Supplement to Socrates

Resources for Teaching

There are many instances of Socrates’s influence in arts and letters outside academic philosophy, of which the following is the merest sample. Wilson 2007 is light in tone and covers the millennia; Monoson 2011 is a thorough and scholarly account of the post-WWII period in North America, especially during the heyday of McCarthyism. Both include scores of examples, and both point to other sources that are likewise full of examples.


  • 1921, Leila Amos Pendleton, “The Foolish and the Wise: Sallie Runner Is Introduced to Socrates,” The Crisis 21:5 21:5
  • 1942, John Steinbeck, The Moon is Down, New York: Collier
  • 1955, Costa Varnali, The True Apology of Socrates, a satire translated from the modern Greek by Stephen Yaloussis, London: Zeno
  • 1956, Mary Renault, The Last of the Wine, New York: Pantheon
  • 1990, Muriel Spark, Symposium, Boston: Houghton Mifflin
  • 1997, Walter Mosley, Always Outnumbered, Always Outgunned, New York: Simon and Schuster
  • 1999, Walter Mosley, Walkin’ the Dog, New York: Little, Brown
  • 2006, Paul Levinson, The Plot to Save Socrates, New York: Tor/Macmillan
  • 2008, Walter Mosley, The Right Mistake: The Further Philosophical Investigations of Socrates Fortlow, New York: Civitas

Plays, Radio, Television, and Film

  • 1939, Corrado D’Errico, Processo e Morte di Socrate, Italian film
  • 1942, Eric Linklater, Socrates Asks Why, BBC Radio Drama
  • 1948, The Death of Socrates, CBS Radio
  • 1951, Maxwell Anderson, Barefoot in Athens, New York: Sloan
  • 1952, Lister Sinclair, Socrates, Montreal: Jupiter Theatre
  • 1953, Arnold Manoff, “The Death of Socrates,” You Are There, season 1, episode 14, CBS
  • 1953, Gilbert Murray, “This I Believe,” imagined speech of Socrates performed by Barry Jones, in Edward R. Murrow, This I Believe: The Personal Philosophies of Ten Immortals, Ten Living Americans, Columbia Records  
  • 1965, Leo Aylen & Jonathan Miller, The Drinking Party, BBC Television: Sunday Night Play
  • 1966, Leo Aylen & Jonathan Miller, The Death of Socrates, BBC Television: Sunday Night Play
  • 1971, Roberto Rossellini, Socrate, in Italian, TV movie distributed with subtitles by New Yorker Films
  • 1978, Steve Allen, Meeting of Minds, season 2, episodes 11–12, PBS
  • 1980, Steve Martin, “The Death of Socrates,” Comedy is Not Pretty, television special released by NBC, in Steve Martin: The Television Stuff, DVD, Shout Factory 2012
  • 2003, Walter Cronkite interview, All Things Considered, NPR, explains the 1953 broadcast in relation to Hollywood black-listing of writers
  • 2019, Socrates Now, adaptation of Plato’s Apology, directed and performed by Yannis Simonides, Elliniko Theatro  

Songs and Musical Compositions

  • 1919, Erik Satie, Socrate, Suite for Voices and Small Orchestra, Paris: Éditions Max Eschig
  • 1949, Bertholt Brecht, “How Fortunate the Man with None” from Mother Courage, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp
  • 1954, Leonard Bernstein, Serenade for Solo Violin, String Orchestra, Harp, and Percussion, after Plato’s Symposium
  • 1979, “Socrates Superstar,” performed by Elpida, Greek entry in the Eurovision Song Contest, Jerusalem
  • 1983, Mark Morris Dance Group, The Death of Socrates
  • 2010, Mark Morris Dance Group, Socrates
  • 2015, Michael Levy, “The Death of Socrates,” The Ancient Greek Tortoise-Shell Lyre, DVD
  • 2022, Taylor Mac and Matt Ray, The Hang, HERE Mainstage Prototype Festival, jazz opera

The Visual Arts

  • 1509–11, Raphael, “The School of Athens,” fresco, Apostolic Palace, Vatican City
  • 1602, Peter Paul Rubens, “The Drunken Alcibiades Interrupting the Symposium, sketch, The Metropolitan Museum of Art, New York
  • 1648, Pietro Testa, “The Drunken Alcibiades,” etching, Staatliche Museen, Berlin
  • 1787, Jacques Louis David, “The Death of Socrates,” oil on canvas, Metropolitan Museum of Art, New York
  • 1787–90, Antonio Canova, “Socrates Taking Leave of His Family” and “Socrates Drinking the Hemlock,” bas-reliefs, Gallerie d’Italia, Milan
  • 1790–92, Antonio Canova, “Crito Closing the Eyes of Socrates,” bas-relief, Gallerie d’Italia, Milan
  • 1791, Jean-Baptiste Regnault, “Socrates Tearing Alcibiades from the Arms of a Courtesan,” oil on canvas, Musée du Louvre, Paris
  • 1797, Antonio Canova, “Socrates Rescues Alcibiades at the Battle of Potidaea,” bas-relief, Accademia Nazionale di San Luca, Rome
  • 1875, Mark Antokolski, “The Death of Socrates,” marble, Russian Museum, St. Petersburg
  • 1960s, Bror Hjorth, “Love, Peace and Work,” Swedish Workers’ Educational Association Building, Stockholm
  • 1962, Hans Erni, “Sokrates,” watercolor; also, a series of illustrations of Socrates and Diotima for Plato’s Symposium appears in volume 2 (1971) of Catalogue Raisonné de L’Oeuvre Lithographié et Gravé de Hans Erni, Geneva: Éditions Pierre Cailler
  • 1986, Ralph Steadman, “Socrates,” Paranoids: From Socrates to Joan Collins, polaroid images, London: Harrap

Books for Young Adults

  • 2006, Pamela Dell, Socrates: Ancient Greek in Search of Truth, Minneapolis: Compass Point
  • 2011, David M. Johnson, Socrates and Athens, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • 2022, Devra Lehman, Socrates: A Life Worth Living, New York: Seven Stories


  • 1963, Leo Rosten, “They Made Our World,” LOOK, June 18 issue
  • 1968, Cary Bates, “Superman, That Has-Been Hero” and “Exit Superman,” World’s Finest Comics, Nos. 178 & 180, DC Comics
  • 2008, Joe Kelly and Scott Kollins, “The Man Who Stole Superman’s Powers,” Batman/Superman Annual #2, DC Comics

Copyright © 2022 by
Debra Nails <>
S. Sara Monoson <>

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