[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Timothy Perrine replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]
All of us—theist, atheist, and agnostic alike—experience suffering and evil in the world. There’s the annoyance of a stubbed toe, the disappointment of personal or professional setback, the endless frustration of debilitating chronic pain, and the soul-crushing experience of the suffering and death of those we care the most about (to name a few). It doesn’t require extensive education to worry if suffering and evil is evidence against the existence of God—or, at least, God understood classically, as a perfect being that is an all-powerful, all-knowing, all-good creator of the universe. This is the problem of evil, and when these worries are turned into arguments, they are known as arguments from evil.
But many of us—again, theist, atheist, and agnostic alike—are impressed by what God is supposed to be: a being with all perfections and knowledge, unencumbered by weaknesses or faults. Given our own ignorance, imperfections, and limitations, it is hard to fully imagine such a being and its potential plans for the world. Again, it doesn’t require extensive education to worry that it would be incredibly challenging for us—in such a comparatively benighted state—to predict, anticipate, or understand all of the plans of such a being.
Skeptical theism is a family of responses to arguments from evil. Skeptical theists think these two types of worries are related, that worries of the second type raise problems for worries of the first type. More specifically, skeptical theism embraces two claims. First, even if theism were true, we should be skeptical of our abilities to reasonably predict all of God’s plans for organizing the world, including those about the amount and nature of evil. Second, if this first claim is true, then it undermines or otherwise greatly mitigates arguments from evil. Now these two claims are vague and imprecise, and different skeptical theists spell them out in different ways depending on the argument from evil they are evaluating. Additionally, neither of these claims assume theism; they can be coherently accepted by theists, atheists, and agnostics alike. Nonetheless, theists frequently appeal to skeptical theism in defense of theism. Thus, sometimes authors use the term ‘skeptical theism’ to refer to the conjunction of these kinds of conditionals with a commitment to theism; sometimes it is just these kinds of conditionals without a commitment to theism. For clarity here, we’ll use ‘skeptical theism’ and similar phrases to be neutral with regard to whether theism is true.
Skeptical theism has a number of historical precedents (see Rudavsky 2013). It was reintroduced into the contemporary literature in a 1984 paper by Stephen Wykstra. Since then, a variety of authors have developed and defended it including William Alston, Alvin Plantinga, Peter van Inwagen, Michael Bergmann, and Daniel Howard-Snyder. The literature on the topic is extensive and technical at points. Consequently, this entry must be selective and simplifying. The overall aim is to provide a basic understanding of the key issues surrounding skeptical theism, with extensive references for readers to dig into the meat of the debates.
- 1. Outweighing Goods and Noseeum Inferences
- 2. Outweighing Goods and Inductive Inferences
- 3. Noseeum Arguments
- 4. Skeptical Theism and Other Responses
- 5. Epistemological Objections
- 6. Moral Objections
- 7. Scope of Skeptical Theism
- 8. Theory Development
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Outweighing Goods and Noseeum Inferences
Skeptical theism is a cluster of responses to arguments from evil. One major argument from evil is what we’ll call the “Outweighing Goods” argument. This section explains a basic outweighing goods argument, a standard way of defending it using “noseeum inferences,” and a skeptical theistic critique of that defense.
1.1 Basic Outweighing Goods Argument
A simple thought is that if God exists, there would be no evil. After all, God could prevent any evil there is; God would know about any evil there is; and God would want to prevent any evil there is. But this simple thought is too simple. For even if God exists, it need not be the case that God wants to prevents any evil there is. For God may have a justifying reason for permitting evil.
Frequently, in life, agents are justified in permitting evil if there is some reason that justifies their permission of it. A common and well-known kind of reason is that the permission of the evil is necessary for either bringing about some greater good or preventing some worse evil from occurring. (We’ll use the term ‘outweighing goods’ to refer inclusively to the greater goods or worse evils.) Indeed, the complexity of trading off permitting evils for outweighing goods is not just a part of consequentialist thinking but pervades most ordinary ethical and legal thinking. There may be other kinds of reasons that justify an agent in permitting evil. (For instance, perhaps the agent does not have the appropriate authority to prevent the evil or the actions necessary to prevent the evil would go against the agent’s character or personal projects.) But justifying reasons involving outweighing goods have dominated discussions of arguments from evil; so this entry will focus on them. Keeping these points in mind, one important argument from evil is this (compare Rowe 1979, 1984, 1986; Martin 1978):
- If God exists, then for any evil e, God is justified in permitting e only if God’s permission of e is necessary for some outweighing good.
- There is at least one evil e such that God’s permission of e is not necessary for some outweighing good.
- Therefore, there is no God.
This argument is deductive; thus, defenses of it focus primarily on the premises. N-O1.1 is seen as a plausible claim articulating God’s obligations to the rest of us. N-O1.2 is an existential claim, stating that some evil is, crudely put, not outweighed. A straightforward way of defending it is existential generalization: find specific evils such that God’s permission of them is not necessary for some outweighing good, and then generalize to N-O1.2.
1.2 Noseeum Inferences
Consider two situations given in the literature: a fawn, caught in a forest fire, that burned to death (cf. Rowe 1979), and a five-year-old girl who was raped and then strangled to death (cf. Russell 1989). Their sufferings are paradigms of evil. Now one might reflect on their suffering, and try hard to identify God’s reasons for permitting their suffering. An important sub-argument for N-O1.2 follows:
- After extensive reflection, it seems that there is no outweighing good that would justify God’s permission of the fawn’s suffering and the girl’s suffering.
- Therefore, it is prima facie reasonable to believe that there is no outweighing good that would justify God’s permission of the fawn’s suffering and the girl’s suffering.
- There is at least one evil e such that God’s permission of e is not necessary for some outweighing good.
This argument is not valid, but inductive in nature. In defense of N-O1.21, authors like Rowe argue that the suffering of the fawn and the girl seem unconnected from the concerns of traditional theodicies. Their suffering isn’t the result of their own free will, for instance; nor does their suffering contribute to their “soul-building” of creating a superior moral character. And while eternal union with God may be extremely good, it is hard to see how this suffering would be connected to it. Reflecting on their suffering, it is hard to identify outweighing goods that would justify God’s permission of that suffering.
This way of defending N-O1.2 is sometimes called a “noseeum” inference (Wykstra 1996). From the claim that we “no see” an outweighing good, one infers that there is no such outweighing good and, thus, there is no God. (Wykstra’s inspiration for this term comes from the name of an insect – a ‘no-see-um’ – that is normally too small to be seen, but can still leave a nasty welt.) Alternatively, this way of defending N-O1.2 is called an argument from “failure of theodicy” (Draper 2013), since it is the apparent failure of theodicies that make N-O1.2 reasonable to believe.
1.3 CORNEA-based Criticisms
Some skeptical theists critique noseeum arguments by using what is called a CORNEA-based criticism (Wykstra 1984, 1996). Like many skeptical theistic critiques, this critique has two components—a general epistemic principle and some claims in philosophy of religion. By combining the two components, skeptical theists aim to undermine some argument.
The term ‘CORNEA’ is an unprincipled acronym: Condition On ReasoNable Epistemic Access. A CORNEA principle is an epistemic principle stating conditions on when it is reasonable for a person to claim or believe p on the basis of something q. Wykstra himself formulated a range of principles that are not obviously equivalent. A simple CORNEA principle is:
A person is prima facie reasonable in believing p on the basis of q only if, given their cognitive abilities, it is reasonable for them to believe that if p were different, then q would likely be different as well.
To illustrate the plausibility of CORNEA principles, consider the following case. A doctor accidentally drops a needle on the floor. The doctor picks up the needle, visually inspects it, and announces that the needle is free of viruses and bacteria. Is the doctor prima facie reasonable in believing the needle is free of viruses and bacteria on the basis of his visual experience? Intuitively not. A principle like S-C is well-suited to explain why. It is not reasonable for the doctor to believe that, given his cognitive abilities, if the needle were contaminated with bacteria or viruses, then his visual experience would likely be different as well.
A CORNEA principle like S-C is a general epistemic principle that can be applied to any range of cases. Skeptical theists apply it to the inference from N-O1.21 to N-O1.22. Suppose we are prima facie reasonable in believing that God’s permission of the fawn’s suffering and the girl’s suffering would not be necessary for some outweighing good on the basis of our failure to see an outweighing good connected to their suffering by reflecting. Then, by S-C, it must be reasonable for us to believe that if God’s permission of the fawn’s suffering and the girl’s suffering were necessary for some outweighing good, then we would likely not fail to identify an outweighing good connected to their suffering by reflecting.
But skeptical theists argue that this is not reasonable for us to believe. That is, they argue that even if God’s permission of the fawn’s suffering and the girl’s suffering were necessary for some outweighing good, then it is likely that we would fail to identify an outweighing good connected to their suffering simply by reflecting. Skeptical theists give analogies to support these claims. One extended analogy is a parent/child analogy (compare Wykstra 1984: 88; 1996: 142–5). A baby infant is in no position to evaluate its parent’s plans for its life. But our cognitive abilities are like a baby infant’s in comparison to God’s. So too, we are in no position to evaluate all of God’s plans. Similarly, parents with increased intelligence, understanding of goods, and abilities are more likely to plan for goods in their children’s future—a future which their children are not yet able to see. God, having maximum intelligence, understanding, and ability, is thus likely to make plans where many goods will be in the future in ways we cannot expect to understand. Another analogy involves the “physical depth” of the universe (cf. Russell and Wykstra 1988: 146–8; see also Alston 1991 : 109). If God created the universe, God created it with “physical depth,” where many of the features of the universe are difficult to learn about. So too, if God has plans for creation, God is likely to have created it with “moral depth,” where many of the goods that play a role in God’s plan are not “surface” goods easily identified but rather more obscure to us.
Thus, by S-C, believing N-O1.22 on the basis of N-O1.21 is reasonable only if it is reasonable to believe that, given our cognitive faculties, if God’s permission of their suffering were necessary for an outweighing good, we’d identify that good by reflecting. But that’s not reasonable for us to believe—even if there is an outweighing good justifying God’s permission of their suffering, then we likely wouldn’t see it by reflecting. So it’s not reasonable to believe N-O1.22 on the basis of N-O1.21. Thus, according to this line of reasoning, the sub-argument for N-O1.2 fails.
2. Outweighing Goods and Inductive Inferences
One of the key claims of the outweighing goods argument is N-O1.2: there is at least one evil e such that God’s permission of e is not necessary for some outweighing good. One way of defending this premise is to appeal to how things seem to us. But another way to defend N-O1.2 is to eschew talk of how things seem to us and use more traditional inductive inferences.
2.1 Representative-based Inductive Inferences
Suppose I have a garden. I like spicy food, so every year I plant hot peppers. I plant a variety of hot peppers—differences in size, heat-level, place of origin, etc. And suppose that each year I notice that my hot peppers only begin flowering in late summer, early fall—never early spring. I might reason as follows:
No hot pepper I know of flowers in early spring.
Therefore, no hot pepper at all flowers in early spring.
The reasoning in this case is inductive. I have a sample size—hot peppers I know of—and they have a certain property—they don’t flower in early spring. I infer from this sample size to a larger group—all hot peppers—that they have the same property. Since my sample size is representative of the larger group, this inductive inference is a reasonable one.
Analogously, suppose we consider whether we know of any outweighing goods that would justify God’s permission of the girl’s suffering and the fawn’s suffering. We are familiar with a variety of outweighing goods in life. Suppose we think that none of the outweighing goods we know of would justify God’s permission of the girl’s suffering and the fawn’s suffering. We might reason inductively as follows (compare Rowe (1988, 1991):
No outweighing goods we know of would justify God’s permission of the fawn’s suffering and the girl’s suffering
Therefore, no outweighing goods at all would justify God’s permission of the fawn’s suffering and the girl’s suffering.
From NaaG it is a short-step to N-O1.2 and then atheism. This way of defending N-O1.2 avoids noseeum inferences and so might be thought to side-step the CORNEA-based criticisms of the previous section.
2.2 Representative Goods
Skeptical theists have critiqued the inference from NKG to NaaG (see Alston 1991 , 1996; Christlieb 1992: 48–54; Sennett 1993; Bergmann 2001). Once again, the critique can usefully be divided into two parts—an epistemological principle and some claims in philosophy of religion.
Skeptical theists have spent less time developing the epistemic principle used in this critique. But they assume a principle something like this: an inference from a sample of a group to the group vis-à-vis some property is reasonable only if one is in a position to reasonably believe that the sample is representative of the group vis-à-vis that property. (See Alston 1996: 326–7; Howard-Snyder 1996b: 297–9; Tucker 2014: 49ff.) for worries about how best to formulate such a principle.) Again, this principle can be intuitively supported by cases. If I plant in my garden only one kind of pepper—say, habaneros—then it would be unreasonable and irresponsible for me to generalize to all kinds of hot peppers.
Skeptical theists then apply something like that principle to the inference from NKG to NaaG. It is reasonable to infer NaaG from NKG only if it is reasonable for us to believe that the outweighing goods we know of are representative of all potential outweighing goods when it comes to the property of justifying God’s permission of evil.
But skeptical theists argue that it is not reasonable for us to believe that. Some skeptical theists reason by analogy. Sometimes, it is reasonable to believe our sample size is representative because it is sufficiently large and chosen at random. Other times, we have already “charted” the relevant group and we know what proportion our sample is from that group. But these are not the case here. The outweighing goods we know of aren’t picked at random. Nor have we “charted” the relevant group of all possible God-justifying outweighing goods. The standard techniques for generating representative samples don’t seem to apply to NKG.
Bergmann summarizes these ideas in a more careful statement as follows (2001: 279; cf. 2009: 376):
- We have no good reason for thinking that the possible goods we know of are representative of the possible goods there are.
- We have no good reason for thinking that the possible evils we know of are representative of the possible evils there are.
- We have no good reason for thinking that the entailment relations we know of between possible goods and the permission of possible evils are representative of the entailment relations there are between possible goods and the permission of possible evils.
Notice that these theses do not claim that we have good reason for thinking they are not representative. They are more skeptical than that. Bergmann sees these claims as independently plausible, so that both theists and non-theists should endorse them, writing: “it just doesn’t seem unlikely that our understanding of the realm of value falls miserably short of capturing all that is true about that realm. One can recognize this even if one is not a theist.” (2001: 279).
Thus, given a relevant epistemic principle, the inference from NKG to NaaG is reasonable only if it is reasonable to believe that the outweighing goods we know of are representative of all outweighing goods when it comes to justifying God’s permission of evil. But, skeptical theists argue, that is not reasonable for us to believe. So the inference from NKG to NaaG is not reasonable. Thus, this representation-based inductive argument for N-O1.2 also fails.
2.3 Connecting Goods
Skeptical theists object to the inference from NKG to NaaG. But some skeptical theists also object directly to NKG (see Alston 1996: 315-6; Plantinga 1998: 53; Bergmann 2009: 382). Given ST3, it may be that some outweighing goods we know of would justify God’s permissions of the fawn’s suffering and the girl’s suffering. It may simply be that the connection between the outweighing goods we are familiar with and God’s permission of suffering is not known to us. Again, skeptical theists might appeal to analogies to clarify their position. A novice chess player knows that a grandmaster’s objective is to win the game. But it doesn’t follow that the novice chess player understands how each move the grandmaster makes might contribute to the grandmaster’s objective. In fact, it might even seem to the novice player that various moves by the grandmaster don’t contribute to that objective at all.
3. Noseeum Arguments
Noseeum evils (or seemingly unjustified evils) are a type of evil—evils such that God’s permission of them do not seem necessary for an outweighing good. One might argue that those evils are good evidence for another type of evil that is inconsistent with the existence of God—evils such that God’s permission of them would not be necessary for an outweighing good. Alternatively, one might argue that noseeum evils are evidence against theism on their own—regardless of whether or not they are also evidence for evils of another kind. This section looks at two arguments of that kind and skeptical theistic critiques of them.
3.1 Individual Case Argument
To understand the first argument, some background in confirmation theory will be useful. On one standard understanding, a claim \(E\) is evidence against a hypothesis \(H\) just in case the probability of \(H,\) given \(E,\) is less than the probability of \(H\) on its own. More formally: \(E\) is evidence against \(H\) just in case \(Pr(H\mid E) \lt Pr(H)\). Furthermore, the lower the difference between \(Pr(H\mid E)\) and \(Pr(H),\) the stronger \(E\) is evidence against \(H\). To determine if \(E\) is evidence against \(H,\) one considers two key conditional probabilities: first, the probability of \(E\) given \(H,\) and second, the probability of \(E\) given the denial of \(H\). More formally, \(Pr(E\mid H)\) and \(Pr(E\mid \neg H),\) respectively. Now if \(Pr(E\mid \neg H)\) is greater than \(Pr(E\mid H)\) then \(E\) will be evidence against \(H\). And the greater \(Pr(E\mid \neg H)\) is than \(Pr(E\neg H)\) the stronger \(E\) will be evidence against \(H\).
No outweighing goods we know of would justify God’s permission of the fawn’s suffering and the girl’s suffering.
(We’ll ignore the objection of 2.3 and assume NKG is true.) NKG is a noseeum claim, since it asserts that we “no see” any outweighing goods that would justify God’s permission of that specific suffering. To determine if NKG is evidence against theism, we need to consider two conditional probabilities: how likely is it given the denial of theism and how likely is it given theism. Rowe (1996: 267–70) argues that the probability of NKG given atheism is 1. For if there is no God, then God doesn’t permit anything. Thus, if there is no God, then nothing justifies God’s permission of anything, since God doesn’t permit anything. Thus, if there is no God, then no outweighing good we know of would justify God’s permission of anything—including the fawn’s suffering and the girl’s suffering.
If the probability of NKG given atheism is 1, then the lower probability it has given theism, the stronger the evidence NKG is against theism. And one might argue that the probability of NKG given theism is not high—at least below 0.5—because God would not let us suffer in silence. That is, if God permitted the suffering of the fawn and the girl for some outweighing good, then God would at least tell us what those goods are or—if that’s not possible for whatever reason—at least offer some kind of comfort for the suffering in some way (cf. Rowe 2006: 86–7). So given theism, we shouldn’t expect that no good we know of would justify God’s permission of these evils—God would tell us about those goods or at least comfort us.
Skeptical theists object to this argument that the probability of NKG, given theism, is not high (cf. Bergmann 2001). Presumably, God would not let us suffer in silence because such silence serves no outweighing good. But it is hard to see how one could establish that it serves no outweighing good, if ST1 and ST2 are true. After all, even if no good we know of would justify God letting us suffer in silence, given ST1 and ST2, it would not be reasonable to infer that no such good would. So this argument fails to show that NKG is not high given theism.
3.2 Cumulative Case Argument
An alternative argumentative strategy doesn’t focus on individual cases of evils that seem such that God’s permission of them is unnecessary for an outweighing good. Rather, it focuses on a larger class of such evils. One kind of argument that focuses on a larger class of these evils is a cumulative case argument like this:
- Each individual seemingly unjustified evil is, on its own, slight disconfirming evidence against theism.
- There are many seemingly unjustified evils.
- Therefore, the collection of all seemingly unjustified evils is strong evidence against theism.
- Therefore, theism is probably false.
But some skeptical theists object to N1.1 on general methodological grounds (see Perrine and Wykstra 2014: 157–163). Evidence of a specific type might disconfirm a hypothesis by eliminating some specific version of that hypothesis that does not fit that type of evidence. But that evidence won’t disconfirm other specific versions of that hypothesis that do fit that type of evidence. Thus, evidence of the same type might initially disconfirm a hypothesis by eliminating specific versions of it; but that type of evidence won’t continue disconfirming that hypothesis, since the only remaining versions of the hypothesis accommodate that evidence. To give an example, the sun rises and sets every day. This type of evidence disconfirms heliocentrism by disconfirming a specific version of heliocentrism on which the earth revolves around the sun while always facing the sun. But this type of evidence won’t disconfirm other versions of heliocentrism on which the earth revolves around the sun, but regularly spins on an axis. Thus, the sun rising and setting each day might initially disconfirm heliocentrism—by eliminating some versions of heliocentrism—but that type of evidence won’t continue disconfirming heliocentrism. For the remaining versions of heliocentrism fit that type of evidence.
Analogously, some skeptical theists might allow that the existence of some seemingly unjustified evils disconfirms theism. Insofar as they do disconfirm theism, it is by disconfirming specific versions of theism on which God always explains, or indicates, the justifying reasons for the permission of evils. But the existence of seemingly unjustified evils won’t disconfirm versions of theism on which God’s justifying reasons for permitting suffering are frequently, even normally, beyond our ken. Thus, this type of evidence—the existence of seemingly unjustified evils—might disconfirm some versions of theism but won’t disconfirm other versions of theism. So, it won’t be the case that each seemingly unjustified evil is slight disconfirmation for theism in general and N1.1 is false.
4. Skeptical Theism and Other Responses
Skeptical theism is one family of responses to arguments from evil. But there are a number of other responses. Following Plantinga’s terminology (1974: 28), a theodicy purports to provide God’s justifying reasons for permitting suffering and evil. By contrast, a defense purports to provide potential reasons that would justify God’s permission of suffering and evil, even if those reasons may not be God’s own. By contrast, a skeptical theistic critique does not offer God’s actual or potential justifying reasons for permitting suffering and evil. Indeed, skeptical theists oftentimes find themselves agreeing with atheologians that they cannot identify connections between potential goods and evils that would justify God’s permission of specific evils.
Initially, it may seem that there is a tension, if not inconsistency, between skeptical theism on the one hand and defense and theodicies on the other (compare Stump 2010: 13–5; Coley 2015). However, there are many types of arguments from evil, utilizing different facts about evil. For the same argument from evil, utilizing specific facts about evil, it may be inconsistent to combine responses. That is, it may be inconsistent to respond with both (i) we know of reasons that do (or could) justify God’s permission of that type of evil and (ii) we don’t know of any reasons that do (or could) justify God’s permission of that type of evil. But some skeptical theists (e.g. Perrine and Wykstra 2014; DePoe 2014: 33) suggest that it may be reasonable to use different responses for different arguments from evil. Whether skeptical theistic critiques can be combined with other responses to various arguments from evil is a place in the literature that needs more attention.
Many authors who utilize skeptical theistic critiques also assume that God has obligations to us. That is, they tend to assume that God is permitted in letting us experience suffering and evil only if God has some kind of justifying reason. Many skeptical theists accept N-O1.1; they assume the justifying reason must involve outweighing goods. Others might reject N-O1.1. Nonetheless, they think God must still have some kind of justifying reason; the reason just may not involve outweighing goods (compare van Inwagen 2006 (lecture 6), Mooney 2019). The claim that God has obligations to us is not normally a requirement of skeptical theistic critiques. Nonetheless, the particular way that skeptical theists critique arguments from evil indicates they assume that God does have obligations to us.
Recently, there have been other, more extreme responses to arguments from evil that deny that God has obligations to us. Various arguments have been offered for this view (see Adams (2013) and Murphy (2017) for some representative examples). But these responses deny that from the claim that God exist it necessarily follows that God would promote goods, prevent evils, or permit evils only if God has a justifying reason. These responses may be technically consistent with skeptical theistic responses, since the different responses will frequently object to distinct premises. Nonetheless, these responses do not sit well with the assumptions skeptical theists tend to bring to bear in evaluating arguments from evil.
5. Epistemological Objections
A number of authors have raised epistemological objections to skeptical theism. Some of these objections are to the epistemic principles skeptical theists use. Others are that the claims of skeptical theistic critiques may, themselves, produce skeptical problems.
5.1 Objections to CORNEA Principles
CORNEA principles state a necessary condition on it being reasonable to claim or believe p on the basis of something q. The condition (roughly) is that it is also reasonable for one to believe that, given one’s cognitive faculties, if p were different, then q would likely be different as well. A standard worry for epistemic principles like this is that they will create an infinite regress (cf. Alston 1980, Fumerton 1995 (chapter 2), Leite 2008). And some have objected to CORNEA principles for exactly this reason (Swinburne 1998: 32–3). To see how the regress might go, suppose I’m reasonable in believing p on the basis of q. Then, by a CORNEA principle, I am also reasonable in believing that, given my cognitive faculties, if p were false, then q would likely be different. But suppose that belief is reasonable but based on something r. Well, applying a CORNEA principle again, it must be reasonable for me to believe that, were that belief different, then r would likely be different… ad infinitum.
A different objection is that CORNEA-principles are inconsistent with forming reasonable beliefs on the basis of inductive evidence (McBrayer 2009; Almeida 2014: 122ff). For instance, suppose the day care center informs me that each day, for the past three months, my child has been sleeping during nap time. On the basis of this inductive evidence, it is reasonable for me to infer that today my child will sleep during nap time. But if my child were not sleeping during nap time today, would my inductive evidence be different? Using standard possible-world semantics, it would not. For in the closest worlds in which my child is not sleeping, it is likely a fluke or random event. And in those worlds, I would still have my inductive evidence from the past. Thus, in this case, S-C implies that it is not reasonable to infer my child is sleeping today on the basis of my inductive evidence. But this example of inductive reasoning is not particularly distinctive. So S-C is inconsistent with forming reasonable beliefs on the basis of inductive evidence.
Several attempts have been made to clarify CORNEA-principles in ways that avoids these problems while still being strong enough for responding to arguments from evil (see Wykstra 1996, 2007; Wykstra and Perrine 2012; Perrine 2022). One clarification is that CORNEA principles are restricted to a specific kind of case: where the grounds or evidence for belief is “levering evidence,” which is (crudely put) evidence strong enough to reasonably “lever” one from agnosticism or disbelief about p to belief about p. The restriction of CORNEA-principles to this type of evidence or grounds is appropriate, since it is the kind of evidence that Rowe (1979) initially tried to provide. Restricting CORNEA-principles in this way may also block an infinite regress, since the CORNEA-principles are not fully general. A second clarification is that the condition in CORNEA-principles should not be interpreted as involving a subjunctive-conditional, but rather a conditional probability. That is, the condition is that it is reasonable to believe, given one’s cognitive faculties, that the conditional probability of one’s grounds or evidence, given one’s belief is false, is below .5. Though some of the details are technical, Wykstra and Perrine argue that a probabilistic understanding of CORNEA’s requirement handles cases of inductive evidence. But whether or not these clarifications ultimately help defuse objections is still a topic of debate. (For further discussion of CORNEA-principles, see Howard-Snyder (1992), Graham and Maitzen (2007), Stone (2011), Draper (2014a).)
5.2 Common Sense Epistemology
Some authors have worried that skeptical theism is inconsistent with “Common Sense Epistemology” (see Dougherty 2008). More precisely, some might worry that the epistemological principles used in skeptical theistic critiques are inconsistent with epistemological principles that are part of Common Sense Epistemology. Such principles include Swinburne’s Principle of Credulity (2004: 303ff.) and Huemer’s Phenomenal Conservativism (2001: 99):
Principle of Credulity
If it seems to a subject S that p, this is good grounds for S to believe p.
If it seems to a subject S that p, then S is prima facie justified in believing p.
One might object to skeptical theism by arguing that these principles of Common Sense Epistemology are true, and thus their inconsistency with skeptical theism is a problem for skeptical theism.
In response, some authors argue that skeptical theistic critiques are consistent with various principles of Common Sense Epistemology. For even if one is prima facie justified in believing something, one’s prima facie justification might be defeated. For instance, I may be prima facie justified in believing my boss’ explanation of the new departmental policy just because he said as much; but that prima facie justification might be defeated when I recall the many times he has misled me about such policies. So too, skeptical theistic critiques might permit that individuals are prima facie justified in believing things like N-O1.2. Nonetheless, that prima facie justification is defeated by considering skeptical theistic critiques of arguments from evil. (For discussion, see Matheson 2011, 2014; McBrayer and Swenson 2012: 147; Coffman 2014: 83–4; Tweedt 2015; Rutledge 2017a; Hendricks 2018.)
Alternatively, other authors argue that the epistemological principles of skeptical theistic critiques are inconsistent with various principles of Common Sense Epistemology (see Wykstra 1984, Senor 2013, Perrine 2022). These authors argue that the inconsistency is not a problem for skeptical theistic critiques because those principles are false. For instance, Perrine argues that there are reasons independent of arguments from evil for thinking that these various principles of Common Sense Epistemology are false. For those principles are consistent with an agent having prima facie justification for believing something even if the belief was not formed in a responsible or reliable manner.
5.3 External World Skepticism
A frequent criticism of skeptical theism is that it leads to skepticism about the external world (see Russell and Wykstra 1988: 158–9; Weisberger 2007: 170–171; Wilks 2013; Law 2017; Russell 2017; 2018: 111ff). This criticism turns on the possibility of divine deception. More specifically, consider the following hypothesis:
Deceiving God (DG)
God is deceiving us into believing the earth is extremely old, when in reality it is quite young.
If DG is true, then we are mistaken about the age of the earth. Now atheists can reject DG because it implies God exists; but clearly theists who are skeptical theists cannot reject DG for that reason. Theists, who are not skeptical theists, might reject DG by reasoning as follows: we can see no reason that would justify God in deceiving us in this way; so there is no such reason. But theists who are skeptical theists cannot rely on that line of reasoning. After all, as learned from their critiques of noseeum inferences, from the mere fact that it seems to us that God has no reason to (e.g.) deceive us about the age of the earth, it does not yet follow that we are prima face justified in believing God has no reason to deceive us about the age of the earth. So skeptical theists who are theists cannot use either of these line of reasoning to rule out DG. But this claim about the age of the earth is merely illustrative of any number of claims about the external world. Thus, skeptical theists who are theists cannot use either of these lines of reasoning to rule out any number of skeptical hypothesis about the external world that involve divine deception.
One type of response is to argue that, for skeptical theists to know about the external world, they do not have to first rule out hypotheses like DG. Otherwise put, there are other routes to knowledge about the external world that don’t involve inferences about potential divine deception (cf. Bergmann 2009: 391; 2012: 15). For instance, skeptical theists might embrace externalism about knowledge. According to that position, in order for one to know facts about the external world, one does not need to have access to what explains that one knows. Thus, one could know facts about the external world without producing an argument or first ruling out that one is not being deceived (cf. Bergmann 2008, Hendricks 2020). But there are other routes skeptical theists might explore. For instance, they might accept theories of perception on which we are antecedently justified in trusting our perceptual experiences, unless we are given evidence that our experiences are misleading in some way (cf. Boyce 2014). Such antecedent justification need not require first ruling out skeptical hypotheses like DG.
5.4 Religious Skepticism
A similar objection is that skeptical theism leads to religious skepticism (Beaudoin 2000, 2005; Rowe 2006: 90–1; Wielenberg 2010; Hudson 2014). Skeptical theists might respond to the previous criticism by claiming that we have many ways of knowing about the external world that don’t, on the face of them, involve God telling us something and not deceiving us. But a staple of many religious traditions is that there are certain things we know about only because God has told us. For instance, consider a claim like:
There is an eternal afterlife of union with God, full of bliss and free of suffering.
Many religious traditions hold that, insofar as we know or are reasonable in believing Af, it is only because God has told us, revealing it to us through a prophet, text, or direct religious experience.
Critics argue that theists who are skeptical theists are not reasonable in believing Af. The criticism here mirrors the one of the previous section. It is possible that God is deceiving us about these matters; but skeptical theists are unable to reasonably rule out the possibility of divine deception. Additionally, in the case of the external world, agents may have a variety of ways of coming to know about the external world. But that kind of response is less plausible here. Since it seems that for claims like Af, our only way of knowing them is to depend upon God—and depend upon God not deceiving us.
A different type of criticism focuses on knowledge of God’s commands. One starting point for this criticism is that many religious texts and traditions contain a wide range of commands that purport to be divine commands (Maitzen 2007). Nevertheless, most religious adherents do not think they are obligated to follow all of those purported commands. Perhaps the commands are issued by the wrong text or tradition; or perhaps the commands had been “superseded” or “updated” by God; or perhaps the commands seem to be issued by God but couldn’t be given the immoral content of the commands; or maybe the commands are just plain silly or arbitrary.
A natural way that a theist might sift through these purported commands is to consider what God would have reason to command. If the theist sees no reason why God would command (e.g.) not cooking goat in its mother’s milk, then the theist might conclude that such a command is not actually God’s. But this way of reasoning about divine commands looks incredibly similar to the noseeum argument for N-O1.2! Thus, if theists who are skeptical theists are skeptical about whether that noseeum inference is reasonable, so too they should be skeptical that this inference about God’s commands is reasonable as well.
6. Moral Objections
A number of authors have argued that skeptical theism—especially when combined with theism—leads to various forms of moral problems, including moral skepticism. However, there are several distinct criticisms that are not always distinguished. I will distinguish three important objections involving morality.
6.1 Moral Deliberation
One criticism is that theists who accept skeptical theism should deliberate about acting in problematic ways (see Almeida and Oppy 2003: 505–7; Piper 2007: 71ff; Rancourt 2013). More specifically, they should reason that they should never intervene in preventing seemingly unjustified evils, even if it would be easy for them to do so. For (as theists) they believe that for any seemingly unjustified evil, there is a justifying reason for it. They might fail to identify the justifying reason for some seemingly unjustified evil. But (as skeptical theists) they do not regard this failure as providing prima facie justification that the justifying reason does not exist. So they should reason that they should not intervene in preventing seemingly unjustified evils. But, the objection goes, it is clearly unreasonable—and immoral—to reason that we should never prevent a potential seemingly unjustified evil.
This basic objection can be extended. For instance, theists who are skeptical theists frequently believe that they have been commanded by God to act in various ways. Thus, in some concrete situation, a theist who is a skeptical theist may believe both that she should not prevent the suffering (because of her skeptical theism) and that she should prevent the suffering (because of her theism). The combination of her views leads to a kind of moral paralysis or aporia (see Piper 2007: 72–3). (Again, for the reasons mentioned in section IV.3, atheists and theists who are not skeptical theists have straightforward ways of resisting these objections.)
Skeptical theists have offered a number of responses. Some skeptical theists who are theists claim that God has commanded them to act in various ways. Therefore, when deliberating about how to act, it is reasonable to prevent evils since they have been commanded by God to prevent evils (compare Bergmann and Rea 2005: 244–5, Schnall 2007). This response requires knowledge or reasonable belief of God’s commands; but some critics of skeptical theism claim that skeptical theists who are theists do not have knowledge of God’s commands (see previous section).
Other skeptical theists argue that the objection misrepresents their position (Anderson 2012). Specifically, it neglects a distinction Wykstra drew (1984: 75–6) between different justifications for permitting evil (cf. Alston 1991 [1996: 101]). God may be justified in permitting an evil because the evil itself is necessary for some greater good. But it may be that God is justified in permitting an evil because the possibility of the evil—that is, not preventing it—is necessary for some good, such as developing moral character. A parenting analogy is apt here. A parent is able to prevent an embarrassingly low score on her child’s school work by forcing her child to do the homework. But by permitting the possibility of that low score, the parent gives her child an opportunity to achieve something of value—a more responsible character. In this case, the suffering—the embarrassingly low score—is not necessary for any further good; rather, the parent’s permission of it is necessary for a further good, namely, increased responsibility. Thus, some skeptical theists reject the claim that for any evil, there is a greater good that outweighs that evil. Rather, God may permit some evil may occur, not because that evil is necessary for some greater good, but because God’s permission of it is.
6.2 All-things-considered Value
Some have objected that skeptical theism is committed to all-things-considered value skepticism (Jordan 2006, Hasker 2010, Ekstrom 2021: ch. 4). Crudely put, the all-things-considered value of something—a state of affairs, action, attitude, etc.—is the overall value or disvalue of it and all of its consequences. Some have argued that if skeptical theism is true, then it is frequently not reasonable to make all-things-considered value judgements about specific things, that is, specific states of affairs, actions, attitudes, etc. Given skeptical theism, we are frequently reasonable in judging that some specific thing is on its own valuable or disvaluable, good or bad. But, the objection goes, we are not reasonable in judging that things have all-things-considered value. Again, this objection might be extended to cases of obligations, since being unable to make reasonable all-things-considered value judgments may also undermine knowledge of our obligations (see next section).
In response, some skeptical theists concede their position undermines certain ways of arriving at all-things-considered value judgments (cf. Bergmann 2009: 379–80, 389; 2012: 25–6). Specifically, just as skeptical theistic claims undermine Rowe’s nosseum inferences, so too they will undermine nosseum inferences that certain things are all-things-considered valuable or disvaluable. But skeptical theists might also maintain that this all-things-considered value skepticism is unproblematic. One reason why it might be unproblematic is that there are reasons for accepting all-things-considered value skepticism independently of skeptical theism. For instance, no one knows all of the causal consequences of their action. Thus, no one knows all of the valuable or disvaluable consequences of their actions. Thus, no one knows the all-things-considered value of their actions. This line of reasoning supports all-things-considered value skepticism, but does not assume that skeptical theistic critiques are successful.
6.3 All-things-considered Obligations
Many authors have argued that skeptical theism leads to skepticism about our obligations (see Jordan 2006: 409ff; Piper 2007: 68; Sehon 2010; Maitzen 2013: 448–451; Street 2014). Skeptical theists can be reasonable in believing that certain things are good and bad; and skeptical theists can be reasonable in believing that agents have certain pro tanto obligations (e.g. to bring about what is good, prevent what is bad, keep our promises, etc.). But oftentimes in ordinary life we take ourselves to reasonably believe—if not know—what we ought to do, what our all-things-considered obligations are. And some authors argue that skeptical theism leads to skepticism about our all-things-considered obligations.
The simplest form of this objection assumes maximizing act consequentialism. According to that view, an agent ought to act to bring about the outcomes with the greatest possible good. However, if skeptical theists cannot be reasonable in forming beliefs about the all-things-considered value of outcomes, then they cannot be reasonable in believing which outcomes have the greatest possible good. Thus, assuming maximizing act consequentialism, skeptical theists cannot be reasonable in believing some action is the one they ought to perform. But, arguably, skeptical theism leads to skepticism about our all-things-considered obligations assuming other moral theories as well. For instance, some robust forms of virtue ethics suggest that agents ought to perform the action that a perfectly virtuous person would perform; but presumably a perfectly virtuous person would not neglect salient outcomes of their actions. Similarly, some forms of Kantian ethics test moral principles by considering whether “universalizing” them in various ways results in some kind of contradiction; but presumably determining whether there is some kind of contradiction requires knowing the various outcomes of actions in those hypothetical scenarios.
Skeptical theists might respond by drawing a distinction between considerations relevant to God’s action and our own (compare Howard-Snyder 1996b: 292-3; Bergmann 2009: 393; Jeffrey 2019: section 3.1.3). For all we know, our knowledge of good and evil is not representative when it comes to considerations that determine what God ought to do; but it may be that our knowledge of good and evil is representative when it comes to considerations that determine what humans ought to do. While this response may be promising, skeptical theists haven’t developed it at great lengths, and some critics (notably Street 2014) have argued it is less promising than it might seem.
Howard-Synder (2009, 2014) offers a dilemma argument in defense of skeptical theism. On some moral theories, the facts that determine our all-things-considered obligations are frequently inaccessible to us. (Maximizing act consequentialism is one example.) Thus, given skeptical theism and those theories, we should frequently be in doubt about our all-things-considered obligations—but not in virtue of skeptical theism, but rather in virtue of those theories. By contrast, on other moral theories, the facts that determine our all-things-considered obligations are frequently accessible to us. Thus, given skeptical theism and those theories, we frequently should not be in doubt about our all-things-considered obligations—but not in virtue of skeptical theism, but rather in virtue of those theories. Either way, skeptical theism itself doesn’t lead to skepticism about our all-things-considered obligations.
7. Scope of Skeptical Theism
Many skeptical theistic critiques focus on “noseeum” inferences. These inferences might be used to infer that God’s permission of some evil lacks a justifying reason or even that there is no God. A natural thought is that skeptical theistic critiques, if successful at all, are only successful against arguments that make a “noseeum” inference. Other arguments from evil, using alternative lines of reasoning, may be immune from skeptical theistic critiques. This natural thought is not a criticism of skeptical theistic critiques per se. Rather, it suggests a certain limitation of skeptical theistic critiques. Such critiques have a limited scope in defending theism from arguments from evil.
A number of authors have argued that there are arguments from evil that are immune to skeptical theistic critiques. We next focus on three types of arguments—non-inferential arguments, Humean arguments, and Hiddenness Arguments.
7.1 Non-inferential Arguments
Non-inferential arguments from evil begin with a standard observation. For a given proposition, sometimes we can be either inferentially justified in believing it—perhaps on the basis of some beliefs or argument—or non-inferentially justified in believing it. For instance, I am inferentially justified in believing my partner is home by inferring this from other things I am justified in believing like: the door is unlocked, the mail has been taken, her keys are on the ring, and her jacket is hanging on the wall, etc. But I can also be non-inferentially justified in believing my partner is home by seeing her in the home as well.
One way of defending N-O1.2— there is at least one evil e such that God’s permission of e is not necessary for some outweighing good—is inferentially, by giving an argument. Skeptical theists have critiqued various arguments for N-O1.2. But even if those critiques succeed, then at best what follows is that we do not (yet!) have inferential justification for believing N-O1.2. But it is conceivable that we have non-inferential justification for believing N-O1.2.
However, a non-inferential argument from evil still needs to show that we do have non-inferential justification for believing N-O1.2 (or a similar kind of claim). While there might be a variety of ways of doing this (see Gellman 2013, 2017), a simple and straightforward way is to appeal to epistemic principles of Common Sense Epistemology like Phenomenal Conservativism (see Tucker 2014: 58f; Ekstrom 2021: 103ff). However, this way of defending a non-inferential argument from evil gets embroiled in the issues of section IV.2. Specifically, some skeptical theists will simply reject the epistemic principles; others may concede them but argue that skeptical theistic critiques provide defeaters. Regardless, whether or not non-inferential arguments from evil avoid skeptical theistic critiques—and are otherwise successful—is one of the more active areas of research on this topic in recent years.
7.2 Humean Arguments
Some of the most powerful arguments from evil are Humean arguments from evil (see Hume 1779 , Draper 1989, Draper 1992: 313–317, Dougherty and Draper 2013, Morriston 2014). Humean arguments have several distinctive features. First, they appeal to facts about good and evil, such as the distribution of pleasure and pain we observe. Second, they are comparative: they compare theism with some alternative, inconsistent hypothesis like a “hypothesis of indifference” (roughly: it is not the case that life on earth as we observe it is the result of actions by either a benevolent or maleficent creator). Third, they are normally abductive, arguing that the inconsistent hypothesis does a better job of explaining certain facts than theism.
Humean arguments normally have a central premise like:
The hypothesis of indifference does a much better job predicting the distribution of pleasure and pain we observe than theism.
On its own, Dist isn’t enough to make it reasonable to believe theism is false; after all, perhaps the hypothesis of indifference is worse off in other respects—it is very implausible or we have other excellent reasons for accepting theism (cf. Plantinga 1996: 247–250). So defenders of Humean arguments normally add additional premises to their argument to show that their rival to theism isn’t worse off in other respects as well (see Dougherty and Draper 2013: 69ff; Morriston 2014: 227). But the inclusion of a comparative premise like Dist is part of what makes Humean arguments distinctive.
Dist may be defended in various ways. One standard way appeals to our background knowledge of the biological role of pleasure and pain (Draper 1989). Simplifying, we antecedently know that pleasure—a good—and pain—an evil—play biological roles. For instance, pleasure will play a role in reinforcing adaptive behavior, whereas pain will play a role in deterring non-adaptive behavior. The hypothesis of indifference does not undermine predictions about the biological role of pleasure and pain. But theism will. For given theism it is expectable that pleasure and pain would play additional roles beyond biological ones such as moral or religious roles (e.g., the virtuous receive pleasure, the vicious pain). So theism, but not the hypothesis of indifference, will undermine the predictions about the biological role of pleasure and pain. Further, the argument goes, those predictions are accurate. Thus, the hypothesis of indifference does a better job of explaining Dist than theism.
Most skeptical theists object to claims like Dist by focusing on what theism predicts or explains. Some skeptical theists express general skepticism of our ability to effectively compare these hypotheses. For instance, Perrine (2019) argues that if theism is true, then skeptical theistic claims—like ST1–ST3 from above—are also very likely true. Thus, if Dist is true, then so is:
The hypothesis of indifference does a much better job predicting the distribution of pleasure and pain we observe than theism and skeptical theistic claims.
But it is doubtful that we are able to effectively predict the pleasure and pain we might observe given both theism and skeptical theistic claims. For skeptical theistic claims undermine our ability to create precise enough predictions about theism to effectively compare them with other hypotheses like the hypothesis of indifference.
Other skeptical theistic critiques of Dist focus on specific hypotheses that, it seems, we cannot reasonably rule out. For instance, consider the following claim (compare Van Inwagen 1991 ; and 1996: 225–234):
Necessary Distribution (ND)
A distribution of pleasure and pain for organisms similar to the one we observe is necessary for great goods associated with higher-level organisms and for avoiding disvaluable worlds that are massively irregular.
If ND is very probable, given theism, then it is not unlikely that we would observe a distribution of pleasure and pain similar to the one we observe. For if theism is true, God likely wants to bring about various greater goods. But if ND is true, God couldn’t bring about those greater goods without allowing for a distribution of pleasures and pains similar to the one we observe. Thus, if ND is very probable, given theism, then theism may predict the distribution of good and evil we observe just as well as the hypothesis of indifference. Thus, if it is reasonable to believe Dist it must also be reasonable to believe that ND is not very probable, given theism. But that hypothesis—that ND is not very probable, given theism—is not one we can reasonably rule out. To do that, we would have to have a greater understanding of goods, evils, their connections to organisms, laws of natures, irregularities, etc. than we in fact have. So it is unreasonable to believe Dist, since to reasonably believe it we would have to reasonably believe ND is not very probable given theism, and that’s not reasonable for us to believe.
7.3 Divine Hiddenness
Divine hiddenness arguments use facts about the apparent “hiddenness” or “absence” or “silence” of God to argue against the existence of God (cf. Schellenberg 1993, 2007, 2015). A simple argument from divine hiddenness is:
- If God exists, there is no non-resistant, non-belief.
- There is non-resistant, non-belief.
- Therefore, God does not exist.
Non-resistant, non-belief refers to people who meet two conditions. First, they do not believe in God. Second, they are not resistant to belief in God, where not being resistant may include both having the conceptual and emotional abilities to have a relationship with God as well not having intentionally and culpably resisted such a relationship. H1 can be defended in various ways, including: according to theism, being in a personal relationship with God is the greatest good for people. However, the argument goes, such a personal relationship requires belief. Thus, if God exists, and a person is not resistant to such a relationship—the person’s greatest good—then God would “make his presence known” to the person so they might reasonably believe that God exists and enter into such a relationship. In other words, God would not remain hidden from those who are receptive to a relationship with God. But H2 claims there are such people—who are not resistant yet do not believe. Thus, there is no God.
Unsurprisingly, some authors claim this argument for H1 is vulnerable to skeptical theistic critique (see Bergmann 2009: 382, McBrayer and Swenson 2012). So far as we can tell, there is no reason that would justify God in remaining hidden to people who are receptive to a relationship with God. But from the mere fact that we cannot identify such a reason, it does not follow that there is no such reason. Thus, attempts to establish H1 by appealing to our knowledge of how God might plan to bring about certain goods—like a loving personal relation—may be vulnerable to skeptical theistic critique.
8. Theory Development
Theism is a cornerstone of many major religious traditions. But it is also a metaphysical view, being an ontological claim about what exists. It is also one potential way of filling in a “supernatural” worldview on which the world is not exhausted by “natural” things but also contains “supernatural” things. Many philosophers evaluate metaphysical claims in a manner similar to scientific claims, such as their ability to explain phenomenon, be well-confirmed, exhibit theoretical virtues (such as simplicity), etc.
However, there is a well-known lesson in scientific theorizing about how not to avoid a theoretical problem. Suppose we are evaluating a hypothesis H (say, Mars revolves around the Earth). But there is some data D that seems to strongly disconfirm H (say, Mars exhibits “retrograde motion”). One could expand or enrich H by adding further hypotheses to H that would predict the data D (say, Mars orbits the earth using epicycles on an orbit). The resulting expanded or enriched hypothesis may perfectly well predict the data D. But if the resulting expanded or enriched hypothesis is random, unprincipled, independently implausible, or otherwise ad hoc, it may not be plausible to believe the expanded hypothesis in virtue of these additions or expansions. The lesson here—crudely put—is that one should not respond to a problem for a hypothesis by just adding claims to that hypothesis. At the very least, one should also explain why those additional claims are also expectable given the hypothesis in question. In that way, one can show that the additional claims are not random, unprincipled, or ad hoc.
Among other things, theism is a metaphysical hypothesis. Many authors have argued that various facts about good and evil are strong evidence that disconfirms this hypothesis. In response, some authors have adduced skeptical theistic critiques, composed of further claims about God and human limitations. However, the lesson from above is that simply adding further claims is insufficient to defend a hypothesis from a theoretical problem. Thus, if these skeptical theistic claims are random, ad hoc, or unprincipled when added to theism, then even if the expanded theism adequately neutralizes the disconfirming evidence, the expanded theism may be too implausible to be reasonably believed.
Though not always framed in this way, skeptical theists have been sensitive to these points. Some skeptical theists argue that their skeptical theistic claims are independently plausible—that is, plausible independent of whether or not theism is true. Other skeptical theists argue that their skeptical theistic claims are quite plausible given theism. Skeptical theists offer various defenses, by appealing to considerations of human limitations or moral progress or ruminations about historical complexity or analogies involving expertise in various fields (see, inter alia, Alston 1996: 317ff; Howard-Snyder 1996b: 301ff; Durston 2000; Bergmann 2001: 284–6; Perrine 2019: 124–126; Hendricks 2020). Either way, these arguments can be used to try to show that skeptical theistic claims are not random, ad hoc, or unprincipled ways of “expanding” or adding to theism.
The issue of how to develop a theory was incipient in some of the exchanges between Rowe and Wykstra (see Rowe 1986: 246–7; Rowe 2006: 85ff; Wykstra 1984: 91ff; 1996: 142–5; Russell and Wykstra 1988: 159–160; Wykstra 1996: 140ff). For instance, Rowe concedes that certain claims are entirely expectable given theism, such as: there might be goods and evils beyond our ken but not beyond God’s. But other claims are not expectable given theism, such as: there is suffering that is necessary for goods beyond our ken and God would not tell us this. Rowe defends these claims by appeal to Wykstra’s parent-child analogy. A parent may allow a child to undergo a painful surgery for reasons that the child cannot yet understand; but a loving parent will surely not be absent while the child suffers (see also Dougherty 2012, Rutledge 2017b). Wykstra argued that such claims are expectable given theism by means of his analogy with scientific depth. More recently, other authors have tried to give other reasons why, even given theism, we should expect seemingly unjustified suffering without divine comfort or acknowledgement of that suffering (see DePoe 2014, 2017; Shields 2021)). These disputes can be understood as disputes over whether theism can be “expanded” by skeptical theistic considerations in a way that is both plausible and undermines arguments from evil, or whether the only plausible and principled ways of expanding theism do not undermine such arguments (compare Perrine and Wykstra 2014, 2017: 104–7).
The issue of theory development is important for two further reasons. First, many skeptical theists defend their claims and critiques by arguing that critics misunderstand them or that their positions are analogous to other cases that are perfectly unproblematic. However, as philosophers of science like Kuhn and Lakatos have suggested, many of our best scientific theories offer recommendations (implicitly or explicitly) for how to develop or expand hypotheses. Skeptical theists have spent less time making positive proposals for how to develop or expand a theistic worldview. Unless they do so, some critics may worry that skeptical theism makes theism into a “degenerating research program” (to use Lakatos’ charming phrase).
Second, many skeptical theists are not simply theists; they are adherents to some religious tradition. Religious traditions normally make many more claims than (mere) theism, and religious traditions normally reject other alternative religious traditions. Some philosophers of religion—such as Richard Swinburne—have continued the project of natural theology to not only defend theism but a specific religious tradition as well (Christianity, in Swinburne’s case). But many—including some skeptical theists—worry that such projects are undermined by skeptical theistic considerations. If so, skeptical theists who are theists need to explore alternative routes for explaining the justification of religious belief, such as reformed epistemology (see Plantinga and Wolterstroff 1983; Plantinga 2000). At the very least, more work could be done exploring positive models that incorporate justified belief in both skeptical theism and specific religious traditions.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Skeptical Theism, entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- Dougherty, Trent, “Skeptical Theism”, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2022 Edition), Edward N. Zalta & Uri Nodelman (eds.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2022/entries/skeptical-theism/>. [This was the previous entry on this topic in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy – see the version history.]
For helpful feedback, the author thanks Michael Bergmann, Spencer Case, Paul Draper, Perry Hendricks, Michael Longenecker, and an anonymous reviewer.