The Greek word skepsis means investigation. Literally, a “skeptic” is an inquirer. Not all ancient philosophers whom in retrospect we call “skeptics” refer to themselves as such. Nevertheless, they all embrace ways of life that are devoted to inquiry. Ancient skepticism is as much concerned with belief as with knowledge. As long as knowledge has not been attained, the skeptics aim not to affirm anything. This gives rise to their most controversial ambition: a life without belief.
Ancient skepticism is, for the most part, a phenomenon of Post-Classical, Hellenistic philosophy. The Academic and Pyrrhonian skeptical movements begin roughly in the third century BCE, and end with Sextus Empiricus in the second century CE. Hellenistic philosophy is a large-scale conversation, not unlike philosophy today. The skeptics (among them Pyrrho, Timon, Arcesilaus, Carneades, Aenesidemus, and Sextus Empiricus) do engage with Pre-Socratic philosophy, Socrates, Protagorean relativism, Plato, and perhaps Aristotle. But their contemporary and principal interlocutors are Epicureans, Stoics, Cynics, and Megarian logicians (cf. Long 2006, ch. 4 and 5).
- 1. The Central Questions
- 2. Skeptical Ideas in Early and Classical Greek Philosophy
- 3. Academic Skepticism
- 4. Pyrrhonian Skepticism
- 5. Ancient and Modern Skepticism: Transitions
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The core concepts of ancient skepticism are belief, suspension of judgment, criterion of truth, appearances, and investigation. Important notions of modern skepticism such as knowledge, certainty, justified belief, and doubt play no or almost no role. This is not to say that the ancients would not engage with questions that figure in today’s philosophical discussions. Ancient debates address questions that today we associate with epistemology and philosophy of language, as well as with theory of action, rather than specifically with the contemporary topic of skepticism. They focus on the nature of belief, the relationship of belief to speech and action, and the mental states of inquiry (on the role of ancient skepticism throughout the history of Western philosophy up to today, cf. Lagerlund 2020; on the relation between ancient skepticism and philosophical debates today, cf. Machuca and Reed 2018, Vlasits and Vogt 2020, and Machuca 2022).
From the point of view of the ancient skeptics, assertions are expressions of dogmatism. And yet, the best-known ancient skeptic, Sextus Empiricus, wrote extensively. Can the skeptics say anything meaningful about their philosophy without asserting anything about how things are (Bett 2013, 2019)? Skeptical writings have a peculiar format, one that comes with its own challenges: the skeptics aim to describe their philosophy tout court, as they practice it, without laying out any particular theories or doctrines. Skeptical ideas have been charged with a family of objections: they might be self-refuting, inconsistent, self-contradictory, and so on (Castagnoli 2010). Another line of objection is associated with Hume, namely that “nature is always too strong for principle.” As Hume puts it, “a Pyrrhonian cannot expect that his philosophy will have any constant influence on the mind” (part 2 of section 12, “Of the Academical or Sceptical Philosophy,” An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, London, 1748). It is one thing for skepticism to be coherent. It is another thing for it to be likely that anyone, no matter how much they rehearse skeptical arguments in their mind, will succeed in adhering to it (Johnson 2001), as ancient Pyrrhonist philosophers claimed to be able to do.
Like later epistemologists, the ancient skeptics start from questions about knowledge. But discussion quickly turns to beliefs (Fine 2000). The Greek term translated here as belief, doxa, can also be translated as opinion. The root of doxa is dokein, seeming. In a belief, something seems so-and-so to someone. But there is also an element of judgment or acceptance. The relevant verb, doxazein, often means ‘to judge that something is so-and-so.’ Hellenistic discussions envisage three attitudes that cognizers take to impressions (how things seem to them): assent, rejection, and suspension of judgment (epochê).
Suspension is a core element of skepticism: the skeptic suspends judgment. However, if this means that the skeptic forms no beliefs whatsoever, then skepticism may be a kind of cognitive suicide. Arguably, belief-formation is a basic feature of human cognitive activity. It is not clear whether one can lead an ordinary human life without belief, or indeed, ancient opponents of the skeptics say, whether one can even survive. Perhaps even the simplest actions, such as eating or leaving a room without running into a wall, involve beliefs (Annas-Barnes 1985, 7; Burnyeat 1980). It is also hard to say whether someone who succeeded in not forming any beliefs could communicate with others, whether they could engage in philosophical investigation, or whether they could even think at all.
The ancient skeptics are well aware of these objections. The most widely discussed charge is that they cannot act without belief (Apraxia Charge). In response, the skeptics describe their actions variously as guided by the plausible, the convincing, or by appearances. The notion of appearances gains great importance in Pyrrhonian skepticism, and poses difficult interpretive questions (Barney 1992). When something appears so-and-so to someone, does this for the skeptics involve some kind of judgment on their part? Or do they have in mind a purely phenomenal kind of appearing? The skeptical proposals (that the skeptic adheres to the plausible, the convincing, or to appearances) have in common their appeal to something less than full-fledged belief about how things are, while allowing something sufficient to generate and guide action.
However, the claim that ancient skepticism is about belief, while modern skepticism is about knowledge, needs to be qualified. Ancient skepticism is not alone in being concerned with belief. Descartes speaks repeatedly of demolishing his opinions (for example, Med 2:12, AT 7:18; cf. Broughton, 2002, 33–61). Contemporary epistemology often pays equal attention to the notions of both belief and knowledge. The distinctive focus of ancient skepticism on belief becomes clearer once we consider a third concept that figures centrally in ancient discussions: the criterion of truth. The skeptics and their opponents discuss how one recognizes a true impression as true. Are there some evident things (some kind of impressions), which can be used as standards or criteria, so that nothing is to be accepted as true if it is not in agreement with these evident things? The Stoics and Epicureans formulate theories that conceive of such criteria. The skeptics respond critically to their proposals. Accordingly, the conception of a criterion of truth assumes as central a role in ancient debates as does the notion of knowledge in modern discussions. This debate includes in-depth analysis of sense perception and its relation to belief. According to Epicurus, all sense perceptions are true, but judgments based on these perceptions are true or false (Striker 1977, Vogt 2017). The Stoics explore differences between sense perception, illusion, and hallucination (Vasiliou 2019). Their account of the criterion of truth starts from perceptual impressions that qualify, or fail to qualify, as cognitive (Shogry 2018). The Stoics propose that we should accept only cognitive impressions, and accordingly we should only form beliefs based on a subset of true perceptual impressions.
Discussion of the criterion of truth arguably also covers some of the ground that is later discussed in terms of certainty. The Stoics say that a particular kind of impression is the criterion of truth: the cognitive impression. Cognitive impressions make it clear through themselves that they reveal things precisely as they are. This notion is an ancestor to the later conception of clear and distinct impressions, and thus, to discussions of certainty.
Consider next the notion of doubt. Doubt is often considered the hallmark of skepticism. So how can it be that ancient skepticism is not about doubt (Corti 2010, Vogt 2014a)? Insofar as ‘to doubt’ means no more than ‘to call into question,’ the ancient skeptics might be described as doubting things. However, skeptical investigation as Sextus Empiricus describes it does not involve doubt (I shall focus here on Pyrrhonism; on Cicero’s use of dubitari, see Section 3.3). Skeptics find themselves struck by the discrepancies among impressions. This experience is described as turmoil (Machuca 2019). They aim to resolve this disturbance by settling what is true and what is false among them. But investigation leads them to suspension of judgment, which brings its own peace of mind (Outlines of Skepticism [= PH] 1.25–30). Where in this account should we locate doubt? Is the initial turmoil the ancient skeptic experiences a kind of doubt? Are the ancient skeptic’s investigations a kind of doubting? Should we describe suspension of judgment as a kind of doubt? All three stages may resemble doubt, at least insofar as the ancient skeptics have not settled on answers to the questions they investigate. But all three stages are also different from doubt as it is conceived in later epistemology. The ancient skeptics do not describe themselves as making an active effort at doubting what ordinarily they would believe, as some philosophers in the Cartesian tradition have it. Instead the ancient skeptics find themselves in turmoil because of discrepancies in how things strike them. Moreover, the progression that ancient skeptics describe differs from the doubt-belief model that later thinkers tend to employ. The ancient skeptics improve their psychological condition by moving from turmoil to suspension of judgment, not by removing doubt. It seems best, then, to refrain from invoking the modern conception of doubt as at all fundamental in the reconstruction of ancient Greek skepticism.
Some of the distinctness of ancient skepticism lies in the fact that it is developed by philosophers who genuinely think of themselves as skeptics. In later epistemology, skepticism is largely construed from the outside. In particular, early modern skepticism is, for the most part, conceived by philosophers who aim to refute it. But ancient skepticism is explored by skeptics, and that is, by philosophers who intend their lives to be reflective of their philosophy (Cooper 2012 ch. 5.5–7; Bett 2013b). Socrates raises the challenge that it might be truly bad (for one’s life, for the state of one’s soul, and so on) to base one’s actions on unexamined beliefs. For all one knows, these beliefs could be false, and without investigation, one does not even aim to rid oneself of false belief, which is admittedly a bad thing for one’s soul. Only an examined life is worth living (Cooper 2007). Once we take this challenge seriously, as the ancient skeptics do, we embark on a kind of investigation that is seen as directly relevant to our lives. Our beliefs are assumed, at this pre-skeptical phase, to be guiding our actions. Confidence in unexamined views seems misplaced. Others regularly disagree with us. In favor of each view, some arguments can be adduced, some practices invoked, some experiences cited. These conflicting arguments, practices and experiences need to be examined. But that just raises further views that are in conflict. As a consequence, suspension of judgment on every such question looks rationally mandatory. But it is also rational to persist in investigation. The skeptic is committed to a search for the truth, on virtually all questions, even if this search repeatedly and predictably leads to suspension of judgment (Cooper 2012).
The early Greek philosophers develop distinctions between reality and appearances, knowledge and belief, and the non-evident and the evident. These distinctions form the framework in which skepticism can be conceived. The idea that truth is seen and knowledge gained from some perspective outside of the ordinary ways of mortal life, and that mortals rely on something lesser, be it the hear-say of fame, or signs, or appearances, runs through much of early Greek thought. However, few early Greek thinkers seem to have had skeptical or proto-skeptical inclinations. Xenophanes and Democritus are perhaps the most prominent apparent exceptions.
Xenophanes famously insists that all conceptions of the gods are anthropomorphic and culturally contingent (DK 21B14, B15). The Ethiopians pray to gods who look like Ethiopians, the Thracians to gods who look like Thracians (B16). If horses and cows had hands, the horses would draw pictures of gods that look like horses, and the cows would draw gods as cows (B15). Xenophanes puts forward a number of theological theses of his own. But he says that no man will know the clear truth about such matters. He makes a point that has lasting relevance in discussions of skepticism: even if someone succeeded in saying something that actually is the case, he himself would not know this. Thus, all is belief (120: B34) (cf. Sassi 2011 on interpretations of Xenophanes that influence the history of skepticism).
Atomism—a theory which thrives in Hellenistic times as the physical theory of Epicureanism, and is thus an interlocutor of skepticism—leads into difficult epistemological questions. The atomist can argue that sense perceptions are explicable as complex events, initiated by objects each one made up of a lot of atoms floating in the void, from which atoms proceed and traverse the intervening space, and affect the senses. It is certain objects, made up by the atoms proceeding from the objects in question (filmy images) that we actually perceive. We neither perceive ‘real reality’ (atoms and void), nor even macroscopic objects and their properties (for example, a square tower). Democritus seems to have argued along these lines (SE M 7.135–9; cf. fr. 9, SE M 7.136; Theophrastus, De Sensibus 2.60–1, 63–4), and accordingly his atomist view of perception can be seen as grounding a kind of proto-skepticism.
Democritus’ student Metrodorus of Chios says at the beginning of his book On Nature “None of us knows anything, not even this, whether we know or we do not know; nor do we know what ‘to not know’ or ‘to know’ are, nor on the whole, whether anything is or is not” (Cicero, Acad. 2.73; trans. Lee (2010) = DK 70B1; SE M 7.48, 87–8; Eusebius, Praep. evang. 14.19.9). This formulation reflects awareness of the fact that a simpler statement than the one reported in Cicero, such as “there is no knowledge,” can be turned against itself. In particular, Metrodorus recognizes the role that understanding concepts plays in any such statement. Does its proponent know something, merely by virtue of understanding what the terms she uses in her philosophizing refer to? Sextus presents Metrodorus’ pronouncement as related to an enigmatic idea that he ascribes to two other philosophers, the Democritean Anaxarchus of Abdera and the Cynic Monismus (SE M 7.87–88). Both are said to have likened existing things to a stage-painting. This comparison, which Burnyeat captures in the catch-phrase “all the world’s a stage-painting,” is open to a range of interpretations (Burnyeat 2017). For Monismus, Burnyeat argues, it is likely to have had a moralistic upshot, along the lines of “all is vanity.” In Democritean philosophy, and insofar as later skepticism recalls the saying, it is bound to be a proposal in epistemology (or possibly epistemology and metaphysics).
The 5th century sophists develop forms of debate which are ancestors of skeptical argumentation (Bett 2020b). They take pride in arguing in a persuasive fashion for both sides of an issue and in developing an agonistic art of refuting any claim put forward. Further, the sophists are interested in the contrast between nature and convention. The formative roles of custom and law were discussed by some of the earliest Greek authors (consider Pindar’s “law is king” and its many interpretations, for example in Herodotus). The sophists explore the idea that, if things are different for different cultures, there may be no fact of the matter of how those things really are. The skeptics engage with both legs of the distinction between nature and convention. Pyrrhonian skepticism employs an argument to the effect that, if something is by nature F, it is F for everyone (affects everyone as F) (see sections 4.2 and 4.4). Pyrrhonism further associates convention with appearances, so that the sceptic, by adhering to appearances, can lead an ordinary life (see section 4). However, the contrast between nature and convention does not figure importantly in ancient skepticism, and there is no skeptical school that would confine itself to ‘moral’ skepticism, or skepticism about values.
Sextus Empiricus, whose writings provide the most detailed extant account of Pyrrhonian skepticism, emphasizes how strongly the skeptics depart from all other philosophers. As he presents it, the Pre-Socratics who put forward some of the views cited above are what he calls dogmatists. They make claims about nature, reality, knowability, and so on. The second-most detailed extant account of Pyrrhonian skepticism is offered by Diogenes Laertius, in his Lives of Eminent Philosophers 9.61–116. It contains a large number of references to early Greek poets and Pre-Socratic philosophers, suggesting that these early thinkers formulate ideas that are similar to skeptic ideas (§§61–73). It is controversial whether the skeptics Diogenes has in mind claim this ancestry. Alternatively, other philosophers may have charged the skeptics with sharing ideas with non-skeptical thinkers, thereby departing from their non-dogmatic approach (Warren 2015). Either way, two observations seem relevant. Contrary to a classic assessment of Diogenes’ report by Jonathan Barnes (1992), the sections of text in which connections are made between early Greek thought and skepticism may be worth exploring. Moreover, scholars may have paid too little attention to skepticism’s ancestry in poetry (Clayman 2009). Pyrrho seems to have referred to Homer as a proponent of ideas he approves of, ideas about change, the status of human rationality and language, and more.
The Socrates of Plato’s Apology tries to solve a puzzle. The Delphic oracle says that no one is wiser than Socrates. But Socrates does not think himself wise. He calls into question the truth of neither the oracle’s pronouncements nor his self-perception. Accordingly, he must figure out how both are consistent with each other. In order to do so, Socrates talks to various groups of experts in Athens: politicians, poets, and craftsmen. As it turns out, all of them think that they know something about great and important things, but in fact, it seems clear to Socrates, they do not. When asked they cannot provide reasons for believing the things they claim to know that are rationally satisfactory. Socrates knows that he does not know about these most important matters (megista; 22d); his interlocutors, it appears, do not know that they lack this knowledge. In this respect, Socrates is wiser than everyone else who has any general reputation for wisdom. In the course of recounting his conversations with others, Socrates says something enigmatic: “About myself I knew that I know nothing” (22d; cf. Fine 2008). Some readers (ancient and modern) take Socrates to profess that he knows nothing. But the context of the dialogue allows us to read his pronouncement as unproblematical. Socrates knows that he does not know about important things. He advocates the importance of critically examining one’s own and others’ views on important matters, precisely because one does not know about them (Vogt 2012a, ch. 1). Such examination is the only way to find out.
Socrates’ commitment to reason—examination as the way to find out—inspires the skepticism of the Hellenistic Academy (Cooper 2004b, Vogt 2013). One is bound to lead one’s life based on one’s beliefs, he assumes. Therefore, one ought to examine one’s beliefs, and abandon those that one finds to be false. One ought to do so because otherwise one might lead a bad life. Socrates’ questioning is rooted in a concern with the good life. Insofar as it is, one might think that the Socratic roots of ancient skepticism lead one toward a kind of limited, wholly moral skepticism. However, Socrates’ examinations are not confined to value questions. While ethical questions may be the starting-point, they immediately lead to questions about the soul, the gods, knowledge, and so on. For Socrates and his Hellenistic followers, value questions cannot be insulated from questions of psychology, physics, and epistemology.
Another strand of skeptical thought begins with questions about the nature of philosophical investigation. In the Meno, Plato formulates a famous puzzle. How is investigation possible? We cannot investigate either what we know or what we do not know. In the former case, there is no need to investigate, and besides, if we really do know we already have in mind everything that investigation could reveal to us about the matter. In the latter case, we would not know what to look for, and we would not recognize it if we found it (80d-86c). So there is no room for investigating anything. Socrates calls this an eristic argument, thus drawing attention to the fact that this is a puzzle that sophists have put forward (cf. Plato’s Euthydemus).
Plato’s solutions to this puzzle are difficult to assess (Fine 2014). Learning is recollection, says one proposal (this is the one that Socrates himself immediately offers). We already know, but only in some implicit way, what it takes investigation to come to know explicitly. This is the famous Anamnesis theory (81a-d). If we give up on investigation, we shall be lazy people, says another argument (81d-e). A third solution of the puzzle arguably says that one of its premises is false. It is not the case that, for everything, we either know it or are entirely ignorant of it. Rather, there is a third state, namely belief (83a-86a). Investigation can begin from beliefs.
The Meno explores a mix of these solutions. Plato develops what he calls a hypothetical method (86c-100b). That is, the interlocutors in some sense begin from their beliefs (for example, “virtue is good”). But they do not endorse them. They set them up as hypotheses, and employ these hypotheses in investigation (on the relationship between Pyrrhonian skepticism and Plato’s and Aristotle’s notions of hypothesis, cf. Corti 2011). A spurious dialogue, the Sisyphus, discusses a similar puzzle, though with respect to deliberation. Deliberation either involves knowledge or is mere guesswork; either way, deliberation is impossible. Here, too, we may ask whether the distinction between knowing and not knowing is exhaustive, or whether attention to belief changes the picture (Fine 2021, ch. 8).
Plato discusses and re-formulates several of the metaphysical considerations that back up proto-skeptical and early skeptical intuitions. The relevant passages are spread out over a number of dialogues, among which passages in the Phaedo, Republic, Theaetetus and Timaeus are perhaps most important. In these dialogues, Plato develops some of his own metaphysical ideas. He also engages critically with metaphysical theories that he does not ultimately adopt. However, in order to explore these theories he formulates them in detail, often invoking a Pre-Socratic ancestor as a proponent of a given idea. These discussions are a great source of inspiration for Pyrrhonian skeptics, who are interested in what may be called a metaphysics of indeterminacy (Bett 2000, Vogt 2021).
In contrasting the Forms with the perceptible realm, Plato discusses properties. For example, for all sensible items, A is tall relative to some B and short relative to some C. There is no such thing as anything’s being tall simpliciter. When we call something tall, we measure it against something else, look at it from a particular perspective, and so on. As we might say, “tall” and “short” are relative predicates. But perhaps many more, or indeed all, predicates work that way, even where this is less obvious. Plato’s arguments lead to the question of whether it is conceivable that all our predications are, in this particular sense, relative. If this were the case, it might quite fundamentally upset our conception of the world as furnished with objects that have properties. Such considerations lead to another idea about properties in the perceptual realm. If a fence is low and high, a cloud is bright and dark, a vase beautiful and ugly, and so on, then it seems that, perhaps quite generally, perceptual things are F and not-F. Only the Form of F is F (for example, only the Beautiful is beautiful). While the relevant passages are difficult to interpret, it is clear enough which line of thought comes to influence later skeptics. The skeptics engage with the idea that, if something appears to be F and not-F, it is not really (or: by nature) either F or not-F.
In the Timaeus, Plato argues that an account of the natural world can only be ‘likely’: it is an eikôs logos. Most generally speaking, the idea here is that certain explananda are such that theorizing about them can do no more than mirror their, comparatively speaking deficient, nature. This idea has ancestors in Xenophanes and Parmenides, and it plays a crucial role in the Timaeus (Bryan 2012). Academic skeptics employ various notions of the plausible and the convincing, thus developing further this tradition, albeit no longer with the assumption that different domains require different kinds of theorizing.
In the Theaetetus, Plato explores the kind of cultural relativism that is associated with some sophists. In his examination relativism is extended to a general theory, not restricted to the domain of values. Socrates (as main speaker of the dialogue) ascribes relativism to Protagoras, who is famous for saying that “man is the measure.” Socrates reformulates this claim as follows: what appears to A is true for A, and what appears to B is true for B. On this premise, Socrates argues, there is no rational way to prefer our perceptions while awake to our perceptions while asleep, or similarly, to prefer sober to intoxicated or deranged perceptions. In each state, our perceptions are true for us. Socrates analyzes relativism in several steps, pointing to ever more radical implications. Along the way, he envisages a moderate metaphysics of flux, where objects do not have stable properties. But eventually he points out that relativism is committed to an even starker revisionist metaphysics, radical flux. For it to be possible that what seems to A is true for A, and what seems to B is true for B, there cannot be a stable world that A and B both refer to. Rather, “everything is motion” (Tht. 179c-184b). The skeptics employ versions of some of the arguments in the Theaetetus, without, however, arriving at relativist conclusions. Schematically speaking, the relativist says that, if X is F for A and F* for B, then X is F-for-A and F*-for-B. Pyrrhonian skepticism of the variant found in Sextus reacts by continued investigation into whether X is F or F* (or both or neither).
Aristotle engages, at several points in his works, with the Meno Problem. For example, Aristotle points out that, for successful investigation to proceed, one first needs a well-formulated question. One needs to know the knot in order to untie it. In order to know what to look for and recognize it when one finds it, one needs to first think one’s way through the difficulties involved, and thereby formulate a question. If one does, then one shall be able to recognize the solution once one hits upon it (Met. 3.1, 995a24–b4). These ideas are highly relevant to Hellenistic discussions. The skeptic is an investigator, and one anti-skeptical charge says that, if indeed a skeptic knew nothing, they could not even formulate the questions they investigate. Interpreters have emphasized a contrast between Aristotle and the skeptics. For Aristotle, formulating puzzles and thinking one’s way through them puts one in a better position, such that one gets clear about how matters are. This may be different for the skeptics: engagement with different angles of philosophical problems leads them to suspension of judgment (Long 2006, Code 2010). Other scholars argue that the skeptics’ way of thinking through puzzles improves their cognitive condition even though they do not settle for an answer to a given question (Vogt 2012a, ch. 5). Also, scholars point to modes of thinking in Plato and Aristotle that are not primarily concerned with results. In contemplation, a cognizer may think again and again through the same kinds of matters, and yet doing so presumably improves their cognitive condition (Olfert 2014).
In Posterior Analytics I.1, Aristotle says that all teaching and learning comes about through things we already know. When we phrase questions, we already have ‘That-Knowledge’ and ‘What-Knowledge.’ For example, when we ask questions about triangles, we need to know that there are triangles (otherwise we would not have questions about their properties). We also need to have a notion of what triangles are (we draw a triangle, not a square, when we phrase a question about its properties). Another way in which Aristotle addresses the Meno Problem conceives of particular perceptions as the starting-points of investigation. Complex cognitive activities arise from simpler ones. Many particular perceptions lead to memory, to experience, and eventually to expert understanding (Met. 1.1, An. Post. II.19). With the generalizations of memory, experience, and expertise comes the ability to investigate. With respect to skepticism, the important point here is that the starting-points of investigation are not themselves in need of justification.
Like Plato, Aristotle engages with the Protagorean claim that, as Aristotle puts it, all seemings (dokounta) and appearances (phainomena) are true (Met 4.5). If this were so, Aristotle says, everything would have to be true and false at the same time. Aristotle argues that earlier thinkers arrived at such views because they identified being solely with the perceptual (4.5, 1010a1–3). Caught up in this assumption, they did not see who or what was going to judge between conflicting sense perceptions. For example, it seemed unsatisfactory to dismiss the views of sick and mad people simply on the grounds that they are in the minority, thereby considering as true what appears to the greater number of people. Similarly, Aristotle reports that these earlier thinkers looked at the ways in which things appear differently to different kinds of living beings, and to one person at different times (4.5, 1099b1–11).
In Metaphysics 4.4, Aristotle notes that some people consider it possible for the same thing to be and not to be, and for someone to believe so (he refers to a range of positions, all of which in some way are related to denial of the Principle of Non-Contradiction; see Castagnoli 2010, I.5.4). Against this, Aristotle says it is the firmest of principles that things cannot be and not be at the same time. To deny this shows a lack of training. With adequate training, one recognizes for which things proof should be sought, and for which it ought not to be sought (see also An. Post. I.3). It is impossible that there be demonstration for everything. Otherwise demonstration would go on ad infinitum. Scholars often refer to this point when discussing the skeptical modes of argument. The skeptics might be guilty of what, from Aristotle’s perspective, would be a mistake of exactly this kind (on this theme in later Aristotelian logic, cf. Malink 2020).
Aristotle continues in a way that is highly relevant to discussions of skeptical language and action. A person who wishes to deny that things cannot be and not be at the same time has two options. Either they say nothing, or they talk to us. In the first case, there is no need for us to refute them. This person is like a plant—they do not talk. In the second case, either their utterance signifies something, or it signifies nothing. If it signifies something, then they say that something is so-and-so (which Aristotle takes to be self-defeating for them). If it signifies nothing, then it does not qualify as speech. Even though they make an utterance, the person is in effect not speaking with us (or to themselves). Aristotle also explains the plant-metaphor in terms of action (1008b10-30). A person who believes nothing is like a plant because they cannot act. Pursuit and avoidance testify to the fact that people have beliefs. (On Aristotle and skepticism, see the papers collected in Irwin 1995.)
With Arcesilaus (316/5–241/0 BCE) and his role as leader of the Academy (266/268 BCE), Plato’s Academy turns skeptical. Arcesilaus does not refer to himself as a skeptic—this nomenclature is a later designation. However, Arcesilaus stands at the beginning of a re-orientation in the history of Platonically inspired philosophy. He rediscovers Socrates the examiner, arguably based on his reading of Plato’s dialogues (Thorsrud 2018). Socrates’ commitment to investigation, to the testing and exploring of one’s own and others’ beliefs, and his passion for weeding out falsehoods, are the starting-points of his Academic skepticism (Cicero, Acad. 2.74, 1.46). Throughout the history of this skeptical school, these traits, and the corresponding commitment to a life guided by reason, remain alive (Cooper 2004b, Vogt 2013). When, as we shall see below, Arcesilaus defends a skeptical life without belief, this is because, as he thinks, reason itself, if properly and faithfully followed, leads us to live that way. To Arcesilaus, the skeptical life is a life lived following reason, a life based on reason—just as the competing Stoic and Epicurean lives are alleged by their proponents to be. Arcesilaus engages with the epistemologies of these contemporaries of his. In particular, the Academics call into question that there is a criterion of truth, as both Epicureans and Stoics, beginning in the generation before Arcesilaus, claim there is. One interpretive question that concerns Arcesilaus, but also later Academic skeptics, is especially vexed. According to Seneca (Letter 88, 44), the Academics paradoxically claim to know that nothing can be known. Scholars disagree on how this and similar reports fit together with the picture of Academic skeptics as open-minded inquirers (Allen 2017). According to Sextus Empiricus, the Academics skeptics say that everything is inapprehensible (PH 1.226, cf. PH 1.3). Is “everything is inapprehensible” the single thing that can be apprehended? Does so-called “non-apprehension” (akatalêpsia) amount to the general claim that there is no knowledge? Alternatively, the Academics may dialectically appeal to the Stoic notion of katalêpsis, and argue merely that the Stoic notion of apprehension is not compelling (Allen 2022).
Like Socrates, Arcesilaus did not write anything. His views must be unearthed from Sextus’ comparisons between Pyrrhonian and Academic skepticism, from Cicero’s discussions in the Academica, and from a range of shorter (and sometimes hostile) reports. Major themes in Arcesilaus’ philosophy are (i) his dialectical method, (ii) discussion of whether there is a criterion of truth, and (iii) his defense of the skeptic’s ability to act.
(i) Method. Arcesilaus embraces what scholars call a dialectical method (Couissin 1929 , Perin 2013, Thorsrud 2018). This method is inspired by Socrates. It proceeds by asking one’s real or imaginary interlocutor what they think about a given question, then plunging into an examination of their views, employing their premises. Can they explain their position without running into inconsistencies, and without having to accept implications that they want to resist? As a consequence of this method, it sometimes appears as if a skeptic, while examining someone’s view and its consequences, makes a positive claim: “so, such-and-such is not so-and-so.” However, within a dialectical exchange, this should be read as “according to your premises, such-and-such follows.” This method remains a key ingredient of Greek skepticism. While the different skeptical schools develop variants of the dialectical method, skeptical argument is often characterized by the fact that skeptics think of themselves as engaging with “dogmatic” interlocutors. In the skeptical tradition, as articulated for example by Sextus Empiricus (see section 4.4.), “dogmatists” are philosophers who put forward, and defend, positive answers to philosophical questions about reality, knowledge, ethical values, etc. They need not do so dogmatically or rigidly or without consideration of alternatives in order to count, in skeptical terms, as “dogmatists.”
(ii) The Criterion of Truth. Zeno, the founder of Stoicism, and roughly 20–30 years Arcesilaus’ senior, was for a time a student at the Academy. He was still in the Academy when he formulated key Stoic doctrines. Like Arcesilaus, he claims Socratic ancestry. Zeno is inspired by some of the same ideas that inspire the skeptics. In particular, he engages with the Socratic idea that knowledge is integral to virtue. Contrary to Arcesilaus, Zeno aims to give accounts of knowledge and virtue, and holds them up as ideals that human nature permits us to achieve. For him, knowledge is very difficult to attain, but ultimately within the reach of human beings. From the point of view of Arcesilaus, Zeno’s claim to Socratic heritage is almost offensive: Zeno seems to be too optimistic about our cognitive powers to be following Socrates (Frede 1983). Scholars have traditionally envisaged an exchange of arguments between Zeno and Arcesilaus, where each modified his views in the light of the other’s criticism. However, Zeno most likely formulated his views between 300–275, and Arcesilaus argued against him c. 275 to 240, when Zeno (who died c. 263) was probably already retired (Brittain 2006, xiii; Alesse 2000, 115 f.; Long 2006, ch. 5).
The core of the dispute between Arcesilaus and the early Stoics concerns the question of whether there is a criterion of truth. The notion of a criterion is introduced into Hellenistic discussions by Epicurus, who speaks about the kanôn (literally measuring stick) and kritêrion. For Epicurus, a criterion is that evident thing, viz., the content of a sense-perception, against which claims about the non-evident are tested. For example, physics advances claims about non-evident things, such as atoms and void. These are not accessible to the senses, and accordingly, do not count as evident. Perception rules out various physical theories. For example, a physical or metaphysical theory according to which there is no movement can be dismissed because it is in disagreement with the evident.
Zeno argues that a certain kind of impression—namely a cognitive impression (phantasia katalêptikê)—is the criterion of truth (cf. Shogry 2018). Zeno’s conception of cognition (katalêpsis, literally grasping, apprehension), and the related notion of a cognitive impression, aim to solve an epistemological problem. Belief-formation aims at the truth; there is a norm inherent in the practice of believing that one should only believe truths. It is not transparent to us, however, which of our beliefs, or claims to the effect that such-and-such is true, are successful in their aim and hit the truth. Zeno argues that some impressions are cognitive. A number of Stoic definitions of the cognitive impression, formulated by Zeno and his successors, are transmitted. Scholars approach them in at least three ways. First, some scholars consider one of the Stoic definitions (SE M 7.247–52) as canonical (Nawar 2014, Shogry 2018). Two, scholars at times examine specific exchanges between Stoics and skeptics in the assumption that some clauses in Stoic definitions respond to skeptic objections (for example, Nawar 2017). Three, scholars have also pointed out that, here as elsewhere, the Stoics offer a multitude of definitions, without privileging one of them as “the” definition; different definitions may speak to different dialectical contexts or theoretical foci (Vogt 2022).
With some simplification, a cognitive impression reveals its content and that it is kataleptic (cf. Cicero, Academica 2.77–8). For example, when I look at my computer screen while typing this, I may very well have a cognitive impression that this is my computer screen. When I look up and out of the window, I have an impression of a friend walking across campus that is probably non-cognitive. This impression might be true. But since I see her from such a distance, it is pretty surely not cognitive. That is, not all true impressions are cognitive, but all cognitive impressions are true. We should only assent to cognitive impressions, and so in forming our beliefs, hold only those certified beliefs (cf. Brittain 2014 on the Stoic view that assent to cognitive impressions is not compelled).
Arcesilaus calls into question whether there are impressions of this kind. His main point seems to be that there could be an impression that is phenomenologically indistinguishable from cognitive impressions, but nevertheless misrepresents the matters it gives an impression about. To use an example that may derive from Carneades (see section 3.2), there is no impression of a given egg such that no impression of any other egg could be phenomenologically indistinguishable from it (Shogry 2018 and 2021, Machek and Veres forthcoming). Assuming that some clauses in Stoic definitions respond to specific skeptic challenges, the following clause, added to a shorter definition, appears to speak to these cases: “and of such a kind as could not arise from what is not” (Long and Sedley (1987) [= LS] 40; DL 7.46, 54; Cicero Acad. 1.40–1, 2.77–8; SE M 7.247–52). Absent a criterion of truth, Arcesilaus’ skeptic suspends judgment about everything (PH 1.232). Reason itself, Arcesilaus thinks, demands such suspension.
(iii) Action. If skeptics suspend judgment, argues their dogmatic opponent, they are not able to act. Stoic philosophy conceives of three movements of the mind: impression, assent, and impulse (Plutarch, Col. 1122a-d). All three figure in action. The agent assents to the impression that A is to be done; their assent is an impulse for the action A; if there is no external impediment, the impulse sets off the action (Inwood 1985). It is a cornerstone of Stoic philosophy that there can be no action without assent, and so without the belief that the action done is to be done. The Stoics aim to avoid the kind of determinism according to which actions are not ‘up to’ the agent (Bobzien 1998); for them, assent, but not impression, is up to the agent. In response to the Apraxia Charge, Arcesilaus seems to have argued that the skeptic can act without having assented (Plutarch, Col. 1122A-d), and so without believing that the action done is to be done. However, this is not his complete response. From the point of view of the Stoics, skeptical action, if performed without the relevant kind of assent (that is, assent that it is up to the agent to give, and that is a rational acceptance of the impression), is like the action of a non-rational animal, or like the automatic movement of plants when they grow and flourish. Arcesilaus is robbing people of their minds (Cicero Acad. 2.37–9; Obdrzalek 2013). But Arcesilaus need not and does not go so far as to compare human agents with non-rational agents. As human beings, skeptics have rational impressions. They perceive the world conceptually, and think about it. Arcesilaus does not suggest that skeptical action is causally set off by impressions, or in the way, whatever that is, that animal actions are set off. This would be a problematic proposal, for it would disregard that the skeptic has a human mind. Given the complexity of human thought, the skeptic is likely to have several, and often competing impressions. If all impressions triggered impulses, the skeptic would be inactive due to a kind of paralysis. The second component of Arcesilaus’ reply, thus, is that the skeptic, in acting without assenting, adheres to the reasonable (eulogon) (SE M 7.158; 7.150; Striker 2010). That is, Arcesilaus aims to explain skeptic action as rational agency (Cooper 2004b). Arcesilaus disputes the dogmatic claim that some impressions can be identified as true, and the related claim that one can only act on the belief that some impression is true. But he does not argue that there are no differences between impressions which agents could take into account. His agents are rational: they think about their options, and go with what looks, in one way or another, more plausible.
Arcesilaus defends skeptical action also against Epicurean critics (Plutarch, Col. 1122A-d), again by showing on the basis of the Epicureans’ own premises that skeptical action is possible. Can the sceptic explain why, when leaving a room, they go through the door rather than running into the wall? Arcesilaus seems to have exploited the Epicurean view that, while all sense-perception is true, belief can introduce falsehood. Like the Epicurean, the skeptic can keep apart the perception and a view formed on its basis. By not assenting to the perception, thus adding belief (“here is the door”), the skeptic guards against the source of falsehood, namely belief. But a skeptic has perception of the door available to them, which is enough for not running into walls.
Like Arcesilaus, Carneades (214–129/8 BCE) refrains from writing and philosophizes in a Socratic spirit. Carneades led an embassy of three philosophers from Athens to Rome in 156/5 BCE. Aside from his official role, he is said to have given two speeches, arguing for justice one day and against justice the next. Whether or not this is historically correct (Powell 2013), the traditional take on Carneades’ speeches is not that he aims to overthrow justice. Instead, the upshot is taken to be that he wants to show that the supporters of justice—including Plato and Aristotle—do not have the successful arguments they think they have to show what justice is and what it requires (Lactantius, Epitome 55.8, LS 68M). Like Arcesilaus, Carneades (i) engages with Stoic epistemology. His account of skeptical action includes (ii) a detailed proposal regarding the criterion. As part of his less radical skepticism, Carneades seems (iii) to allow for a certain kind of assent, and perhaps for belief.
(i) The Stoic-Academic Debate. Chrysippus, the third major Stoic (after Zeno and Cleanthes), and his student Diogenes of Babylon, revise Zeno’s epistemology, defending it against Arcesilaus’ arguments (Brittain 2006, xiii). In response to their arguments, Carneades continues the exchange with the Stoics that Arcesilaus began (SE M 7.402–10). His first move addresses the link between mental states and action. People in states of madness, he argues, act just as easily and naturally on their impressions as other people, even those who act on cognitive impressions (if there are any). From the point of view of exhibited behavior, there does not seem to be a difference: any and all impressions, even those the Stoics think clearly arise from something that is not, are in all respects relevant to action completely on a par. Cognitive impressions, if there are any, have no superiority.
In a second argument, Carneades points to objects that are similar to one another: can the wise person discern any two eggs, two grains of sand, and so on? The Stoics have multiple replies. It is conceivable that, in some contexts of action, the wise person assents to what is reasonable (eulogon) (DL 1.177), without having a cognitive impression of how things are. Or, if faced with the task to identify grains of sand while lacking a cognitive impression, the wise person can suspend judgment. However, the wise will train themselves so as to be able to perceive minute differences (Cicero, Acad. 2.57), where it might be important to do so. This point is backed up by Stoic physics: no two items in the universe are identical, and their differences are in principle perceptible (Sedley 1982, 2002). Carneades replies that even if no two things were exactly alike (consistent with his general line of argument, he does not take a stance on such questions), a very close similarity could appear to exist for all perceivers (Cicero, Acad. 2.83–5); that is, the impressions of two items, though in fact these items might differ from each other, could be indistinguishable (Nawar 2017, Shogry 2018 and 2021). Discussion continues with a move on the part of the Stoics: they add to their definition of the cognitive impression “one that has no impediment.” Sometimes an impression is—as it were, by itself—cognitive, but is unconvincing due to external circumstances (SE M 7.253). It is a difficult question whether this addition harms the Stoics more than it helps them. If the initial conception of a cognitive impression hangs on the idea that something about its phenomenological nature, or something internal to the impression, marks it as cognitive, the Stoics give up on a crucial assumption if they grant that sometimes there are “impediments.” If, however, cognitive impressions are differentiated by a causal feature (the way they are caused by the ‘imprinter’ which causes the ‘imprint’), the further addition might help (Frede 1983, Nawar 2014), since the impediment might need to be removed before the causal connection could be confirmed (Hankinson 2003).
(ii) Carneades’ Criterion. Even though Carneades further pursues a discussion begun by Arcesilaus, he does not simply continue within the framework of Arcesilaus’ skepticism. The distinctiveness of his position is best seen in the context of his criterion: the persuasive (pithanon). The notion of the persuasive can be understood in two distinctively different ways. Persuasiveness might be a causal feature, so that a persuasive impression sets off a physiological process of being moved in a certain way. But there may also be a rational kind of persuasiveness. Carneades construes persuasiveness in rational terms. For him, the persuasive is the convincing, or perhaps even the plausible.
Carneades develops a three-stage criterion: (1) In matters of importance, skeptics adhere to the persuasive. (2) In matters of greater importance, they adhere to the persuasive and undiverted. A persuasive impression is undiverted if there is no tension between it and its surrounding impressions. (3) In matters that contribute to happiness, skeptics adhere to persuasive, undiverted, and thoroughly explored impressions. A persuasive impression is undiverted and thoroughly explored when it and the surrounding impressions are closely examined without its persuasiveness being diminished (SE M 7.166–84). Consider an example. A skeptic looks in a dark room for a rope. Before they pick up what appears to them to be a rope, they look closely and poke it with a stick. Coiled objects can be ropes, but they can also be snakes. The persuasive impression that this is a rope must be examined before the skeptic adheres to it (M 7.187).
The three-stage criterion is put forward in the context of action. However, Sextus describes Carneades’ criterion as a criterion of truth, not a criterion of action (M 7.173). Carneades might take himself to offer more than a practical criterion. His discussions of the persuasive come close to a general epistemological theory (Couissin 1929 , Striker 1980, Bett 1989 and 1990, Allen 1994 and 2004 , Brittain 2001). Cicero renders the Greek pithanon as probabile (and sometimes as veri simile), which modern editors sometimes translate in terms of what is probable or likely to be true. Some scholars think that Carneades is an early thinker about likelihoods, and argue that he develops a fallibilist epistemology (Obdrzalek 2004).
(iii) Assent and Belief. Does adherence to persuasive impressions involve belief? Carneades coins a term for the kind of adherence he has been describing: approval (Cicero, Acad. 2.99). He distinguishes it from assent in the sense of Stoic and other dogmatic theories, which establishes a belief that something is in actual fact true; but he nevertheless describes it as a kind of assent (Cicero, Acad. 2.104). Carneades’ disciples disagree on whether approval is any kind of genuine assent. That is, they disagree on whether, in approval, one forms a belief. Philo and Metrodorus think that Carneades allows for some kind of belief, close to or identical with belief as the Stoics understand it. Clitomachus disagrees, and Cicero follows Clitomachus (Acad. 2.78, see also 2.59, 2.67). Scholars continue to debate these issues (Allen 2022), and the basic problem remains unchanged. It is not clear whether there is a plausible notion of belief according to which belief falls short of ‘holding to be true’ (or according to which, though some kind of ‘holding true’ is involved, the relevant affirmation-as-true is weaker than in beliefs as Stoics and other dogmatist epistemologists conceive of them). In any event, affirmations as true, at least of the full and flat-out (“in actual fact”) sort the Stoics think of, are precisely what the skeptic does not make.
Another approach to Carneades’ stance toward belief is to ask whether he might invoke Platonic considerations. Consider that Socrates, when asked in the Republic what he thinks the good is, refuses to reply because he thinks beliefs without knowledge are shameful (Rp. 506c). In response to this, his interlocutors point out that there is a difference between putting forward one’s beliefs as if one knew them to be true, and putting them forward with the proviso that they are merely beliefs (Vogt 2012a, ch. 2). The shamefulness of mere belief might disappear through this proviso. A passage in Cicero’s Academica suggests that Carneades invokes this thought. According to Carneades, the wise person can hold beliefs if they fully understand them to be beliefs (2.148). Along similar lines, it has been suggested that Carneades might conceive of a hypothetical mode of believing (Striker 1980 [1996, 112]), perhaps engaging with a move in Plato’s Meno. Investigation cannot get off the ground if we do not, in some sense, begin with our beliefs about the matter under investigation. But how can we do so without endorsing our beliefs, not knowing whether our views are true? Plato’s answer at this point is: by hypothesizing our beliefs. Today we would insist that hypotheses are not beliefs. However, it is conceivable that Carneades argued along these lines, and that the details of his vocabulary got lost or confused in doxography.
Carneades was an enigma to his students and immediate successors. Clitomachus (head of the Academy from 127 to 110 BCE) seems to have attempted the impossible: to adhere closely to Carneades’ philosophy, even though he never understood what Carneades truly meant (Levy 2010). The cornerstone of his adherence lies in the view that Carneades argues for suspension of judgment and against beliefs understood as Stoics understand them. Philo of Larissa, another student of Carneades, interprets his teacher as allowing for tentative beliefs in the skeptic’s life. With Philo, the skeptical era of Plato’s Academy comes to an end. Philo’s philosophy seems to divide into two phases. In Athens, and as head of the Academy, he stays relatively close to Carneades. Moving to Rome later in his career, he develops a markedly different position. He argues only narrowly against the Stoic criterion and their conception of cognition. One can apprehend things and so come to know them—one just cannot apprehend them in the way in which the Stoics construe cognition (PH 1.235). The fact that there is no apprehension in the sense of the Stoics does not mean that there is no knowledge (Acad. 2.14). This move shifts the discussion in several important ways. First, Philo can be interpreted as a kind of externalist: one can know something without knowing that one knows it. Absent Stoic cognitive impressions, we are not able to identify which instances of ‘holding-true’ qualify as knowledge; but we nevertheless have some knowledge (Hankinson 2010). Second, this proposal is a step toward modern skepticism, which is not concerned with criteria of truth, but with knowledge.
Cicero’s skeptical philosophy in his own philosophical writings is again distinctively different. In line with his notions of what is probable (probabile) or likely to be true (veri simile), Cicero often examines a range of philosophical positions, aiming to find out which of them is most rationally defensible. He thinks it is better for us to adopt a view that is likely to be true, rather than remain unconvinced by either side (Thorsrud 2009, 84–101). Cicero is of the greatest importance for the transition between ancient and early modern skepticism. As in other fields of philosophy, Cicero’s influence is partly the influence of the translator. In transposing philosophical ideas into the language of a different culture, the ideas change. Cicero sometimes speaks of doubting, dubitari (e.g., Acad. 2.27, 106; however, he often sticks with the earlier language of assent and suspension). But doubt has no place in Greek skepticism (see section 1).
When comparing Pyrrhonian and Academic skepticism, two topics stand out: Pyrrhonism aims at tranquility; and it assigns pride of place to appearances. Anecdotes about Pyrrho’s life (365/60–275/70 BC) convey how unaffected he was (DL 9.61–69). This kind of ideal—a tranquil state of mind—is not part of Academic skepticism, and scholars disagree on its role in Pyrrhonism (Machuca 2006; Striker 2010; Perin 2020; on Democritean influences on tranquility in Pyrrho and Timon, cf. Svavarsson 2013). Insofar as the point of the anecdotes about Pyrrho’s life is that Pyrrho did not avoid or pursue anything with fervor, or that he did not despair about things that other people find terrible, they capture ideas that remain central to Pyrrhonism (for a general account of early Pyrrhonism, cf. Castagnoli 2013; on Sextus’ take on Pyrrhonian tranquility, cf. Svavarsson 2015).
The biographical anecdotes portray Pyrrho as a strikingly unconventional figure, unaffected not just by emotion and belief, but also by perception—to the extent that friends had to pull him off the street when a wagon approached (DL 9.62). At the same time, Pyrrho seems to have said that the skeptic adheres to appearances (phainomena) (DL 9.106; Bett 2000, 84–93; on earlier notions of appearances relevant to skepticism, cf. Barney 1992). This might suggest that he would not cross the street when a wagon is approaching, and so appears to him. One story makes Pyrrho appear not only unusual, but arguably a not so sympathetic character. Passing by a drowning man, he was so unmoved that he simply walked on (DL 9.63). This is in rather stark contrast with Stoic notions of unaffectedness, where the idea would be that, not being disturbed by emotions like fear and panic, the passerby is ideally equipped to help effectively. Some biographical details can seem to mold Pyrrho’s life to fit the schema of the sage: a traveler to the East (Flintoff 1980), whose insights are conveyed in brief sayings; an enigmatic figure, exemplary and shocking at the same time. Though it is difficult to assess the testimony on Pyrrho’s travels, scholars increasingly explore resonances between Pyrrho’s pronouncements, later Pyrrhonian skepticism, and dimensions of Buddhist philosophy (Hanner 2020). For example, Mill (2018) argues that a tradition in classical Indian philosophy develops a “skepticism about philosophy” that resembles dimensions of Pyrrhonian thought.
Even though he discussed tranquility and adherence to appearances, Pyrrho was arguably no Pyrrhonian skeptic (Bett 2000, 14–62). That is, it is likely that he put forward a dogmatic position, in the sense that he had positive philosophical views about the character of reality. Pyrrho wrote nothing. Much of what we know about him is preserved through the writings of Timon, his adherent (325/20–235/30 BCE) (Burnyeat 1980b; Clayman 2009). The most important piece of testimony is a passage reporting an account by Timon:
It is necessary above all to consider our own knowledge; for if it is in our nature to know nothing, there is no need to inquire any further into other things. […] Pyrrho of Elis was also a powerful advocate of such a position. He himself has left nothing in writing; his pupil Timon, however, says that the person who is to be happy must look to these three points: first, what are things like by nature? second, in what way ought we to be disposed towards them? and finally, what will be the result for those who are so disposed? He [Timon] says that he [Pyrrho] reveals that things are equally indifferent and unstable and indeterminate (adiaphora kai astathmêta kai anepikrita); for this reason, neither our perceptions nor our beliefs tell the truth or lie (adoxastous kai aklineis kai akradantous). For this reason, then, we should not trust them, but should be without opinions and without inclinations and without wavering, saying about each single thing that it no more is than is not, or both is and is not, or neither is nor is not (ou mallon estin ê ouk estin ê kai esti kai ouk estin ê oute estin oute ouk estin). Timon says that the result for those who are so disposed will be first speechlessness (aphasia), but then freedom from worry (ataraxia); and Aenesidemus says pleasure. These, then, are the main points of what they say (Aristocles in Eusebius PE 14.18.1–5 = DC53; tr. Bett 2000 with changes)
In response to the first question, how things are in their nature, Pyrrho makes a metaphysical claim: they are indeterminate (Bett 2000, 14–29). There are no stable items, or no items with stable properties. Scholars sometimes hesitate to ascribe such a position to Pyrrho, because it is undoubtedly dogmatic. Perhaps the text can be given an epistemological reading: things are indifferentiable and unmeasurable and undecidable, because we fail in differentiating, measuring, and determining how they are (Svavarsson 2010; Thorsrud 2010). But Pyrrho’s response to the second question may only follow if we adopt the metaphysical reading (Bett 2000, 29–37). Pyrrho infers that our perceptions and beliefs are neither true nor false. They are not truth-evaluable, presumably because there are no facts which could be correctly captured. Third, if we understand these things, speechlessness (aphasia) follows, and then tranquility (ataraxia). Pyrrho does not say that we should cease to speak. He suggests that we adopt a complicated mode of speech, constructed around the expression ou mallon (“no more”), which aims to capture the indeterminate natures of things, when we attempt to say anything about anything (Bett 2000, 37–39; Vogt 2021).
Aenesidemus (first century BCE) was discontented with the views discussed in the Academy at his time, of which he began as an adherent. Philo’s proto-externalism as well as a counterposition formulated by Antiochus both appeared to him dogmatic. Aenesidemus aimed to revive a more radical skepticism, and left the Academy for this purpose. Arguably, he is the first Pyrrhonian skeptic. Aenesidemus wrote a treatise, the Pyrrhonian Discourses, probably similar in structure to Sextus’ Outlines of Pyrrhonism and partially preserved in a summary by Photius: a general account of skepticism, followed by books on particular philosophical questions (Hankinson 2010). The basic elements of Aenesidemus’ skepticism are: the skeptic puts appearances and thoughts into opposition; this generates equipollence (isostheneia, lit. “of equal weight”) between several appearances and/or thoughts; suspension of judgment follows; with it comes tranquility; and the skeptic leads a life according to appearances (DL 9.62, 78, 106–7). However, we do not know much detail of his views on these matters. Instead, Aenesidemus is famous for having developed Ten Modes or Tropes—forms of argument by which the sceptic puts appearances and thoughts into opposition. Key questions about Aenesidemus’ skepticism concern (i) the interpretation of his Modes, (ii) the relationship of his philosophy to competing theories, (iii) the scope of the Ten Modes, and (iv) the skeptic’s mode of speech.
(i) Conflicting Appearances or Causal Invariance. The Ten Modes are preserved in Diogenes Laertius (9.78–88), Philo of Alexandria (On Drunkenness 169–202), and Sextus. Diogenes’ account of the Ten Modes may postdate Sextus’ (Sedley 2015). Sextus gives extensive illustrations, and integrates the Ten Modes into his general account of Pyrrhonism (PH 1.36–163; cf. M 7.345 for ascription of the Ten Modes to Aenesidemus; cf. Annas-Barnes 1985 and Hankinson 1995, 268; the sequence below follows Sextus). Here is the first of the Ten Modes, interpreted in two ways.
Arguments concerning oppositions based on the differences between kinds of animals.
Conflicting Appearances Interpretation:
X appears F to animal of kind A (e.g., humans) and F* to animal of kind B [where F and F* are opposite or otherwise incompatible properties]. We cannot judge how X really is, because we are a party to the dispute.
Causal Invariance Interpretation:
For something to be ‘really’ F, it would have to consistently affect different perceivers as F. But different constitutions of different animals cause different impressions of the same thing. For different animals, something is F and F* (where F and F* are opposite or otherwise incompatible properties). Therefore, things do not seem to really be F or F*.
The Conflicting Appearances Interpretation is based on Sextus’ account (Annas-Barnes 1985). The focus here is on the idea that every kind of animal, perceiver, sensory faculty, thinker, or judger (depending on which mode we consider) is only one of several animals, perceivers, sensory faculties, thinkers, or judgers. The object is perceived or considered from a particular point of view. Everyone is a party to the dispute, and there is no ‘view from nowhere.’ Accordingly, the dispute cannot be decided. The Causal Invariance Interpretation, on the other hand, suggests that the focus on decidability is introduced by Sextus. Aenesidemus may (implicitly or explicitly) have endorsed the following idea: if X were F by nature, X would affect everyone as F. If X affects different people (living beings, sensory faculties, etc.) as F and F*, X is by nature neither F nor F*. For example, if X is harmful to A and beneficial to B, it is neither harmful nor beneficial in its nature (Woodruff 2010, Bett 2000). The Ten Modes can generally be construed as engaging either with conflicts between appearances or with causal invariance:
Arguments based on the differences among human beings (differences in body and in soul).
Arguments based on the differences between the senses and on the complexity of perceived objects.
Arguments based on states (dispositions and conditions of a human being, such as age, motion versus rest, emotions, etc.).
Arguments based on positions, distances, and places.
Arguments based on mixtures (objects in conjunction with external things like air and humidity; physical constituents of sense organs; physiology of thought).
Arguments based on the composition of the perceived object.
Arguments based on relativity (to the judging subject, to circumstances, etc.). 10–8 comprises at least 10–1 to 10–7, or all Ten Modes.
Arguments based on constancy or rarity of occurrence.
Arguments concerned with ways of life, customs, laws, mythical beliefs, and dogmatic assumptions, all of which can be put into opposition to each other.
(ii) Skepticism, Relativism, Epicureanism. Consider first the relationship between skepticism and relativism (cf. Bett 2000; Vogt 2012a, ch. 4). Relativism, as envisaged in Plato’s Theaetetus, looks at a similar range of phenomena. Things appear different to different kinds of animals; to different people; and so on. Relativism embraces the intuition that there is (as we would say today) faultless disagreement. That is, you and I disagree, but neither of us is wrong. Accordingly, metaphysical relativism claims we must give up the intuition that we both refer to the same thing. In the Theaetetus, the world dissolves into radical flux: there are no stable items with stable properties that we both refer to.
The Ten Modes, according to Conflicting Appearances, differ from relativism by turning precisely the other way (Annas-Barnes 1985, 97–8; Pellegrin 1997, 552–3). They implicitly rely on the intuition that there are stable items with stable properties. Of course, the skeptic is not committed to the thesis that opposites cannot hold of the same thing, and that therefore no two conflicting appearances can be true. However, the modes presuppose a common sense metaphysics that does not accommodate faultless disagreement. In all cases of disagreement, at best one of us can be right. If we cannot figure out which view is right, we should suspend. This does not mean that Pyrrhonians are committed to a common-sense metaphysics. The Ten Modes are only one of several tools that skeptics have at their disposal. They may thus imply a metaphysics that, at other points, skeptics would call into question (cf. Fine 2003b, 352).
Causal Invariance differs from Conflicting Appearances precisely with respect to the metaphysics that is, even if only dialectically, invoked. Aenesidemus seems to have explored the relationship between skepticism and flux. He remarks that skepticism leads to Heraclitean philosophy. The idea that one thing appears to have contrary properties (the ones it appears to different animals/persons/senses to have) leads to the idea that one thing actually has contrary properties (PH 1.210; cf. Schofield 2007 on the role of Heraclitus and causal invariance). This remark can be taken as an expression both of moderate flux and of relativism (Aenesidemus does not seem to think of radical flux, where it is no longer even possible to refer to anything). There is no stable reality of how things are (moderate flux); X is F and F* insofar as, if X seems F to A, this is true for A, and F* to B, this is true for B (relativism). This proposal differs from the Causal Invariance interpretation of the Modes presented above. There, Aenesidemus seems to argue that things do not really have stable properties (they are neither F nor F* by nature); he does not say that they are F and F* (as relativism says).
A third approach, competing with skepticism and relativism, is Epicurean epistemology. Again, the set of phenomena to be accounted for is the same. But it is described differently. Epicurus insists that we should not even speak of conflicting appearances. Rather, we should speak of different perceptions. Perceptions cannot refute each other, because they are of the same weight. Epicurus here uses the term that is central to Pyrrhonism: equal weight, isostheneia (DL 10.31–2). The fact that perceptions differ has perfectly reasonable explanations: I look from a distance, you look from nearby; I have a cold, you are healthy; I am a human being, another cognizer is a dog; and so on. These facts figure in the explanations of how our perceptions are constituted. Accordingly, Epicurus argues, all perceptions, even though they differ, are true. They all have a causal history that physics can explain. The precise interpretation of this proposal is controversial. One might object that the notion of truth employed here is deeply puzzling. It is not clear what it means to describe all perceptions as true if they cannot be true or false.
(iii) Scope. For the greatest part, the Ten Modes seem to be concerned with perception in a broad sense, so that it includes pleasure and pain, harm and benefit, as well as pursuit and avoidance. To perceive something as pleasant or beneficial is to pursue it. Perception and evaluation are also mixed in another way: depending on the frequency with which we perceive something, it seems more or less amazing and precious to us. 10–10 envisages oppositions that can be construed with the help of dogmatic theses. The Ten Modes thus fit Sextus’ description of what skepticism is: the ability to put appearances and thoughts (phainomena and nooumena) into opposition (PH 1.8, 1.31–33; cf. DL 9.78).
Another issue concerning the scope of the Ten Modes is whether they address general or particular matters. Compare the example of whether the tower is round or square (T) to the example of whether honey is sweet or bitter (H). (T) is a particular; the question is whether this tower is round or square. (H) can be construed as a particular (“is this bit of honey sweet?”), or as a general issue (“is honey sweet?”). The Ten Modes offer strategies for suspension of judgment on both kinds of questions.
Scholars have asked whether it is a problem for skepticism if the Ten Modes appear ‘systematic’ (Sedley 2015). A set of arguments that aims to be complete, covering domains according to a standardized pattern, may appear to be out of tune with the skeptic’s presumed mode of investigation. Purportedly, skeptics think through given questions as they arise, arriving at suspension of judgment in a piecemeal fashion. If this self-description is to be taken at face value, then modes of generating suspension of judgment across the board may appear problematic. In this respect, Diogenes Laertius’ report of the Ten Modes may be superior to Sextus’ account. Diogenes begins with a remark that suggests that skeptics pick up where other philosophers have already begun to make an argument (9.78–9). Other philosophers have collected, presumably, ways in which ‘we are persuaded’, say, because things regularly appear the same way. Now the skeptics, as it were in response to this, add a collection of further cases, where things do not appear the same way to different cognizers. If this is the dialectical set-up, the Ten Modes may not be ‘systematic’ in ways that harm skepticism. They may co-opt the patterns of dogmatic reports about cases where appearances are stable (Sedley 2015).
(iv) Language. Aenesidemus contributes an interesting move to the question of how the skeptic can speak. Consider the relationship between a skeptic’s state of mind and their utterances. One way to construe this relationship is that an utterance reflects a state of mind. This is a background assumption to the idea that, if skeptics use assertoric language, they hold beliefs. Another option is to assume that language does not have the means to capture the skeptic’s state of mind. On this premise, a skeptic might flag their utterances as falling short of doing so. This is Aenesidemus’ strategy. He says that the Pyrrhonian determines nothing, and not even this fact that he determines nothing. The Pyrrhonian puts matters in such terms, he says, because he has no way to express the actual thought of the sceptic in determining nothing (Photius, Bibl. 169b40–170a14, = 71C(6)-(8) LS).
Almost nothing is known about Agrippa (1st to 2nd century CE; SE PH 1.164–177; DL 9.88–89). However, the modes of argument that Sextus calls the Five Modes are attributed to him. These modes are among the most famous arguments of ancient skepticism (Barnes 1990, Hankinson 2010).
The mode that argues from disagreement. With respect to some matter that presents itself, there is undecided (anepikriton) conflict, both among the views of ordinary life and the views held by philosophers. Due to this, we are unable to choose or reject one thing, and must fall back on suspension.
5–2 Eis apeiron ekballonta:
Arguments that throw one into an infinite regress. That which is brought forward to make a given matter credible needs yet something else to make it credible, and so on ad infinitum. Since we thus have no starting point for our argument, suspension of judgment follows.
5–3 Pros ti:
Arguments from relativity. X only ever appears such-and-such in relation to the subject judging and to the things observed together with it. Suspension on how X really is follows.
Someone makes an assumption without providing argument. A dogmatist, if thrown back into an infinite regress of arguments, just assumes something as a starting-point, without providing an argument (anapodeiktôs). We suspend over mere hypotheses—they could be false, opposite hypotheses could be formulated, and so on.
5–5 Ton diallêlon:
Arguments that disclose a circularity. This mode is used when that which ought to confirm a given investigated matter requires confirmation (pistis—credibility) from that matter. We are unable to assume either in order to establish the other. We suspend judgment on both.
It is a commonplace to say that, while the Ten Modes, as presented in Sextus, are concerned with conflicting appearances, the Five Modes are about argument or proof. In these modes, the skeptics develop strategies by which to attack theories that the dogmatists defend. If this is how we characterize the Modes, Aristotle’s objection (section 2.3) immediately comes to mind. Do the Five Modes reveal the skeptic’s lack of understanding because they presuppose that everything is subject to proof? (Barnes 1990; Hankinson 1995, 182–92; Long 2006, ch.3) The three so-called formal modes—Regress, Hypothesis, and Circularity—can be construed in this fashion: when employing them, the skeptic can argue that every premise must be supported by argument; if it is not so supported, the theory begins from a mere hypothesis (on earlier uses of the term hupothesis in Plato and in medicine, cf. Cooper 2002 [2004a]); or it is ultimately circular.
However, the skeptic might not be vulnerable to this objection. First, the Five Modes can be construed as dialectical, invoking dogmatic theories of justification (Striker 2004). Second, they might be broader in scope. 5–1 and 5–3 explore disagreement and relativity. Skeptical examination often begins with the Mode of Disagreement: different answers to a given question are surveyed, and the conflict between them is observed. The interpretation of 5–1 hangs, for the most part, on the question of whether anepikriton should be translated as ‘undecided’ or ‘undecidable’ (Barnes 1990). It would be dogmatic to claim that matters are undecidable. The Pyrrhonist must prefer the idea that, up to now, matters have not been decided. In applying the Mode of Disagreement, skeptics can either record a conflicting argument that others have formulated or come up with an argument that disagrees with a view formulated by a dogmatist (cf. Sienkiewicz 2019, 47–51). This leads to the question of whether something can be found that would decide matters, and thus to the application of further modes. Scholars have observed that 5–3, the Mode of Relativity, does not really fit into the Five Modes. However, the Five Modes could be designed to supersede and include the Ten Modes, and 5–3 might be viewed as capturing the common thread of the Ten Modes. With the help of 5–3, the skeptic can argue that the premises that theorists employ are formulated from particular points of view, in particular contexts, and so on (for a reading that emphasizes the role of the first mode at the expense of the role of the third, cf. Sienkiewicz 2019).
Third, even the so-called formal modes (5-2, 5–4, 5–5) might not be narrowly concerned with proof, but rather with everything that can lend credibility to something else. Consider Regress (5–2), the first of the formal modes. The text does not actually speak of proof (apodeixis) (this is obscured by Bury’s Loeb translation; 5–4 is the only place in Sextus’ report of the Five Modes that uses a cognate of apodeixis). Sextus’ language is wider: the mode deals with everything that can make something else credible. We might read this in the context of the Hellenistic view that proof is a species of sign (PH 2.122). A sign reveals something non-evident. Smoke that reveals fire has, from this point of view, a function and structure that is similar to a proof. The target of the Five Modes might be sign-inferences in general. If this is so, then their target might include what we would call inductive reasoning and causal explanations (when Sextus introduces a further set of modes, the Causal Modes, he says that they are not really needed, because the relevant work can be done by the Five Modes; PH 1.180–86). Taken together, the Five Modes deny all “proof, criterion, sign, cause, movement, learning, coming into being, and that there is anything by nature good or bad.” (DL 9.90). This is notably more than just proof. Indeed, it is an excellent summary of the key topics in Sextus’ discussions of logic, physics, and ethics.
Sextus’ (ca. 160–210 CE) epithet, Empiricus, indicates that he belonged to the empiricists, a medical school (cf. Svavarson 2014 for a brief conspectus of Sextus’ philosophy). The empiricist medical school argued against rationalistic tendencies in medicine (Frede 1990; Allen 2010). Rationalism in medicine aims to give causal explanations as a basis for therapies. Empiricism, on the contrary, confines itself to observation and memory. Somewhat confusingly (considering his name), Sextus discusses differences between Pyrrhonism and empiricism, and says that skepticism is closer to medical methodism than to empiricism (Allen 2010). On the whole, it may be safest to think of Sextus as rejecting medical rationalism as well as other trends within medicine that by Sextus’ lights are dogmatic. Methodism follows appearances, and derives from them what seems beneficial. No explanations are attempted, no underlying substances postulated, and no regularities assumed—these are some of the rationalistic methods that both methodism and empiricism argue against. Methodism also makes no statements to the effect that such explanations cannot be given, or that underlying substances and regularities do not exist, as Sextus says empiricism does (SE PH 1.236–241). Beyond the fact that Sextus was a doctor and wrote on medicine (M 7.202, M 1.61), his philosophical thinking seems shaped by engagement with medical writers. Scholars have long been interested in the relationship between medicine and skeptical arguments that pertain to be therapeutic (Voelke 1990). More recently, scholars explore ways in which medical writings, in particular by Galen, inform Sextus’ thinking, even on specific issues such as how to conceive of and solve sophisms (Schmitt, forthcoming). It has also been argued that the skeptics’ application of the modes should be interpreted in light of the methodological commitments of non-rationalist medicine (Sienkiewicz 2019, 2021).
Sextus’ philosophical writings are traditionally divided into two groups. The Outlines of Pyrrhonism [PH] consists of three books. PH 1 is the only general account of Pyrrhonism that survives. PH 2 and 3 discuss questions of logic, physics, and ethics. The other writings are summarily referred to, traditionally, as Against the Mathematicians [M]. In fact, they oppose not just mathematical, but also other theorists: the title really means Against the Theoreticians, or Against the Learned (Bett 2012). In a sense, only M 1–6 should go by that title. It is a complete work, and M 7 does not seem to be its continuation (Bett 2012, “Introduction”). M 1–6 discuss grammar, rhetoric, geometry, arithmetic, astrology, and music theory. They argue against theoretical ‘learning’ in these fields. M 7–11 discuss core questions of the three philosophical disciplines, logic, physics, and ethics, and could plausibly be referred to as Against the Logicians (M 7–8), Against the Physicists (M 9–10), and Against the Ethicists (M 11). Scholars disagree on whether M is earlier (Bett 1997) or later than PH (Janacek 1948 and 1972). Scholars also disagree on whether we can evaluate different strands of skepticism within Sextus as more or less sophisticated. Those who consider PH as later often do so because they think it shows greater philosophical sophistication, either by avoiding claims that a certain matter cannot be known (sometimes described as negative dogmatism), as found in M 1–6 and M 11, or by streamlining discussions from M 7–10 (Bett 1997; Brunschwig 1980).
These questions are complicated further by Sextus’ attempt to incorporate diverse material, such as different sets of Modes, into his skepticism. According to recent interpretations, the different sets of modes are part of an integrated philosophical approach (Powers 2010). Morison (2018) argues that the Ten Modes and Five Modes both serve the same purpose: to produce equal and opposing arguments to arguments in support of philosophical or scientific views. Arguably, two kinds of consistency are at work in Sextus’ writings. On the one hand, Sextus aims at the consistency of one philosophical outlook. On the other hand, he aims at the consistency of having a response to every objection. These two aims overlap greatly, but they can also come apart. A given argument might refute a particular critic. This argument may go back to various earlier versions of Pyrrhonism. Similarly, the critical objection that is refuted may be traced to dogmatic theories formulated over the course of several centuries. As a result, a given argument in Sextus may be effective against a given objection he has in mind. It may thus preserve consistency in the sense of leaving the skeptic unharmed by dogmatic criticism. But at the same time, this argument may have implications that are in tension with the way in which Sextus explains skepticism in other passages. Such tensions are particularly important with respect to the way in which Sextus uses core concepts. For example, it is not clear that Sextus uses the notion of appearances (phainomena) in a consistent fashion (PH 1.8–9; 1.15; 1.22; for the view that Sextus employs the notion consistently throughout, see Barney 1992). At times, he draws on the contrast between appearances and thoughts (noumena). But for the most part, the term refers to all cases where something seems so-and-so to the skeptic, either perceptually or in thought. In some contexts, Sextus draws on the idea that appearances are impressions, invoking the dogmatic assumption that impressions are passive. In other contexts, he does not envisage appearances as entirely passively experienced (Vogt 2012b).
It is thus no surprise that the interpretation of Sextus’ Pyrrhonism is quite controversial. This applies in particular to the question of whether the skeptic has any beliefs, or beliefs of any kind. In the past 40 years, scholars have paid attention to this question more than to any other interpretive issue. Insofar as the texts may contain different strands of Pyrrhonian argument, exegesis is to some extent shaped by the philosophical interests we bring to the texts. Two ideas are particularly prominent here. First, some scholars find in Sextus an account of action that challenges standard ancient and modern theories of agency. These theories might portray ordinary agents as all-too-rational, as if every action involved an actively formed belief that such-and-such is good. Scholars explore how far we can draw on Sextus, asking whether a life guided by appearances (as Sextus says the skeptic’s life is) might after all be rather ordinary (Frede 1979 ). Second, one might on the other hand embrace those aspects of Sextus’ texts that make Pyrrhonism look radically different from ordinary life. From this perspective, Sextus’ writings invite reflection on the question of whether it would be possible to live without belief (Burnyeat 1980 ; Barnes 1982 ; Burnyeat 1984 ).
PH 1, which figures most prominently in scholarly discussions, is a tour de force. Sextus gives a general account of what skepticism is, including skeptical investigation, suspension of judgment, the skeptic’s end, action, and language; he gives lists and illustrations of various sets of Modes; he explains the so-called skeptical formulae (phônai), such as “I determine nothing,” “non-assertion,” “maybe,” and so on; and he compares skepticism to relevantly similar philosophies.
Sextus emphasizes that the skeptic is an investigator. Others either arrive at theories (dogmatism) or at claims about inapprehensibility (negative dogmatism—that the matter investigated is beyond one’s capacity to decide, and so is unknowable). But the skeptic continues to investigate (PH 1.1–4). Investigation is described as setting appearances and thoughts into opposition (PH 1.8) (Morison 2011 offers a reconstruction of skepticism that takes its starting–point from this description), and as the application of the various sets of Modes (PH 1.36–186). Skepticism does not have teachings, but it is an approach in philosophy (Smith 2022). Many of the thoughts the skeptics arrive at are expressed in the skeptical formulae (PH 1.13–15; 187–209). The starting–point (archê) of skepticism is divergency—anômalia. The proto-skeptics are disturbed by the discrepancies they encounter, and begin to investigate (PH 1.12). They hope to gain quietude by settling what is true and what is false. But then they have a surprising experience. Encountering disagreement where several views appear to be of equal weight (isostheneia), they find themselves unable to decide things, give up, and experience tranquility (ataraxia) (Striker 1990 ; Nussbaum 1994). The skeptic’s end (telos) is tranquility in matters of belief (kata doxan) and moderate affection (metriopatheia) in matters that are forced upon us (PH 1.25–29). That is, skeptics can free themselves from those kinds of turmoil that come with holding beliefs. They cannot free themselves from freezing, thirst, or pain. But they suffer less than others, for they do not add the belief (prosdoxazein) that, for example, pain is bad. The skeptic must explain how, without belief (adoxastôs), they can be active. Sextus says that skeptics follow appearances, and that is, that they adhere to the fourfold ways of life (PH 1.21–24). Nature supplies them with perception and thought; necessary affections compel them (for example, thirst guides them to drink); they go along with traditions and customs; and they can do technical things by having been instructed in skills. The notion of appearances is also central to Sextus’ account of how the skeptic can speak. Without making assertions, a skeptic reports (apangellein) like a chronicler (historikôs) what appears to them now (PH 1.4).
I shall discuss the following aspects of Sextus’ skepticism: (i) investigation and tranquility, (ii) concepts and inference rules, (iii) belief, (iv) the formulae, (v) appearances, (vi) language, (vii) action, and (viii) the so-called special arguments (that is, arguments that do not explain the nature of Pyrrhonism, but engage with specific dogmatic theories in logic, physics, and ethics).
(i) Investigation and tranquility. Investigation must aim at discovery of the truth, otherwise it is not genuine investigation. However, a skeptic seems to mechanically apply the skeptical Modes, in order to generate suspension of judgment and tranquility. Scholars disagree on whether the skeptics genuinely aim at the truth (Palmer 2000; Striker 2001; Perin 2006; Veres 2020b), while they (also) aim at tranquility. Note that this objection, unlike the other problems central to contemporary engagement with ancient skepticism, was not raised in antiquity. If ancient skepticism is approached in the context of the larger study of ancient philosophy, we might first of all note that the skeptics in a sense agree with Socrates, Plato, Aristotle, Epicurus, and the Stoics. All these philosophers defend, in so many formulations, a life of reason, of contemplation, of wisdom, or of inquiry as the best or at least a very good human life (on affinities between the skeptics’ commitment to inquiry and Aristotle, cf. Olfert 2015). The objection that skeptical inquiry seems insincere, then, may not have come up in antiquity in quite the way in which it is discussed today because a commitment to inquiry would be common ground among most philosophers. Further, we might observe that aiming at the truth includes two aims: to accept truths, and to avoid falsehoods. The Modes are tailored to keep us from assenting to something that could be false. Insofar as the skeptic’s effort to avoid falsehoods expresses a valuation for the truth, the skeptic might be a genuine investigator (Vogt 2012a, ch. 5; Olfert 2014).
A related objection calls into question the actual practice of skeptical inquiry. Does Sextus rely on the assumption that, in any given case of putting several arguments into opposition, these arguments are equally persuasive for the skeptic? This seems unrealistic: at least in some cases, skeptical inquirers are bound to be more strongly attracted to one view than to another. How then do they arrive at suspension of judgment? One skeptical strategy is to remind oneself that additional arguments will be formulated in the future (PH 1.33–34, 89, 96–97; 2.38–41; 3.233–34). Another strategy is to consider that different arguments are persuasive to different people (Svararsson 2014). Relatedly, skeptics may find themselves in a position comparable to a student who takes a seminar on freedom and determinism: it is possible to be more attracted to one view rather than another, and at the same time be aware that as far as the arguments are concerned, there is unresolved disagreement among several views, to the effect that neither of the views seems compelling in ways that warrant assent (cf. Vogt 2012a, ch. 5, on how the skeptical expression “as far as the argument is concerned” bears on this question; for general discussion of this expression, cf. Brunschwig 1990).
(ii) Concepts and rules of inference. If skeptics do not assent, then how can they understand the terms philosophers use (M 8.337–332a)? Even more radically, how can they even think (PH 2.1–12)? This objection, which Sextus says is continually raised against the skeptics, proceeds on the assumption that possession of concepts involves the acceptance of assumptions. For example, in order to examine a given theory of proof, the skeptic must have a notion of what proofs are. This involves assumptions: for example, the assumption that a proof contains premises and a conclusion. Sextus’ response to this objection invokes the Epicurean and Stoic theories of preconceptions. Human beings are not born with reason (Frede 1994, 1996). The acquisition of reason is a nature-guided process of concept acquisition. At a given age, children have completed this process. They have become rational, which means that they can perceive and think in a conceptual way. Only now, they have rational impressions to which they can assent. The acquisition of preconceptions did not involve assent, simply because the child was not yet rational (Brittain 2005).
Sextus invokes dogmatic ideas about the acquisition of reason (or: the abilities of conceptual thought) in his response to the Apraxia Charge (PH 1.23–4). Skeptics are, first of all, active because nature has equipped them with perception and thought (Vogt 1998, 2010). More generally, the skeptics’ ability to think and investigate depends on the fact that they have acquired concepts as part of growing up. This process did not involve assent, and accordingly, Sextus argues that the skeptic’s ability to think does not violate suspension of judgment (cf. Brunschwig 1988; Vogt 2012a ch. 6; Grgic 2008; Fine 2011). It is conceivable, though, that the skeptic’s ability to understand involves some knowledge, namely a kind of knowledge that does not entail any belief (Corti 2009, part III; Corti 2015). This option appears counterintuitive given today’s premises in epistemology, according to which someone who knows that p also believes that p. The relevant notion of belief in skeptical discussions, doxa, as well as the relevant ancient notions of knowledge, however, may behave quite differently (cf. Vogt 2012a and Moss and Schwab 2019 on belief; Burnyeat 1980c, Frede 2008 and Schwab 2016 on knowledge). Insofar as doxa is an inherently deficient activity and attitude, and insofar as knowledge is conceived in elevated ways, knowledge without belief is a rather intuitive option within ancient epistemology. If understanding concepts and arguments involves knowledge that does not entail beliefs, the skeptics may be taken to have such knowledge. Modern critics raise the further question of whether the skeptic must endorse logical laws (such as the Principle of Non-Contradiction) and rules of inference. In particular, they ask whether a skeptic is committed to the logical validity of the conditionals they formulate when arguing against the dogmatists (Sorensen 2004). Sextus records no ancient version of this complaint, and accordingly no direct response. Relatedly, one may ask whether Sextus’ method, in particular regarding the Five Modes, is systematic in a way that is in tension with suspension of judgment (cf. Sienkiewicz 2021, who defends Sextus against this charge).
(iii) Belief. Bury, in his Loeb translation, translates adoxastôs as “undogmatically,” for example, when Sextus speaks (PH 1.15) of skeptics as saying that “nothing is true.” This translation suggests that Sextus bans dogmatism from the skeptic’s life, where this still leaves room for other, non-dogmatic beliefs. But adoxastôs means non-doxastically or ‘without belief’ (cf. Burnyeat 1980 ). As noted above, the skeptic’s end is tranquility in matters relating to belief—kata doxan. A skeptic lives adoxastôs. And even more confusingly, the skeptics assent adoxastôs, when they act.
Contemporary interest in Pyrrhonian skepticism was much spurred by Michael Frede’s paper “The Sceptic’s Beliefs” (1979 ). Frede argues that ancient skepticism was traditionally dismissed too easily as vulnerable to the Apraxia Charge, the charge that, without belief, the skeptic cannot act. The skeptics seem to be confident that they have replies to this objection. Thus, it seems uncharitable not to look closely at these replies. Further, insofar as these replies respond to the charge that without belief one cannot act, we should focus on what the skeptics say about the role of belief in their lives. Frede cites PH 1.13, and claims that in this passage we find a distinction between two kinds of belief:
When we say that the skeptic does not dogmatize, we are not using ‘dogma’ in the more general sense in which some say it is dogma to accept anything (for the skeptic does assent to the experiences forced upon him in virtue of this-or-that impression: for example, he would not say, when warmed or cooled, ‘I seem not to be warmed or cooled’). Rather, when we say he does not dogmatize, we mean ‘dogma’ in the sense in which some say that dogma is assent to any of the non-evident matters investigated by the sciences. For the Pyrrhonist assents to nothing that is non-evident. (PH 1.13; trans. Burnyeat (1984)  with changes)
Following Frede, several scholars focus on PH 1.13 when discussing skeptical belief (with the notable exceptions of Barnes 1980  and Barney 1992). They take it to be obvious that, in this paragraph, Sextus distinguishes between two kinds of belief, one which he bans from the skeptic’s life, and one which he allows into the skeptic’s life. Barnes (1982 ) employs a distinction between rustic and urbane skepticism. The rustic skeptic suspends on all matters. The urbane skeptic suspends on scientific matters, but holds ordinary beliefs. The clause “non-evident matters investigated in the sciences” in PH 1.13 might be taken as a point of reference for the urbane interpretation. However, Barnes points out that this cannot be right. Everything can be considered as a non-evident matter, even such things as whether honey is sweet.
Against Barnes, Frede argues that the relevant distinction must be drawn between two kinds of assent, such that “having a view involves one kind of assent, whereas taking a position, or making a claim, involves another kind of assent, namely the kind of assent the sceptic will withhold” (1984 , 128). Sextus characterizes skeptical assent in three ways. He speaks of forced assent (PH 1.23–24), involuntary assent (PH 1.19), and adoxastôs assent (PH 2.102). Frede does not explore the details of how Sextus uses these notions. The core of his proposal is that Sextus allows for a kind of assent that does not involve a claim as to how things are in actual fact.
In (1979 ), Frede is predominantly concerned with the skeptic’s reply to the Apraxia Charge. In (1984 ) his focus is on skeptical pronouncements such as “nothing can be known.” His distinction between two kinds of assent, and accordingly two kinds of belief, is explored with respect to such sentences. Frede writes that “[t]o be left with the impression or thought that p […] does not involve the further thought that it is true that p” (133). This is the sense in which, on his interpretation, the skeptic might think “nothing is known.” The thought counts as a belief, but not as a claim that, in actual fact, nothing is known by anybody. Contrary to Frede’s interpretation, one might argue that to believe simply is to hold true, at least according to the notions of belief that the skeptics invoke in discussions with their contemporary critics (Vogt 2012b). It is thus not clear that Frede’s distinction is genuinely one between two kinds of beliefs (Burnyeat 1980 ). Perhaps it is a distinction between two different propositional attitudes, only one of which is belief. As Striker (2001) points out, there is a danger that debates over this issue become merely terminological. We might thus draw a distinction between two issues. It is one thing to disagree with Frede on what should or should not be called belief, and another to dispute whether he identifies and characterizes a phenomenon in the skeptic’s mental life. As Frede argues, skeptics find themselves with a rather persistent thought, without having accepted it as true in actual fact. This appears to capture a core element of skepticism: the way in which the skeptic thinks such thoughts as “everything is inapprehensible.”
(iv) The Skeptical Formulae. PH 1.13, the passage in which scholars find a distinction between two kinds of belief, occurs in a chapter entitled “Does the Skeptic dogmatize?” One angle from which we might disagree with Frede is to insist that PH 1.13 addresses the status of the core thoughts of skeptical philosophy, rather than the question of skeptical belief. Consider the rest of the chapter:
Not even in uttering the skeptical formulae about unclear matters—for example, “In no way more,” or “I determine nothing,” or one of the other formulae which we shall later discuss—do they dogmatize (dogmatizein). For if you dogmatize, then you posit as real the things that you are said to dogmatize about; but skeptics posit these formulae not as necessarily being real. For they suppose that, just as the formula “Everything is false” says that it too, along with everything else, is false (and similarly for “Nothing is true”), so also “In no way more” says that it too, along with everything else, is no more so than not so, and hence cancels itself along with everything else. And we say the same of the other skeptical formulae. Thus, if people who dogmatize posit as real the things they dogmatize about, while skeptics utter their own phrases in such a way that they are implicitly cancelled by themselves, then they cannot be said to dogmatize in uttering them. But the main point is this: in uttering these formulae they say what appears to themselves and report their own feelings without any belief (adoxastôs), affirming nothing about external objects. (PH 1.14–15; trans. Annas-Barnes with changes)
When explaining in PH 1.13 how the skeptic does not dogmatize, Sextus may have a particular issue in mind: that some skeptical formulae look like doctrines, and have traditionally been turned against themselves due to their dogmatic surface-structure. For example, “all things are indeterminate” looks like a straightforward dogmatic statement. There is a long history of skeptical attempts to explain the nature of such pronouncements so that they no longer undermine themselves. Sextus arguably mentions several solutions to this problem (PH 1.13–15 and 1.187–209; cf. Pellegrin 2010). In PH 1.15, Sextus identifies the following as his main point: the skeptic merely reports what appears to them. Along these lines, Sextus calls indeterminacy an affection of thought (pathos dianoias; PH 1.198), a state that the utterance “all things are indeterminate” aims to capture. The other solution mentioned in PH 1.14–15 is somewhat more problematic: the skeptical formulae cancel themselves out. That is, one can say them and convey something through them. But then, once one has made a point, they as it were turn back upon themselves and eat themselves up—as fire first burns combustible materials and then destroys itself. This idea became famous through another comparison Sextus uses (invoked by Wittgenstein 1922, 6.54): the skeptical pronouncements are like a ladder that one climbs up; once one is on top, one can throw the ladder away (M 8.481). Scholars disagree on whether Sextus in some sense admits that these statements are self-refuting (McPherran 1987), or whether he defuses their self-refutational structure (Castagnoli 2010, III.14).
(v) Appearances (phainomena). While it is difficult to establish a clear distinction between two kinds of belief in Sextus, there is a comparatively more explicit distinction between two ways of engaging with appearances. Sextus says that, while things appear X to the skeptic, the skeptic does not affirm that they are X. Questions that are traditionally discussed in terms of whether the skeptic has beliefs thus might be addressed in terms of whether the way things appear to the skeptic has a judgment-component. Arguably, “A appears X to me now” can be construed in different ways. Certain examples (say, the way in which it makes sense to say both that the moon appears small and that it appears large) may suggest that appearance can but need not involve something like a judgment (Barney 1992). Some formulations in Sextus seem to insist on a significant difference between the mental activity of something appearing to a cognizer on the one hand, and on the other hand the mental activity that, on the level of language, is represented by assertion. This suggests that, for Sextus, A appearing F to me now does not entail that I hold it to be true that A is F (Vogt 2012b).
(vi) Language. Another approach to the question of whether the skeptic has beliefs looks at skeptical language. Sextus insists that the skeptic does not accept or reject any impression, and associates the absence of these mental acts with the fact that the skeptic does not affirm or deny anything (e.g., PH 1.4, 7, 10). Arguably, we can infer from Sextus’ account of the skeptic’s utterances what Sextus wants to say about the skeptic’s mental states and acts. That is, the question of language immediately bears on the question of belief. The report on Pyrrhonian skepticism in Diogenes Laertius is particularly instructive in this respect. Contrary to scholarly focus on belief in reconstructing skepticism, it barely mentions belief. Discussion of the skeptics’ attitudes is almost entirely conducted in terms of skeptical language and the skeptical formulae (for detailed discussion of the relevant paragraphs, DL 9.74–7, cf. Corti 2015). If Sextus is read in light of the report in DL IX, PH 1.13 may appear to be more of an isolated passage than scholarly debates imply. Sextus too devotes much space to accounts of skeptical expressions and language. It may thus be asked whether scholars should reframe discussions, and pay more attention to skeptical language then they previously have. As of now, there is one monograph on skeptical language, Corti (2009), and one approach to belief that focuses on language, Vogt (1998). Both scholars pursue further ideas put forward by Barnes (1982 ), who compares the skeptic’s utterances to avowals. The skeptic lays open their state of mind, they announce or record (apangellein) it (Fine 2003a). In order to do this, the skeptic must misuse language (Burnyeat 1984 ). Some strategies to avoid assertion are given in the context of the skeptical formulae (“non-assertion,” “I determine nothing,” and so on). (i) Skeptical expressions can be used as signs, which reveal a state of mind (PH 1.187). (ii) Expressions like “ou mallon” (no more) and “ouden mallon” (nowise more) can be used indifferently (in the sense of interchangeably) (PH 1.188). (iii) As is the practice in ordinary language, the skeptic can use expressions elliptically; for example “no more” for “no more this-than-that” (PH 1.188). (iv) People often use questions instead of assertions and the other way around. Similarly, “no more” can be construed as a question: “Why more this-than-that?” (v) The skeptic misuses language and uses it in a loose way (PH 1.191).
In M 1 and M 2, Sextus says that the skeptic goes along with ordinary ways of using language (M 1.172, 193, 206, 218, 229, 233; M 2.52–3, 58–9). This seems to be a key resource in construing skeptical ways of speaking: the skeptic exploits the ways in which ordinary speakers can diverge from grammatically correct speech, and still be understood. Apart from using their skeptical formulae, and apart from conducting philosophical investigations, which they can do in a dialectical mode, referring to theses, arguments, and inferences, the skeptic also has to talk in everyday contexts. It is here where we see best how skeptical utterances are tailored to reveal a state of mind in which nothing is accepted or rejected. Sextus takes great pains to construe his examples of skeptical utterances according to the following schema: “X appears F to me now.” This will generally be understood as an elliptical version of “X appears to be F to me now.” However, Sextus consistently avoids “to be” (Vogt 1998; for the view that “X appears F” avoids reference to external objects, see Everson 1991). The peculiar form of skeptical utterances suggests that Sextus sees a relevant difference between “X appears to be F to me now” and “X appears F to me now.” The former might imply reference to a state of affairs, and an epistemic usage of “to appear” that could be rendered as “It appears to me, that p,” or, “I take it that p.” This, however, would be assertoric: the skeptic would state that it appears to them that such-and-such is the case. But the skeptic’s elliptical utterances about what appears to them aim to be purely phenomenological. They aim to report a condition of the skeptic’s mind, without expressing a judgment of any kind (Burnyeat 1984 ; Annas-Barnes 1985, 23–4; for an assessment of these strategies in terms of modern philosophy of language, cf. Pagin 2020). As part of the skeptics’ way of life, language can also be seen as an activity. That is, how the skeptics can speak can be considered a sub–question of how the skeptics can act. Skeptical utterances have been compared to Wittgensteinian confessions, arguably a kind of speech act that is consistent with the skeptics’ avoidance of belief (Corti 2009, Parts I and II). Moreover, the skeptics not only speak. They presumably also understand what others say. A persuasive account of skeptical language must explain both speaking and understanding (Corti 2009, Part III).
(vii) Action. Sextus says that appearances (phainomena) are the practical criterion of the skeptic (PH 1.23–24). By adhering to appearances, the skeptic is prevented from inactivity (anenergêsia). Note that Sextus does not describe the skeptic as performing actions in the sense of dogmatic theory of action, which involves belief and choice (cf. M 11.162–166). Contrary to the Academic skeptic, a Sextan skeptic does not view themselves as a rational agent, who chooses one course of action over another. Sextus claims an active life for the skeptic, but not the life of a rational agent, as conceived by dogmatic philosophers (Vogt 2010; Schwab 2020). This attitude has been critically discussed for a long time, for example, with respect to its ethical (Bett 2019) and political upshots (Marchand 2015) and with respect to the skeptics’ relation to the law (Marchand 2021).
The skeptic’s forced assent is situated in the domain of action (PH 1.13, 19, 29–30, 193, 237–8). Thirst, for example, necessitates assent, and that means, it moves the skeptic to drink. This kind of assent may be genuinely unrelated to belief-formation of any kind. Rather, forced assent generates the movement of action. But what about more complex kinds of activities, such as applying a medication, or attending a festival? Sextus argues that the skeptic adheres to custom, convention, and tradition, and to what they have been trained to do. In explaining how adherence to appearances in these domains generates activity, Sextus does not mention assent. However, he might have to concede that, like drinking when thirsty, more complex actions also involve some kind of assent. In PH 2.102, Sextus says that the sceptic assents non-doxastically (adoxastôs) to the things relied on in ordinary life. In PH 1.19, he mentions involuntary assent. Accordingly, non-doxastic and involuntary assent may figure in those domains of skeptical action that do not involve necessitation by bodily affections. Non-doxastic assent is, from the point of view of the Stoics, a contradiction in terms, just like forced and involuntary assent. Assent is defined as in our power, and as that by which beliefs are formed. If Sextus intends skeptical assent to be genuinely non-doxastic and involuntary, then it does not have the core features of assent as defined by the dogmatists.
(viii) Logic, Physics, Ethics, and the “disciplines.” The special arguments of the skeptic are directed against particular theories in the three disciplines of Hellenistic philosophy: logic, physics, and ethics. In addition, they address the so-called disciplines, namely grammar, rhetoric, geometry, arithmetic, astrology, and music-theory. Sextus’ treatments of logic divide up into two main topics: sign and criterion (cf. Bett 2005 on signs). This structure reflects central concerns of Hellenistic epistemology as well as of ancient skepticism. Skepticism looks for a ‘decider’ between conflicting appearances and thoughts. A decider could be something evident. Dogmatic philosophers associate the evident with the criterion of truth. For something to serve the role of criterion, it cannot be equally disputed as the matters it helps to decide. Or something non-evident could take on the role of decider. For that to be the case, the skeptics argue, it would have to be conclusively revealed by a sign or proof. If there is no compelling theory of the criterion and no compelling account of sign and proof, then there is nothing that can decide between several conflicting views. Sextus’ treatises on logic thus are not simply a collection of individual arguments against various dogmatic theories. Their main line of thought sketches a route into skepticism. Along these lines, Vlasits (2020b) argues that Sextus’ treatment of logic in PH 2 is unified. Sextus’ argument is structured such as to lead to suspension of judgment on the methodologies of the dogmatists. The final section of M 8 (463–81) formulates a challenge for the skeptic that scholars interested in self-refutational arguments have examined (Castagnoli 2010): does the skeptic aim to prove that proof does not exist (Sienkiewicz 2022)?
Sextus’ discussions of ethics also focus on issues that plausibly lead into skepticism. Again, there are two central questions: whether there is anything good and bad by nature; and whether there is an art of life (Bett 2010, 2011 and 2019), as the Epicureans and Stoics claim there is. If we could settle what is good and what is bad, some of the most disturbing anomalies would be resolved. If there were an art of life, there would be a teachable body of knowledge about the good and the bad. In both cases, questions that can cause a great deal of puzzlement would be resolved. Sextus’ discussions of ethics are in part famous because Sextus ascribes outlandish and shocking views to the Stoics. As Sextus construes his arguments, the contrast between ‘ordinary life’ and philosophical views leads to suspension of judgment (Vogt 2008a, ch. 1). In the modern tradition, a number of philosophers including Hegel and Nietzsche have engaged with aspects of Sextus’ outlook and in particular with the skeptical adherence to ordinary life (Berry 2010 and 2020; Bett 2020a). Recently, scholars have asked how ethical a skeptic can be, to use a phrased employed by Bett (2019), given that it may seem that suspension of judgment on grave ethical challenges can seem facile. At the same time, scholars point out that some dimensions of ethical frameworks went unquestioned a long time, for example, with respect to gender; here suspension of judgment may appear innovative (Olfert forthcoming).
The books on physics discuss god, cause, matter, bodies, mixture, motion, increase and decrease, subtraction and addition, whole and part, change, becoming and perishing, rest, place, time, and number. Notably, god is one of the topics explored in physics. This stands in stark contrast to medieval and early modern discussions, where the quest for knowledge of God often frames and motivates engagement with skepticism. In PH 3, Sextus prefaces his discussion of arguments for and against the existence of gods by saying that the skeptics’ ordinary life without opinions (adoxastôs) includes the following: the skeptics say that there are gods, are pious toward the gods, and say that the gods are provident. Scholars discuss how this relates to Sextus’ discussions of theology qua topic in physics on the one hand (PH 3.2–12, M 9.11–194), and to his portrayal of the skeptics’ ordinary life in PH 1 on the other hand (Annas 2011, Veres 2020a). The skeptics come to suspend judgment on all central questions in ancient physics (Bett 2012). This means, they come to suspend judgment on whether, for example, there are causes, time, place, and bodies (cf. Bobzien 2015 and Warren 2015). Their suspension does not merely mean that they have not yet found a satisfying theory of, say, body. It means that they find themselves unable to say whether there is body (Burnyeat 1997). (On the cumulative force of these arguments, see section 5.4.)
The six books entitled Against those in the Disciplines (M 1–6) have traditionally received less attention. Only in the last few years have scholars begun to explore them with the kind of philosophical subtlety that has been brought to bear in the study of ancient skepticism in recent decades. M 1–6 skeptically examine six fields of study, namely grammar, rhetoric, geometry, arithmetic, astronomy, and music-theory. Sextus begins with an astonishing move. Contrary to his usual strategy of emphasizing the distance between skeptics and dogmatists, he admits that Pyrrhonians and Epicureans share much in viewing standard disciplines as useless (M 1.1–7; cf. Thorsrud 2019). Generally speaking, increased attention to M 1–6 may provide additional occasion to modify the long-standing assumption that the Stoics are Sextus’ most important dogmatic interlocutors. Throughout M 1–6, resonances between Epicurean and Pyrrhonian philosophy are remarkably visible (Bett 2018, “Introduction”). Engagement with Epicurean philosophy shapes Sextus’ approach deeply, to the extent that both schools, Stoics and Epicureans, should be considered fundamental points of reference.
After his remarks on how Pyrrhonians and Epicureans take issue with the presumed usefulness of the disciplines, Sextus lays out general arguments, suitable for skeptical examination of any field. He argues that, for there to be a discipline, there must be the matter being taught, the teacher, the learner, and the means of learning. If, however, neither of these things exists, then the discipline doesn’t exist. This is how Sextus proceeds. He argues, or seems to argue, for the non-existence of the disciplines (M 1.9). Already in the very first sentence of M 1, Sextus describes his own approach as one of putting forward counterarguments, a strategy that he mentions repeatedly throughout M 1–6.
These moves give rise to the most contentious question regarding M 1–6. Are these books negatively dogmatic? Or do they fit in with Sextus’s outlook in PH 1–3, where skeptical arguments are described as leading up to suspension of judgment? Bett (2018, “Introduction”) argues that, with some qualifications, Sextus’ approach is to be explained as follows. Sextus lays out counterarguments based on the assumption that the arguments of the dogmatists have already been formulated. For there to be arguments of equal weight on both sides, only the anti-dogmatic arguments need to be adduced. The intended effect is that jointly, these opposing sets of arguments lead us to suspend judgment. In addition, Bett notes that the remarkable emphasis on counterarguments, non-existence, and uselessness suggests that some of the material in M 1–6 goes back to an earlier phase of Pyrrhonism.
In four of the six fields, namely grammar, rhetoric, music, and astrology, Sextus admits non-technical versions into the skeptic’s life, while subjecting all theoretical claims to skeptical examination. For example, he distinguishes between the ordinary ability to read and write on the one hand and grammar as a technical discipline on the other, or the ability to play a musical instrument on the one hand and music theory on the other (cf. Corti 2015b on why this kind of contrast does not come up in the books on arithmetic and geometry, Corti 2015c on Sextus’ attack on the Platonic-Pythagorean notion of the Two, and Corti forthcoming).
It is remarkable that, qua theoretical field, Sextus examines astrology rather than astronomy. The latter would make for a more typical sequence: apart from the fact that in Sextus, logic is considered part of philosophy rather than a “discipline,” the six fields otherwise correspond to the so-called trivium of grammar, logic, and rhetoric and quadrivium of arithmetic, geometry, astronomy, and music theory. Sextus’ attention to astrology rather than astronomy highlights a deep feature of his philosophy (Corti 2015, Bett 2018). Astronomy, from Sextus’ point of view, is concerned with appearances; and hence there is a sense in which the skeptic does not object to it. Astronomy, then, is the “version” of astrology that skeptics can admit into their adherence to ordinary life (M 5.1–3). Presumably, astronomy is concerned with predicting things like droughts, floods, earthquakes, and plagues based on appearances. Astrology, on the other hand, is concerned with matters of great obscurity.
Historians of philosophy sometimes argue that Henri Etienne’s rediscovery of Sextus in 1562 initiated an era of epistemology. Early modern engagement with skepticism is here seen as a turn to arguments found in Sextus (Annas-Barnes 1985, 5–7; Bailey 2002, 1–20). Via Cicero, early modern and modern philosophers seem to have engaged also with Academic arguments (for a recent analysis of Academic skepticism in Hume and Kant, cf. González Quintero 2022). In particular the beginning of Descartes’ Meditations may display a kind of Socratic spirit: a commitment to calling into question all one’s beliefs. However, early modern philosophers work within a theologically framed tradition that importantly begins with St. Augustine (354–430) (cf. Menn 1998 and Lagerlund 2009; on the history of medieval skepticism cf. Lagerlund ed. 2009; cf. Carriero 2009 on Descartes’ engagement with Aquinas; for an analysis of the transformation of skepticism that turns immediately to Descartes, cf. Williams 2010).
A major part of Augustine’s early education consisted in the study of Cicero’s writings. He was thus closely acquainted with Academic skepticism (Cicero was one kind of Academic skeptic). Augustine sees the force of ancient skeptical strategies. Even though he does not become a skeptic, he integrates distinctively skeptical moves into his thought. This has a long-standing effect on the history of theology and science. For example, Galileo Galilei is able to cite Augustine when he defends himself against the charge that his physics is in opposition to the Bible (Letter to the Grand Duchess, in Drake 1957). Augustine supplies arguments to the effect that we should keep an open mind. Both our physical theories and our interpretations of the Bible are likely to evolve. This idea figures importantly in Pyrrhonism. Past experience tells us that, on every given issue, someone eventually came up with a new argument. Accordingly, even if the skeptics cannot find an objection to a given claim right now, they expect that in the future, a conflicting view will be formulated.
However, such traces of skepticism are integrated into an ultimately non-skeptical philosophy. In Contra Academicos, Augustine recognizes a core feature of ancient skepticism, namely that it is a commitment to ongoing inquiry (cf. Nawar 2019 on Augustine’s defense of knowledge against the skeptics in Contra Academicos 3). The question that Augustine considers vital, then, is whether a life devoted to inquiry can be compelling, if seemingly there is no prospect for ever attaining truth (cf. Lagerlund 2009). It is as a philosophy of inquiry that skepticism makes a lasting contribution to ethics, continuing, as it were, a Socratic legacy (Vogt 2017).
Augustine creates the framework that will become characteristic of early modern discussions. First, in his work skeptical arguments are explored in order to be refuted. Second, the key issue is whether we have knowledge, not whether we should hold anything to be true. In Augustine, the background for caring so much about knowledge is the pressing question of whether we can know God: whether we can know that he exists and what his properties are. This might also be the reason why knowledge of testimony gains importance (De Trinitate, 15.12; in Schoedinger 1996). The Bible, or parts of it, might be considered testimony about God, and accordingly as one possible way of attaining knowledge of God.
Third, in the process of asking whether we can have knowledge of God it makes sense to distinguish between kinds of knowledge (sensory, rational, by testimony, etc.). If we know God, then we do so via one of the kinds of knowledge. This becomes a standard feature of discussions of skepticism. Philosophers go through the different kinds of knowledge that are conceivable, and examine them in turn. In Augustine as well as later authors, this includes mathematical knowledge (Nawar 2022). Though Sextus wrote on geometry and arithmetic, questions about knowledge in mathematics do not shape Hellenistic debates between skeptics on the one hand and Epicureans and Stoics on the other hand. Fourth, Augustine conceives of what he calls ‘inner knowledge.’ He envisages a skeptical scenario. Suppose we have no sensory knowledge, no rational knowledge, and no knowledge of testimony. We still know that we think, love, judge, live, and are (De Trinitate 15.12). In the City of God 11.26, Augustine uses his well-known phrase “si enim fallor, sum” (even if I err, I am). That is, Augustine suggests that we have knowledge of our mental acts (cf. Nawar 2022 on Augustine’s concern with self-knowledge). However, Augustine does not consider these pieces of knowledge foundational. While he points to them when he discusses the challenges of Academic skepticism, he does not systematically build upon them in refuting skepticism about sense perception, rational knowledge, and knowledge of testimony. Rather, he refutes skepticism by stating that God created us and the things that are known to us; God wanted these things to be known to us (De Trinitate 15.12). In later epistemology, the idea of the turn into one’s mind and an introspective access to one’s mental acts becomes a secular idea. Augustine is a transitional figure in the philosophy of mind, and thereby re-conceives skepticism. By focussing on a gap between ‘what is in the mind’ and the world outside, he as it were invites external world skepticism (Vogt 2014a). But Augustine is concerned with the path to God: the mind turns into itself and from there it moves further, toward God (e.g., Confessions 7. 17,23).
Next to Augustine, Al-Ghazali (1085-1111) plays a major role in re-conceiving the questions relevant to skepticism (Menn 2003, Kukkonen 2009). In The Rescuer From Error, Al-Ghazali literally describes God as the rescuer from error (in Khalidi 2005). Like Augustine before and Descartes after him, Al-Ghazali moves through different cognitive faculties. Do the senses or reason allow us to gain knowledge? These questions are framed by the quest for knowledge of God. While Augustine thinks that knowledge of God comes through a combination of seeking God on the one hand and God’s grace on the other, Al-Ghazali thinks it comes through spiritual exercises. However, once confidence in God is secured, trust in the more familiar ways of gaining knowledge—sense perception, rational reasoning, and so on—is restored (for a detailed treatment of skepticism in Classical Islam, cf. Heck 2014).
One key difference between ancient skepticism on the one hand, and medieval as well as Cartesian skepticism on the other, is that ancient skepticism is not framed by theological concerns. Note that in Cartesian skepticism, God is not only invoked when it comes to refuting skepticism. More importantly, the skeptical problems arise in a way that depends on God as creator. Our cognitive faculties are seen as created faculties, and the world as a created world. A kind of ‘faculty-skepticism’ that asks whether our cognitive faculties are built so as to be erroneous is formulated, and a potential gap between our minds and the world opens up. Perhaps God made us in such a way that we are fundamentally wrong about everything (or, as later secular versions have it, a mad scientist experiments on a “brain in a vat”).
These are important steps away from the non-theological ancient construal of skepticism. The theological premises of early modern skepticism are not only foreign to ancient debates; they would be seen as misguided. From the Hellenistic point of view, theology is part of physics. An account of god is part of an account of the natural world (as such, it is unrecognizable as ‘theology’ from the point of view of later theologies). Human beings and their cognitive faculties are natural parts of a natural world. They are organic and functional parts, interconnected with the other parts of the large whole which the universe is. A mind-world-gap (of the kind envisaged in the Cartesian tradition) is inconceivable. Each ‘mind,’ and that is, rational soul, is an integrated physical part of the physical world. Like a part of a complex organism, it would not exist were it not for the interrelations it has with the other parts. A physiological account of the mind makes the stark divide between mind and world that figures in early modern skepticism unimaginable.
Contemporary discussions inherit long-standing problems from early modern philosophy. Among them, external world skepticism, skepticism about other minds, and skepticism about induction are particularly prominent. In assessing ancient skepticism, we might ask whether the ancients saw these problems.
Among the skeptical problems of modern philosophy, skepticism about induction stands out. Its early formulation in Hume does not depend on the idea that our faculties are created by God, who also created the world. Hume takes himself to engage with Pyrrhonian skepticism (Ainslie 2003). Induction proceeds from particular observations to a general conclusion. Skepticism about induction points out that, no matter how many particulars were observed, the general claim pronounces also on what has not been observed. In this respect, the inference seems unwarranted and so we should suspend judgement on its effectiveness. Induction can concern the ascription of properties to some kind of entity as well as causal claims. In the latter, the skeptic observes that what regularly precedes a type of event may not be its cause. Perhaps we cannot infer anything from the fact that certain properties or events regularly occur together (Vlasits 2020a; for a related argument in Al-Ghazali, cf. Kukkonen 2009).
Relevant ideas can be traced in various aspects of Sextus’ philosophy. First, Sextus sides with anti-rationalist tendencies in medicine. According to these schools, a doctor remembers that, in earlier cases, symptom A was alleviated by medication B. They do not infer that medication B makes symptom A disappear, or that the illness C is the cause of symptom A. Second, the Five Modes do not exclusively target proof. They address everything that lends credibility to something else. They may thus also call into question signs that are taken as indicative of their causes. Sextus’ skeptic does not accept such indicative signs. Third, Sextus discusses the role of so-called commemorative signs in the skeptic’s life (PH 2.100–102; Allen 2001). For example, a scar is a commemorative sign of a wound. Both were co-observed in the past. A skeptic will think of a wound when seeing a scar. But they do not commit to causal or explanatory claims. Fourth, Sextus records a set of Causal Modes (PH 1.180–86), which are specifically targeted toward causal explanations (Corti 2014; on the relation between the Causal Modes and Hume cf. Garrett 2020). He does not ascribe the kind of relevance to them that the Ten Modes and the Five Modes have. Indeed, he thinks the Five Modes can do the work of Causal Modes (that is, call into question causal and explanatory theses and theories). However, the Causal Modes go into great detail on how the skeptic investigates any kind of causal thesis or theory.
The distinction between subjectivity and objectivity is central to modern discussions of skepticism. It is not envisaged in ancient thought. However, this does not mean that ancient philosophers do not reflect on questions relevant to this distinction. Arguably, Pyrrhonism conceives of the affections of the mind in ways that anticipate later thought about subjectivity (Fine 2003a and 2003b). Sextus describes the skeptic’s states of ‘being-appeared-to’ as affections of the mind. A skeptic can report these states in their utterances. Illustrating this point, Sextus uses expressions associated with the Cyrenaics, a Socratic school of thought. These expressions literally mean something like ‘I am being heated’ or ‘I am being whitened.’ They aim to record affections without claiming anything about the world. Fine argues that the skeptic’s beliefs are beliefs about these affections (2000). With this proposal, Fine turns against two prominent positions in scholarly debate about skeptical belief (see section 4.4), that skeptics have no beliefs whatsoever, and that they have beliefs that fall short of holding true. Fine envisages reflective beliefs: beliefs about one’s states of mind (on related issues in contemporary epistemology, cf. Feeney and Schellenberg 2020 and Glüer 2020).
Whether or not Sextus’ account of the skeptic’s mental life includes reflective beliefs about one’s mental states, we should note an important difference to later proposals of that kind. Later philosophers focus on the particular kind of certainty attached to reflective knowledge. Reflective knowledge is sometimes seen as a stepping-stone towards greater confidence in our cognitive powers, and our ability to also attain other kinds of knowledge. But it may not be obvious that reflective knowledge can take on this important role. In this respect, Augustine is still closer to ancient than to modern intuitions. He says that such pieces of knowledge as “I know that I think” are not what we are looking for. Augustine envisages that reflective knowledge-claims can be iterated, so that we would have infinitely many pieces of knowledge (“I know that I know that I think…”). But from his point of view, this kind of knowledge leads nowhere. When we ask whether we can have knowledge, we are interested in knowledge of the world and of God (De Trinitate 15.12).
Modern philosophers also pay great attention to the privileged access cognizers have to their own cognitive activities. Augustine introduces a distinction that paves the way for this idea. He argues that the mind cannot know what kind of stuff it is (De Trinitate 10.10 and 15.12). The mind does not know its substance, but it knows its activities. For Augustine, this means that the mind knows itself. The mind is precisely what it knows itself to be: in knowing that one thinks, judges, lives, and so on, one knows the mind (Vogt 2014a). Note that this argument indicates that knowing that one lives and is are not pieces of knowledge about one’s bodily existence, but about the activities of the mind.
Finally, modern philosophers conceive of the special kind of access to one’s own mind not only in contrast with our access to the world. They also compare it to our access to what goes on in other minds. One of their core problems is skepticism about other minds. If our own minds are accessible to us in the way nothing else is, then we might not be able to ascribe mental states to others. For example, we might not know that someone who looks as if she is in pain really is in pain. The ancient skeptics envisage nothing of this kind (Warren 2011). This suggests that, insofar as they draw a distinction between affections of the mind and the world, this distinction is construed differently than in modern skepticism.
In its early modern versions, external world skepticism involves the idea that there is a creator—someone who made the world and our faculties, and the fit or misfit between them. If this assumption is crucial to external world skepticism, then the ancients do not conceive of this skeptical problem. From the point of view of modern philosophy, ancient skepticism may appear limited by not addressing some of the most radical skeptical scenarios (Burnyeat 1980  and 1982; Williams 1988; Fine 2003a and 2003b). From the point of view of ancient skepticism, early modern skepticism and the long life that its problems enjoy, however, would seem to originate in a flawed theology.
Contemporary philosophers sometimes discuss external world skepticism in terms of a paradox: one thinker finds herself torn between the strength of skeptical arguments and her ordinary convictions. For example, she thinks that this is her hand. But she concedes that the skeptical hypothesis that a mad scientist might have set things up so that she has such perceptions and thoughts (the so-called brain in a vat scenario) is hard to refute. This way of framing discussions of skepticism is foreign to antiquity. In antiquity, skeptics and their opponents are different thinkers, each of them with one set of intuitions, arguing against each other. It is also foreign to ancient skepticism insofar as it inherits the early modern idea that some greatly powerful agent sets things up, and in a sense creates the thinker’s faculties and the world as it appears to them.
However, the ancient skeptics might conceive of their own kind of external world skepticism. One way to explore this question is to turn to the way in which Sextus describes that which is outside of the skeptic’s mind (Fine 2003 and 2003(2)). Throughout his work, Sextus employs the distinction between appearances and what really is the case. Consider some of the detail of how he characterizes the latter. One phrase in the Ten Modes is “ta ektos hupokeimena,” the externally underlying things (PH 1.61, 127, 128, 134, 144). Other phrases, meant to demarcate roughly the same contrast with appearances, are how things are in their nature (phusei) (PH 1.78, 123, 140), “the underlying things” (hupokeimena) (PH 1.106), as well as a combination: “the nature of the underlying external things” (PH 1.117, 163). The expressions which contain the word “external” might read as if Sextus was talking about the external world in a sense familiar to us from early modern skepticism.
But what are the underlying or external objects, as Sextus conceives of them? For example, Sextus speaks of the underlying reality of whether honey really is sweet (PH 1.19). In such a case, it is assumed that there are ordinary objects. But we do not have access to the properties they really have (Fine calls this Property Skepticism, 2003b). However, external objects in Sextus’ sense also include objects that later philosophers would not obviously see as part of the external word. For example, an answer to the question of what kind of life really is good would count as a claim about external or underlying reality (cf. Pellegrin 2010).
Another approach to the question of whether Sextus envisages some kind of external world skepticism is to turn to his discussions of physics. Ordinarily we take ourselves to live in a world in which there are bodies, movement, place, time, and so on. But as Sextus argues, we do not have compelling accounts of any of these core conceptions of physics. This leads to suspension of judgment on whether there are bodies, movement, place, time, and so on. Sextus’ discussions of physics might add up to a rather far-reaching skepticism about the natural world.
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- Groarke, Leo, “Ancient Skepticism”, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2009 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/spr2009/entries/skepticism-ancient/>. [This was the previous entry on ancient skepticism in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]
- Podcasts on ancient skepticism by Peter Adamson:
I am grateful to John Cooper, Jens Haas, Chloe Layman, Wolfgang Mann, Christiana Olfert, Jim Pryor, and Carol Rovane for feedback on the 2010 version of this entry, and to Abigail Breuker for feedback on the 2022 version.