Supplement to Socrates

Early Attempts to Solve the Socratic Problem

Proposed solutions to the Socratic problem that could provide reasonable explanations of inconsistencies in Plato’s dialogues were ready at hand as far back as the eighteenth century (Thesleff 2009). Residue from the four identified here, with a few variations, are found in the assumptions of the twentieth century’s proposed solutions as well. Likewise, the problems with each are as alive now as they were long ago.

  1. The real Socrates is the one whose qualities in Plato are corroborated by Aristophanes and Xenophon.

This view could not yield much because there was too little direct overlap among the three extant sources. Later, but on the same historical assumption, there were similar attempts to find the real Socrates by identifying views that showed progress beyond extant presocratic views, e.g., those of Heraclitus and Parmenides, the Pythagoreans, Xenophanes, and Anaxagoras.

  1. The real Socrates is the one who claims no wisdom but exercises his skill at seeking understanding, thus the one depicted in dialogues that end inconclusively or at an impasse (i.e., in aporia — literally, without resources), without a clear indication of how the initial questions should be answered or even what the next step in the discussion should be.

At first, this seemed to promise that the real Socrates was described in such dialogues as Charmides, Laches, Lysis, and Euthyphro. Over time, however, positive doctrines were identified in all of the ones that had at first seemed aporetic, despite their inconclusive ends. Also, it was problematic that significant works such as Crito and Apology which seemed, at least to some scholars, to be historically plausible, were omitted under this criterion. What is more, Theaetetus, often cited as ushering in the late Statesman and Sophist, ends in apparent aporia.

  1. The real Socrates is the one who appears in Plato’s earliest dialogues.

The problem was to find a non-circular way to determine which dialogues were earliest. The only secure piece of information about the order of Plato’s dialogues available from ancient times was that Republic was written before Laws; and that was not nearly enough information to support a full-fledged chronology of dates of composition, especially because so many dialogues were assumed to have been composed before Republic. Two important attempts to introduce appropriate criteria followed.

(3a) Stylometrics (the measument of aspects of Plato’s conscious and unconscious writing style) contributed hundreds of articles purporting to show which dialogues were early. However, proponents of stylometry could not overcome the circularity problem: every suggested order depended on first positing an early, i.e., pre-Republic, exemplar for which no independent confirmation was possible. In fact, the first non-circular effort (Ledger 1989) was possible only after computers enabled the measurement and correlation of very large numbers of stylistic features; but then the results did not confirm scholars’ expectations about the order of the dialogues. More nuanced contemporary stylometric research is closely related to Plato’s skill at changing registers to evoke different characters, an approach that sometimes identifies affinities in clusters of dialogues (e.g. Tarrant 2022).

Another effort took literally the suggestion that such formulaic expressions as “I said” and “he agreed” should give way to direct speech (suggested at Theaetetus 143b3). By this criterion, all dialogues with direct speech were to be counted as later than Theaetetus. However, the criterion foundered on the exceptions: Laches, for example, would have to be post-Theaetetus while, by all other criteria deemed relevant, it was written early in Plato’s career. And Timaeus, seeming so late, would have to be recategorized as pre-Theaetetus. To complicate matters, several dialogues mix the dramatic and narrative styles, and some manuscripts imply revision of style.

(3b) Thematic development was supposed to demonstrate that Plato’s views evolved over time on specific philosophical issues and that the order in which the dialogues were written could be determined by placing the least evolved first. Two insurmountable problems arose: the particular view considered most highly evolved depended entirely on the preferred views of the scholars who performed the investigations; moreover, when longer dialogues containing more than one subject were compared (e.g., Republic and Symposium), it often occurred that a dialogue would be highly evolved on one subject and introductory on a second subject, while the other dialogue would have the reverse configuration, leaving no obvious way to distinguish which was earlier.

  1. The real Socrates is the one who turns from the presocratic interest in nature to ethics, and has no theory of separate forms (loosely based on Aristotle, Metaphysics 987b1–6).

The difficulty arises that forms appear to be implicit even in the dialogues that, by all other criteria, would be considered early (e.g., Euthyphro, cf. Allen 1971). In addition, when specific ethical issues later came to be identified, the old difficulties of (3b) reappeared with respect to the views taken to be those of Socrates. Some scholars have been reluctant to concede that Socrates toyed with forms as a young man and that, even then, forms may not have been novel but a clever step that more than one philosopher took to overcome Parmenidean problems with motion and change (Parmenides 130b).

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