# Social Choice Theory

*First published Wed Dec 18, 2013; substantive revision Fri Oct 14, 2022*

Social choice theory is the study of collective decision procedures and mechanisms. It is not a single theory, but a cluster of models and results concerning the aggregation of individual inputs (e.g., votes, preferences, judgments, welfare) into collective outputs (e.g., collective decisions, preferences, judgments, welfare). Central questions are: How can a group of individuals choose a winning outcome (e.g., policy, electoral candidate) from a given set of options? What are the properties of different voting systems? When is a voting system democratic? How can a collective (e.g., electorate, legislature, collegial court, expert panel, or committee) arrive at coherent collective preferences or judgments on some issues, on the basis of its members’ individual preferences or judgments? How can we rank different social alternatives in an order of social welfare? Social choice theorists study these questions not just by looking at examples, but by developing general models and proving theorems.

Pioneered in the 18th century by Nicolas de Condorcet and Jean-Charles de Borda and in the 19th century by Charles Dodgson (also known as Lewis Carroll), social choice theory took off in the 20th century with the works of Kenneth Arrow, Amartya Sen, and Duncan Black. Its influence extends across economics, political science, philosophy, mathematics, and recently computer science and biology. Apart from contributing to our understanding of collective decision procedures, social choice theory has applications in the areas of institutional design, welfare economics, and social epistemology.

- 1. History of social choice theory
- 2. Three formal arguments for majority rule
- 3. The aggregation of preferences
- 4. The aggregation of welfare measures or qualitative ratings
- 5. The aggregation of judgments
- 6. Other topics
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. History of social choice theory

### 1.1 Condorcet

The two scholars most often associated with the development of social
choice theory are the Frenchman Nicolas de Condorcet (1743–1794)
and the American Kenneth Arrow (1921–2017). Condorcet was a
liberal thinker in the era of the French Revolution who was pursued by
the revolutionary authorities for criticizing them. After a period of
hiding, he was eventually arrested, though apparently not immediately
identified, and he died in prison (see McLean and Hewitt 1994). In his
*Essay on the Application of Analysis to the Probability of
Majority Decisions* (1785), he advocated a particular voting
system, pairwise majority voting, and presented his two most prominent
insights. The first, known as *Condorcet’s jury theorem*,
is that if each member of a jury has an equal and independent chance
better than random, but worse than perfect, of making a correct
judgment on whether a defendant is guilty (or on some other factual
proposition), the majority of jurors is more likely to be correct than
each individual juror, and the probability of a correct majority
judgment approaches 1 as the jury size increases. Thus, under certain
idealized conditions, majority rule is good at ‘tracking the
truth’ (e.g., Grofman, Owen, and Feld 1983).

Condorcet’s second insight, often called *Condorcet’s
paradox*, is the observation that majority preferences can be
‘irrational’ (specifically, intransitive) even when
individual preferences are ‘rational’ (specifically,
transitive). Suppose, for example, that one third of a group prefers
alternative \(x\) to \(y\) to \(z\), a second third prefers \(y\) to
\(z\) to \(x\), and a final third prefers \(z\) to \(x\) to \(y\).
Then there are majorities (of two thirds) for \(x\) against \(y\), for
\(y\) against \(z\), and for \(z\) against \(x\): a
‘cycle’, which violates transitivity. Furthermore, no
alternative is a *Condorcet winner*, an alternative that beats,
or at least ties with, every other alternative in pairwise majority
contests.

Condorcet anticipated a key theme of modern social choice theory: majority rule is at once a plausible method of collective decision making and yet subject to some surprising problems. Resolving or bypassing these problems remains one of social choice theory’s core concerns.

### 1.2 Arrow and his influence

While Condorcet had investigated a *particular* voting method
(majority voting), Arrow, who won the Nobel Memorial Prize in
Economics in 1972, introduced a *general* approach to the study
of preference aggregation, partly inspired by his teacher of logic,
Alfred Tarski (1901–1983), from whom he had learnt relation
theory as an undergraduate at the City College of New York (Suppes
2005). Arrow considered a class of *possible* aggregation
methods, which he called *social welfare functions*, and asked
which of them satisfy certain axioms or desiderata. He proved that,
surprisingly, there exists no method for aggregating the preferences
of two or more individuals over three or more alternatives into
collective preferences, where this method satisfies five seemingly
plausible axioms, discussed below.

This result, known as *Arrow’s impossibility theorem*,
prompted much work and many debates in social choice theory and
welfare economics. William Riker (1920–1993), who inspired the
Rochester school in political science, interpreted it as a
mathematical proof of the impossibility of populist democracy (e.g.,
Riker 1982). Others, most prominently Amartya Sen (born 1933), who won
the 1998 Nobel Memorial Prize, took it to show that ordinal
preferences are insufficient for making satisfactory social choices
and that social decisions require a richer informational basis.
Commentators also questioned whether Arrow’s desiderata on an
aggregation method are as innocuous as claimed or whether they should
be relaxed.

The lessons from Arrow’s theorem depend, in part, on how we
interpret an Arrovian social welfare function. The use of ordinal
preferences as the ‘aggreganda’ may be easier to justify
if we interpret the aggregation rule as a *voting method* than
if we interpret it as a *social evaluation method*. Sen argued
that when a social planner seeks to rank different social alternatives
in an order of social desirability (thereby employing some aggregation
rule as a social evaluation method), it may be justifiable and even
necessary to use additional information over and above ordinal
preferences, such as interpersonally comparable welfare measurements
(e.g., Sen 1982) or information about people’s capabilities to
achieve valuable functionings (e.g., Sen 1992).

Arrow himself held the view

‘that interpersonal comparison of utilities has no meaning and … that there is no meaning relevant to welfare comparisons in the measurability of individual utility.’ (1951/1963: 9)

This view was influenced by neoclassical economics, associated with scholars such as Vilfredo Pareto (1848–1923), Lionel Robbins (1898–1984), John Hicks (1904–1989), co-winner of the Economics Nobel Prize with Arrow, and Paul Samuelson (1915–2009), another Nobel Laureate. Arrow’s theorem demonstrates the stark implications of the ‘ordinalist’ assumptions of neoclassical thought. For a critique of this restrictive ordinalist approach to welfare economics, see also the work of Kotaro Suzumura (1944–2020) (e.g., Suzumura 2000).

Nowadays most social choice theorists have moved beyond the negative interpretations of Arrow’s theorem and are interested in the trade-offs involved in finding satisfactory decision procedures and the possibilities opened up by relaxing certain restrictive assumptions. Sen has promoted this ‘possibilist’ interpretation of social choice theory (e.g., in his 1998 Nobel lecture). Moreover, as Fabienne Peter has argued, by moving beyond the narrow informational basis leading to the classic impossibility results, social choice theory can become a more promising framework for policy evaluation and offer resources for taking into account the situated nature of people’s agency, inequalities between them, and issues of gender (Peter 2003).

In contemporary social choice theory, it is perhaps fair to say, Arrow’s axiomatic method is more influential than his impossibility theorem itself (on the axiomatic method, see Thomson 2000). The paradigmatic kind of result in formal work is now the ‘characterization theorem’. Here the aim is to identify a set of plausible necessary and sufficient conditions that uniquely characterize a particular solution (or class of solutions) to a given type of collective decision problem. An early example is Kenneth May’s (1952) characterization of majority rule, discussed below.

### 1.3 Borda, Carroll, Black, and others

Condorcet and Arrow are not the only founding figures of social choice
theory. Condorcet’s contemporary and co-national Jean-Charles de
Borda (1733–1799) defended a voting system that is often seen as
a prominent alternative to majority voting. The *Borda count*,
formally defined later, avoids Condorcet’s paradox but violates
one of Arrow’s conditions, the *independence of irrelevant
alternatives*. Thus the debate between Condorcet and Borda is a
precursor to some modern debates on how to respond to Arrow’s
theorem.

The origins of this debate precede Condorcet and Borda. In the Middle
Ages, Ramon Llull (c1235–1315) proposed the aggregation method
of pairwise majority voting, while Nicolas Cusanus (1401–1464)
proposed a variant of the Borda count (McLean 1990). In 1672, the
German scholar and jurist Samuel von Pufendorf (1632–1694)
compared simple majority, qualified majority, and unanimity rules and
offered an analysis of the structure of preferences that can be seen
as a precursor to later discoveries (e.g., on
*single-peakedness*, discussed below) (Gaertner 2005).

In the 19^{th} century, the British mathematician and
clergyman Charles Dodgson (1832–1898), better known as Lewis
Carroll, independently rediscovered some of Condorcet’s and
Borda’s insights and also developed a theory of proportional
representation. It was largely thanks to the Scottish economist Duncan
Black (1908–1991) that Condorcet’s, Borda’s, and
Dodgson’s social-choice-theoretic ideas were drawn to the
attention of the modern research community (McLean, McMillan, and
Monroe 1995). Black also made several discoveries related to majority
voting, some of which are discussed below.

In France, George-Théodule Guilbaud ([1952] 1966) wrote an
important but often overlooked paper, revisiting Condorcet’s
theory of voting from a logical perspective and sparking a French
literature on the *Condorcet effect*, the logical problem
underlying Condorcet’s paradox, which has only recently received
more attention in Anglophone social choice theory (Monjardet 2005). In
particular, Guilbaud anticipated some of the ideas underlying recent
work on the aggregation of judgments. For further contributions on the
history of social choice theory, see McLean, McMillan, and Monroe
(1996), McLean and Urken (1995), McLean and Hewitt (1994), and a
special issue of *Social Choice and Welfare*, edited by Salles
(2005).

## 2. Three formal arguments for majority rule

To introduce social choice theory formally, it helps to consider a simple decision problem: a collective choice between two alternatives.

### 2.1 The concept of an aggregation rule

Let \(N = \{1, 2, \ldots ,n\}\) be a set of individuals, where \(n \ge 2\). These individuals have to choose between two alternatives (candidates, policies etc.). Each individual \(i \in N\) casts a vote, denoted \(v_i\), where

- \(v_i = 1\) represents a vote for the first alternative,
- \(v_i = -1\) represents a vote for the second alternative, and optionally
- \(v_i = 0\) represents an abstention (for simplicity, we set this possibility aside in this section).

A combination of votes across the individuals, \(\langle v_1, v_2 ,
\ldots ,v_n\rangle\), is called a *profile*. For any profile,
the group seeks to arrive at a social decision \(v\), where

- \(v = 1\) represents a decision for the first alternative,
- \(v = -1\) represents a decision for the second alternative, and
- \(v = 0\) represents a tie.

An *aggregation rule* is a function \(f\) that assigns to each
profile \(\langle v_1, v_2 , \ldots ,v_n\rangle\) (in some domain of
admissible profiles) a social decision \(v = f(v_1, v_2 , \ldots
,v_n)\). Examples are:

\[ f(v_1,v_2,\ldots,v_n) = \begin{cases} 1 & \begin{aligned} &\text{if } v_1+v_2+\cdots+v_n \gt 0 \\ &\text{(there are more 1s than -1s)}\end{aligned} \\ 0 & \begin{aligned} &\text{if } v_1+v_2+\cdots+v_n = 0 \\ &\text{(there are as many 1s as -1s)}\end{aligned}\\ -1 & \begin{aligned} &\text{if } v_1+v_2+\cdots+v_n \lt 0\\ &\text{(there are more -1s than 1s)}\end{aligned} \end{cases}\]

Majority rule: For each profile \(\langle v_1, v_2 , \ldots ,v_n\rangle\),\[ f(v_1, v_2 , \ldots ,v_n) = v_i, \]

Dictatorship: For each profile \(\langle v_1, v_2 , \ldots ,v_n\rangle\),where \(i \in N\) is an antecedently fixed individual (the ‘dictator’).

\[ f(v_1,v_2,\ldots,v_n) = \begin{cases} 1 & \text{if } w_1v_1+w_2v_2+\cdots+w_nv_n \gt 0 \\ 0 & \text{if } w_1v_1+w_2v_2+\cdots+w_nv_n = 0 \\ -1 & \text{if } w_1v_1+w_2v_2+\cdots+w_nv_n \lt 0 \end{cases}\]

Weighted majority rule: For each profile \(\langle v_1, v_2 , \ldots ,v_n\rangle\),where \(w_1, w_2 , \ldots ,w_n\) are real numbers, interpreted as the ‘voting weights’ of the \(n\) individuals.

Two points about the concept of an aggregation rule are worth noting.
First, under the standard definition, an aggregation rule is defined
*extensionally*, not *intensionally*: it is a
*mapping* (*functional relationship*) between individual
inputs and collective outputs, not a *set of explicit
instructions* (a *rule* in the ordinary-language sense).
Different sets of instructions could in principle give rise to the
same mapping from inputs to outputs. Secondly, an aggregation rule is
defined for a fixed set of individuals \(N\) and a fixed decision
problem, so that majority rule in a group of two individuals is a
different mathematical object from majority rule in a group of three.
One potential disadvantage of this way of defining an aggregation rule
is that it makes it harder to determine how a given aggregation rule
is to be extended to inputs outside the function’s formal
domain. By contrast, if we were given an explicit set of instructions,
it might be easier to infer, for instance, how these are to be
extended from the case of \(n\) individuals and three alternatives to
the case of \(n + 1\) individuals and four alternatives.

To illustrate, Tables 1 and 2 show majority rule for groups of sizes two and three as extensional objects. The rows of each table correspond to the different possible profiles of votes; the final column displays the resulting social decisions.

Individual 1’s vote |
Individual 2’s vote |
Collective decision |
---|---|---|

1 | 1 | 1 |

1 | \(-1\) | 0 |

\(-1\) | 1 | 0 |

\(-1\) | \(-1\) | \(-1\) |

Table 1: Majority rule among two individuals

Individual 1’s vote |
Individual 2’s vote |
Individual 3’s vote |
Collective decision |
---|---|---|---|

1 | 1 | 1 | 1 |

1 | 1 | \(-1\) | 1 |

1 | \(-1\) | 1 | 1 |

1 | \(-1\) | \(-1\) | \(-1\) |

\(-1\) | 1 | 1 | 1 |

\(-1\) | 1 | \(-1\) | \(-1\) |

\(-1\) | \(-1\) | 1 | \(-1\) |

\(-1\) | \(-1\) | \(-1\) | \(-1\) |

Table 2: Majority rule among three individuals

The present way of representing an aggregation rule helps us see how many possible aggregation rules there are. Suppose there are \(k\) profiles in the domain of admissible inputs (in the present example, \(k = 2^n\), since each of the \(n\) individuals has two choices, with abstention disallowed). Suppose, further, there are \(l\) possible social decisions for each profile (in the example, \(l = 3\), allowing ties). Then there are \(l^k\) possible aggregation rules: the relevant table has \(k\) rows, and in each row, there are \(l\) possible ways of specifying the final entry (the collective decision). Thus the number of possible aggregation rules grows exponentially with the number of admissible profiles and the number of possible decision outcomes.

To select an aggregation rule non-arbitrarily from this large class of possible ones, some constraints are needed. I now consider three formal arguments for majority rule.

### 2.2 A procedural argument for majority rule

The first involves imposing some ‘procedural’ requirements on the relationship between individual votes and social decisions and showing that majority rule is the only aggregation rule satisfying them. May (1952) introduced four such requirements:

Universal domain: The domain of admissible inputs of the aggregation rule consists of all logically possible profiles of votes \(\langle v_1, v_2 , \ldots ,v_n\rangle\), where each \(v_i \in \{-1,1\}\).

Anonymity: For any admissible profiles \(\langle v_1, v_2 , \ldots ,v_n\rangle\) and \(\langle w_1, w_2 , \ldots ,w_n\rangle\) that are permutations of each other (i.e., one can be obtained from the other by reordering the entries), the social decision is the same, i.e., \(f(v_1, v_2 , \ldots ,v_n) = f(w_1, w_2 , \ldots ,w_n)\).

Neutrality: For any admissible profile \(\langle v_1, v_2 , \ldots ,v_n\rangle\), if the votes for the two alternatives are reversed, the social decision is reversed too, i.e., \(f(-v_1, -v_2 , \ldots ,-v_n) = -f(v_1, v_2 , \ldots ,v_n)\).

Positive responsiveness: For any admissible profile \(\langle v_1, v_2 , \ldots ,v_n\rangle\), if some voters change their votes in favour of one alternative (say the first) and all other votes remain the same, the social decision does not change in the opposite direction; if the social decision was a tie prior to the change, the tie is broken in the direction of the change, i.e., if [\(w_i \gt v_i\) for some \(i\) and \(w_j = v_j\) for all other \(j\)] and \(f(v_1, v_2 , \ldots ,v_n) = 0\) or 1, then \(f(w_1, w_2 , \ldots ,w_n) = 1\).

Universal domain requires the aggregation rule to cope with any level of ‘pluralism’ in its inputs; anonymity requires it to treat all voters equally; neutrality requires it to treat all alternatives equally; and positive responsiveness requires the social decision to be a positive function of the way people vote. May proved the following:

Theorem(May 1952): An aggregation rule satisfies universal domain, anonymity, neutrality, and positive responsiveness if and only if it is majority rule.

Apart from providing an argument for majority rule based on four
plausible procedural desiderata, the theorem helps us characterize
other aggregation rules in terms of which desiderata they violate.
Dictatorships and weighted majority rules with unequal individual
weights violate anonymity. Asymmetrical supermajority rules (under
which a supermajority of the votes, such as two thirds or three
quarters, is required for a decision in favour of one of the
alternatives, while the other alternative is the default choice)
violate neutrality. This may sometimes be justifiable, for instance
when there is a presumption in favour of one alternative, such as a
presumption of innocence in a jury decision. Symmetrical supermajority
rules (under which neither alternative is chosen unless it is
supported by a sufficiently large supermajority) violate positive
responsiveness. A more far-fetched example of an aggregation rule
violating positive responsiveness is the inverse majority rule (here
the alternative *rejected* by a majority wins).

May’s theorem has been generalized in a variety of ways, including to the mathematically interesting but unrealistic case of infinite sets of voters (Fey 2004) and to choices between multiple options (e.g., Cantillon and Rangel 2002, offering a May-style characterization of pairwise majority voting; and Goodin and List 2006, offering a May-style characterization of plurality rule).

### 2.3 An epistemic argument for majority rule

Condorcet’s jury theorem provides a consequentialist argument for majority rule. The argument is ‘epistemic’, insofar as the aggregation rule is interpreted as a truth-tracking device (e.g., Grofman, Owen and Feld 1983; List and Goodin 2001).

Suppose the aim is to make a judgment on some procedure-independent fact or state of the world, denoted \(X\). In a jury decision, the defendant is either guilty \((X = 1)\) or innocent \((X = -1)\). In an expert-panel decision on the safety of some technology, the technology may be either safe \((X = 1)\) or not \((X = -1)\). Each individual’s vote expresses a judgment on that fact or state, and the social decision represents the collective judgment. The goal is to reach a factually correct collective judgment. Which aggregation rule performs best at ‘tracking the truth’ depends on the relationship between the individual votes and the relevant fact or state of the world.

Condorcet assumed that each individual is better than random at making a correct judgment (the competence assumption) and that different individuals’ judgments are stochastically independent, given the state of the world (the independence assumption). Formally, let \(V_1, V_2 , \ldots ,V_n\) (capital letters) denote the random variables generating the specific individual votes \(v_1, v_2 , \ldots ,v_n\) (small letters), and let \(V = f(V_1, V_2 , \ldots ,V_n)\) denote the resulting random variable representing the social decision \(v = f(v_1, v_2 , \ldots ,v_n)\) under a given aggregation rule \(f\), such as majority rule. Condorcet’s assumptions can be stated as follows:

Competence: For each individual \(i \in N\) and each state of the world \(x \in \{-1,1\}, Pr(V_i = x | X = x) = p \gt 1/2\), where \(p\) is the same across individuals and states.

Independence: The votes of different individuals \(V_1, V_2 , \ldots ,V_n\) are independent of each other, conditional on each value \(x \in \{-1,1\}\) of \(X\).

Under these assumptions, majority voting is a good truth-tracker:

Theorem(Condorcet’s jury theorem): For each state of the world \(x \in \{-1,1\}\), the probability of a correct majority decision, \(Pr(V = x | X = x)\), is greater than each individual’s probability of a correct vote, \(Pr(V_i = x | X = x)\), and converges to 1, as the number of individuals \(n\) increases.^{[1]}

The first conjunct (‘is greater than each individual’s
probability’) is the *non-asymptotic conclusion*, the
second (‘converges to 1’) the *asymptotic
conclusion*. One can further show that, if the two states of the
world have an equal prior probability (i.e., \(Pr(X = 1) = Pr(X = -1)
= 1/2)\), majority rule is the most reliable of all aggregation rules,
maximizing \(Pr(V = X)\) (e.g., Ben-Yashar and Nitzan 1997).

Although the jury theorem is often invoked to demonstrate the
epistemic merits of democracy (for recent discussions, see, e.g.,
Landemore 2012 and Goodin and Spiekermann 2018), its assumptions are
highly idealistic. The competence assumption is not a conceptual claim
but an empirical one and depends on any given decision problem.
Although an average (not necessarily equal) individual competence
above 1/2 may be sufficient for Condorcet’s conclusion (e.g.,
Grofman, Owen, and Feld 1983; Boland 1989; Kanazawa
1998),^{[2]}
the theorem ceases to hold if individuals are randomizers (no better
and no worse than a coin toss) or if they are worse than random \((p
\lt 1/2)\). In the latter case, the probability of a correct majority
decision is *less* than each individual’s probability of
a correct vote and converges to 0, as the jury size increases. The
theorem’s conclusion can also be undermined in less extreme
cases (Berend and Paroush 1998), for instance when each
individual’s reliability, though above 1/2, is an exponentially
decreasing function approaching 1/2 with increasing jury size.

Similarly, whether the independence assumption is true depends on the decision problem in question. Although Condorcet’s conclusion is robust to the presence of some interdependencies between individual votes, the structure of these interdependencies matters (e.g., Boland 1989; Ladha 1992; Estlund 1994; Berend and Sapir 2007; Pivato 2017). If all individuals’ votes are perfectly correlated with one another or mimic a small number of opinion leaders, the collective judgment is no more reliable than the judgment among a small number of independent individuals.

Bayesian networks, as employed in Pearl’s account of causation (2000), have been used to model the effects of voter dependencies on the jury theorem and to distinguish between stronger and weaker variants of conditional independence (Dietrich and List 2004; Dietrich and Spiekermann 2013). This work suggests that, under realistic assumptions, Condorcet’s asymptotic conclusion fails to hold, and the probability of a correct majority decision converges, at most, to a number strictly below 1 (e.g., the probability that the jury’s evidence is not misleading). Furthermore, Dietrich (2008) has argued that Condorcet’s original two assumptions are never simultaneously justified, in the sense that, even when they are both true, one cannot obtain evidence to support both at once.

Finally, game-theoretic work challenges an implicit assumption of the
jury theorem, namely that voters will always reveal their judgments
truthfully. Even if all voters prefer a correct to an incorrect
collective judgment, they may still have incentives to misrepresent
their individual judgments. This can happen when, conditional on the
event of being pivotal for the outcome, a voter expects a higher
chance of bringing about a correct collective judgment by voting
*against* his or her own private judgment than by voting in
line with it (Austin-Smith and Banks 1996; Feddersen and Pesendorfer
1998).

### 2.4 A utilitarian argument for majority rule

Another consequentialist argument for majority rule is utilitarian
rather than epistemic. It does not require the existence of an
independent fact or state of the world that the collective decision is
supposed to track. Suppose each voter gets some utility from the
collective decision, which depends on whether the decision matches his
or her vote (preference): specifically, each voter gets a utility of 1
from a match between his or her vote and the collective outcome and a
utility of 0 from a
mismatch.^{[3]}
The Rae-Taylor theorem then states that if each individual has an
equal prior probability of preferring each of the two alternatives,
majority rule maximizes each individual’s expected utility (see,
e.g., Mueller 2003).

Relatedly, majority rule minimizes the number of frustrated voters
(defined as voters on the losing side) and maximizes total utility
across voters. Brighouse and Fleurbaey (2010) generalize this result.
Define voter \(i\)’s *stake* in the decision, \(d_i\), as
the utility difference between his or her preferred outcome and his or
her dispreferred outcome. The Rae-Taylor theorem rests on an implicit
equal-stakes assumption, i.e., \(d_i = 1\) for every \(i \in N\).
Brighouse and Fleurbaey show that when stakes are allowed to vary
across voters, total utility is maximized not by majority rule, but by
a weighted majority rule, where each individual \(i\)’s voting
weight \(w_i\) is proportional to his or her stake \(d_i\).

## 3. The aggregation of preferences

At the heart of social choice theory is the analysis of preference aggregation, understood as the aggregation of several individuals’ preference rankings of two or more social alternatives into a single, collective preference ranking (or choice) over these alternatives. The basic framework, which is still standard, was introduced by Arrow (1951/1963).

### 3.1 The basic framework

Consider a set \(N = \{1, 2, \ldots ,n\}\) of individuals \((n \ge
2)\). Let \(X = \{x, y, z, \ldots \}\) be a set of social
alternatives, for example possible worlds, policy platforms, election
candidates, or allocations of goods. Each individual \(i \in N\) has a
*preference ordering* \(R_i\) over these alternatives: a
complete and transitive binary relation on
\(X\).^{[4]}
For any \(x, y \in X\), \(xR_i y\) means that individual \(i\) weakly
prefers \(x\) to \(y\). We write \(xP_i y\) if \(xR_i y\) and not
\(yR_i x\) (‘individual \(i\) strictly prefers \(x\) to
\(y\)’), and \(xI_i y\) if \(xR_i y\) and \(yR_i x\)
(‘individual \(i\) is indifferent between \(x\) and
\(y\)’).

A combination of preference orderings across the individuals,
\(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\), is called a
*profile*. A *preference aggregation rule*, \(F\), is a
function that assigns to each profile \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots
,R_n\rangle\) (in some domain of admissible profiles) a social
preference relation \(R = F(R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n)\) on \(X\). When
\(F\) is clear from the context, we simply write \(R\) for the social
preference relation corresponding to \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots
,R_n\rangle\).

For any \(x, y \in X\), *xRy* means that \(x\) is socially
weakly preferred to \(y\). We also write \(xPy\) if \(xRy\) and not
\(yRx\) (‘\(x\) is strictly socially preferred to \(y\)’),
and \(xIy\) if \(xRy\) and \(yRx\) (‘\(x\) and \(y\) are
socially tied’). For generality, the requirement that \(R\) be
complete and transitive is not built into the definition of a
preference aggregation rule.

The paradigmatic example of a preference aggregation rule is
*pairwise majority voting*, as discussed by Condorcet. Here,
for any profile \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\) and any \(x,
y \in X\), \(xRy\) if and only if at least as many individuals have
\(xR_i y\) as have \(yR_i x\), formally \(|\{i \in N : xR_i y\}| \ge
|\{i \in N : yR_i x\}|.\) As we have seen, this does not guarantee
transitive social
preferences.^{[5]}

How frequent are intransitive majority preferences? It can be shown that the proportion of preference profiles (among all possible ones) that lead to cyclical majority preferences increases with the number of individuals \((n)\) and the number of alternatives \((|X|).\) If all possible preference profiles are equally likely to occur (the so-called ‘impartial culture’ scenario), majority cycles should therefore be probable in large electorates (Gehrlein 1983). (Technical work further distinguishes between ‘top-cycles’ and cycles below a possible Condorcet-winning alternative.) However, the probability of cycles can be significantly lower under certain systematic, even small, deviations from an impartial culture (List and Goodin 2001: Appendix 3; Tsetlin, Regenwetter, and Grofman 2003; Regenwetter et al. 2006).

### 3.2 Arrow’s theorem

Abstracting from pairwise majority voting, Arrow suggested the following conditions on a preference aggregation rule, \(F\).

Universal domain: The domain of \(F\) is the set of all logically possible profiles of complete and transitive individual preference orderings.

Ordering: For any profile \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(F\), the social preference relation \(R\) is complete and transitive.

Weak Pareto principle: For any profile \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(F\), if for all \(i \in N\), \(xP_i y,\) then \(xPy.\)

Independence of irrelevant alternatives: For any two profiles \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\) and \(\langle R^*_1, R^*_2,\ldots, R^*_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(F\) and any \(x, y \in X\), if for all \(i \in N\), \(R_i\)’s ranking between \(x\) and \(y\) coincides with \(R^*_i\)’s ranking between \(x\) and \(y\), then \(xRy\) if and only if \(xR^*y.\)

Non-dictatorship: There does not exist an individual \(i \in N\) such that, for all \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(F\) and all \(x, y \in X, xP_i y\) implies \(xPy.\)

Universal domain requires the aggregation rule to cope with any level of ‘pluralism’ in its inputs. Ordering requires it to produce ‘rational’ social preferences, avoiding Condorcet cycles. The weak Pareto principle requires that when all individuals strictly prefer alternative \(x\) to alternative \(y\), so does society. Independence of irrelevant alternatives requires that the social preference between any two alternatives \(x\) and \(y\) depend only on the individual preferences between \(x\) and \(y\), not on individuals’ preferences over other alternatives. Non-dictatorship requires that there be no ‘dictator’, who always determines the social preference, regardless of other individuals’ preferences. (Note that pairwise majority voting satisfies all of these conditions except ordering.)

Theorem(Arrow 1951/1963): If \(|X| \gt 2\), there exists no preference aggregation rule satisfying universal domain, ordering, the weak Pareto principle, independence of irrelevant alternatives, and non-dictatorship.

It is evident that this result carries over to the aggregation of other kinds of orderings, as distinct from preference orderings, such as (i) belief orderings over several hypotheses (ordinal credences), (ii) multiple criteria that a single decision maker may use to generate an all-things-considered ordering of several decision options, and (iii) conflicting value rankings to be reconciled.

Examples of other such aggregation problems to which Arrow’s theorem has been applied include: intrapersonal aggregation problems (e.g., May 1954; Hurley 1985), theory choice (e.g., Okasha 2011; cf. Morreau 2015), evidence amalgamation (e.g., Stegenga 2013), the aggregation of multiple similarity orderings into an all-things-considered similarity ordering (e.g., Morreau 2010; Kroedel and Huber 2013), decision-making under normative uncertainty (e.g., MacAskill 2016), and radical interpretation in the face of competing criteria of interpretation choice (Hattiangadi 2020). In each case, the plausibility of Arrow’s theorem depends on the case-specific plausibility of Arrow’s ordinalist framework and the theorem’s conditions.

Generally, if we consider Arrow’s framework appropriate and his conditions indispensable, Arrow’s theorem raises a serious challenge. To avoid it, we must relax at least one of the five conditions or give up the restriction of the aggregation rule’s inputs to orderings and defend the use of richer inputs, as discussed in Section 4. In what follows, we consider non-dictatorial escape routes from Arrow’s theorem.

### 3.3 Possibilities of preference aggregation

#### 3.3.1 Relaxing universal domain

One way to avoid Arrow’s theorem is to relax universal domain.
If the aggregation rule is required to accept as input only preference
profiles that satisfy certain ‘cohesion’ conditions, then
aggregation rules such as pairwise majority voting will produce
complete and transitive social preferences. The best-known cohesion
condition is *single-peakedness* (Black 1948).

A profile \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\) is
*single-peaked* if the alternatives can be aligned from
‘left’ to ‘right’ (e.g., on some cognitive or
ideological dimension) such that each individual has a most preferred
position on that alignment with decreasing preference as alternatives
get more distant (in either direction) from the most preferred
position. Formally, this requires the existence of a linear ordering
\(\Omega\) on \(X\) such that, for every triple of alternatives \(x,
y, z \in X\), if \(y\) lies between \(x\) and \(z\) with respect to
\(\Omega\), it is not the case that \(xR_i y\) and \(zR_i y\) (this
rules out a ‘cave’ between \(x\) and \(z\), at \(y)\).
Single-peakedness is plausible in some democratic contexts. If the
alternatives in \(X\) are different tax rates, for example, each
individual may have a most preferred tax rate (which will be lower for
a libertarian individual than for a socialist) and prefer other tax
rates less as they get more distant from the ideal.

Black (1948) proved that if the domain of the aggregation rule is restricted to the set of all profiles of individual preference orderings satisfying single-peakedness, majority cycles cannot occur, and the most preferred alternative of the median individual relative to the relevant left-right alignment is a Condorcet winner (assuming \(n\) is odd). Pairwise majority voting then satisfies the rest of Arrow’s conditions—a point also discussed in detail by Arrow (1951/1963).

Other domain-restriction conditions with similar implications include
*single-cavedness*, a geometrical mirror image of
single-peakedness (Inada 1964), *separability into two groups*
(*ibid.*), and *latin-squarelessness* (Ward 1965), the
latter two more complicated combinatorial conditions (for a review,
see Gaertner 2001). Sen (1966) showed that all these conditions imply
a weaker condition, *triple-wise value-restriction*. It
requires that, for every triple of alternatives \(x, y, z \in X\),
there exists one alternative in \(\{x, y, z\}\) and one rank \(r \in
\{1, 2, 3\}\) such that no individual ranks that alternative in
\(r\)^{th} place among \(x, y\), and \(z\). For instance, all
individuals may agree that \(y\) is not bottom \((r = 3)\) among \(x,
y\), and \(z\). Triple-wise value-restriction suffices for transitive
majority preferences.

There has been much discussion on whether, and under what conditions, real-world preferences fall into such a restricted domain. It has been suggested, for example, that group deliberation can induce single-peaked preferences, by leading participants to focus on a shared cognitive or ideological dimension (a ‘meta-agreement’) (Miller 1992; Knight and Johnson 1994; Dryzek and List 2003). Experimental evidence from deliberative opinion polls, where participants’ preferences were elicited before and after a period of group deliberation, is consistent with this hypothesis (List, Luskin, Fishkin, and McLean 2013), though further empirical work is needed. For a critical assessment of the idea of deliberation-induced ‘meta-agreement’, see Ottonelli and Porello (2013). For a recent computational study, see Rafiee Rad and Roy (2021).

#### 3.3.2 Relaxing ordering

Preference aggregation rules are normally expected to produce
orderings as their outputs, but sometimes we may only require partial
orderings or not fully transitive binary relations. An aggregation
rule that produces transitive but often incomplete social preferences
is the *Pareto dominance rule*: here, for any profile \(\langle
R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\) and any \(x, y \in X\), \(xRy\) if and
only if, for all \(i \in N\), \(xP_i y\). An aggregation rule that
produces complete but often intransitive social preferences is the
*Pareto extension rule*: here, for any profile \(\langle R_1,
R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\) and any \(x, y \in X\), \(xRy\) if and only
if it is not the case that, for all \(i \in N\), \(yP_i x\). Both
rules have a unanimitarian spirit, giving each individual veto power
either against the *presence* of a weak social preference for
\(x\) over \(y\) or against its *absence*.

Gibbard (1969) proved that even if we replace the requirement of
transitivity with what he called *quasi-transitivity*, the
resulting possibilities of aggregation are still very limited. Call a
preference relation \(R\) *quasi-transitive* if the induced
strict relation \(P\) is transitive (while the indifference relation
\(I\) need not be transitive). Call an aggregation rule
*oligarchic* if there is a subset \(M \subseteq N\) (the
‘oligarchs’) such that (i) if, for all \(i \in M\), \(xP_i
y,\) then \(xPy,\) and (ii) if, for some \(i \in M\), \(xP_i y\), then
\(xRy.\) The Pareto extension rule is an example of an oligarchic
aggregation rule with \(M = N\). In an oligarchy, the oligarchs are
jointly decisive and have individual veto power. Gibbard proved the
following:

Theorem(Gibbard 1969): If \(|X| \gt 2\), there exists no preference aggregation rule satisfying universal domain, quasi-transitivity and completeness of social preferences, the weak Pareto principle, independence of irrelevant alternatives, and non-oligarchy.

#### 3.3.3 Relaxing the weak Pareto principle

The weak Pareto principle is arguably hard to give up. One case in which we may lift it is that of spurious unanimity, where a unanimous preference for \(x\) over \(y\) is based on mutually inconsistent reasons (e.g., Mongin 1997; Gilboa, Samet, and Schmeidler 2004). For instance, two men may each prefer to fight a duel (alternative \(x)\) to not fighting it (alternative \(y)\) because each over-estimates his chances of winning. There may exist no mutually agreeable probability assignment over possible outcomes of the duel (i.e., who would win) that would ‘rationalize’ the unanimous preference for \(x\) over \(y\). In this case, the unanimous preference is a bad indicator of social preferability\(.\) This example, however, depends on the fact that the alternatives of fighting and not fighting are not fully specified outcomes but uncertain prospects. Arguably, the weak Pareto principle is more plausible in cases without uncertainty.

An aggregation rule that becomes possible when the weak Pareto
principle is dropped is an *imposed rule*, where, for any
profile \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\), the social
preference relation \(R\) is an antecedently fixed
(‘imposed’) ordering \(R_{\textit{imposed}}\) of the
alternatives. Though completely unresponsive to individual
preferences, this aggregation rule satisfies the rest of Arrow’s
conditions. Another possibility, which is no less degenerate, would
make one individual an ‘inverse dictator’. Here, for any
profile \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\) and any \(x, y \in
X\), we have \(xRy\) if and only if \(yR_i x,\) where \(i\) is some
antecedently fixed individual. Thus the social preference is always
the opposite of individual \(i\)’s preference. Formally, this
aggregation rule satisfies all of Arrow’s conditions except the
weak Pareto principle.

Although, from a democratic perspective, the idea that unanimous individual preferences should be respected at the social level (at least when the unanimity isn’t ‘spurious’) seems difficult to contest, we will consider a critique of the Pareto principle in Section 3.4 below.

#### 3.3.4 Relaxing independence of irrelevant alternatives

A common way to obtain possible preference aggregation rules is to give up independence of irrelevant alternatives. Almost all familiar voting methods over three or more alternatives that involve some form of preferential voting (with voters being asked to express full or partial preference orderings) violate this condition.

A standard example is *plurality rule*: here, for any profile
\(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\) and any \(x, y \in X\),
\(xRy\) if and only if \(|\{i \in N\) : for all \(z \ne x\), \(xP_i
z\}| \ge |\{i \in N\) : for all \(z \ne y\), \(yP_i z\}|.\)
Informally, alternatives are socially ranked in the order of how many
individuals most prefer each of them. Plurality rule avoids
Condorcet’s paradox, but runs into other problems. Most notably,
an alternative that is majority-dispreferred to every other
alternative may win under plurality rule: if 34% of the voters rank
\(x\) above \(y\) above \(z, 33\)% rank \(y\) above \(z\) above \(x\),
and 33% rank \(z\) above \(y\) above \(x\), plurality rule ranks \(x\)
above each of \(y\) and \(z\), while pairwise majority voting would
rank \(y\) above \(z\) above \(x\) (\(y\) is the Condorcet winner). By
disregarding individuals’ lower-ranked alternatives, plurality
rule also violates the weak Pareto principle. However, plurality rule
may be plausible in ‘restricted informational
environments’, where the balloting procedure collects
information only about voters’ top preferences, not about their
full preference rankings (Goodin and List 2006).

A second example of a preference aggregation rule that violates
independence of irrelevant alternatives is the *Borda count*
(e.g., Saari 1990). Here, for any profile \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots
,R_n\rangle\) and any \(x, y \in X\), \(xRy\) if and only if \(\sum_{i
\in N} |\{z \in X : xR_i z\}| \ge \sum_{i \in N} |\{z \in X : yR_i
z\}|.\) Informally, each voter assigns a score to each alternative,
which depends on its rank in his or her preference ranking. The
most-preferred alternative gets a score of \(k\) (where \(k = |X\)|),
the second-most-preferred alternative a score of \(k - 1\), the
third-most-preferred alternative a score of \(k - 2\), and so on.
Alternatives are then socially ordered in terms of the sums of their
scores across voters: the alternative with the largest sum-total is
top, the alternative with the second-largest sum-total next, and so
on.

To see how this violates independence of irrelevant alternatives, consider the two profiles of individual preference orderings over four alternatives \((x, y, z, w)\) in Tables 3 and 4.

Individual 1 |
Individuals 2 to 7 |
Individuals 8 to 15 | |
---|---|---|---|

1^{st} preference |
\(y\) | \(x\) | \(z\) |

2^{nd} preference |
\(x\) | \(z\) | \(x\) |

3^{rd} preference |
\(z\) | \(w\) | \(y\) |

4^{th} preference |
\(w\) | \(y\) | \(w\) |

Table 3: A profile of individual preference orderings

Individual 1 |
Individuals 2 to 7 |
Individuals 8 to 15 | |
---|---|---|---|

1^{st} preference |
\(x\) | \(x\) | \(z\) |

2^{nd} preference |
\(y\) | \(z\) | \(x\) |

3^{rd} preference |
\(w\) | \(w\) | \(y\) |

4^{th} preference |
\(z\) | \(y\) | \(w\) |

Table 4: A slightly modified profile of individual preference orderings

In Table 3, the Borda scores of the four alternatives are:

- \(x\): \(9 \cdot 3 + 6 \cdot 4 = 51\),
- \(y\): \(1 \cdot 4 + 6 \cdot 1 + 8 \cdot 2 = 26\),
- \(z\): \(1 \cdot 2 + 6 \cdot 3 + 8 \cdot 4 = 52\),
- \(w\): \(1 \cdot 1 + 6 \cdot 2 + 8 \cdot 1 = 21\),

leading to a social preference for \(z\) over \(x\) over \(y\) over \(w\). In Table 4, the Borda scores are:

- \(x\): \(7 \cdot 4 + 8 \cdot 3 = 52\),
- \(y\): \(1 \cdot 3 + 6 \cdot 1 + 8 \cdot 2 = 25\),
- \(z\): \(1 \cdot 1 + 6 \cdot 3 + 8 \cdot 4 = 51\),
- \(w\): \(7 \cdot 2 + 8 \cdot 1 = 22\),

leading to a social preference for \(x\) over \(z\) over \(y\) over \(w\). The only difference between the two profiles lies in Individual 1’s preference ordering, and even here there is no change in the relative ranking of \(x\) and \(z\). Despite identical individual preferences between \(x\) and \(z\) in Tables 3 and 4, the social preference between \(x\) and \(z\) is reversed, a violation of independence of irrelevant alternatives.

Such violations are common in real-world voting rules, and they make preference aggregation potentially vulnerable to strategic voting and/or strategic agenda setting. In Section 3.5, I illustrate this in the case of strategic voting.

### 3.4 The liberal paradox

Although the weak Pareto principle is arguably one of the least contentious ones of Arrow’s conditions, Sen (1970a) offered a critique of it that applies when the aggregation rule is interpreted not as a voting method, but as a social evaluation method which a social planner can use to rank social alternatives in an order of social desirability. Here, the alternatives are understood not as coarse-grained electoral options but as more richly specified states of society. Sen showed that, in this setting, the Pareto principle conflicts with a ‘liberal’ principle, which—he suggested—a social planner ought to respect.

The liberal principle requires that each individual be given some basic rights, to the effect that his or her preferences are sometimes socially decisive (i.e., cannot be overridden by others’ preferences). Intuitively, each individual has a personal sphere in which this individual alone should be able to decide what happens. To give a trivial example, I alone should be able to decide whether I sleep on my right side or on my left side, and the same should be true for everyone else. So, if two social alternatives, \(x\) and \(y\), differ only with respect to the side on which individual \(i\) sleeps, then individual \(i\)’s preference between \(x\) and \(y\) should determine the social preference between \(x\) and \(y\). (Recall that alternatives are here understood as richly specified states of society.) Sen’s ‘minimal liberal’ requirement says that at least two individuals in society should have such a decisiveness right between two alternatives each. The requirement is ‘minimal’ because we would ideally want not just two individuals, but everyone to have such rights, and we would ideally want those rights to concern more than a single pair of alternatives each.

Minimal liberalism: There are at least two distinct individuals \(i, j \in N\) who are each decisive on at least one pair of alternatives; i.e., there is at least one pair of (distinct) alternatives \(x, y \in X\) such that, for every profile \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\), \(xP_i y\) implies \(xPy\), and \(yP_i x\) implies \(yPx,\) and at least one pair of (distinct) alternatives \(x^*, y^* \in X\) such that, for every profile \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\), \(x^*P_j y^*\) implies \(x^*Py^*,\) and \(y^*P_jx^*\) implies \(y^*Px^*.\)

To illustrate the conflict between minimal liberalism and the weak
Pareto principle, Sen asked us to imagine a society that consists of
two individuals, Lewd and Prude, faced with the decision of who among
them (if any) should read a controversial book, *Lady
Chatterley’s Lover*. In Sen’s story, Lewd most prefers
that Prude read the book (alternative \(x)\), second-most prefers that
he (Lewd) read the book himself (alternative \(y)\), and least prefers
that neither of the two read the book \((z)\). Prude most prefers that
neither read the book \((z)\), second-most prefers that he (Prude)
read the book himself \((x)\), and least prefers that Lewd read the
book \((y)\). Assuming Lewd is decisive over the pair \(y\) and \(z\),
society should prefer \(y\) to \(z\). Assuming Prude is decisive over
the pair \(x\) and \(z\), society should prefer \(z\) to \(x\). But
since Lewd and Prude both prefer \(x\) to \(y\), the weak Pareto
principle (applied to \(N = \{\)Lewd, Prude\(\})\) implies that
society should prefer \(x\) to \(y\). So, we are faced with a social
preference cycle: \(x\) is socially preferred to \(y, y\) is socially
preferred to \(z\), and \(z\) socially preferred to \(x\). Sen
generalized this problem—now known as the ‘liberal
paradox’—as follows.

Theorem(Sen 1970a): There exists no preference aggregation rule satisfying universal domain, acyclicity of social preferences, the weak Pareto principle, and minimal liberalism.

This result suggests that if we wish to respect individual rights, we may sometimes have to sacrifice Paretian efficiency. Hence, Sen’s spoke of the ‘impossibility of a Paretian liberal’. An alternative conclusion is that the weak Pareto principle can be rendered compatible with minimal liberalism only if the domain of admissible preference profiles is suitably restricted, for instance to preferences that are ‘tolerant’ or not ‘meddlesome’ (Blau 1975; Craven 1982; Gigliotti 1986; Sen 1983). Lewd’s and Prude’s preferences in Sen’s example are ‘meddlesome’. Each of them ‘meddles’ with the other’s private sphere.

However, several authors have challenged the relevance of Sen’s result, by arguing that his ‘minimal liberalism’ condition uses an inadequate formalization of the notion of individual rights (e.g., Gaertner, Pattanaik, and Suzumura 1992; Dowding and van Hees 2003).

### 3.5 The Gibbard-Satterthwaite theorem

So far we have discussed *preference aggregation rules*, which
map profiles of individual preference orderings to social preference
relations. We now consider *social choice rules*, whose output,
instead, is one or several winning alternatives. Formally, a
*social choice rule*, \(f\), is a function that assigns to each
profile \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\) (in some domain of
admissible profiles) a social choice set \(f(R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n)
\subseteq X\). A social choice rule \(f\) can be derived from a
preference aggregation rule \(F\), by defining \(f(R_1, R_2 , \ldots
,R_n) = \{x \in X\) : for all \(y \in X\), \(xRy\}\) where \(R =
F(R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n)\); the reverse does not generally hold. We
call the set of sometimes-chosen alternatives the *range* of
\(f\).^{[6]}

The *Condorcet winner criterion* defines a social choice rule,
where, for each profile \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\),
\(f(R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n)\) contains every alternative in \(X\) that
wins or at least ties with every other alternative in pairwise
majority voting. As shown by Condorcet’s paradox, this may
produce an empty choice set. By contrast, plurality rule and the Borda
count induce social choice rules that always produce non-empty choice
sets. They also satisfy the following basic conditions (the last for
\(|X| \ge 3)\):

Universal domain: The domain of \(f\) is the set of all logically possible profiles of complete and transitive individual preference orderings.

Non-dictatorship: There does not exist an individual \(i \in N\) such that, for all \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(f\) and all \(x\) in the range of \(f\), \(yR_i x\) where \(y \in f(R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n)\).^{[7]}

The range constraint: The range of \(f\) contains at least three distinct alternatives (and ideally all alternatives in \(X)\).

When supplemented with an appropriate tie-breaking criterion, the plurality and Borda rules can further be made ‘resolute’:

Resoluteness: The social choice rule \(f\) always produces a unique winning alternative (a singleton choice set). (We then write \(x = f(R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n)\) to denote the winning alternative for the profile \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\).)

Surprisingly, this list of conditions conflicts with the following further requirement.

Strategy-proofness: There does not exist a profile \(\langle R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(f\) at which \(f\) is manipulable by some individual \(i \in N\), wheremanipulabilitymeans the following: if \(i\) submits afalsepreference ordering \(R'_i\) \((\ne R_i)\), the winner is an alternative \(y'\) that \(i\) strictly prefers (according to \(R_i)\) to the alternative \(y\) that would win if \(i\) submitted thetruepreference ordering \(R_i\).^{[8]}

Theorem(Gibbard 1973; Satterthwaite 1975): There exists no social choice rule satisfying universal domain, non-dictatorship, the range constraint, resoluteness, and strategy-proofness.

This result raises important questions about the trade-offs between different requirements on a social choice rule. A dictatorship, which always chooses the dictator’s most preferred alternative, is trivially strategy-proof. The dictator obviously has no incentive to vote strategically, and no-one else does so either, since the outcome depends only on the dictator.

To see that the Borda count violates strategy-proofness, recall the example of Tables 3 and 4 above. If Individual 1 in Table 3 truthfully submits the preference ordering \(yP_1 xP_1 zP_1 w\), the Borda winner is \(z\), as we have seen. If Individual 1 falsely submits the preference ordering \(xP_1 yP_1 wP_1 z\), as in Table 4, the Borda winner is \(x\). But Individual 1 prefers \(x\) to \(z\) according to his or her true preference ordering (in Table 3), and so he or she has an incentive to vote strategically.

Moulin (1980) has shown that when the domain of the social choice rule is restricted to single-peaked preference profiles, pairwise majority voting and other so-called ‘median voting’ schemes can satisfy the rest of the conditions of the Gibbard-Satterthwaite theorem. Similarly, when collective decisions are restricted to binary choices alone, which amounts to dropping the range constraint, majority voting satisfies the rest of the conditions. Other possible escape routes from the theorem open up if resoluteness is dropped. In the limiting case in which all alternatives are always chosen, the other conditions are vacuously satisfied.

The requirement of strategy-proofness has been challenged too. One
line of argument is that, even when there exist strategic incentives
in the technical sense of the Gibbard-Satterthwaite theorem,
individuals will not necessarily act on them. They would require
*detailed information* about others’ preferences and
*enough computational power* to figure out what the optimal
strategically modified preferences would be. Neither requirement is
generally met. Bartholdi, Tovey, and Trick (1989) showed that, due to
computational complexity, some social choice rules are resistant to
strategic manipulation: it may be an NP-hard problem for a voter to
determine how to vote strategically. In this vein, Harrison and
McDaniel (2008) provide experimental evidence suggesting that the
‘Kemeny rule’, an extension of pairwise majority voting
designed to avoid Condorcet cycles, is ‘behaviourally
incentive-compatible’: i.e., strategic manipulation is
computationally hard.

Dowding and van Hees (2008) have argued that not all forms of strategic voting are normatively problematic. They distinguish between ‘sincere’ and ‘insincere’ forms of manipulation and argue that only the latter but not the former are normatively troublesome. Sincere manipulation occurs when a voter (i) votes for a compromise alternative whose chances of winning are thereby increased and (ii) genuinely prefers that compromise alternative to the alternative that would otherwise win. For example, in the 2000 US presidential election, supporters of Ralph Nader (a third-party candidate with little chance of winning) who voted for Al Gore to increase his chances of beating George W. Bush engaged in sincere manipulation in the sense of (i) and (ii). Plurality rule is susceptible to sincere manipulation, but not vulnerable to insincere manipulation.

## 4. The aggregation of welfare measures or qualitative ratings

One way to respond to the impossibility results of preference aggregation is to argue that mere rankings of alternatives in an order of preference provide insufficient information for making satisfactory collective decisions. The idea is that if we enrich the informational basis of social choice, we can avoid some of the negative results. This can be done in at least two ways. The first, which has received the most attention, is to replace preference orderings with richer welfare measures, which may allow interpersonal comparisons. The bulk of this section will be devoted to this proposal. A second, recently popular proposal is to replace preference orderings with qualitative ratings of the alternatives. This will be discussed at the end of the section.

### 4.1 Sen’s extension of Arrow’s framework

An assumption built into Arrow’s framework is that preferences are ordinal and not interpersonally comparable: preference orderings contain no information about each individual’s strength of preference or about how to compare different individuals’ preferences with one another. Statements such as ‘Individual 1 prefers alternative \(x\) more than Individual 2 prefers alternative \(y\)’ or ‘Individual l prefers a switch from \(x\) to \(y\) more than Individual 2 prefers a switch from \(x^*\) to \(y^*\)’ are considered meaningless.

In voting contexts, this assumption may be plausible, as we often may not be able to elicit more information from voters than their ordinal rankings of the options. But in welfare-evaluation contexts—when a social planner seeks to rank different social alternatives in an order of social welfare—the use of richer information may be justified. Sen (1970b) generalized Arrow’s framework to incorporate such richer information.

As before, consider a set \(N = \{1, 2, \ldots ,n\}\) of individuals
\((n \ge 2)\) and a set \(X = \{x, y, z, \ldots \}\) of social
alternatives. Now each individual \(i \in N\) has a *welfare
function* \(W_i\) over these alternatives, which assigns a real
number \(W_i (x)\) to each alternative \(x \in X\), interpreted as a
measure of \(i\)’s welfare under alternative \(x\). Any welfare
function on \(X\) induces an ordering on \(X\), but the converse is
not true: welfare functions encode more information. A combination of
welfare functions across the individuals, \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots
,W_n\rangle\), is called a *profile*.

A *social welfare functional* (*SWFL*), also denoted
\(F\), is a function that assigns to each profile \(\langle W_1, W_2 ,
\ldots ,W_n\rangle\) (in some domain of admissible profiles) a social
preference relation \(R = F(W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n)\) on \(X\), with
the familiar interpretation. Again, when \(F\) is clear from the
context, we write \(R\) for the social preference relation
corresponding to \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\). The
*output* of a SWFL is similar to that of a preference
aggregation rule (again, we do not build the completeness or
transitivity of \(R\) into the
definition^{[9]}),
but its *input* is richer.

What we gain from this depends on how much of the enriched informational input we allow ourselves to use in determining society’s preferences: technically, it depends on our assumption about measurability and interpersonal comparability of welfare.

### 4.2 Measurability and interpersonal comparability of welfare

By assigning real numbers to alternatives, welfare profiles contain a
lot of information over and above the profiles of orderings on \(X\)
they induce. Many different assignments of *numbers* to
alternatives can give rise to the same *orderings*. But we may
not consider all this information meaningful. Some of it could be an
artifact of the numerical representation. For example, the difference
between the profile \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and its
scaled-up version \(\langle 10\cdot W_1, 10 \cdot W_2,\ldots , 10\cdot
W_n\rangle\), where everything is the same in proportional terms,
could be like the difference between length measurements in
centimeters and in inches. The two profiles might be seen as
alternative representations of the exact same information, just on
different scales.

To express different assumptions about which information is truly
encoded by a profile of welfare functions and which information is not
(and should thus be seen, at best, as an artifact of the numerical
representation), it is helpful to introduce the notion of
*meaningful statements*. Some examples of statements about
individual welfare that are candidates for meaningful statements are
the following (the present formulations come from List 2003a; for
earlier analyses, see Bossert 1991 and Bossert and Weymark 1996:
Section 5):

A level comparison: Individuali’s welfare under alternative \(x\) is at least as great as individual \(j\)’s welfare under alternative \(y\), formally \(W_i (x) \ge W_j (y)\). (The comparison isintrapersonalif \(i = j\), andinterpersonalif \(i \ne j\).)

A unit comparison: The ratio of [individual \(i\)’s welfare gain or loss if we switch from alternative \(y_1\) to alternative \(x_1\)] to [individual \(j\)’s welfare gain or loss if we switch from alternative \(y_2\) to alternative \(x_2\)] is \(\lambda\), where \(\lambda\) is some real number, formally \(((W_i (x_1) - W_i (y_1)) / (W_j (x_2) - W_j (y_2)) = \lambda\). (Again, the comparison isintrapersonalif \(i = j\), andinterpersonalif \(i \ne j\).)

A zero comparison: Individual \(i\)’s welfare under alternative \(x\) is greater than / equal to / less than zero, formally \(\textit{sign}(W_i (x)) = \lambda\), where \(\lambda \in \{-1, 0, 1\}\) and \(\textit{sign}\) is a real-valued function that maps strictly negative numbers to \(-1\), zero to 0, and strictly positive numbers to \(+1\).

Arrow’s view, as noted, is that only intrapersonal level comparisons are meaningful, while all other kinds of comparisons are not. Sen (1970b) formalized various assumptions about measurability and interpersonal comparability of welfare by (i) defining an equivalence relation on welfare profiles that specifies when two profiles count as ‘containing the same information’, and (ii) requiring any profiles in the same equivalence class to generate the same social preference ordering. Of the three kinds of comparison statements introduced above, the meaningful ones are those that are invariant in each equivalence class. Arrow’s ordinalist assumption can be expressed as follows:

Ordinal measurability with no interpersonal comparability (ONC): Two profiles \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and \(\langle W^*_1, W^*_2,\ldots, W^*_n\rangle\) contain the same information whenever, for each \(i \in N\), \(W^*_i = \phi_i (W_i)\), where \(\phi_i\) is some positive monotonic transformation, possibly different for different individuals.

Thus the individual welfare functions in any profile can be arbitrarily monotonically transformed (‘stretched or squeezed’) without informational loss, thereby ruling out any interpersonal comparisons or even intrapersonal unit comparisons.

If welfare is cardinally measurable but still interpersonally non-comparable, we have:

Cardinal measurability with no interpersonal comparability (CNC): Two profiles \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and \(\langle W^*_1, W^*_2,\ldots, W^*_n\rangle\) contain the same information whenever, for each \(i \in N\), \(W^*_i = a_i W_i + b_i\), where the \(a_i\)s and \(b_i\)s are real numbers (with \(a_i \gt 0)\), possibly different for different individuals.

Here, each individual’s welfare function is unique up to positive affine transformations (‘scaling and shifting’), but there is still no common scale across individuals. This renders intrapersonal level and unit comparisons meaningful, but rules out interpersonal comparisons and zero comparisons.

Interpersonal level comparability is achieved under the following enriched variant of ordinal measurability:

Ordinal measurability with interpersonal level comparability (OLC): Two profiles \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and \(\langle W^*_1, W^*_2,\ldots, W^*_n\rangle\) contain the same information whenever, for each \(i \in N\), \(W^*_i = \phi(W_i)\), where \(\phi\) is the same positive monotonic transformation for all individuals.

Here, a profile of individual welfare functions can be arbitrarily monotonically transformed (‘stretched or squeezed’) without informational loss, but the same transformation must be used for all individuals, thereby rendering interpersonal level comparisons meaningful.

Interpersonal unit comparability is achieved under the following enriched variant of cardinal measurability:

Cardinal measurability with interpersonal unit comparability (CUC): Two profiles \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and \(\langle W^*_1, W^*_2,\ldots, W^*_n\rangle\) contain the same information whenever, for each \(i \in N\), \(W^*_i = aW_i + b_i\), where \(a\) is the same real number for all individuals \((a \gt 0)\) and the \(b_i\)s are real numbers.

Here, the welfare functions in each profile can be re-scaled and shifted without informational loss, but the same scalar multiple (though not necessarily the same shifting constant) must be used for all individuals, thereby rendering interpersonal unit comparisons meaningful.

Zero comparisons, finally, become meaningful under the following enriched variant of ordinal measurability (List 2001):

Ordinal measurability with zero comparability (ONC\(+0)\): Two profiles \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and \(\langle W^*_1, W^*_2,\ldots, W^*_n\rangle\) contain the same information whenever, for each \(i \in N\), \(W^*_i = \phi_i (W_i)\), where \(\phi_i\) is some positive monotonic and zero-preserving transformation, possibly different for different individuals. (Herezero-preservingmeans that \(\phi_i(0) = 0\).)

This allows arbitrary stretching and squeezing of individual welfare
functions without informational loss, *provided the welfare level
of zero remains fixed*, thereby ensuring zero comparability.

Several other measurability and interpersonal comparability assumptions have been discussed in the literature. The following ensures the meaningfulness of interpersonal comparisons of both levels and units:

Cardinal measurability with full interpersonal comparability (CFC): Two profiles \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and \(\langle W^*_1, W^*_2,\ldots, W^*_n\rangle\) contain the same information whenever, for each \(i \in N\), \(W^*_i = aW_i + b\), where \(a, b\) are the same real numbers for all individuals \((a \gt 0)\).

Lastly, intra- and interpersonal comparisons of all *three*
kinds (level, unit, and zero) are meaningful if we accept the
following:

Ratio-scale measurability with full interpersonal comparability (RFC): Two profiles \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and \(\langle W^*_1, W^*_2,\ldots, W^*_n\rangle\) contain the same information whenever, for each \(i \in N\), \(W^*_i = aW_i\), where \(a\) is the same real number for all individuals \((a \gt 0)\).

Which assumption is warranted depends on how welfare is interpreted.
If welfare is *hedonic utility*, which can be experienced only
from a first-person perspective, interpersonal comparisons are harder
to justify than if welfare is the *objective satisfaction of
subjective preferences or desires* (the
*desire-satisfaction* view) or an *objective good or
state* (an *objective-list* view). The desire-satisfaction
view may render interpersonal comparisons empirically meaningful (by
relating the interpersonally significant maximal and minimal levels of
welfare for each individual to the attainment of his or her most and
least preferred alternatives), but arguably not in a normatively
attractive way (Hausman 1995). Different individuals’ most
preferred alternatives may differ significantly with respect to how
costly they are, for instance due to some individuals’ expensive
tastes or adaptive preferences, and it is not obvious whether it is
fair to treat a modest individual’s welfare under,
say, a diet of cheap food as being equal to the welfare of
someone who finds only caviar satisfactory. Resource-based,
functioning-based, or primary-goods-based currencies of welfare, by
contrast, may allow interpersonal comparisons in a way that is less
morally problematic.

### 4.3 Possibilities of welfare aggregation

Once we introduce interpersonal comparisons of welfare levels or units, or zero comparisons, there exist possible SWFLs satisfying the analogues of Arrow’s conditions as well as stronger desiderata. In a welfare-aggregation context, Arrow’s impossibility can therefore be traced to a lack of interpersonal comparability (for detailed analyses, see Sen 1977 and Roberts 1980).

As noted, a SWFL respects a given assumption about measurability and interpersonal comparability if, for any two profiles \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and \(\langle W^*_1, W^*_2,\ldots, W^*_n\rangle\) that are deemed to contain the same information, we have \(F(W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n) = F(W^*_1, W^*_2,\ldots, W^*_n)\). Arrow’s conditions and theorem can be restated as follows:

Universal domain: The domain of \(F\) is the set of all logically possible profiles of individual welfare functions.

Ordering: For any profile \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(F\), the social preference relation \(R\) is complete and transitive.

Weak Pareto principle: For any profile \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(F\), if for all \(i\in N\) \(W_i (x) \gt W_i (y)\), then \(xPy\).

Independence of irrelevant alternatives: For any two profiles \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and \(\langle W^*_1, W^*_2,\ldots, W^*_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(F\) and any \(x, y \in X\), if for all \(i \in N\) \(W_i(x) = W^*_i(x)\) and \(W_i (y) = W^*_i(y)\), then \(xRy\) if and only if \(xR^*y\).

Non-dictatorship: There does not exist an individual \(i \in N\) such that, for all \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(F\) and all \(x, y \in X, W_i (x) \gt W_i (y)\) implies \(xPy\).

Theorem: Under ONC (or CNC, as Sen 1970b has shown), if \(|X| \gt 2\), there exists no SWFL satisfying universal domain, ordering, the weak Pareto principle, independence of irrelevant alternatives, and non-dictatorship.

Crucially, however, each of OLC, CUC, and ONC\(+0\) is sufficient for the existence of SWFLs satisfying all other conditions:

Theorem(combining several results from the literature, as illustrated below): Under each of OLC, CUC, and ONC\(+0\), there exist SWFLs satisfying universal domain, ordering, the weak Pareto principle, independence of irrelevant alternatives, and non-dictatorship (as well as stronger conditions).

Some examples of such SWFLs come from political philosophy and welfare economics. A possible SWFL under OLC is a version of Rawls’s difference principle (1971).

Maximin: For any profile \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and any \(x, y \in X\), \(xRy\) if and only if \(\min_{i\in N}(W_i (x)) \ge \min_{i \in N}(W_i (y))\).

While maximin rank-orders social alternatives in terms of the welfare
level of the worst-off individual alone, its lexicographic extension
(*leximin*), which was endorsed by Rawls himself, uses the
welfare level of the second-worst-off individual as a tie-breaker when
there is tie at the level of the worst off, the welfare level of the
third-worst-off individual as a tie-breaker when there is a tie at the
second stage, and so on. (Note, however, that Rawls focused on primary
goods, rather than welfare, as the relevant ‘currency’.)
This satisfies the *strong* (not just weak) *Pareto
principle*, requiring that if for all \(i\in N\) \(W_i (x) \ge W_i
(y)\), then \(xRy\), and if in addition for some \(i \in N\) \(W_i (x) \gt
W_i (y)\), then \(xPy.\)

An example of a possible SWFL under CUC is classical utilitarianism.

Utilitarianism: For any profile \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and any \(x, y \in X\), \(xRy\) if and only if \(W_1 (x) + W_2 (x) + \ldots + W_n (x) \ge W_1 (y) + W_2 (y) + \ldots + W_n (y)\).

Finally, an example of a possible SWFL under ONC\(+0\) is a variant of a frequently used, though rather simplistic poverty measure.

A head-count rule: For any profile \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and any \(x, y \in X\), \(xRy\) if and only if \(|\{i \in N : W_i (x) \lt 0\}| \lt |\{i \in N : W_i (y) \lt 0\}|\) or \([|\{i \in N : W_i (x) \lt 0\}| = |\{i \in N : W_i (y) \lt 0\}|\) and \(xR_jy],\) where \(j \in N\) is some antecedently fixed tie-breaking individual.

While substantively less compelling than maximin or utilitarian rules, head-count rules require only zero-comparability of welfare (List 2001).

An important conclusion, therefore, is that Rawls’s difference principle, the classical utilitarian principle, and even the head-count method of poverty measurement can all be seen as solutions to Arrow’s aggregation problem that become possible once we go beyond Arrow’s framework of ordinal, interpersonally non-comparable preferences.

Under CFC, one can provide a simultaneous characterization of Rawlsian
maximin and utilitarianism (Deschamps and Gevers 1978). It uses two
additional axioms. One, *minimal equity*, requires (in the
words of Sen 1977: 1548) ‘that a person who is going to be best
off anyway does not *always* strictly have his way’, and
another, *separability*, requires that two welfare profiles
that coincide for some subset \(M \subseteq N\) while everyone in
\(N\setminus M\) is indifferent between all alternatives in \(X\) lead
to the same social ordering.

Theorem(Deschamps and Gevers 1978): Under CFC, any SWFL satisfying universal domain, ordering, the strong Pareto principle, independence of irrelevant alternatives, anonymity (as in May’s theorem), minimal equity, and separability is either leximin or of a utilitarian type (meaning that, except possibly when there are ties in sum-total welfare, it coincides with the utilitarian SWFL defined above).

Finally, the additional information available under RFC makes
‘prioritarian’ SWFLs
possible.^{[10]}
Like utilitarian SWFLs, they rank-order social alternatives on the
basis of welfare sums across the individuals in \(N\), but rather than
summing up welfare directly, they sum up concavely transformed
welfare, giving greater marginal weight to lower levels of
welfare.

\[ W_1^r(x) + W_2^r (x) + \ldots + W_n ^r(x) \ge W_1^r (y) + W_2^r (y) + \ldots + W_n ^r(y),\]

Prioritarianism: For any profile \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and any \(x, y \in X\), \(xRy\) if and only ifwhere \(0 \lt r \lt 1\).

Prioritarianism requires RFC and not merely CFC because, by design, the prioritarian social ordering for any welfare profile is not invariant under changes in welfare levels (shifting).

### 4.4 Applications

The present welfare-aggregation framework has been applied to several areas. Elements of it have been used in analyses of distributive justice (e.g., Roemer 1996), proposed as improvements over standard cost-benefit analysis in policy-making contexts (e.g., Adler 2012, 2019), and applied to health economics (e.g., Tsuchiya and Miyamoto 2009).

The framework has also been generalized to variable-population choice problems, so as to formalize population ethics in the tradition of Parfit (1984). Here, we must rank-order social alternatives (e.g., possible worlds) in which different individuals exist. Let \(N(x)\) denote the set of individuals existing under alternative \(x\). For example, the set \(N(x)\) could differ from the set \(N(y)\), when \(x\) and \(y\) are distinct alternatives (this generalizes our previous assumption of a fixed set \(N)\). The variable-population case raises questions such as whether a world with a smaller number of better-off individuals is better than, equally good as, or worse than a world with a larger number of worse-off individuals. (The focus here is on axiological questions about the relative goodness of such worlds, not normative questions about the rightness or wrongness of bringing them about.)

Parfit (1984) and others argued that classical utilitarianism is
subject to the *repugnant conclusion*: a world with a very
large number of individuals whose welfare levels are barely above zero
could have a larger sum-total of welfare, and therefore count as
better, than a world with a smaller number of very well-off
individuals.

Blackorby, Donaldson, and Bossert (e.g., 2005) have axiomatically characterized different variable-population welfare aggregation methods that avoid the repugnant conclusion and satisfy some other desiderata. One solution is the following:

\[ \sum_{i\in N(x)}[W_i (x) - c] \ge \sum_{i\in N(y)}[W_i(y) - c], \]

Critical-level utilitarianism: For any profile \(\langle W_1, W_2 , \ldots ,W_n\rangle\) and any \(x, y \in X\), \(xRy\) if and only ifwhere \(c \ge 0\) is some ‘critical level’ of welfare above which the quality of life counts as ‘decent/good’.

Critical-level utilitarianism avoids the repugnant conclusion when the parameter \(c\) is set sufficiently large. It requires stronger measurability of welfare than classical utilitarianism, since it generates a social ordering \(R\) that is not generally invariant under re-scaling of welfare units or shifts in welfare levels. Even the rich setting of RFC would force the critical level \(c\) to be zero, thereby collapsing critical-level utilitarianism into classical utilitarianism and making it vulnerable to the repugnant conclusion again. As Blackorby, Bossert, and Donaldson (1999: 420) note,

‘[s]ome information environments that are ethically adequate in fixed-population settings have ethically unattractive consequences in variable-population environments.’

Thus, in the variable-population case, a more significant enrichment of the informational basis of Arrow’s original framework is needed to avoid impossibility results.

The SWFL approach has been generalized to the case in which each individual has multiple welfare functions (e.g., a \(k\)-tuple of them), capturing (i) multiple opinions about each individual’s welfare (e.g., Roberts 1995; Ooghe and Lauwers 2005) or (ii) multiple dimensions of welfare (e.g., List 2004a). In this case, we are faced not only with issues of measurability and interpersonal comparability, but also with issues of inter-opinion or inter-dimensional comparability. To obtain compelling possibility results, comparability across both individuals and dimensions/opinions is needed. A related literature addresses multidimensional inequality measurement (for an introductory review, see Weymark 2006).

In the philosophy of biology, the one-dimensional and multi-dimensional SWFL frameworks have been used (by Okasha 2009 and Bossert, Qi, and Weymark 2013) to analyse the notion of group fitness, defined as a function of individual fitness indicators.

### 4.5 From rankings to ratings

A distinct way of amending the informational basis of social choice, which is also feasible in electoral contexts, is to ask voters to express qualitative ratings, rather than rankings, of the alternatives. Two such proposals have received particular attention: first, ‘approval voting’, and secondly, more general forms of ‘grade aggregation’.

Approval voting only modifies rather than enriches the informational
basis of social choice. Here, individuals indicate which alternatives
they approve of, where ‘approving’ can mean something like
saying ‘yes’ to an alternative, or ‘good’, or
‘satisfactory’. Each individual can approve of as many or
as few alternatives as he or she wishes. This partitions the set of
alternatives into two subsets: the approved and the non-approved ones.
Alternatives are not fully ranked from top to bottom. Formally, for
each individual \(i \in N\), let \(A_i\) be the subset of \(X\)
consisting of those alternatives which individual \(i\) approves of.
Then the set \(X\setminus A_i\) contains the non-approved
alternatives. Call \(A_i\) individual \(i\)’s *approval
ballot*. The task is to find a way of aggregating any given
profile of approval ballots, \(\langle A_1, A_2 , \ldots
,A_n\rangle\), into a collective outcome, which also takes the form of
a subset of \(X\), consisting of the collectively approved or winning
alternatives. Thus an *aggregation rule* is a function \(f\)
that assigns to each profile \(\langle A_1, A_2 , \ldots ,A_n\rangle\)
(typically in the domain of all possible approval ballots) a subset of
\(X\), denoted \(f(A_1, A_2 , \ldots ,A_n)\).

Brams and Fishburn (1978, 1983) proposed the following aggregation
rule, which they called *approval voting*: for each profile
\(\langle A_1, A_2 , \ldots ,A_n\rangle\), the set \(f(A_1, A_2 ,
\ldots ,A_n)\) of winning alternatives consists of all those
alternatives that receive the largest number of individual approvals,
i.e., all those alternatives \(x \in X\) such that, for every other
alternative \(y \in X\), \(|\{i \in N : x \in A_i\}| \ge |\{i \in N :
y\in A_i\}|.\)

We can think of approval voting as a generalization of plurality rule. Under plurality rule, each voter votes for only one alternative—normally his or her most preferred one—and the alternative with the largest number of votes wins (or if there are several alternatives with an equal largest number of votes, they are tied for winning). Under approval voting, each voter can instead vote for any number of alternatives; again, the alternative with the most votes wins (or there may be ties). Plurality rule is like approval voting with a domain restriction to approval ballots in which each voter may approve of only one alternative. While it may seem counterintuitive to allow different voters to vote for different numbers of alternatives, note that approving of more alternatives does not necessarily give a voter more influence. In the limit, approving of all alternatives is equivalent to abstaining or approving of none of them, since such an approval ballot makes no difference to the relative vote tallies. Approval voting can also be interpreted as implementing a form of ‘yes’/‘no’ or ‘pass’/‘fail’ grading of the alternatives. For an alternative to ‘win’ or to be collectively ‘approved’, it must secure a maximal number of ‘yes’ or ‘pass’ grades.

There is some debate on whether approval voting incentivizes voters to
express their evaluations of the alternatives truthfully. If the
individuals’ underlying preferences are *dichotomous*
(i.e., they each partition the alternatives into only two indifference
classes, namely the preferred and the dispreferred alternatives), then
approval voting is strategy-proof, and each voter has an incentive to
vote for all and only his or her preferred alternatives (Brams and
Fishburn 1978). However, if preferences aren’t dichotomous, then
approval voting loses this property (Niemi 1984). The real-world
strategic incentives under approval voting thus depend on the
structure of the voters’ preferences.

Approval voting can be axiomatically characterized in terms of adjusted versions of May’s four condition, extended to the setting of approval balloting. Specifically, approval voting is the unique aggregation rule for approval ballots that satisfies universal domain, neutrality, positive responsiveness, and a strengthened version of anonymity called ‘optionwise anonymity’ (Goodin and List 2006). The latter condition formalizes a principle that Brams and Fishburn informally describe as follows: ‘In effect, the principle of “one person, one vote” under plurality voting becomes the principle of “one candidate, one vote” under approval voting. That is, each voter makes judgments about every candidate under approval voting, so the tie-in of a vote is not to the voter but rather to the candidate’ (Brams and Fishburn 1983: 12). For other axiomatic characterizations, see Fishburn (1978, 1988) and Sertel (1988). For extensions of approval voting to settings in which voters express not only approvals but also full rankings of the alternatives, see Brams and Sanver (2009).

While approval voting implements a form of
‘yes’/‘no’ or
‘pass’/‘fail’ grading of the alternatives, a
more general grading-based approach to social choice has been
advocated by Balinski and Laraki (2007, 2011). Under their proposal,
voters each assign grades to the alternatives, drawn for instance from
the familiar spectrum of school grades A, B, C etc., and these grades
are then aggregated into collective grades, on the basis of which a
winning alternative can be chosen. Their preferred version of this
proposal—which they call ‘majority
judgment’—defines each alternative’s collective
grade as a *median grade* relative to the
individually assigned grades, i.e., a grade that divides the
individuals into an equal number whose grade is no lower and an equal
number whose grade is no higher. For instance, if an alternative
receives the grades A, B, B, E, and E from a group of five
individuals, then the median grade is B. When the number of
individuals is even, there could be an interval of median or
‘middlemost’ grades. An attractive
feature of this way of defining the collective grade is
that ‘every grade other than a grade in the middlemost
interval is condemned by an absolute majority of the judges as being
either too high or too low’ (Balinski and Laraki 2007:
8723). Balinski and Laraki further argue that this proposal would
lead voters to express considered evaluations of the alternatives in
an intuitively intelligible format and incentivize truthfulness, as
discussed below.

To formalize this, let \(S\) be the set of all available grades
(‘\(S\)’ for grading scale), where \(S\) is non-empty and
linearly ordered from highest to lowest. For instance, \(S\) could be
\(\{\)A, B, C, D, E\(\}\) or \(\{ \text{Distinction,}\)
\(\text{Merit,}\) \(\text{Pass,}\) \(\text{Fail}\}.\)
Each individual \(i\)’s *assignment of
grades* to the alternatives in \(X\) is a function \(G_i\) that
assigns to each element \(x \in X\) a grade \(G_i (x)\) from the set
\(S\). A combination of grade assignments across the individuals in
\(N\), \(\langle G_1, G_2 , \ldots ,G_n\rangle\), is called a
*profile of grade assignments*. A *grade aggregation
rule* is a function \(f\) that assigns to each profile of grade
assignments \(\langle G_1, G_2 , \ldots ,G_n\rangle\) (in some domain
of admissible ones) a collective grade assignment \(G = f(G_1, G_2 ,
\ldots ,G_n)\), where, for each \(x \in X, G(x)\) is the collective
grade for \(x\).

Balinski and Laraki propose several conditions that a satisfactory
grade aggregation rule should satisfy. In particular, they suggest
that \(f\) should be (i) defined for the *universal domain* of
all possible profiles of individual grade assignments; (ii)
*neutral* in the familiar sense of treating all alternatives
equally; (iii) *anonymous* in the equally familiar sense of
treating all voters equally; (iv) *unanimous* in the sense that
if all individuals assign the same grade to an alternative, this
becomes the collective grade; (v) *monotonic* in the sense
that if some individuals raise their grade for an alternative (other
grades remaining equal), this doesn’t lower the resulting
collective grade, and if all individuals raise the grade, this
correspondingly raises the collective grade; (vi) *independent of
irrelevant alternatives* in the sense that the collective grade
for any alternative depends only on the individual grades for that
alternative, not on the individual grades for other alternatives, and
(vii) *continuous* (which becomes relevant when \(S\) is a
subset of the real numbers) in the sense that small changes in the
individual grades for an alternative lead only to small changes in the
collective grade. A grade aggregation rule that satisfies conditions
(i) to (vii) is called a *social grading function*.

Balinski and Laraki show that, among the social grading functions, the
so-called ‘order methods’ stand out. For any given profile
of individual grade assignments \(\langle G_1, G_2 , \ldots
,G_n\rangle\), an *order method* (with parameter \(k)\) assigns
to each alternative \(x \in X\) the \(k\)^{th} highest grade
the alternative has been individually assigned, i.e., the
\(k\)^{th} highest grade in the list \(G_1 (x), G_2 (x),
\ldots ,G_n (x)\). The most salient example of an order method is the
*median method*, already mentioned above, which assigns to each
option the median grade it has been individually assigned. This is the
order method with parameter \(k = (n+1)/2\), when \(n\) is odd. (When
\(n\) is even, the definition requires some adjustment.) The following
result holds:

Theorem(Balinski and Laraki 2007): A social grading function is strategy-proof in grading if and only if it is an order method.

Here, a grade aggregation rule is said to be *strategy-proof in
grading* if it satisfies two conditions: first, when an
individual’s grade for an alternative \(x \in X\) is higher than
the collectively assigned grade, then this individual can at most
lower (and never raise) the collective grade for \(x\) by unilaterally
changing his or her individual grade; and second, when an
individual’s grade for an alternative \(x \in X\) is lower than
the collectively assigned grade, then this individual can at most
raise (and never lower) the collective grade for \(x\) by unilaterally
changing his or her individual grade. Strategy-proofness in grading
means that, when the goal is to assign collective grades to the
alternatives in \(X\) and voters each seek to achieve collective
grades that are as close as possible to their individual grades,
they will not be incentivized to misrepresent their grades. In short,
truthful expression of grades will be a (weakly) dominant
strategy.

However, incentives to vote strategically may reoccur if the
collectively assigned grades are used to choose one of the
alternatives. As Balinski and Laraki point out, ‘[w]hen rank
orderings are the principal goal instead of grades, the strategic
behavior of the judges may change’ (2007: 8724), and
*strategy-proofness in ranking* as opposed to
*strategy-proofness in grading* is not achievable in a social
grading function (*ibid.*), a result somewhat analogous to the
Gibbard-Satterthwaite theorem. Note further that the collective grades
alone are often insufficient to determine a unique winning
alternative; two or more alternatives might each receive the same top
grade. This raises to question of how to break such ties in the
grades, and a number of possible criteria have been proposed. For
discussion, see Fabre (2021).

The key challenge for the grading-based approach to social choice is to ensure that the grades have a common meaning for all voters. Unless an ‘A’-grade, for instance, has the same meaning for all voters, the entire exercise of aggregating individually assigned grades would not be meaningful. Some voters might be tougher graders than others, and it will then not be possible to infer that an ‘A’-grade from one voter is a stronger quality signal than a ‘B’-grade from another. Just as Sen’s SWFL approach avoids the impossibility results of social choice only if we can assume interpersonal comparability of welfare, so the grading-based approach allows us to make meaningful social choices only if grades are interpersonally comparable in an appropriate sense. For a technical development of this critique of the grading-based approach, see Morreau (2016).

## 5. The aggregation of judgments

The objective of a collective decision need not always be the choice of a winning alternative or the ranking of several alternatives in an order of social preference. Rather, many decision-making bodies have to aggregate individual sets of judgments on multiple, logically connected propositions into collective sets of judgments.

A court may have to judge whether a defendant is liable for breach of contract on the basis of whether there was a valid contract in place and whether there was a breach. An expert panel may have to judge whether atmospheric greenhouse-gas concentrations will exceed a particular threshold by 2050, whether there is a causal chain from greater greenhouse-gas concentrations to temperature increases, and whether the temperature will increase. Legislators may have to judge whether a particular end is socially desirable, whether a proposed policy is the best means for achieving that end, and whether to pursue that policy.

In each case, the ‘aggreganda’ are not simply preference orderings, welfare assignments, or ratings over some set of alternatives, as in the models discussed in the previous sections. Rather, the ‘aggreganda’ are entire systems of judgments or beliefs on some interconnected issues. The theory of judgment aggregation represents them using formal logic. At the end of this section, we also briefly consider the aggregation of probabilistic judgments or credences.

### 5.1 The paradoxes of judgment aggregation

The contemporary field of judgment-aggregation theory was inspired by a series of ‘paradoxes’, with which we begin. Kornhauser and Sager (1986) described the following problem, now known as the ‘doctrinal paradox’. (A structurally similar problem was discovered by Vacca 1921 and, as Elster 2013 points out, by Poisson 1837.) A three-judge court has to make judgments on the following propositions:

- \(p\): The defendant was contractually obliged not to do action \(X\).
- \(q\): The defendant did action \(X\).
- \(r\): The defendant is liable for breach of contract.

According to legal doctrine, the *premises* \(p\) and \(q\) are
jointly necessary and sufficient for the *conclusion* \(r\).
Suppose the individual judges hold the views shown in Table 5.

\(p\) (obligation) |
\(q\) (action) |
\(r\) (liability) | |
---|---|---|---|

Judge 1 |
True | True | True |

Judge 2 |
False | True | False |

Judge 3 |
True | False | False |

Majority |
True | True | False |

Table 5: An example of the ‘doctrinal paradox’

Although each individual judge respects the relevant legal doctrine,
there is a majority for \(p\), a majority for \(q\), and yet a
majority against \(r\)—in breach of the legal doctrine. The
court faces a dilemma: it can *either* go with the majority
judgments on the premises \((p\) and \(q)\) and reach a
‘liable’ verdict by logical inference (the
*issue-by-issue* or *premise-based approach*); \(or\) go
with the majority judgment on the conclusion \((r)\) and reach a
‘not liable’ verdict, ignoring the majority judgments on
the premises (the *case-by-case* or *conclusion-based
approach*). The ‘doctrinal paradox’ consists in the
fact that these two approaches may lead to opposite outcomes.

We can learn another lesson from this example. Relative to the legal
doctrine, the majority judgments are logically inconsistent. Formally
expressed, the set of majority-accepted propositions, \(\{p, q\),
*not r*\(\}\), is inconsistent relative to the constraint \(r\)
*if and only if* \((p\) *and* \(q)\). This observation
was the starting point of the more recent, formal-logic-based
literature on judgment aggregation.

The possibility of inconsistent majority judgments is not tied to the presence of a legal doctrine or other explicit side constraint (as pointed out by Pettit 2001, who called this phenomenon the ‘discursive dilemma’). Suppose, for example, an expert panel has to make judgments on three propositions (and their negations):

- \(p\): Atmospheric CO\(_2\) will exceed 600ppm by 2050.
*if*\(p\)*then*\(q\): If atmospheric CO\(_2\) exceeds this level by 2050, there will be a temperature increase of more than 3.5° by 2100.- \(q\): There will be a temperature increase of more than 3.5° by 2100.

If individual judgments are as shown in Table 6, the majority
judgments are inconsistent: despite individually consistent judgments,
the set of majority-accepted propositions, \(\{p\), *if* \(p\)
*then* \(q\), *not* \(q\}\), is logically
inconsistent.

\(p\) | if \(p\) then \(q\) |
\(q\) | |
---|---|---|---|

Expert 1 |
True | True | True |

Expert 2 |
False | True | False |

Expert 3 |
True | False | False |

Majority |
True | True | False |

Table 6: A majoritarian inconsistency

Note that the patterns of judgments in Tables 5 and 6 are structurally equivalent to the pattern of preferences leading to Condorcet’s paradox when we reinterpret those preferences as judgments on propositions of the form ‘\(x\) is preferable to \(y\)’, ‘\(y\) is preferable to \(z\)’, and so on, as shown in Table 7 (List and Pettit 2004; an earlier interpretation of preferences along these lines can be found in Guilbaud [1952] 1966). Here, the set of majority-accepted propositions is inconsistent relative to the constraint of transitivity.

‘x preferable to y’ |
‘y preferable to z’ |
‘x preferable to z’ | |
---|---|---|---|

Individual 1
(prefers \(x\) to \(y\) to \(z)\) |
True | True | True |

Individual 2
(prefers \(y\) to \(z\) to \(x)\) |
False | True | False |

Individual 3
(prefers \(z\) to \(x\) to \(y)\) |
True | False | False |

Majority
(prefers \(x\) to \(y\) to \(z\) to \(x\), a ‘cycle’) |
True | True | False |

Table 7: Condorcet’s paradox, propositionally reinterpreted

A general combinatorial result subsumes all these phenomena. Call a
set of propositions *minimal inconsistent* if it is a logically
inconsistent set, but all its proper subsets are consistent.

Proposition(Dietrich and List 2007a; Nehring and Puppe 2007): Propositionwise majority voting may generate inconsistent collective judgments if and only if the set of propositions (and their negations) on which judgments are to be made has a minimal inconsistent subset of three or more propositions.

In the examples of Tables 6, 5, and 7, the minimal inconsistent sets
of size (at least) three are: \(\{p\), *if p then q*, *not
q*\(\}\), which is minimal inconsistent *simpliciter*;
\(\{p, q\), *not r*\(\}\), which is minimal inconsistent
relative to the side constraint *r if and only if* (*p and
q*); and \(\{\)‘\(x\) is preferable to \(y\)’,
‘\(y\) is preferable to \(z\)’, ‘\(z\) is preferable
to \(x \textrm{'} \}\), which is minimal inconsistent relative to a
transitivity constraint on preferability.

### 5.2 The basic framework and a simple impossibility result

The problem of judgment aggregation can be formalized as follows. Let
\(N = \{1, 2, \ldots ,n\}\) be a set of individuals \((n \ge 2)\). The
propositions on which judgments are to be made are represented by
sentences from propositional logic (or some other, expressively richer
logic, such as a predicate, modal, or conditional logic, as discussed
in Dietrich 2007). We define the *agenda*, \(X\), as a finite
set of propositions, closed under single negation
\((\neg)\).^{[11]}
For example, \(X\) could be \(\{p, \neg p, p\rightarrow q,
\neg(p\rightarrow q), q, \neg q\}\), as in the expert-panel case.

Each individual \(i \in N\) has a *judgment set* \(J_i\),
defined as a subset \(J_i \subseteq X\) and interpreted as the set of
propositions that individual \(i\) accepts. A judgment set is
*consistent* if it is a logically consistent set of
propositions^{[12]}
and *complete* (relative to \(X)\) if it contains a member of
every proposition-negation pair \(p, \neg p \in X\).

A combination of judgment sets across the individuals, \(\langle J_1,
J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle\), is called a *profile*. A
*judgment aggregation rule*, \(F\), is a function that assigns
to each profile \(\langle J_1, J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle\) (in some
domain of admissible profiles) a collective judgment set \(J = F(J_1,
J_2 , \ldots ,J_n) \subseteq X\), interpreted as the set of
propositions accepted by the group as a whole. As before, when \(F\)
is clear from the context, we write \(J\) for the collective judgment
set corresponding to \(\langle J_1, J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle\). Again,
for generality, we build no rationality requirement on \(J\) (such as
consistency or completeness) into the definition of a judgment
aggregation rule.

The simplest example of a judgment aggregation rule is
*propositionwise majority voting*. Here, for any profile
\(\langle J_1, J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle,\) \(J = \{p \in X : |\{i \in N :
p \in J_i\}| \gt n/2\}\). As we have seen, this may produce
inconsistent collective judgments.

Consider the following conditions on an aggregation rule:

Universal domain: The domain of \(F\) is the set of all logically possible profiles of consistent and complete individual judgment sets.

Collective rationality: For any profile \(\langle J_1, J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(F\), the collective judgment set \(J\) is consistent and complete.

Anonymity: For any two profiles \(\langle J_1, J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle\) and \(\langle J^*_1, J^*_2, \ldots ,J^*_n\rangle\) that are permutations of each other, \(F(J_1, J_2 , \ldots ,J_n) = F(J^*_1, J^*_1, \ldots ,J^*_n)\).

Systematicity: For any two profiles \(\langle J_1, J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle\) and \(\langle J^*_1, J^*_2, \ldots ,J^*_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(F\) and any \(p, q \in X\), if for all \(i \in N\), \(p \in J_i\) if and only if \(q \in J^*_i\), then \(p \in J\) if and only if \(q \in J^*.\)

The first three conditions are analogous to universal domain,
ordering, and anonymity in preference aggregation. The last is the
counterpart of independence of irrelevant alternatives, though
stronger: it requires that (i) the collective judgment on any
proposition \(p \in X\) (of which a binary ranking proposition such as
‘\(x\) is preferable to \(y\)’ is a special case) depend
only on individual propositions on \(p\) (the *independence*
part), and (ii) the pattern of dependence between individual and
collective judgments be the same across all propositions in \(X\) (the
*neutrality* part). Formally, *independence* is the
special case with quantification restricted to \(p = q\).
Propositionwise majority voting satisfies all these conditions, except
the consistency part of collective rationality.

Theorem(List and Pettit 2002): If \(\{p, q, p\wedge q\} \subseteq X\) (where \(p\) and \(q\) are mutually independent propositions and ‘\(\wedge\)’ can also be replaced by ‘\(\vee\)’ or ‘\(\rightarrow\)’), there exists no judgment aggregation rule satisfying universal domain, collective rationality, anonymity, and systematicity.

Like other impossibility theorems, this result is best interpreted as describing the trade-offs between different conditions on an aggregation rule. The result has been generalized and strengthened in various ways, beginning with Pauly and van Hees’s (2006) proof that the impossibility persists if anonymity is weakened to non-dictatorship (for other generalizations, see Dietrich 2006 and Mongin 2008).

### 5.3 More general impossibility results

As we have seen, in preference aggregation, the ‘boundary’ between possibility and impossibility results is easy to draw: when there are only two decision alternatives, all of the desiderata on a preference aggregation rule reviewed above can be satisfied (and majority rule does the job); when there are three or more alternatives, there are impossibility results. In judgment aggregation, by contrast, the picture is more complicated. What matters is not the number of propositions in \(X\) but the nature of the logical interconnections between them.

Impossibility results in judgment aggregation have the following generic form: for a given class of agendas, the aggregation rules satisfying a particular set of conditions (usually, a domain condition, a rationality condition, and some responsiveness conditions) are non-existent or degenerate (e.g., dictatorial). Different kinds of agendas trigger different instances of this scheme, with stronger or weaker conditions on the aggregation rule leading to an impossibility depending on the properties of the agenda. The significance of combinatorial properties of the agenda was first discovered by Nehring and Puppe (2002, Other Internet Resources) in a mathematically related but interpretationally distinct framework (strategy-proof social choice over so-called property spaces). Three kinds of agenda stand out:

A non-simple agenda: \(X\) has a minimal inconsistent subset of three or more propositions.

A pair-negatable agenda: \(X\) has a minimal inconsistent subset \(Y\) that can be rendered consistent by negating a pair of propositions in it. (Equivalently, \(X\) is not isomorphic to a set of propositions whose only connectives are \(\neg\) and \(\leftrightarrow\) in standard propositional logic; see Dokow and Holzman 2010a.)

A path-connected agenda(ortotally blocked, in Nehring and Puppe 2002, Other Internet Resources): Any pair of contingent propositions in \(X\) is connected by a path of conditional entailments. Formally, for any contingent \(p, q \in X\), there exist \(p_1, p_2 , \ldots ,p_k \in X\) with \(p_1 = p\) and \(p_k = q\) such that \(p_1\) conditionally entails \(p_2, p_2\) conditionally entails \(p_3,\ldots\), and \(p_{k-1}\) conditionally entails \(p_k\). (Here, \(p_i\)conditionally entails\(p_j\) if \(p_i \cup Y\) entails \(p_j\) for some \(Y \subseteq X\) consistent with each of \(p_i\) and \(\neg p_j\); and \(p\) iscontingentif neither \(\{p\}\), nor \(\{\neg p\}\) is logically inconsistent.)

Some agendas have two or more of these properties. The agendas in our
‘doctrinal paradox’ and ‘discursive dilemma’
examples are both non-simple and pair-negatable. To illustrate, take
the agenda from the expert-panel example, \(X = \{p, \neg p,
p\rightarrow q, \neg(p\rightarrow q), q, \neg q\}\). It is non-simple,
because it has a minimal inconsistent subset of size 3, namely \(\{p,
p\rightarrow q, \neg q\}\), and it is pair-negatable, because it has a
minimal inconsistent subset, namely \(Y = \{p, p\rightarrow q, \neg
q\}\), in which we can find a pair of propositions, namely \(\{p, \neg
q\}\), such that if we replace these with their negations in \(Y\),
the resulting set is consistent (note that \(\{\neg p, p\rightarrow q,
q\}\) is consistent). An example of an agenda which has all three
combinatorial properties is the *preference agenda*, \(X =
\{\)‘\(x\) is preferable to \(y\)’, ‘\(y\) is
preferable to \(x\)’, ‘\(x\) is preferable to
\(z\)’, ‘\(z\) is preferable to \(x\)’, \(\ldots
\}\), assuming preferability is transitive and complete and there are
three or more alternatives \(x, y, z, \ldots\), over which
preferability is defined. The following result holds:

Theorem(Dietrich and List 2007b; Dokow and Holzman 2010a; building on Nehring and Puppe 2002, Other Internet Resources): If \(X\) is non-simple, pair-negatable, and path-connected, there exists no judgment aggregation rule satisfying universal domain, collective rationality, independence, unanimity preservation (requiring that, for any unanimous profile \(\langle J, J, \ldots ,J\rangle,\) \(F(J, J, \ldots ,J) = J)\), and non-dictatorship.^{[13]}

Applied to the preference agenda, this result yields Arrow’s
theorem (for strict preference orderings) as a corollary (for a
precursor result, see Nehring
2003).^{[14]}
Thus Arrovian preference aggregation can be reinterpreted as a
special case of judgment aggregation.

The literature contains several variants of this theorem. One variant
drops the agenda property of path-connectedness and strengthens
independence to systematicity. A second variant drops the agenda
property of pair-negatability and imposes a monotonicity condition on
the aggregation rule (requiring that additional support never hurt an
accepted proposition) (Nehring and Puppe 2010, reformulating a result
from Nehring and Puppe 2002, Other Internet Resources). A final
variant drops both path-connectedness and pair-negatability while
imposing both systematicity and monotonicity (*ibid.*).

In each case, the agenda properties are not only sufficient but also (if \(n \ge 3)\) necessary for the result (Nehring and Puppe 2002 [Other Internet Resources], 2010; Dokow and Holzman 2010a). Note also that path-connectedness implies non-simplicity. Therefore, non-simplicity need not be listed among the theorem’s conditions, though it is needed in the variants dropping path-connectedness.

### 5.4 Possibilities of judgment aggregation

#### 5.4.1 Relaxing universal domain

As in preference aggregation, one way to avoid the present impossibility results is to relax universal domain. If the domain of admissible profiles of individual judgment sets is restricted to those satisfying specific ‘cohesion’ conditions, propositionwise majority voting produces consistent collective judgments.

The simplest cohesion condition is *unidimensional alignment*
(List 2003b). A profile \(\langle J_1, J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle\) is
*unidimensionally aligned* if the individuals in \(N\) can be
ordered from left to right (e.g., on some cognitive or ideological
dimension) such that, for every proposition \(p \in X\), the
individuals accepting \(p\) (i.e., those with \(p \in J_i)\) are
either all to the left, or all to the right, of those rejecting \(p\)
(i.e., those with \(p \not\in J_i)\). Table 8 gives an example. Here
the individuals are ordered from left to right in the order 1-2-3-4-5,
and for each proposition the individuals accepting the proposition
(corresponding to the ‘True’ entries in the
table) are on the opposite side of those rejecting the
proposition (corresponding to the ‘False’ entries).
For any profile satisfying this condition, the majority judgments
coincide with the judgments of the median individual relative to the
given left-right ordering (if \(n\) is odd) (individual 3 in Table
8), or with the intersection of the judgment sets of the two
middle individuals (if \(n\) is even). Assuming individual judgments
are consistent, the majority judgments then inherit their consistency.
By implication, on unidimensionally aligned domains, propositionwise
majority voting will satisfy the rest of the conditions on judgment
aggregation rules reviewed above (assuming there are no majority
ties).

Individual 1 |
Individual 2 |
Individual 3 |
Individual 4 |
Individual 5 | |
---|---|---|---|---|---|

\(p\) | True | True | False | False | False |

\(q\) | True | True | True | True | False |

\(r\) | False | False | False | True | True |

\(p \wedge q \wedge r\) | False | False | False | False | False |

Table 8: Unidimensional alignment

In analogy with the case of single-peakedness in preference
aggregation, several less restrictive conditions already suffice for
consistent majority judgments. One such condition (introduced in
Dietrich and List 2010a, where a survey is provided) generalizes
Sen’s triple-wise value-restriction. A profile \(\langle J_1,
J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle\) is *value-restricted* if every
minimal inconsistent subset \(Y \subseteq X\) has a pair of elements
\(p, q\) such that no individual \(i \in N\) has \(\{p, q\} \subseteq
J_i\). Value-restriction prevents any minimal inconsistent subset of
\(X\) from becoming majority-accepted, and hence ensures consistent
majority judgments. Applied to the preference agenda,
value-restriction reduces to Sen’s equally named condition.

#### 5.4.2 Relaxing collective rationality

While the requirement that collective judgments be consistent is widely accepted, the requirement that collective judgments be complete (in \(X)\) is more contentious. In support of completeness, one might say that a given proposition would not be included in \(X\) unless it is supposed to be collectively adjudicated. Against completeness, one might say that there are circumstances in which the level of disagreement on a particular proposition (or set of propositions) is so great that forming a collective view on it is undesirable or counterproductive.

Judgment aggregation rules violating collective completeness while
satisfying (all or most of) the other conditions introduced above
include: *unanimity rule*, where, for any profile \(\langle
J_1, J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle\), \(J = \{p \in X : p \in J_i\)
for all \(i \in N\}\); *supermajority rules*, where, for any
profile \(\langle J_1, J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle\), \(J = \{p \in
X : |\{i \in N : p \in J_i\}| \gt qn\}\) for a suitable acceptance
quota \(q \in\) (0.5,1); and *conclusion-based rules*, where a
subset \(Y \subseteq X\) of logically independent propositions (and
their negations) is designated as a set of conclusions and \(J = \{p
\in Y : |\{i \in N : p \in J_i\}| \gt n/2\}\). In the multi-member
court example of Table 5, the set of conclusions is simply \(Y = \{r,
\neg r\}\).

Given consistent individual judgment sets, unanimity rule guarantees consistent collective judgment sets, because the intersection of several consistent sets of propositions is always consistent. Supermajority rules guarantee consistent collective judgment sets too, provided the quota \(q\) is chosen to be at least \((k-1)/k\), where \(k\) is the size of the largest minimal inconsistent subset of \(X\) (Dietrich and List 2007a). The reason is combinatorial: any \(k\) distinct supermajorities of the relevant size will always have at least one individual in common. So, for any minimal inconsistent set of propositions (which is at most of size \(k)\) to be supermajority-accepted, at least one individual would have to accept all the propositions in the set, contradicting this individual’s consistency. Conclusion-based rules, finally, produce consistent collective judgment sets by construction, but always leave non-conclusions undecided.

Gärdenfors (2006) and more generally Dietrich and List (2008) and
Dokow and Holzman (2010b) have shown that if—while relaxing
completeness—we require collective judgment sets to be
*deductively closed* (i.e., for any \(p \in X\) entailed by
\(J\), it must be that \(p \in J)\), we face an impossibility result
again. For the same agendas that lead to the impossibility result
reviewed in
Section 5.3,
there exists no judgment aggregation rule satisfying universal domain,
collective consistency and deductive closure, independence, unanimity
preservation, and non-oligarchy. An aggregation rule is
called *oligarchic* if there is an antecedently fixed subset
\(M \subseteq N\) (the ‘oligarchs’) such that, for any
profile \(\langle J_1, J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle\), \(J = \{p \in
X : p \in J_i\) for all \(i \in M\}\). Unanimity rule and
dictatorships are special cases with \(M = N\) and \(M = \{i\}\) for
some \(i \in N\), respectively.

The downside of oligarchic aggregation rules is that they either lapse into dictatorship or lead to stalemate, with the slightest disagreements between oligarchs resulting in indecision (since every oligarch has veto power on every proposition).

#### 5.4.3 Relaxing systematicity/independence

A variety of judgment aggregation rules become possible when we relax systematicity/independence. Recall that systematicity combines an independence and a neutrality requirement. Relaxing only neutrality does not get us very far, since for many agendas there are impossibility results with independence alone, as illustrated in Section 5.3.

One much-discussed class of aggregation rules violating independence
consists of the *premise-based rules*. Here, a subset \(Y
\subseteq X\) of logically independent propositions (and their
negations) is designated as a set of *premises*, as in the
court example. For any profile \(\langle J_1, J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle
, J = \{p \in X : J_Y\) entails \(p\}\) where \(J_Y\) are the
majority-accepted propositions among the premises, formally \(\{p \in
Y : |\{i \in N : p \in J_i\}| \gt n/2\}\). Informally, majority votes
are taken on the premises, and the collective judgments on all other
propositions are determined by logical implication. If the premises
constitute a logical basis for the entire agenda, a premise-based rule
guarantees consistent and (absent ties) complete collective judgment
sets. (For a more general definition, see Dietrich and Mongin 2010.
The procedural and epistemic properties of premise-based rules are
discussed, e.g., in Pettit 2001; Chapman 2002; Bovens and Rabinowicz
2006; Dietrich 2006.)

A generalization is given by the *sequential priority rules*
(List 2004b; see Dietrich 2015 for further generalization). Here, for
each profile \(\langle J_1, J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle\), the
propositions in \(X\) are collectively adjudicated in a fixed order of
priority, for instance, a temporal or epistemic one. The collective
judgment on each proposition \(p \in X\) is made as follows. If the
majority judgment on \(p\) is consistent with collective judgments on
prior propositions, this majority judgment prevails; otherwise the
collective judgment on \(p\) is determined by the implications of
prior judgments. By construction, this guarantees consistent and
(absent ties) complete collective judgments. However, it is
*path-dependent*: the order in which propositions are
considered may affect the outcome, specifically when the underlying
majority judgments are inconsistent. For example, when this
aggregation rule is applied to the profiles in Tables 5, 6, and 7 (but
not 8), the collective judgments depend on the order in which the
propositions are considered. Thus sequential priority rules are
vulnerable to *agenda manipulation*. Similar phenomena occur in
sequential pairwise majority voting in preference aggregation (e.g.,
Riker 1982).

Another prominent class of aggregation rules violating independence is
given by the *distance-based rules* (Pigozzi 2006, building on
Konieczny and Pino Pérez 2002; Miller and Osherson 2009). A
distance-based rule is defined in terms of some distance metric
between judgment sets, for example the *Hamming distance*,
where, for any two judgment sets \(J\), \(J' \subseteq X\), \(d(J, J')
= |\{p \in X : \text{ not } [p \in J \Leftrightarrow p \in J']\}|.\)
Each profile \(\langle J_1, J_2 , \ldots ,J_n\rangle\) is mapped to a
consistent and complete judgment set \(J\) that minimizes the
sum-total distance from each of the \(J_i\)s. (As an aside: applied to
the preference agenda, the Hamming-distanced-based rule becomes
equivalent to the ‘Kemeny rule’, already briefly mentioned
earlier.) Distance-based rules can be interpreted as capturing the
idea of identifying compromise judgments. Unlike premise-based or
sequential priority rules, they do not require a distinction between
premises and conclusions or any other order of priority among the
propositions.

As in preference aggregation, the cost of relaxing independence is the loss of strategy-proofness. The conjunction of independence and monotonicity is necessary and sufficient for the non-manipulability of a judgment aggregation rule by strategic voting (Dietrich and List 2007c; for related results, see Nehring and Puppe 2002 [Other Internet Resources]). Thus we cannot generally achieve strategy-proofness without relaxing either universal domain, or collective rationality, or unanimity preservation, or non-dictatorship. In practice, we must therefore look for ways of rendering opportunities for strategic manipulation less of a threat.

### 5.5 Probabilistic opinion pooling

A distinct and framework-transcendent way of avoiding the
impossibility results of judgment aggregation is to give up the binary
(‘Yes’/‘No’,
‘True’/‘False’) format of judgments and to
assume that they take the form of subjective probabilities or
credences. The resulting aggregation problem is that of
*probabilistic opinion pooling* (Stone 1961; Aczél and
Wagner 1980; Lehrer and Wagner 1981; McConway 1981; Genest and Zidek
1986; and Mongin 1995). Some key works on it predate the contemporary
literature on ‘binary’ judgment aggregation, but the
problem has recently received renewed attention.

In this probabilistic rather than binary setting, each individual \(i
\in N\) has an *opinion function* \(Pr_i\) on a given agenda
\(X\) (which is here typically an algebra of propositions), where, for
each \(p \in X\), \(Pr_i(p)\) is the subjective probability or degree
of belief (a real number in the interval [0,1]) that individual \(i\)
assigns to \(p\). The function \(Pr_i\) is normally assumed to be
probabilistically
coherent.^{[15]}
The aim is to find an *opinion pooling rule*, again denoted
\(F\), which assigns to each admissible profile \(\langle Pr_1,
Pr_2,\ldots, Pr_n\rangle\) of individual opinion functions a
collective opinion function \(Pr\), which should ideally also be
probabilistically coherent. For each \(p \in X, Pr(p)\) is interpreted
as the subjective probability or degree of belief that is collectively
assigned to \(p\). A structurally similar aggregation problem can be
found in the literature on peer disagreement, where an individual
epistemic agent seeks to reconcile several potentially conflicting
assignments of probabilities to some propositions—typically the
agent’s own probability assignment and those of some epistemic
peers—so as to arrive at an all-things-considered
probability assignment (for an overview, see, e.g., Christensen and
Lackey 2013).

A classic result shows that, in this probabilistic framework, conditions similar to those leading to an impossibility in the binary case can now be non-trivially satisfied. These conditions are:

Universal domain: The domain of \(F\) is the set of all logically possible profiles of probabilistically coherent opinion functions on \(X\).

Collective coherence: For any profile \(\langle Pr_1, Pr_2,\ldots, Pr_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(F\), the collectively assigned opinion function \(Pr\) on \(X\) is probabilistically coherent.

Zero preservation: For any profile \(\langle Pr_1, Pr_2,\ldots, Pr_n\rangle\) and proposition \(p \in X\), if \(Pr_i(p) = 0\) for all \(i \in N\), then the collectively assigned probability is \(Pr(p) = 0\).

Independence: For any two profiles \(\langle Pr_1, Pr_2,\ldots, Pr_n\rangle\) and \(\langle Pr^*_1, Pr^*_2, \ldots ,Pr^*_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(F\) and any \(p \in X\), if for all \(i \in N\) \(Pr_i(p) = Pr^*_i(p)\), then \(Pr(p) = Pr^*(p)\).

The following holds:

Theorem(Aczél and Wagner 1980; McConway 1981): Suppose \(X\) is an algebra containing more than two contingent, non-equivalent proposition-negation pairs. Then a probabilistic opinion pooling rule satisfies universal domain, collective coherence, zero preservation, and independence if and only if it is a linear pooling rule.

Such a rule is defined as follows. Let \(w_1, w_2 , \ldots ,w_n \ge
0\) be an assignment of weights to the \(n\) individuals with
\(w_{1 }+ w_{2 }+ \ldots_{ }+ w_n = 1\). Then the
corresponding *linear pooling rule* assigns to each profile
\(\langle Pr_1, Pr_2,\ldots, Pr_n\rangle\) of probabilistically
coherent opinion functions the collective opinion function \(Pr = w_1
Pr_1 + w_2 Pr_2 + \ldots + w_n Pr_n.\) Thus the collective probability
assigned to each proposition \(p \in X\) is a weighted linear average
of the individual probabilities assigned to \(p\). Linear pooling
rules range from ones with perfectly equal weights (which thereby
satisfy anonymity) to ones that concentrate all weight on one
individual (i.e., dictatorships). A noteworthy lesson is that
essentially the same conditions that characterize the class of
dictatorial aggregation rules in the case of binary judgment
aggregation now characterize the class of linear pooling rules.

At first sight, one might think that probabilistic opinion pooling is free from any troubling impossibility results. However, linear pooling, and thus any opinion pooling rule satisfying the above-stated conditions, has some defects. The first is this. Suppose we require that whenever all individuals consider two propositions \(p\) and \(q\) probabilistically independent (perhaps conditional on a third proposition \(r)\), this probabilistic independence judgment be preserved in the collective probability assignments. A rationale for requiring this is that judgments of probabilistic independence may encode insights about which propositions (or events described by them) are causally relevant or irrelevant to which others. Unfortunately, however, linear pooling (except in its degenerate dictatorial form) does not generally preserve unanimously held conditional independence judgments (Genest and Wagner 1987), and so we would again get an impossibility result if we added this preservation requirement to our list of earlier conditions, together with non-dictatorship.

The second defect is the following. Suppose the individuals in \(N\)
learn some new information that prompts them to revise their opinions
on the propositions in \(X\), where revision takes the form of
Bayesian conditionalization or some generalization of it. It is
plausible to require that if we aggregate their post-revision
probability assignments, the result will be the same as the one we
would have got if we had first aggregated the pre-revision probability
assignments and then revised the resulting collective probability
assignments on the basis of the learnt information. More formally
expressed, suppose \(L\) is the learnt information, and suppose \(Pr_1
|L, Pr_2 |L, \ldots ,Pr_n|L\) are the results of conditionalizing the
\(n\) individuals’ opinion functions on the new
information.^{[16]}
Then, assuming that all the profiles involved are in the domain of
our opinion pooling rule, we require that aggregation (via \(F)\) and
revision (via |) commute, i.e.,

\(F(Pr_1 |L, Pr_2 |L,\ldots, Pr_n|L) = F(Pr_1, Pr_2,\ldots, Pr_n)|L\).

Again, linear pooling (except in its degenerate dictatorial form) does not generally satisfy this requirement (often called ‘external Bayesianity’), and so we would also get an impossibility result if we added it to our list of conditions, together with non-dictatorship (Madansky 1964). Subsequent work has shown that if we aggregate probabilities by geometric rather than linear averaging, we can make aggregation and revision commute (Genest 1984; Genest et al. 1986), though we must then lift the independence requirement on the opinion pooling rule. This finding has been picked up in more recent work and has sparked a small but growing philosophical literature on Bayesian group beliefs (e.g., Dietrich 2010, 2019; Russell, Hawthorne, and Buchak 2015; and Baccelli and Stewart 2020). The key question here is this: under what conditions can a group whose opinions are given by aggregating its members’ opinions constitute a rational Bayesian agent?

Other work has considered probabilistic opinion pooling with general (i.e., non-algebra) agendas (Dietrich and List 2017) and with imprecise probabilities (Stewart and Ojea Quintana 2018), as well as more general forms of attitude aggregation, which subsume binary judgment aggregation, probability/credence aggregation, and Arrovian preference aggregation as special cases (e.g., Dietrich and List 2010b; Dokow and Holzman 2010c).

## 6. Other topics

As should be evident, social choice theory is a vast field. Areas not covered in this entry, or mentioned only in passing, include: preference and welfare aggregation under risk and uncertainty (how to aggregate individual preferences or individual welfare into social preferences when the prospects to be ranked have risky or uncertain outcomes, to which at most probabilities can be assigned; e.g., Mongin and Pivato 2016); theories of fair division (how to divide one or several divisible or indivisible goods, such as cakes or houses, between several claimants; e.g., Brams and Taylor 1996 and Moulin 2004); theories of matching (how to allocate university places to applicants or donated organs to patients; e.g., Gale and Shapley 1963; Roth and Sotomayor 1992; Klaus, Malove, and Rossi 2016); behavioural social choice theory (analyzing empirical evidence of voting behaviour under various aggregation rules; e.g., Regenwetter et al. 2006); empirical social choice theory (analysing surveys and experiments on people’s intuitions about distributive justice; e.g., Gaertner and Schokkaert 2012); topological social choice theory (studying social-choice-theoretic questions using tools from mathematical topology; e.g., Chichilnisky 1980; Heal 1997); computational social choice theory (analysing computational properties of aggregation rules, including their computational complexity; e.g., Bartholdi, Tovey, and Trick 1989; Brandt, Conitzer, and Endriss 2013); the study of collective decision-making in non-human animals (studying group decisions in a variety of animal species from social insects to primates; see, e.g., Conradt and Roper 2003); and applications to social epistemology beyond Condorcet’s jury theorem and judgment aggregation (e.g., the analysis of group doxastic states and their relationship to individual doxastic states; e.g., Goldman 2004, 2010; Lackey 2016).

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## Other Internet Resources

- Nehring, K. and C. Puppe, 2002, “Strategy-Proof Social Choice on Single-Peaked Domains: Possibility, Impossibility and the Space Between,” unpublished manuscript.
- The Society for Social Choice and Welfare
- The Computational Social Choice Website

### Acknowledgments

I am grateful to the editors, their reviewers, Franz Dietrich, Iain McLean, and Michael Morreau for comments.