the Middle Ages, we also find a growing interest in his Commentary on Epictetus’ Handbook from the fifteenth century onwards, especially among Humanists (P. Hadot 1987). Last, but not least, in his Lectures on the History of Philosophy, G. W. F. Hegel (1770–1831) calls Simplicius “the most learned and acute of the Greek commentators on Aristotle” (“der gelehrteste und scharfsinnigste der griechischen Kommentatoren des Aristoteles”) and asserts that “we owe him much” (“wir verdanken ihm Verdienstliches”).
Although much more could be said here about Simplicius’ legacy, suffice it to say the following. As mentioned in the introduction, his Commentary on the Physics was the basis for Diels’ fundamental studies on the Greek doxographers (Doxographi graeci) and the fragments of the Presocratic philosophers (Fragmente der Vorsokratiker). The reconstruction of the Peripatetic tradition also depends to a large extent on Simplicius (Falcon 2017 and Baltussen 2016). This is especially obvious in the work of Alexander of Aphrodisias, where substantial parts of lost commentaries can be retrieved from Simplicius’ works (M. Rashed 2011), but also in the case of less well-known figures such as Boethos of Sidon (Chiaradonna & Rashed forthcoming). Compared to Hermann Diels and others, we now have a much better grasp of how Simplicius handled his sources and how he portrayed the historical development of Greek philosophy up to his time. Several recent studies have also provided a clearer profile of Simplicius’ own philosophical agenda. Nevertheless, considerable parts of his commentaries are still relatively unexplored, and it now seems to be a good time for contemporary scholars to rediscover the Neoplatonist as an inspiring late-ancient colleague in the joint venture of coming to terms with Aristotle.
List of abbreviations
- [In Cael.] In Aristotelis De Caelo commentaria, Johann Ludwig Heiberg (ed.)— Commentary on Aristotle’s On the Heavens
- [In Cat.] In Aristotelis Categorias commentaria, Carolus Kalbfleisch (ed.)—Commentary on Aristotle’s Categories
- [In de Anima] In libros Aristotelis de Anima commentaria, Michael Hayduck (ed.)—Commentary on Aristotle’s De Anima
- [In Epict.] Commentaria In Epicteti Encheiridion, Ilsetraut Hadot (ed.)— Commentary on Epictetus’ Handbook [the commentary is quoted here according to the number of the lemmata (including the praefatio and the epilogus) and the pages and line numbers of Hadot’s editio maior (1996); the English translation by Brennan and Brittain 2002, only mentions the page numbers of Hadot’s edition and otherwise provides references to Dübner’s edition from 1840. In principle, it would suffice to quote Hadot’s edition according to the lemmata and line number, but then it would be impossible to find the corresponding passage in the English translation.]
- [In Phys.] In Aristotelis Physicorum libros quattuor priores/posteriores, Hermann Diels (ed.)—Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics
Introductions, monographs, and collected volumes
- Baltussen, Han, 2008, Philosophy and Exegesis in Simplicius: The Methodology of a Commentator, London: Duckworth.
- –––, 2010, “Simplicius of Cilicia”, in The Cambridge History of Philosophy in Late Antiquity, Volume 2, Lloyd P. Gerson (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 711–732. doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521194846.010
- –––, 2018, “§162. Simplikios”, in Die Philosophie der Antike, Christoph Riedweg, Christoph Horn, and Dietmar Wyrwa (eds.), (Band 5: Philosophie der Kaiserzeit und der Spätantike) (= Grundriss der Geschichte der Philosophie: Die Philosophie der Antike. Band 5/3), Basel: Schwabe, pp. 2060–2084.
- Goulet, Richard and Elisa Coda, 2016, “Simplicius de Cilicie”, in Dictionnaire des Philosophes Antiques (Volume VI: De Sabinillus à Tyrsénos), Paris: CNRS Éditions, pp. 341–394.
- Hadot, Ilsetraut, 1987, Simplicius, sa vie, son œuvre, sa survie: actes du colloque international de Paris 28 Sept. – 1er Oct. 1985, (Peripatoi, 15), Berlin: de Gruyter.
- –––, 1990, “The Life and Works of Simplicius in Greek and Arabic Sources”, in Aristotle Transformed: The Ancient Commentators and their Influence, Richard Sorabji (ed.), Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, pp. 275–304.
- –––, 2014, Le néoplatonicien Simplicius à la lumière des recherches contemporaines: Un bilan critique, St. Augustin: Academia Verlag.
- Hadot, Ilsetraut and Pierre Hadot, 2004, Apprendre à philosopher dans l’Antiquité: L’enseignement du “Manuel d’Épictète” et son commentaire néoplatonicien, Paris: Librairie générale française.
- Linguiti, Alessandro, 1988, “Studi recenti sulla vita e l’opera di Simplicio”, Studi Classici e Orientali, 36: 331–346.
- Praechter, Karl, 1927, “Simplicius (10)”, in Paulys Realencyclopädie der classischen Altertumswissenschaft, Band III A, Halbband 5, Silacenis–Sparsus, 204–213.
Editions and Translations of His Commentaries
On Aristotle’s On the Heavens
Standard edition of the Greek
- Simplicii in Aristotelis De caelo commentaria, Johann Ludwig Heiberg (ed.), (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca [CAG] 7), Berlin 1894.
- Simplicius, On Aristotle On the Heavens, multiple
volumes, (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Bloomsbury
(Duckworth prior to 2010)
- On Aristotle On the Heavens 1.1–4, Robert J. Hankinson (trans.), 2002.
- On Aristotle On the Heavens 1.5–9, Robert J. Hankinson (trans.), 2004.
- On Aristotle On the Heavens 1.10–12, Robert J. Hankinson (trans.), 2006.
- On Aristotle On the Heavens 1.2–3, Ian Mueller (trans.), 2011.
- On Aristotle On the Heavens 1.3–4, Ian Mueller (trans.), 2011.
- On Aristotle On the Heavens 2.1–9, Ian Mueller (trans.), 2004.
- On Aristotle On the Heavens 2.10–14, Ian Mueller (trans.), 2005.
- On Aristotle On the Heavens 3.1–7, Ian Mueller (trans.), 2009.
- On Aristotle On the Heavens 3.7–4.6, Ian Mueller (trans.), 2009.
- Philoponus, Against Aristotle on the Eternity of the World, Christian Wildberg (trans.), (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Bloomsbury Academic, 2013. [Collection of fragments, most of which can be found in Simplicius’ In cael.]
- The Treatises of Aristotle On the Heavens, On generation and corruption, and On meteors, translated from the Greek, with copious elucidations, from the commentaries of Simplicius on the first, and of Olympiodorus on the last of these treatises, Th. Taylor (trans.), London 1807; Somerset: ND Frome 2004.
On Aristotle’s Categories
Standard edition of the Greek
- Simplicii in Aristotelis Categorias commentarium, Carolus Kalbfleisch (ed.), (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca [CAG] 8), Berlin, 1907.
- Simplicius, On Aristotle’s Categories, multiple
volumes, (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Bloomsbury
(Duckworth prior to 2010)
- On Aristotle’s Categories 1–4, Michael Chase (trans.), 2003.
- On Aristotle’s Categories 5–6, Frans A. J. de Haas and Barrie Fleet (trans.), 2001.
- On Aristotle’s Categories 7–8, Barrie Fleet, 2002.
- On Aristotle’s Categories 9–15, Richard Gaskin, 2000.
- Simplicius, Commentaire sur les ‹Catégories›. Traduction commentée sous la direction de I. Hadot. Fascicule I: Introduction, Première partie (p. 1–9, 3 Kalbfleisch), traduction de Ph. Hoffmann, commentaire et notes à la traduction par I. Hadot, avec des appendices de P. Hadot et J.-P. Mahé, Leiden: Brill, 1990.
- –––, Commentaire sur les ‹Catégories›. Traduction commentée sous la direction de I. Hadot. Fascicule III: Préambule aux Catégories, Commentaire au premier chapitre des Catégories (p. 21–40, 13 Kalbfleisch), traduction de Ph. Hoffmann, avec la collaboration de I. Hadot, P. Hadot et C. Luna, commentaire et notes à la traduction par C. Luna, Leiden: Brill, 1990.
- –––, Commentaire sur les ‹Catégories› d’Aristote, Chapitres 2–4. Traduction par Ph. Hoffmann, avec la collaboration de I. Hadot et P. Hadot, commentaire par C. Luna, Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2001.
On Aristotle’s On the Soul
Standard edition of the Greek
- Simplicii in libros Aristotelis De anima commentaria, Michael Hayduck (ed.), (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca [CAG] 11), Berlin, 1882.
- Simplicius, On Aristotle On the Soul 1.1–2.4, James O. Urmson (trans.), notes by Peter Lautner, (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Duckworth, 1995.
- –––, On Aristotle On the Soul 2.5–12, Carlos Steel (trans.), in collaboration with James O. Urmson, notes by Peter Lautner in Priscian: On Theophrastus On Sense-Perception, Pamela Huby (trans.), (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Duckworth, 1997.
- –––, On Aristotle On the Soul 3.1–5, Hans J. Blumenthal (trans.), (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: 2000: Duckworth.
- –––, On Aristotle On the Soul 3.6–13, Carlos Steel (trans.), (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Bloomsbury, 2013.
- Priskian von Lydien (›Simplikios‹), Kommentar zu Aristoteles’ De anima III, ausgewählt, eingeleitet, übersetzt und erläutert von M. Perkams, in H. Busche, and M. Perkams (eds.), Antike Interpretationen zur aristotelischen Lehre vom Geist, Hamburg: Meiner, pp. 547–675.
On Epictetus’ Handbook
Standard edition of the Greek
- Simplicius, Commentaire sur le Manuel d’Epictète. Introduction et édition critique du texte grec par I. Hadot, Leiden, 1995. [Editio maior]
- –––, Commentaire sur le Manuel d’Epictète. I: Chapitres I–XXIX. Texte établi et traduit par Ilsetraud Hadot, Paris, 2001. [CUF]. [Editio minor with French translation]
- Simplicius, On Epictetus’ Handbook 1–26, Charles Brittain and Tad Brennan (trans.), (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Duckworth, 2002.
- –––, On Epictetus’ Handbook 27–53, Tad Brennan and Charles Brittain (trans.), (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Duckworth, 2002.
- Epictetus, his morals, with Simplicius his comment, made English from the Greek, by G. Stanhope, London, 1694.
- Simplicii Commentarius in Epicteti Enchiridion, aus dem Griechischen übersetzt von J. G. Schulthess (= Bibliothek der griechischen Philosophen, 1. Band). Zürich: Orell, Füssli und Co., 1778.
- Simplikios’ Commentar zu Epiktetos Handbuch, aus dem Griechischen in das Deutsche übertragen von K. Enk. Wien: Beck, 1867.
On Aristotle’s Physics
Standard edition of the Greek
- Simplicii in Aristotelis Physicorum libros quattuor priores/posteriores commentaria, 2 volumes, Hermannus Diels (ed.), (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca [CAG] 9 and 10), Berlin, 1882–1895.
- Golitsis, Pantelis and Philippe Hoffmann, 2014, “Simplicius et le ‘Lieu’: À propos d’une nouvelle édition du Corollarium de loco”, Revue Des Études Grecques 127: 119–175. [New edition of the Corollary on place]
- Simplicius, On Aristotle Physics, multiple volumes,
(Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Bloomsbury (Duckworth
prior to 2010)
- On Aristotle Physics 1.1–2, R. Barney (trans.), St. Menn, forthcoming.
- On Aristotle Physics 1.3–4, Pamela Huby and C. C. W. Taylor (trans.), 2011.
- On Aristotle Physics 1.5–9, Han Baltussen, Michael Atkinson, Michael Share, and Ian Mueller (trans.), 2012.
- On Aristotle Physics 2, Barrie Fleet (trans.), 1997.
- On Aristotle Physics 3, James O. Urmson (trans.), notes by Peter Lautner, 2002.
- On Aristotle Physics 4.1–5, 10–14, J. O. Urmson (trans.), 1992.
- On Aristotle Physics 5, James O. Urmson (trans.), notes by Peter Lautner, 1997.
- On Aristotle Physics 6, David Konstan (trans.), 1989.
- On Aristotle Physics 7, Charles Hagen (trans.), 1994.
- On Aristotle Physics 8.1–5, István Bodnár, Michael Chase, and Michael Share (trans.), 2012.
- On Aristotle Physics 8.6–10, Richard D. McKirahan (trans.), 2001.
- –––, Corollaries on Place and Time, J. O. Urmson (trans.), annotated by Lucas Siorvanes, London: Duckworth, 1992.
- Simplicius, Commentaire sur la Physique d’Aristote. Livre ii, ch. 1-3, Introduction, traduction, notes et bibliographie par Alain Lernould, Villeneuve d'Ascq: Presses universitaires du Septentrion, 2019.
- Sonderegger, E., 1982, Simplikios: Über Die Zeit. Ein Kommentar zum Corollarium de Tempore, (Hypomnemata, 70), Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht. [includes a translation of the Corollary on time]
Editions and Translations of other Ancient Authors
- Agathiae Myrinaei Historiarum libri quinque in Corpus Fontium Historiae Byzantinae, Rudolf Keydell (ed.), Volume 2, (Series Berolinensis), Walter de Gruyter: Berlin, 1967.
- Alexander of Aphrodisias, On the Soul, Part I: Soul as Form of the Body, Parts of the Soul, Nourishment, and Perception, Victor Caston (trans.), (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Bristol Classical Press, 2012.
- –––, Supplement to ‘On the Soul’, Robert W. Sharples (trans.), (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2004.
- Eliae (olim Davidis), In Aristotelis Categorias commentarium, A. Busse (ed.), (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca) [CAG 18], Berlin, 1900. [on the authorship of this commentary, see Helmig 2018]
- Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich, Vorlesungen über die Geschichte der Philosophie 1, Eva Moldenhauer and Karl Markus Michel (eds.), Volume 18, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1986.
- Philoponus, De aeternitate mundi contra Proclum, Hugo Rabe (ed.), (Bibliotheca scriptorium Graecorum et Romanorum Teubneriana), Lipsiae: B.G. Teubner, 1899.
- Plotinus, Opera, Paul Henry and Hans-Rudolf Schwyzer (eds.), editio minor, 3 Volumes, (Scriptorum classicorum Bibliotheca Oxoniensis), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1964–1982.
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I would very much like to thank my collaborators at the University of Cologne Anna Pavani, Manuel Lorenz, Ina Schall, Fedora Hartmann, Emil Gaub and especially Laura Marongiu. I would also like to thank the anonymous referee for most useful remarks and corrections. Thanks are due to the fantastic team of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy and its principal editor Edward N. Zalta for their patience and detailed observations. Last but not least let me thank Merrie Bergmann for correcting the English and many useful suggestions.